First published Thu Mar 19, 2015

Gratitude is the proper or called-for response in a beneficiary to benefits or beneficence from a benefactor. It is a topic of interest in normative ethics, moral psychology, and political philosophy, and may have implications for metaethics as well. Despite its commonness in everyday life, there is substantive disagreement among philosophers over the nature of gratitude and its connection to other philosophical concepts. The sections of this article address five areas of debate about what gratitude is, when it is called for, and what implications it has for other debates in moral philosophy and philosophy generally.

1. Conceptual Matters

In analyzing gratitude and the conditions under which it is called for, philosophers have generally tried to account for all the cases in which we find it natural to use gratitude terms (“grateful”, “thankful”, etc.). We use such terms in a broad range of circumstances: it sounds natural to say, for instance, “I am grateful that it did not rain on my wedding day;” “grateful someone happened to walk by as I was being mugged;” “grateful to someone for trying unsuccessfully to help me;” “grateful for someone’s well-wishes.” The breadth of circumstances in which we invoke gratitude terms would suggest that gratitude, generally, is the response a person should have to something good—that is, to benefit or “favour” (Walker 1980–1981).

In the last 40 years, philosophers have begun paying attention to a fundamental distinction in how we use gratitude terms (Walker 1980–1981; Card 1988; McAleer 2012). On one hand, such terms can be used just before the preposition “to”, as in

Y is grateful to R for φ-ing,

where Y is some beneficiary, R is some benefactor, and φ is (at least paradigmatically) something R has done that was beneficial for Y. Locutions with this structure describe what we might call prepositional gratitude. On the other hand, gratitude terms are sometimes followed by the word “that” and a proposition, as in

Y is grateful that p,

where p represents some state of affairs Y finds beneficial. Locutions of this structure describe propositional gratitude (McAleer 2012). Prepositional gratitude is essentially a “triadic” or three-place relation between Y, R, and φ. Propositional gratitude, by contrast, is a “dyadic” or two-place relation between Y and some good state of affairs p. Propositional gratitude might be described as the proper response to a good state of affairs. Prepositional gratitude, on the other hand, is the proper response to something more specific: a benefactor’s doing or having done something beneficial for the beneficiary. Unlike propositional gratitude, prepositional gratitude is an essentially interpersonal phenomenon.

Recently, a consensus seems to be emerging that analyses of the concept of gratitude should be concerned only with the phenomenon expressed by the prepositional sense of the term (Carr 2013; Gulliford, Morgan et al. 2013). The consensus is based on the observation that the propositional sense of “gratitude” is more or less identical to another concept: the concept of appreciation or gladness. To say that I am grateful that it did not rain on my wedding day, for instance, is just to say that I am glad it did not; to say that I am grateful for life’s little blessings is just to say I appreciate or am glad that they transpire. To say I am grateful for my children is just to say that I am glad or appreciate that they are in my life. By contrast, to say I am grateful to a good Samaritan for saving my life implies more than that I am glad, or appreciate the fact, that I was saved by her. To be grateful to such a person seems to imply, for instance, a desire to see her fare well, or a commitment to helping her out in the future, should she ever find herself in dire circumstances. (Other ways in which appreciation and gratitude are different can be found in section 3.) As the good Samaritan case suggests, prepositional gratitude and appreciation are called for in many of the same situations. Indeed, appreciation may be called for in every situation in which prepositional gratitude is called for. But as the earlier examples suggested, there are times when appreciation is called for but gratitude is not. Insofar as philosophers are interested in analyzing gratitude proper, without having their analyses contaminated by such cases of mere or bare appreciation, they should focus their attention on all and only instances of the essentially interpersonal kind of gratitude—instances where a beneficiary is grateful to a benefactor for something she did. In keeping with this emerging consensus, the remaining sections of this entry will be concerned only with the concept of prepositional gratitude: the response called for in a beneficiary to a benefactor’s having done something beneficial for him.

2. When Gratitude is Owed

Philosophers debate the specific conditions under which gratitude is called for in a beneficiary—that is, the conditions under which beneficiary Y owes gratitude to benefactor R, and R deserves gratitude from Y, as a result of R’s φ-ing. This debate focuses on several features of Y, R, and R’s φ-ing.

Whether R must be an agent. Most philosophers agree that at the very least, benefactor R must be an agent in order for Y to owe gratitude to R for φ-ing. Indeed, this is suggested by the fact that φ in the formulation of prepositional gratitude (Y is grateful to R for φ-ing) paradigmatically represents an intentional verb. One notable skeptic of the “agency requirement” on gratitude is McAleer (2012), who points out that people sometimes purport to be grateful to inanimate objects. He gives the example of a prospector who finds gold on a mountain, and then claims to be grateful to that mountain for yielding its bounty to him. It seems plausible, however, that in such cases, the beneficiary implicitly anthropomorphize the “benefactor”, attributing to it the ability to give a benefit when it, strictly speaking, lacks the agency to do so. Though gratitude to the mountain would not be called for in this case, appreciation that he found gold on the mountain might be called for in the prospector.

Whether φ must be an action. Among philosophers, there is general agreement that benefactor R must act in some way that concerns beneficiary Y in order to deserve Y’s gratitude. Two exceptions in the literature are worth noting. In the first place, Smilansky (1997) argues that Y sometimes should be grateful to R for abstaining from harming Y, at least when certain conditions are met—e.g., in cases when abstaining from harming someone goes beyond the call of duty, or requires effort and sacrifice (see the remainder of this section for a more detailed analysis of those conditions). In these cases, R’s φ-ing, for which Y would be grateful, would be an omission or a refraining rather than an act. A second exception is Kant (1775–1780 [1981]), who writes that something like gratitude is owed or called for in response to mere “heartfelt benevolence”, even in the absence of any acts or attempts on the part of the benefactor. Kant refers to this response as “gratefulness” rather than gratitude.

Whether R must have φ-ed intentionally. Most philosophers hold that Y owes R gratitude only if R φ-ed intentionally. More specifically, R’s φ-ing must have been intentional under the description of “benefiting Y”. Some philosophers go further, arguing that gratitude is only owed in response to voluntary acts. On this view, if R benefits Y only because she (R) has a gun to her head, she does not deserve gratitude, even if she benefited Y intentionally (Simmons 1979). Not all philosophers accept the “intentionality requirement” on gratitude. One exception in the literature is Fitzgerald (1998), who claims that Y’s gratitude to R for harming him might be called for if there was some benefit that came about for Y because of that harm. Thus it might be the case that the Dalai Lama, Fitzgerald argues, should be grateful to the Chinese government for persecuting and humiliating him, insofar as these actions gave him the opportunity to become more virtuous. It might be more accurate, however, to say that the Dalai Lama should appreciate the opportunity the Chinese gave him by trying to harm him, though he should not be grateful to them for “providing” it.

There is some disagreement about whether R’s intention to benefit Y must be R’s only motive in φ-ing. Most philosophers allow that R may have other motives for φ-ing (Weiss 1985: 495), noting that our motives are almost always mixed (McConnell 1993: 19). Some philosophers argue, however, that the presence of certain intentions might render a particular act of beneficence less than gratitude-worthy. Weiss (1985) argues that whatever her other motives, R must not benefit Y with the intention of gaining standing to demand a return in the future, as this would render R’s φ-ing a sort of lending, rather than a gratitude-worthy act of beneficence. Berger (1975) also worries about such cases.

Whether R’s φ-ing must be supererogatory. There is also debate over whether Y can owe R gratitude for φ-ing if R was obligated to φ, or if Y had a right to R’s φ-ing. Heyd (1982), Weiss (1985), Walker (1980–1981), and Card (1988) all argue that Y owes no gratitude to R for doing something R was already obligated to do anyway, and that gratitude is called for only in response to supererogatory acts. Other philosophers disagree, citing various counterexamples. Simmons (1979), for instance, claims that I owe gratitude to a good Samaritan who stops to offer me assistance, even though such acts are obligatory. Lyons (1969) argues that while I may not owe gratitude to a lifeguard for saving my life, I may owe him gratitude for having freely taken up the obligation to do so. Seneca (On Benefits) claims that gratitude may be owed for an obligatory act if the benefactor had gratitude-worthy motives beyond the motive to fulfill her obligation, and these gratitude-worthy motives were decisive in motivating her. Finally, it might be argued that a benefactor who benefits me in fulfilling her duty deserves gratitude insofar as living up to her duty required extraordinary sacrifice on her part (McConnell 1993: 16; Seneca On Benefits: III.19.12–13). The captured soldier who resists torture long enough for her companions to reach safety seems to deserve gratitude, despite doing no more than her duty (refraining from giving the enemy valuable information). These examples suggest that perhaps φ’s praiseworthiness, rather than φ’s supererogatoriness, is a necessary condition for Y’s owing gratitude to R. This possibility is challenged by the fact that sometimes, it seems a beneficiary Y may owe gratitude to a benefactor who was obligated to give away some particular benefit to someone, and happened to choose Y as the recipient. McConnell (1993) gives the example of a student who is required by her instructor to volunteer at a charitable organization of her choice. When she chooses Y’s organization, her action is neither supererogatory nor praiseworthy; but it seems she still deserves gratitude from Y.

Whether R must incur some liability in φ-ing. Several of the examples in the last paragraph suggest that gratitude is owed to R only if R incurred some liability in φ-ing. On this view, gratitude is due only when the benefactor incurs some cost, sacrifice or risk in φ-ing (Simmons 1979: 178; Weiss 1985: 495). Upon reflection, this condition may be too stringent. It would seem to rule out, for instance, the possibility of gratitude to an omnipotent god, who, in virtue of his omnipotence, would sacrifice little or nothing in acting beneficently. It also seems to rule out the possibility of gratitude in McConnell’s example at the end of the last paragraph. In response to these worries, it might be pointed out that agents (perhaps even an omnipotent god) always incur opportunity costs in deciding to bestow benefits in one place and not another.

Whether R’s φ-ing must actually benefit R. Most philosophers agree that R’s φ-ing need not result in Y’s actually being benefited in order for R to deserve Y’s gratitude. Some philosophers suggest that the mere offer of a benefit, even if it is not accepted, calls for gratitude in the offeree (Camenisch 1981). Others argue that gratitude may be called for in response to R’s attempt at benefiting Y, even if the attempt does not succeed. There is a parallel here with the conditions under which resentment or blame are deserved. If one agent intends, plans and attempts to harm another, then it seems he deserves resentment and blame, even if his attempts were thwarted at the last minute by chance. By the same token, if R intends, plans and sacrifices in an attempt to benefit Y, but finds her attempts thwarted at the last minute by chance, it seems she still deserves gratitude. This claim may not be absolute. Dowling (1995), for instance, argues that if R inadvertently harms Y in attempting to benefit him, gratitude may not be owed. This may be true especially in cases where R knew, or should have known, that φ-ing would expose Y to non-negligible risk of harm.

Whether Y wants or accepts R’s φ-ing. Philosophers also debate whether certain features of the beneficiary are necessary for gratitude to be owed. Simmons (1979), for instance, claims that Y owes R no gratitude for benefits R forced on Y against Y’s will. Furthermore, it seems, Y must want R’s benefit in order for gratitude to be called for. If R delivers a benefit without Y’s desire or consent to receive it, this may betray a disregard for Y’s autonomy that would ultimately undermine R’s desert of gratitude (Berger 1975; Camenisch 1981; Meilaender 1984: 168). This condition seems too stringent in cases where a beneficiary desperately needs a benefit but is not able to accept it, say, because of incapacitation. In response to such worries, Simmons adds the proviso that if Y does not actually want the benefit, it may suffice for gratitude to be owed that Y would want the benefit if certain “impairing conditions” (such as drunkenness, mental disorder or ignorance) were removed. Still, some philosophers think gratitude may be called for in the absence of both Y’s desire and such impairing conditions. McConnell (1993), for instance, argues that a child who accepts an offer of college tuition from a benefactor owes that benefactor gratitude, even if she does not want to go to college.

Simmons (1979) argues for a further necessary condition for Y’s owing gratitude to R: that Y must not want the benefit in question not to come from R. Y may not want his once-abusive father to pay for his college education, for example, in which case Y would not owe him gratitude for doing so, even if Y might have been happy to accept the same benefit from anyone else. McConnell (1993) and Weiss (1985) disagree, arguing that while it may sometimes be emotionally difficult for a beneficiary to be grateful to a particular benefactor for φ-ing, beneficiaries might still owe their benefactors gratitude under such circumstances (especially if the beneficiary accepts the benefit).

Two remarks about the role of these conditions. In considering the conditions under which beneficiary Y owes gratitude to benefactor R for φ-ing, two points should be noted. The first is that the question of whether gratitude is owed is not necessarily settled once and for all in the moment that R φ’s. Even if R’s φ-ing makes it the case that Y owes R gratitude, some future harm or wrong on R’s part might render Y’s gratitude for R’s φ-ing no longer called for (McConnell 1993: 29–30). This might happen if, for example, R recklessly or malevolently destroys a gift she gave Y. Gratitude may also cease to be called for if R, subsequent to gratitude-worthily φ-ing, demands a return or compensation for having φ-ed (insofar as such a demand would seem to render R’s φ-ing more of a loan than a gratitude-worthy act of benevolence or beneficence) (Weiss 1985), or tries to use the fact of his having φ-ed to manipulate Y by guilting him into doing something (Berger 1975).

A second point worth noting is that while these conditions are often discussed as necessary (and perhaps jointly sufficient) conditions for gratitude’s being called for, they can also be seen as factors that modulate how much and what sort of gratitude is owed. The proper response to mere “heartfelt benevolence” on R’s part might be no more than a similar feeling of goodwill from Y to R. On the other hand, if R sacrifices greatly in voluntarily and successfully conveying substantial and much-needed benefit on Y, the gratitude Y owes R may take the form of a strong intention or willingness to sacrifice to a similar degree if R ever finds herself in need.

3. The Elements of the Grateful Response

Gratitude, understood as the response called for in Y to R’s φ-ing (when conditions in section 2 are met), is a complex phenomenon. It consists of certain beliefs, feelings and behavioral tendencies, without each of which a beneficiary fails to count as fully grateful. The elements of the grateful response can be broken down into four categories: cognitive, affective, communicative, and conative.

3.1 Cognitive Elements

As a response to beneficence, gratitude seems to include certain judgments or beliefs—at the very least, the belief that an act of beneficence has occurred (Berger 1975: 302; Walker 1980–1981: 51). In the absence of such judgments, we would be hard pressed to call a beneficiary grateful. A beneficiary who failed to judge that an act of beneficence had been performed would be unlikely to have the feelings or exhibit the behaviors a grateful person ought to have and do (see sections 3.2, 3.3, and 3.4 below). Such feelings and behaviors, after all, do not arise ex nihilo in normal people, so without a sufficient reason, we would expect them not to arise.

The precise content of grateful beliefs will vary, depending on the nature of the act of beneficence in response to which they are called for. They may, for instance, include the belief that benefactor R is especially brave, or especially thoughtful, or especially self-sacrificing. They may include the belief that R cares a great deal about Y. But a beneficiary must form more than just the belief that something good has happened to him, if he is to qualify as grateful to R. If a benevolent stranger saves my life at great risk to herself, and I consequently form no beliefs about her as an agent (e.g., that she is a benevolent or brave person, or that she cares about me), then I fail to be grateful to her—though I may be grateful that she saved me, if I form the belief that something good has happened to me. The difference in the content of the beliefs called for in response to benefit from an agent, on the one hand, and benefit more generally, on the other, is yet another way in which prepositional gratitude is distinguished from propositional “gratitude”, or appreciation (see section 1).

Gratitude calls not only for the formation of certain beliefs, but for their persistence as well. A beneficiary who forgets an act of beneficence (or, at least, forgets too quickly) seems to fall short of what gratitude calls for (Aquinas II–II, q. 104, art. 1; Seneca On Benefits: II.10.4; III.5.2). In fact, according to Seneca, a beneficiary who forgets a benefit is “the worst and most ungrateful” of beneficiaries—perhaps because merely remembering a benefit is the easiest part of being grateful (Seneca On Benefits: III.5.2).

3.2 Affective Elements

In addition to certain beliefs, gratitude calls for certain feelings or affects in a beneficiary, without which he fails to count as grateful. Philosophers generally concur that feelings of gratitude are positive and agreeable feelings (Fitzgerald 1998; Bruton 2003). Some philosophers claim that an act of beneficence should incite feelings of joy and pleasure in the grateful beneficiary—and not just because of the benefit, but because he has benefited as a result of someone’s benevolence toward him (Camenisch 1981; Card 1988; McConnell 1993; Seneca On Benefits). Still others claim that gratitude entails a certain affection for the benefactor (Bruton 2003). These generalizations may not apply to gratitude in all cases, however. A beneficiary whose benefactor sacrifices terribly in conferring her benefit on him should probably feel grief or sadness, rather than joy or pleasure, insofar as he is grateful to her; and the proper response to a benefit from a benefactor one finds loathsome need not amount to affection.

Several philosophers suggest that as far as feelings go, gratitude requires some degree of goodwill toward a benefactor, understood as wishing a benefactor well (Walker 1980–1981; Herman 2012). Goodwill in this sense should be understood not strictly speaking as an affect, but as a disposition to have certain affects in certain situations—what we might call an affective disposition. For a beneficiary to have goodwill toward his benefactor is for the beneficiary to have dispositions to be pleased if things go well for her. Insofar as goodwill is necessary for gratitude, it may mark another distinction between prepositional gratitude and propositional “gratitude”. I can be perfectly grateful that it did not rain on my wedding day without wishing anyone well. By contrast, it seems that I fail to be grateful to a benefactor if I fail to wish her well after she does me a good turn.

Gratitude seems to call not only for the presence of certain affective elements, but the diminution or absence of certain affective elements as well. In particular, one affective disposition thought to be inconsistent or incompatible with gratitude is resentment: an affective disposition to feel pleasure when a benefactor suffers, and displeasure when she fares well (Camenisch 1981: 24; McConnell 1993: 83; Fitzgerald 1998: 131, fn 143; Bruton 2003: 3; Roberts 2004: 69; Costello 2006: 270). Insofar as there was resentment between a benefactor and beneficiary before an act of benevolence, a grateful beneficiary will be inclined to experience less resentment after the fact. A beneficiary who, in response to an act of benevolence, experiences increased resentment toward his benefactor, is guilty of a special kind of ingratitude (see section 3.5).

3.3 Communicative Elements

In addition to feelings and beliefs, gratitude also seems to require an act of or tendency to acknowledge a benefactor’s act of benevolence, and/or to communicate, demonstrate or express grateful beliefs and feelings to the benefactor. A beneficiary who lacks any motivation to show or inform his benefactor of his grateful attitudes (perhaps, say, because he is overly prideful) seems to fall short of what gratitude requires, even if he has the appropriate feelings and beliefs regarding her.

Gratitude is generally communicated verbally, by thanking; but the demonstration, expression or communication of gratitude can occur through certain behaviors as well—such as presenting a benefactor with a thank-you gift, or doing her a return-favor. Some philosophers argue that expression or demonstration of grateful attitudes may in fact require certain such nonverbal behaviors. Berger (1975) and Swinburne (1989), for instance, argue that if a benefactor’s act of benevolence was especially great, only a return-favor or thank-you gift that is obviously costly to the beneficiary will suffice as an adequate demonstration of especially intense feelings and beliefs of gratitude. Whether the acts of presenting a benefactor with a thank-you gift or doing her a favor in the future serve only this demonstrative or expressive function is disputed (see section 3.4.2).

As far as verbal expressions of thanks go, philosophers agree that the grateful beneficiary’s thanks should be sincere; but what exactly sincerity consists in will depend on what sort of speech-act thanking turns out to be. For philosophers who consider thanking an expressive, thanks will be sincere insofar as they accurately reflect grateful beliefs and feelings that are actually present in a beneficiary. Other philosophers suggest that thanks might be sincere even if a beneficiary lacks the requisite grateful feelings and attitudes at the time of thanking. Camenisch (1981), for instance, suggests that thanking might sometimes be a commissive—a speech-act through which a beneficiary commits himself to developing grateful beliefs, feelings and other dispositions that he may not have at the time of thanking. There is a parallel here with forgiveness, which may sometimes be granted even when the forgiver has not yet rid himself of resentful feelings toward his malefactor. In such cases, it might still be fair to say the forgiver was sincere in his utterance, if we understand “I forgive you” to imply the forgiver’s commitment to ridding himself of such feelings (Griswold 2007).

3.4 Conative Elements

In addition to certain beliefs, certain feelings, and thanking, gratitude seems to require certain behaviors (or tendencies) on the part of the beneficiary, such as the giving of thank-you gifts or the doing of return-favors. There is debate among philosophers about exactly what behaviors are required for a beneficiary to count as grateful, and about how such behaviors should be motivated in a conscientious beneficiary.

3.4.1 Grateful Behavior

Several philosophers argue that a beneficiary must treat a benefactor’s benefit in certain ways in order to count as grateful. Seneca (On Benefits), for instance, claims that accepting the benefactor’s gift in the first place is necessary for gratitude, since turning down a gift is likely to frustrate or disappoint a benefactor, or signal an unwillingness to advance a friendship. (Whether turning down a gift actually constitutes ingratitude is discussed in section 4.3, below.) Once beneficiaries accept or receive gifts or favors, Camenisch (1981) argues that beneficiaries must respect certain “use conditions” on the benefits they receive—i.e., not treat such benefits in a way obviously repugnant to the benefactor, or antithetical to her reasonable hopes for how the gift would be enjoyed. If I accept a rare edition of Kant’s works, and then summarily toss it in the trash, this may instantiate a sort of ingratitude. In certain cases, gratitude might also require that a beneficiary compensate his benefactor for certain costs she incurred in providing the benefit. If a good Samaritan damages her car in rushing me to the hospital, offering to pay for the damage might be called for (Simmons 1979).

Gratitude also seems to require a desire, tendency or willingness to benefit the benefactor in the future—say, by returning a favor, or buying a thank-you gift. Some philosophers argue that such a tendency of reciprocity is ultimately fundamentally different from gratitude (Feinberg 1966). It might be fairer to say, however, that while reciprocity can be conceptualized apart from gratitude (e.g., as a component of justice), gratitude entails reciprocity. After all, a beneficiary who is devoid of any inclination to reciprocate a favor seems to fall short of gratitude—even if he has the appropriate beliefs and feelings toward his benefactor, and has expressed thanks. This seems especially clear in cases where a benefactor requests a reasonable favor from a beneficiary, and the beneficiary refuses to accede to it (Bruton 2003). Outside the case of requests, though, benefactors seem to have a great deal of latitude in when and how they return a favor or present a thank-you gift to a benefactor (Simmons 1979). If R gives Y an unexpected gift, Y should be inclined to do something nice, of roughly equal magnitude, for R in the future; but he seems to have a great deal of discretion in what he does and when. Within this latitude, however, it has been argued that a truly grateful beneficiary would not return a benefit too soon, or too similar in kind, or too close in value (Camenisch 1981; Meilaender 1984). Such responses might be interpreted by the benefactor as “payment” for the “gift”, and might be taken as an attempt to reject the benefit qua benevolent gift or favor.

Aside from an inclination to reciprocate a benefit, grateful beneficiaries should also have an especial inclination to refrain from harming their benefactors (Walker 1980–1981). Beneficiaries should be disinclined to harm anyone, of course, insofar as harming others is generally morally wrong. But there are circumstances in which harming others is not necessarily wrong; and in these circumstances, we might expect a grateful beneficiary’s special disinclination to harm a benefactor to make a difference in his behavior. Imagine that Y is a morally upstanding and successful businessman in a fair market, whose legitimate business activities have begun driving his nearby competitors out of business. Driving competitors out of business under such conditions certainly amounts to harming them, though this sort of harm is not necessarily wrong. Imagine, however, that Y discovers one of his vulnerable competitors to be R, a former benefactor who sacrificed greatly in performing an act of benevolence for him years earlier. It seems plausible that Y, insofar as he is grateful, should go out of his way to spare her from financial harm (perhaps, say, by refraining from marketing his products in her region). At the very least, if Y had no special compunction about driving R out of business, we would be hard-pressed to say he was fully grateful to her. A beneficiary, then, should be especially disinclined to harm a benefactor, and should perhaps refrain from harming her in certain situations where he might reasonably be willing to harm a stranger. We can call this behavioral aspect of the grateful response grateful nonmaleficence.

3.4.2 Grateful Reasons and Motivation

In order to instantiate gratitude, each of these behaviors must be done for certain reasons, and must be motivated in a certain way. Consider first the sorts of reasons a grateful beneficiary should have for behaving gratefully—the sorts of considerations he should take as counting in favor of returning a favor, say, or buying a thank-you gift. Virtually all philosophers agree that a beneficiary who benefits a benefactor merely for prudential reasons falls short of gratitude. For example, a beneficiary who returns a favor because he is afraid of being labeled an ingrate, or because he wants to keep a benefactor’s benevolence flowing, seems to fall short of gratitude (McConnell 1993). Beyond this, however, there is some disagreement among philosophers about what reasons count as legitimate ones for performing grateful behavior.

According to some philosophers, the fact that grateful behavior, like returning a favor, can demonstrate or express grateful beliefs and feelings should count in favor of doing them (see section 3.3). Ultimately, however, such demonstrativeness reasons cannot be the only legitimate reasons that count in favor of grateful behavior. As Walker (1980–1981) notes, if the only legitimate reason a beneficiary might have to perform grateful behavior was to express or communicate gratitude, then a beneficiary should take himself to have no special reason to do a favor for a benefactor secretly or anonymously. And yet, intuitively, a beneficiary who takes himself to have no reason to do a good turn for a benefactor upon realizing he won’t get credit for it seems to fall short of gratitude. This suggests that a beneficiary should be motivated to do certain things for a benefactor for reasons other than demonstrating or communicating gratitude.

Walker (1980–1981) suggests that the main reason a grateful beneficiary should take to count in favor of performing some grateful behavior, ψ, is that ψ-ing will advance the interests of the benefactor in some way. We might think of these as reasons of grateful beneficence (Fitzgerald 1998). Walker’s suggestion is supported by the fact that all the grateful behaviors in the previous subsection have in common the fact that each tends to advance or protect the interests of the benefactor. Grateful reciprocity and nonmaleficence advance or protect a benefactor’s welfare interests, while respecting use conditions and accepting benefits advance a benefactor’s ulterior interests. Even certain paradigmatically expressive “behaviors”, like verbally thanking, mentioned in section 3.3, can be construed as advancing the interests of a benefactor, insofar as benefactors have interests in being recognized for their benevolence, or knowing that their benevolence accomplished its goal.

Aside from reasons of demonstrativeness and grateful beneficence, philosophers have proposed several other types of reasons a grateful beneficiary might take to count in favor of grateful behaviors. Fitzgerald (1998), for instance, claims that there are six types of potentially legitimate reasons for performing grateful actions. Juridical reasons are cited when a benefactor deserves or merits gratitude. Beneficent or nonmaleficent reasons are cited when showing gratitude will help someone, or spare her from harm. Caring reasons are cited when the justification for grateful action is primarily to enhance or preserve a special relationship. Civic reasons are cited when gratitude is shown to enhance communal relationships. Perfectionist justifications are cited when a beneficiary acts gratefully in order to develop certain other virtues within himself. Ultimately, Fitzgerald may be guilty of conflating moral reasons a beneficiary might legitimately take into account in deliberation about grateful behavior, on one hand, with reasons why it would be good if a beneficiary were to act gratefully, on the other. In general, just because my having some attitude or intention will have morally good consequences does not necessarily constitute the right kind of reason for me to have that attitude. An analogy with beliefs is helpful here. There might be all sorts of reasons why it would be good for me to believe that p; but the only reasons that will count as the right sorts of reasons for me to believe that p are reasons that speak in favor of p’s truth. By the same token, while many good effects may follow from a beneficiary’s performing acts of gratitude, not all of those facts will count as the right sorts of reason for a deliberating beneficiary to take into account. Caring reasons, civic reasons, and perfectionist reasons may ultimately fail to count as the right sort of reasons to be grateful. A beneficiary who returns a favor to a benefactor for civic reasons, for instance, may be a good citizen; but if he does not believe his benefactor deserves a return-favor, or does not think the return-favor will actually benefit his benefactor, it is hard to see how he counts as grateful.

Reasons aside, philosophers are also concerned with the way in which grateful behavior is actuated. Several philosophers argue that a grateful beneficiary must be “naturally inclined” to benefit his benefactor (Wellman 1999b) and will do so spontaneously (Camenisch 1981). On this view, a beneficiary who has to deliberate about whether to act gratefully, and then exert an effort of will to act on the outcome of his deliberation, falls short of gratitude. There may be room to question whether grateful behavior must always flow from natural inclination, however. Consider an analogy with friendship. We expect a good friend to be naturally inclined to help a friend in need; but sometimes, a person may need to muster an effort of will to come to his friend’s aid—specifically, when and if his first-order natural inclinations to help his friend are overwhelmed. This will happens inevitably even to the best of friends at times, since even the best of friends will have other legitimate commitments, interests and desires that might sometimes outweigh their natural inclination to come to the aide of a friend (Telfer 1970–1971; Owens 2012). By the same token, it might be argued that even the most grateful of beneficiaries will sometimes find their inclinations to benefit a benefactor overwhelmed by competing legitimate inclinations. A beneficiary might have to muster an effort of will, for instance, to pull himself away from his daughter’s birthday party in order to help a benefactor in need. But exerting an effort of will in such cases need not be inconsistent with being grateful, just as exerting an effort of will to help a friend under similar circumstances would not make one a bad friend. The friendship analogy suggests, then, that acting spontaneously on first-order natural inclinations is not always necessary for an act to count as an act of gratitude.

The friendship analogy suggests, further, that the presence of first-order natural inclinations is not sufficient for gratitude. We expect a good friend to be naturally inclined to help a friend in need; but we also expect him to recognize that his natural inclinations might sometimes be overwhelmed. A true friend, then, should be prepared to muster an effort of will to come to his friend’s aid in circumstances when his natural inclinations fail. A friend who is not so prepared is one type of fair-weather friend. By the same token, a beneficiary who merely has the natural inclination to act gratefully, but is not prepared to exert an effort of will to ensure grateful action when first-order inclinations fail, might not instantiate fullest gratitude, but what we might call “fair-weather gratitude”. Still, though, it seems plausible that a beneficiary who never acts gratefully from natural inclination, and must always exert an effort of will, almost certainly falls short of gratitude, regardless of whether he acts for the right reasons.

3.5 Ingratitude and Overgratitude

Clarity on the elements of the grateful response is critical for developing an accurate account of what gratitude actually is (see section 4 below); but it also helps clarify the ways in which a beneficiary who owes gratitude can fail to be properly grateful. In the first place, knowing the elements of the grateful response sheds light on all the ways a beneficiary can be ungrateful. Ingratitude (the state of being ungrateful) can be thought of as the absence or deficiency of one or more of the elements of the grateful response when gratitude is in fact called for in a particular beneficiary. A beneficiary, then, can be ungrateful in one (or more) of several ways. Forgetfulness, apathy, pride and laziness, for instance, are all generally characterized as vices or shortcomings in themselves; but when they result in the absence or deficiency of grateful memory, grateful feelings, a willingness to acknowledge a benefactor’s benevolence, or grateful reciprocity in a beneficiary, they may very well also amount to species of ingratitude (Aquinas II–II, q. 104, art. 2). We might label these species of ingratitude with reference to the shortcomings in the elements by which they are constituted: cognitive ingratitude for the inattentive or forgetful beneficiary; affective ingratitude for the coldhearted or apathetic beneficiary; expressive ingratitude for the overly prideful beneficiary, and conative or motivational ingratitude for the lazy beneficiary. Ungrateful beneficiaries may, of course, instantiate more than one species of ingratitude in response to the same instance of beneficence.

Within the category of ingratitude, Aquinas (II–II, q. 104, art. 3) points to another helpful distinction. A beneficiary can be ungrateful by failing to have a sufficient level of a certain element of the grateful response (e.g., not being willing enough to help a benefactor in need; not being quite pleased enough when a benefactor fares well; etc.). We might think of this as sub-gratitude. A beneficiary can also be ungrateful by having and instantiating the opposite or negation of some particular element. For instance, in response to a genuine act of benevolence, a beneficiary might actually come to resent his benefactor; and rather than feeling any motivation to benefit her in the future, he may find himself inclined to set back her interests. These tendencies might arise out of envious reflection on how morally superior a benefactor’s benevolence makes her. We might think of this type of ingratitude as anti-gratitude.

Ingratitude is not the only way a beneficiary might reprehensibly fail to have an appropriate degree of the elements of the grateful response. Several philosophers have noted that an overabundance of any of the elements of gratitude, beyond the level called for by some genuine act of benevolence, might also constitute a moral failing of a certain kind. Card (1988), for instance, writes that grateful beliefs or feelings toward someone who has not earned them might be a mark of servility, or a lack of self-respect, on the part of the beneficiary who has them. We might think of this moral failing as overgratitude. It is important to note, however, that a beneficiary may go beyond what gratitude calls for without being servile. An extravagant thank-you gift might not necessarily signal servility on the part of a beneficiary, if he did not sacrifice excessively in giving it, or overestimate the favor his benefactor did for him, even if he might have been properly grateful in presenting his benefactor with a less extravagant gift.

4. Accounts of Gratitude

Clarity on the elements of the grateful response (section 3) is critical for developing an accurate account of what sort of phenomenon gratitude is. This section critically summarizes four prominent accounts of gratitude that have emerged in recent philosophical literature. All of these accounts highlight important features of gratitude and its relationship to other concepts, like the vices of ingratitude or pride, or the negative reactive attitude of resentment. Each account, however, faces difficulties in accounting for all the elements of the grateful response (though many of them do not actually purport to account for all the elements).

4.1 Gratitude as Emotion

Perhaps the most common way gratitude is conceptualized is as an emotion. Emotions, such as fear and sadness, are occurrent complex mental states that arise in response to certain stimuli. They are more than just feelings, in that emotions are intentional, or about something, while feelings (like the feeling of euphoria) need not be; and emotions imply or include beliefs and motivational tendencies, while feelings need not. On the other hand, emotions differ from moods, like anxiety, in that an emotion is usually more short-lived than a mood, which can be longer lasting, and not about anything in particular. Emotions are often thought to involve certain propositional content, and thus to serve the function of representing the world (and, particularly, their stimulus) as being a certain way. To say that gratitude is an emotion, then, is to say that gratitude is a particular complex of beliefs, feelings and motivational tendencies arising in a beneficiary in response to, and targeted at, an act of beneficence from a benefactor. Gratitude as an emotion may involve propositional content (e.g., that benefactor R performed some benevolent act for me), and may represent its target as being a certain way (e.g., benefactor R is benevolent, brave, cares about me).

Conceiving of gratitude as an emotion has a certain plausibility. The concept of emotion provides a familiar framework for integrating many of the cognitive, affective and conative elements of the grateful response under one conceptual roof. Nevertheless, conceptualizing gratitude as an emotion (and nothing more) comes at certain theoretical costs. The first stems from the fact that emotions are episodic: an emotion is not the sort of thing we experience or undergo continuously for years at a time. But though a beneficiary might go years without instantiating or experiencing the emotion of gratitude, he might still all that time be grateful to some benefactor for a genuine act of benevolence performed in the past, insofar as he is properly disposed to believe, feel and act toward her as a grateful beneficiary should. An analogy with the emotion of love is helpful here. It is (often) true that I love my mother in moments when I do not experience any emotion of love regarding her (in moments when my full attention is on some other emotionally salient object, say). This suggests that whatever love is, it must be more than the emotion of love. So too for gratitude.

In the second place, conceiving of gratitude as an emotion might incline us to overlook a certain way in which the grateful beneficiary is sometimes motivated to grateful action. An emotion influences behavior in a particular way—that is, by providing or constituting a certain natural inclination. A grateful beneficiary, however, might sometimes find his natural inclinations to benefit a benefactor overwhelmed by other natural inclinations; and in these cases, a truly grateful beneficiary will be prepared to muster an effort of will to act against the balance of his natural inclinations (see section 3.4.2 above). Most conceptions of emotion, however, do not allow that emotions can motivate in this particular way. Insofar as this preparedness to muster an effort of will is necessary for true gratitude, then, it may be misleading to claim that gratitude is (nothing more than) an emotion. It might be fairer to say that many of the elements of gratitude can be explained by or accounted for in an emotion (what we might call the emotion of gratitude), but there is more to gratitude (the proper response to an act of beneficence from an agent) than can be accounted for in an emotion.

4.2 Gratitude as Reactive Attitude

Gratitude is sometimes described as a reactive attitude—a term originally coined by P.F. Strawson (1974) to characterize certain natural responses we as humans have to the goodwill, ill will or disregard other persons evince for us. Resentment, for instance, is the fitting reactive attitude to a lack of goodwill, or presence of ill will, toward oneself from another person. For Strawson, the reactive attitudes also include vicarious attitudes—reactions to the ill will others evince toward third parties. The vicarious reactive analog to resentment, for instance, would be indignation. Reactive attitudes can be had toward oneself as well, as in the guilt a wrongdoer might feel upon committing a resentment-worthy act of ill will or disregard. What the reactive attitudes have in common, according to Strawson, is that they “rest on” and “reflect” expectations and demands for minimal levels of goodwill we make of others. In this way, the reactive attitudes are expressed in (and perhaps constitutive of) treating other agents as morally responsible. The reactive attitudes thus fundamentally differ from the “objective” attitudes we might take toward inanimate objects, or toward others’ behavior that does not evince any ill will. Such events and behaviors might make us angry or joyful; but only when they reflect a responsible agent’s goodwill or ill will as falling below or rising above a normative expectation is a reactive attitude, like resentment or gratitude, appropriate. To conceptualize gratitude as a Strawsonian reactive attitude, then, is to see it as the proper reaction to another person’s exceeding minimum expectations of goodwill toward oneself—a reaction which is the positive correlate of resentment (Strawson 1974: 6); the second-personal analog of praise and pride; and the participant or reactive analog of the objective attitudes of joy or appreciation.

Conceiving of gratitude within Strawson’s framework of reactive attitudes fruitfully highlights certain distinctions and parallels that are easily overlooked. For example, it nicely highlights the distinction between gratitude proper (a response to the agency of another person) and appreciation or joy (the objective counterpart to the reactive attitude of gratitude), emphasizing that the former is a response to goodwill (see section 1 above). Treating gratitude within the Strawsonian framework also presents several theoretical challenges and pitfalls. For instance, the traditional Strawsonian picture of gratitude may be problematic insofar as it implies that gratitude is an attitude through which we hold others responsible (Bennett 1980: 42; Wallace 1994: 27). Strawson (1974) suggests that gratitude is a reactive attitude, and that the reactive attitudes have an essential connection to the practice of holding others to normative expectations. Resentment, indignation and guilt, for instance, are proper reactions when someone has fallen short of such expectations. Pride, approval and gratitude, on this view, would be the proper reactions to an exceeded expectation (Martin 2014: 120). Gratitude, however, may not always be called for in response to an exceeded expectation, and sometimes gratitude seems called for when no expectation has been exceeded (see section 2). If this is true, then gratitude is fundamentally different from resentment, indignation and guilt, in that gratitude is not conceptually tied to normative expectations. Instead, it may be conceptually tied to another form of interpersonal engagement, like “normative hope” (Martin 2014).

4.3 Gratitude as Relationship Enhancement

Some philosophers have conceptualized gratitude, and the benevolence to which it is a response, in terms of the relationships they enhance. On these accounts, a genuine act of benevolence is thought to signal a desire or intention to start or to deepen a friendship (Swinburne 1989: 65), and gratitude is the reciprocation of this intention, which enhances or advances the relationship. Wellman (1999b: 287), for instance, writes that a beneficiary who has accepted a genuine act of benevolence should “naturally be inclined to take a more active interest both in [the benefactor’s] well-being and in their friendship”, and Blustein (1982: 190) writes that while gratitude does not presuppose a preexisting personal relationship, “it establishes one by some form of reciprocation.” That reciprocation, which he calls gratitude, encourages friendship. Most recently, Scanlon (2008: 151) has advocated a similar “relationship-enhancement” view of gratitude. For Scanlon, gratitude

is not just a positive emotion but also an awareness that one’s relationship with a person has been altered by some action or attitude on that person’s part.

That awareness is reflected in appropriately modified intentions, expectations, and other attitudes on the part of the beneficiary.

Relationship-enhancement views of gratitude underscore the important (perhaps even necessary) role that benevolence and gratitude play in initiating and deepening relationships, like friendships and romantic relationships. Relationship-enhancement views also highlight the important role acts of benevolence and gratitude might play in relationship repair—the process of rebuilding a relationship after wrong or harm has been committed. But while relationship-enhancement views may paint an accurate picture of gratitude between relative strangers, or within growing friendships, they seem to leave little room for gratitude within friendships that are already sufficiently deep and healthy. Between two extremely close friends, most of the elements of a grateful response might already be in place. Each might already believe that the other would sacrifice greatly to help him if he were in need; each might already feel profound goodwill for the other, and might already be willing to sacrifice substantially in order to save the other from harm. When one friend actually performs a genuine act of benevolence for the other, the beneficiary would have no reason to revise his expectations or intentions or affective dispositions vis-à-vis his benefactor in light of that; and yet a great deal of gratitude may be owed. This suggests that gratitude must be something more than a change in these elements.

Another problem faced by certain relationship-enhancement views is the implication that a beneficiary who does not want to develop a friendship with the benefactor is, for that reason, ungrateful. This implication does not seem warranted. It is possible, after all, for a beneficiary to be grateful but uninterested in deepening a bond with his benefactor. Perhaps he finds his benefactor irritating to be around. Perhaps he is too busy to spend time cultivating a new relationship. Perhaps he is simply a loner. All these possibilities seem, intuitively, to be consistent with such a beneficiary avoiding ingratitude; and insofar as they are, gratitude must be something more than the tendency to develop relationships, at least in the sense of friendship or romance.

4.4 Gratitude as Virtue

Several philosophers have argued that gratitude is best construed as a virtue (Meilaender 1984; Wellman 1999b). Virtues are morally positive character traits—stable dispositions to think, feel and act in certain ways under certain circumstances. Construed as a virtue, gratitude would be the stable tendency to respond to acts of benevolence with the beliefs, feelings and behavioral tendencies that characterize the grateful response (see section 3). Conceiving of gratitude as a virtue has some plausibility. Like the concept of emotion, virtue as a concept seems well-suited to integrating the affective and motivational elements of the grateful response. Unlike emotions, though, virtues are dispositions, not episodes, and so can be possessed without being occurrent. Conceiving of gratitude as a virtue thus allows us to attribute gratitude to a beneficiary who may not be experiencing any grateful feelings, beliefs or motivations in a given moment. Moreover, construing gratitude as a virtue captures nicely the moral phenomenology of how we tend to respond to evidence of ingratitude. When we respond critically to a beneficiary’s act of ingratitude or lack of grateful feeling on some particular occasion, we are often criticizing his character rather than some specific action or inaction or decision on his part (Wellman 1999b: 285). Furthermore, gratitude fits nicely into Aristotle’s picture of virtue as a mean between an excess and a deficiency, with gratitude being a mean between the vices of arrogant, prideful or envious ingratitude, on one hand, and the obsequiousness or servility of overgratitude, on the other (see section 3.5).

Conceptualizing gratitude as a virtue, however, has certain theoretical drawbacks. For instance, if gratitude were a virtue, then it should be natural to ascribe it to certain people as a general, global character trait, the way temperance, courage, or appreciativeness might be ascribed to someone. More often than not, however, people are not grateful or ungrateful tout court, but grateful only vis-à-vis certain people, and ungrateful vis-à-vis certain others. A man might be reliably predisposed to form and maintain grateful feelings, beliefs and conations in response to benevolence from strangers, but radically disinclined to form them in response to, say, a sibling or a parent. Does this person possess the virtue of gratitude? The lack of an easy answer, and the commonness of such cases, may speak against conceptualizing gratitude as a virtue (Carr 2013).

5. Gratitude and Obligation

The deontic status of gratitude (whether beneficiaries have moral obligations concerning gratitude) is a topic of continued debate. In this debate, much depends on how “moral obligation” is defined. The term is sometimes used loosely in moral philosophy to refer to anything we morally ought to do or be; but such a loose use of the term misses the heart of the disagreement between philosophers of gratitude. Virtually no philosopher denies that beneficiaries morally ought to be grateful. Philosophers are split, however, on whether gratitude implies obligations in the stricter, more specific way one might have an obligation to keep a promise, or to refrain from lying to another person. To say that something is obligatory in this stricter sense is to say that it is binding. It something that must be done. It admits of little or no latitude, and failing to do it is not just bad or lousy, but prima facie wrong.

Definitions of obligation aside, much also hinges on the precise question being asked. Some philosophers start with what we might call the broad question: whether gratitude itself is an obligation (Camenisch 1981: 10; Blustein 1982; Heyd 1982: 109–111; Meilaender 1984: 156; Swinburne 1989: 65–66; Wellman 1999b: 291). This question, however, is infelicitous. Gratitude is a complex phenomenon (see section 2), consisting of cognitive, affective and conative elements; some of these elements may be obligations, others not—and the broad question is problematic insofar as it rules out this possibility. Another question philosophers sometimes use to begin an inquiry into the deontic status of gratitude is whether gratitude is a source of obligations (Carr 2013). This question too is misleading, since if any of the elements of the grateful response are obligatory, then technically, it would be the benefactor’s φ-ing that would be the source (cause or basis) of the obligations, not the beneficiary’s response itself. Rather than asking whether gratitude is an obligation, or whether it is a source of obligation, a more fruitful question to ask is whether there are obligations of gratitude (and, if so, what they are). This question allows for the possibility that only certain elements of the grateful response may be obligatory, the way promise-keeping is; and it does not obscure the fact that the source or root of such obligations would be a benefactor’s beneficence.

5.1 Arguments For and Against Obligations of Gratitude

It is widely held that the cognitive and affective elements of the grateful response cannot be obligatory. Most philosophers agree that in order for some ψ to qualify as a moral obligation (in the strict sense that there are moral obligations of promise-keeping), ψ must be something over which an agent has direct control; and insofar as agents do not have direct control over their beliefs and feelings, they cannot have obligations to have grateful beliefs and feelings (Berger 1975: 306; Simmons 1979: 166–167; Camenisch 1981: 11; McConnell 1993: 83). Two points are worth noting, however, regarding obligation and grateful feeling and belief. The first is that even if beliefs and affects cannot be obligatory, the absence of such attitudes may still be blameworthy or reprehensible, at least insofar as we can be blamed or held responsible for things beyond our direct control. A second point worth noting is that we may have an obligation to cultivate such attitudes, insofar as trying to bring them about is within our direct control (Dyck 1973: 48; Weiss 1985: 494).

Thanking seems a more plausible candidate for an obligation of gratitude than grateful affects and beliefs. After all, doing or saying the things necessary to express, demonstrate or communicate one’s grateful attitudes appears to be within a beneficiary’s direct control. Against this, it might be argued that beneficiaries cannot have an obligation to thank, since thanking implies sincere expression, demonstration or communication of beliefs and affects, and whether a beneficiary has these attitudes (and thus whether his thanks are sincere) is beyond his control. In response, it might be pointed out that certain “expressions” seem sometimes to be obligatory, regardless of whether they are sincere. For instance, it seems plausible that offenders can be obligated to apologize for wrongs they’ve done, even if they lack apologetic beliefs and affects. It might also be pointed out that if thanking can serve as a commissive (see section 3.3), then thanking might be made sincere simply by forming the intention to develop grateful attitudes, if they are lacking at the time of thanks. Insofar as forming such an intention is within the direct control of the beneficiary, the sincerity of thanks would be under his direct control, and thanking might be a candidate for an obligation of gratitude.

The most plausible candidates for obligations of gratitude are instances grateful behavior (see section 3.4). Ordinary language seems to speak in favor of some of these behaviors being obligatory. The metaphor of debts of gratitude, which a beneficiary pays to a benefactor by returning a favor, dates back centuries, at least in the Anglophone linguistic tradition (Brandt 1964: 386); and philosophers and writers throughout history have condemned acts and omissions of ingratitude as among the most vicious of wrongs. Hume (1738 [2007]: III.I.I), for instance, wrote that “Of all crimes that human creatures are capable of committing, the most horrid and unnatural is ingratitude…” Kant wrote that ingratitude was (along with envy and malice) “the essence of vileness and wickedness” (Kant 1775–1780 [1981]). And Seneca (On Benefits) ranked ingrates below thieves, rapists and adulterers.

Obligation skeptics about gratitude present several arguments against the possibility of obligations of grateful behavior. The first, which we might call the vagueness argument, says that while beneficiaries may have an obligation to return a favor upon a benefactor at some point, the beneficiary has substantial latitude in deciding when and how to bestow his grateful favor (Camenisch 1981: 15–16; Fitzgerald 1998: 138). This latitude is consistent with his having a certain sort of imperfect obligation; but it does not amount to the sort of strict obligation had by the promisor or the debtor, who have little or no latitude in fulfilling their obligation by the agreed-upon time. In response to this, obligationists about gratitude might point out that there are indeed certain acts of gratitude that seem to admit of no latitude—specifically, acceding to a reasonable request from a benefactor in need, or refraining from harming a benefactor in certain ways when opportunities to do so arise (see section 3.4.1).

A second argument against the possibility of obligations of gratitude relies on what is sometimes referred to as the correlativity thesis: if one person owes an obligation to another, then paradigmatically, the person to whom the obligation is owed has a right to the obligation’s fulfillment, and thus has standing to demand or exact fulfillment of the obligation. If Y makes R a promise, for instance, then Y has an obligation to R to keep the promise, and from this it follows that R has a right that the promise be kept. If beneficiaries had obligations of gratitude, the argument goes, these obligations would certainly be owed to their benefactors, and we would expect benefactors to have a right to the fulfillment of such obligations. But no benefactor has a right to gratitude—the standing to demand or exact a return favor. Therefore, there are no obligations of gratitude (Wellman 1999b). Acts or omissions of ingratitude, on this view, are not morally wrong or forbidden, but what Driver (1992) calls suberogatory—bad to do, but not obligation-breaching (Wellman 1999b). In response to this argument, some obligationists about gratitude have suggested modifying the correlativity thesis to allow that directed obligations need not entail standing to enforce or exact, but only standing to hold the obligee responsible in some weaker way—say, with a reactive attitude, like resentment (Darwall 2012).

Two final arguments against obligations of grateful behavior concern the motivation and reasons on which the grateful beneficiary acts. The first begins with the premise that acts of gratitude must be done spontaneously, or from natural inclination, in order to count as acts of gratitude. Moral obligations, however, are supposed to be the sorts of things we can fulfill even if natural inclination is lacking, by exerting an effort of will. For example, I can fulfill an obligation of justice even if I do not act from natural inclination, when I grudgingly repay a steep loan, for instance; and so it seems I can have obligations of justice. By contrast, the possibility of a moral obligation to laugh at a joke seems absurd, in part, because laughter is something that can only be done spontaneously, or from natural inclination (Card 1988). Insofar as acts of gratitude must be done from natural inclination, the argument goes, such acts cannot be done by exerting an effort of will, and thus cannot be morally obligatory (Card 1988; Wellman 1999b). This argument may be vulnerable to the objection that the initial premise (that acts of gratitude must be done from natural inclination to count as such) is false (see section 3.4.2).

A final argument against the possibility of obligations of gratitude runs as follows: whether grateful acts must be done from natural inclination, beneficiaries must act from certain reasons in order for their actions to count as acts of gratitude (see section 3.4.2). But no one has direct control over what reasons he acts from (Ross 2002). Beneficiaries, then, cannot have direct control over whether they act gratefully; and if we can only be obligated to do what is in our direct control, no beneficiary can be obligated to act gratefully. Obligationists about gratitude might object that this argument targets a straw man understanding of obligations of gratitude. Obligations of gratitude, if they exist, are not obligations to ψ-and-ψ-for-the-right-reasons, but simply obligations to ψ—just as promissory obligations are simply obligations to do as promised, not obligations to do-as-promised-and-do-so-for-the-right-reasons. We might criticize a promisor if she does as promised for “wrong” reasons (e.g., reasons of self-interest); but we still believe that such obligations exist, and that one need not act for the right reason to avoid breaching or violating them (though one may thereby fail to respect, fulfill or discharge such obligations) (McConnell 1993; Owens 2012). So too, an obligationist might argue, with gratitude.

5.2 Reluctance to Receive Beneficence

If there are indeed obligations of gratitude, this might be taken to imply the strange conclusion that we should avoid accepting or receiving favors or gifts. The spirit of this conclusion dates back at least to Aristotle, who wrote that the megalopsychos

is the sort of person who does good but is ashamed when he receives it; for doing good is proper to the superior person, and receiving it to the inferior. (Nicomachean Ethics: 1124b1110–1114)

In the modern era, Kant suggested in the Lectures on Ethics that beneficiaries should cringe at receiving favors, since in doing so, a beneficiary becomes the debtor of his benefactor—a shameful position (Kant 1775–1780 [1981]: 118–119). For Kant, owing an obligation of gratitude is especially bad, since duties of gratitude are sacred duties—duties which can never be fully discharged. This is because any attempt on a beneficiary’s part to “pay off” the debt of gratitude will always be done essentially as a reaction to the original act of benevolence. The benefactor alone has the honor of having acted benevolently in a purely proactive way. Insofar as we would want to avoid being in such an eternally imbalanced relationship, we should be wary of accepting gifts and favors.

Kant’s worries about obligations of gratitude in the Lectures on Ethics may be overstated. For one thing, it may well be possible to discharge an obligation of gratitude, if by this we mean get back on equal footing with a benefactor. A beneficiary might one day bestow an act of benevolence for a stranger, only to find out after the fact that the stranger was a benefactor of his from long ago. Here, the beneficiary has benefited his benefactor, and has done it not as any sort of reaction, but with the same sort of original proactive benevolence that motivated the original benefactor’s benevolence in the first place. Furthermore, even if it may be impossible ever to “pay off” an obligation of gratitude, it is usually not especially difficult to avoid violating any such obligations, especially if the original favor was small (Hewitt 1924). A beneficiary need not shape his life around respecting his obligations of gratitude, insofar as living up to those obligations might require only occasional minor return favors on his part. Sacred duties of gratitude, then, need not be as burdensome as Kant originally suggested. And indeed, Kant himself seemed to soften his claims about accepting favors and the psychological effects of being under an obligation of gratitude. In the Doctrine of Virtue, he noted that while it may be natural to feel shamed at being made a beneficiary, this shame is not rationally justified, and results from a misunderstanding of the legitimate sources of one’s moral worth (Smit and Timmons 2011).

A more plausible picture of obligations of gratitude paints them as obligations that we ought not be upset at having. Even if those obligations sometimes land us in situations we find unpleasant, we should not regret the circumstances that brought us to that point. A similar point could be made about parenthood, love, or friendship. In all such relationships, a parent, lover or friend will sometimes find himself tightly constrained by certain obligations and commitments. Such constraints may be in themselves unpleasant; but a good parent, lover or friend will not take that unpleasantness as reason to regret the special relationship they stem from (Owens 2012). By the same token, it might be argued that a good beneficiary will not regret or avoid having been shown benevolence, despite what obligations may arise as a result. Indeed, insofar as we incur moral obligations in accepting or receiving favors, we might even find pleasure or pride in such obligations. Card (1988) argues that in bestowing a favor upon a beneficiary, we should see the benefactor as expressing her faith in the beneficiary as someone worthy of benevolence, and as someone who can be trusted to return a favor in the future. Beneficiaries should see themselves not as debtors, with the constant need to prove to benefactors that they are indeed grateful, but as trustees, who already have the confidence of their depositors. On this “trusteeship paradigm”, obligations of gratitude are obligations we are proud and honored to have been given.

Still, there may be wisdom in the point Kant makes in the Lectures. We may want to be careful who we accept favors from, insofar as there are people whose interests we would not want to have to consider in our future practical deliberations (Camenisch 1981). Furthermore, even a competent trustee open for business will be reluctant to take on too many deposits, lest he find himself having to pay too many back at the same time. That this reluctance may be reasonable finds support in the claim that sometimes, it seems, benefactors may need to ask for permission before doing a favor (Card 1988).

5.3 Gratitude and Political Obligation

One question that hinges on gratitude’s deontological status is the question of whether political obligation—subjects’ obligations to their state—can be derived from subjects’ gratitude to the state. Political obligation is often understood in the specific sense of obligation to obey the laws and decrees of the state. With this understanding in mind, the argument from gratitude for political obligation runs roughly as follows:

  • (1)The state benefits its subjects.
  • (2) Subjects therefore owe obligations of gratitude to the state.
  • (3) Among these is the obligation not to harm the state.
  • (4) Disobeying the state’s decrees and laws harms the state.
  • (5) Therefore, subjects have an obligation to obey the state’s laws and decrees.

This argument has an ancient pedigree (depending on how one interprets Plato [Crito]), and boasts certain theoretical advantages over other derivations of political obligation. It explains, for instance, why subjects have obligations to their own particular state, rather than, say, to any state that is just or legitimate. The argument from gratitude for political obligation has also been the target of many objections.

One set of objections targets the inference from (1) to (2), arguing that even if the state benefits its subjects, it does not do so in a way that calls for gratitude (see section 2). Some might doubt, in the first place, whether a state, as a non-human entity, is capable of intentionally benefiting anyone. In response to this objection, Walker (1988) points out that we sometimes feel gratitude to schools or universities we’ve attended for what we take to have been their goodwill or benevolence toward their students. It might be doubted whether states can be the proper objects of obligations—that is, whether they are capable of having obligations owed to them. As McConnell (1993) notes, though, we seem to be able to owe obligations of repayment to corporations that have lent us money. Furthermore, the fact that institutions seem to be able to owe gratitude to individuals suggests that they should be capable of deserving it from individuals as well (McConnell 1993: 196).

States’ agential capacities aside, it might be doubted whether states have the primary intention of benefiting their subjects, and whether states actually sacrifice in granting the benefits they grant (Simmons 1979: 185–188). In the first place, the fact that states receive taxes from their citizens in exchange for the benefits they confer seems to undermine the claim that beneficence is a state’s primary intention, and that states make sacrifices in order to benefit their subjects. Defenders of the link between (1) and (2) might point out that many states spend more money conferring benefits on their subjects than they take in from taxes. They might also note that many subjects receive great benefits from the state despite paying few or no taxes (Walker 1988: 209). Critics, however, point out that every tax-paying subject—even those who pay minimal taxes—is forced by the state to pay them (Klosko 1989: 354; Wellman 1999a: 73). Someone who forces benefits on me, and forces me to pay a share for them, may thereby undermine his desert of gratitude. Finally, it might be argued that even if the state provides some benefits to its subjects, and provides them intentionally, the state may still lose its claim to gratitude if it subsequently harms those subjects, which many states do, through unjust laws or other types of repression and persecution.

Other critics of the argument from gratitude might concede (2), that subjects owe gratitude to the state, and (3), that this entails a specific obligation not to harm the state, but deny (4), that disobeying the state’s decrees and laws actually harms the state. In the first place, while flouting a state’s laws and decrees might undermine general compliance with those laws, disobeying them secretly or privately need not lead to this consequence. In the second place, publicly disobeying laws and decrees might not harm the state insofar as those laws and decrees are unjust. Public acts of civil disobedience against unjust laws might actually improve the state, insofar as they hasten the abolition of those laws, and those laws are detrimental to the state.

In light of these objections, several philosophers have fallen back on a version of the argument from gratitude with a weaker and more limited conclusion. Considerations of gratitude, they argue, might ground the claim that some subjects have some obligations of gratitude to the state. McConnell (1993) suggests that only those who have been benefited by the state, and not subsequently treated unfairly by it, might owe the state obligations of gratitude. As for the specific obligations these subjects owe to the state, they may not include the obligation to obey laws and decrees; but they may include certain other obligations of wider latitude, e.g., to aid one’s own country in various ways, participate in civic organizations, vote, or volunteer for a year of national service (McConnell 1993: 207). Ingratitude to the state may also justify special punishment for treason, or for acts aimed squarely at the destruction of the state. Insofar as the state claims the right to compel every subject’s obedience to the laws, though, obligations of gratitude would only be part of the justification for political obligation generally (Klosko 1989: 358).

The argument from gratitude for political obligation, even in its weaker form, might have important ramifications for questions of political obligation and political authority more generally. For instance, if some subjects have obligations of gratitude to the state, and obligations of gratitude cannot be exacted or demanded, then the question of political obligation (what obligations a subject owes to the state) and the question of political authority (what the state has a right to demand of its subjects) do not have coextensive answers (McConnell 1993: 208).


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