Thomas Hill Green
Thomas Hill Green (1836–1882), political philosopher and radical, temperance reformer, and the leading member of the British Idealist movement. His principal writings are: ‘Essay on Christian Dogma’ (CD), ‘The Conversion of Paul’ (CP), ‘Different Senses of “Freedom” as Applied to Will and the Moral Progress of Man’ (DSF), ‘Faith’ (F), ‘Lecture on Liberal Legislation and Freedom of Contract’ (LF), ‘Incarnation’ (I), ‘Immortality’ (IM), ‘Justification by Faith’ (JF), ‘Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation’ (LPPO), ‘Metaphysic of Ethics, Moral Psychology, Sociology or the Science of Sittlichkeit’ (ME), Prolegomena to Ethics (PE), ‘Witness of God’ (WG), and ‘Word is Nigh Thee’ (WNT). The full references are given in the Bibliography.
- 1. Life
- 2. Religious Thought
- 3. The Eternal Consciousness
- 4. The Theory of the Will
- 5. Social Theory and Conscientious Agency
- 6. The Principles of State Action
- 7. Theory of Rights
- 8. The Principles of Green's Political Economy
- 9. General Assessment
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Thomas Hill Green was born on April 7, 1836 in Birkin, a tiny village in the West Riding of Yorkshire, where his father was rector. Together with his sisters and three brothers, Thomas was brought up by a nanny following the death of his mother when he was only a year old. He attended Rugby School between 1850 and 1855, having received his earliest education from his father. Green was a lazy student, and gained few academic or sporting distinctions. His fellow students, including Henry Sidgwick, thought him serious, a character trait which showed itself in his piety and earnest endorsement of philosophical idealism (see Sidgwick's recollection of Green, in Tyler ed 2008, pp.5–17). In later life, Sidgwick and Green were forthright in published criticisms of each other's work. Sidgwick sought to clarify his own reaction in the recollection that he sent to Charlotte Green following Green's death:
I ought not to omit to say that in those later years I more than once had occasion to enter into public controversy with him in reviews and articles: and — as I afterwards learnt — my controversial manner gave offence to some of his enthusiastic disciples. But he himself never manifested the least sense of offence by any written and spoken word: or ever changed in the least degree for a moment the frank cordality of his intercourse. I was really in the wrong, this was magnanimous: in any case, I feel it to be worthy of him and characteristic. (Tyler ed 2008, 16–17)
Green, for his part, was reported to have confided to his close friend and later brother-in-law that “I can never think of him but as the chubby pot-bellied little Rugby boy” (Symonds, 1968–69, vol. 2, p.774).
Green went up to Balliol College, Oxford in 1855 where he came under the influence of Benjamin Jowett. Jowett had been one of the first to bring a set of Hegel's writings to England, and it was through him that, probably towards the end of his undergraduate years, Green became enraptured by idealism. It will become clear that Green's mature philosophical system has many affinities with the thought of Fichte. Yet, we do not know which idealists were having the greatest influences on Green at this time. Nettleship records that Green read Fichte as a young man: “The writers from whom he seems at this time to have assimilated the most were Wordsworth, Carlyle, Maurice, and probably Fichte in his lectures on the ‘nature’ and ‘vocation’ of ‘the scholar’ and of ‘man’” (Nettleship, p.xxv). (Nettleship records that Green read more Fichte towards the end of his life, yet implies that Green did not study him in depth at that time; see Nettleship, pp.cxxv-cxxvi.) These influences helped Green to escape the baleful influence of the British empiricist tradition of George Berkeley, John Locke, David Hume and John Stuart Mill. He found particularly in Hegelianism a justification for his instinctive egalitarianism, and became firm friends with other students who were sympathetic to his political radicalism, such as AV Dicey, John Nichol, and Edward Caird. Soon Green was a leading member of the Old Mortality Club, a radical university society founded by Nichol. Green's failure to apply himself brought him a second class in Classical Moderations in 1857, after which time he buckled down and earned a first in Literae Humaniores in 1859 followed by a respectable third in law and modern history six months later. He was made a college fellow towards the end of 1860, having lectured in ancient and modern history earlier in that year. His search for a career direction led him to act as an assistant commissioner with the Schools Inquiry Commission in 1865 and 1866, after which time he returned to academic life at Balliol. His first significant article appeared in 1866. ‘The Philosophy of Aristotle’ marked the beginning of a number of Hegelian contributions to many philosophical issues, in such works as the ‘Essay on Christian Dogma’ and ‘Popular Philosophy in Its Relation to Life’ (both of which were later published in the third volume of his Works). Green took charge of Balliol Hall where reasonably priced accommodation was provided for poor and mature students. His personal influence spread throughout the college at this time and he taught many undergraduates who later achieved fame, including Bernard Bosanquet, F. H. Bradley, R. L. Nettleship and Henry Scott Holland. In 1871, he married Charlotte Byron Symonds, sister of his close friend John Addington Symonds. His famous ‘Introductions to Hume's Treatise of Human Nature’ appeared in 1874. In 1866 he has been appointed to a Balliol tutorship and in 1878 he was made Whyte's Professor of Moral Philosophy.
Green had been involved in local politics for many years, through the University (not least in the campaign to gain access for women to degree-awarding programmes), temperance societies and the local Oxford Liberal association. During the passage of the Second Reform Act, he campaigned for the franchise to be extended to all men living in boroughs (all sane urban adult males not currently serving a jail term). In this sense, Green's position was more radical than that of most other Advanced Liberals, including W.E. Gladstone and even John Bright (nevertheless, one of Green's heroes). He was also more radical on this issue than John Stuart Mill (then Member of Parliament for Westminster) in that Green did not advocate a property qaulification for the vote. (Green lagged behind Mill on the question of votes for women though.) (See Tyler, 2006, chapter 3).)
It was in the context of his Liberal party activities that in 1881 Green gave what became one of his most famous statements of his liberal philosophy, the ‘Lecture on Liberal Legislation and Freedom of Contract.’ At this time he was also lecturing on religion, epistemology, ethics, and political philosophy. Then, at the height of his intellectual powers and academic career, Green died from blood poisoning on March 15, 1882. Most of his major works were published posthumously, including his lay sermons on Faith and The Witness of God, the essay ‘On the Different Senses of “Freedom” as Applied to Will and the Moral Progress of Man’, Prolegomena to Ethics, Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation, and the ‘Lecture on Liberal Legislation and Freedom of Contract’. In addition to Green's friends from his academic life, approximately two thousand local people attended his funeral.
Developments in geology and evolutionary theory, as well as the impact of Higher Criticism, led many mid-nineteenth century Christians to question the doctrinal authority of the Church of England, and the moral views and allegiances which it was purported to justify. Green's pupil, Henry Scott Holland wrote of this crisis of faith and the effects of Green's religious thought upon it.
[Many people came to believe that] Scientific Analysis held the key to the universe. Under this intellectual dominion we had lost all touch with the Ideals of life in Community. There was a dryness in the Oxford air, and there was singularly little inspiration to be felt abroad. We were frightened; we saw everything passing into the tyranny of rational abstract mechanism … Then at last, the walls began to break. A world of novel influences began to open to us. Philosophically the change in Oxford thought and temper came about mainly through the influence of T. H. Green. He broke for us the sway of individualistic Sensationalism. He released us from the fear of agnostic mechanism. He gave us back the language of self-sacrifice, and taught us how we belonged to one another in the one life of high idealism. We took life from him at its spiritual value. (quoted in Carpenter, 1959, p. 483)
Even though Scott Holland and many others such as W. T. Davison saw him as a potential saviour of England's religious life, Green was too open to the unorthodox religious theories of such as Hegel, Strauss, Baur, and Lotze, to accept the dogma of the Church of England. In fact his own religious beliefs were so unorthodox that many people questioned the propriety of calling him a Christian at all. One of the main factors which antagonised believers was the depth of Green's immanentism (Lidgett, 1897, pp. 325–348). Hence, Green's friend, Mrs. Humphry Ward had to defend his position against sustained attacks from William Gladstone who objected that “in proposing a substitute for [Christianity], reached by reduction and negation, I think (forgive me) you are dreaming the most visionary of all human dreams” (quoted in Ward, p.xvi). Nettleship identified the key point: “To the question which is sure to be asked by those who hear or read of Green, Was he a christian? the answer must depend on what ‘to be a christian’ means” (Nettleship, p.c).
One can begin to understand Green's mature religious thought via an examination of his analysis of the history of Christian dogma. In his very important Essay on Christian Dogma, Green characterised the formulation of the creeds as an attempt to arrive at an authoritative expression of those doctrines by which all Christians — irrespective of time and place — should judge the varying interpretations of their faith (CD 162). Yet Green objected that in reality the creeds were not eternal truths, but devices employed by humans to solve particular, historically contingent problems. More specifically the creeds arose out of the need to convey the essence of Christ's teaching once the life of Jesus passed from living memory. No matter how pure the motives of their authors, the creeds actually did more to legitimate the teachings of subsequent religious leaders than they did to convey the timeless message of Jesus (CD 162–3).
Hence, the tradition of the Christian church, [-] though, according to the original theory expressed by Tertullian, it had its source in oral communications of Christ to his apostles, and was the necessary complement, [-] soon came, by an insensible instinct of self-preservation, to affiliate itself to them, and to refashion the parent after the supposititious child's likeness. (CD 163)
The formalisation of Jesus' teaching transformed Christianity from a fluid, developing, personal faith into a static theology authorised by an ecclesiastical elite. Originally, Christianity had been “penetrated to its object, as was then said, by revelation, as we should say, by intuition, without the intervention of any system of ideas” (CD 164). It had excluded theology — “a connected system of ideas, each qualified by the other, each serving as a middle term by which the rest are held together” (CD 164). Yet the maintenance of the unity of a theological system necessitated the dogmatic entrenchment of definite and authoritative interpretations of Jesus' words. Such a shift altered fundamentally the Christian's understanding of his relationships to other believers, to the church, and to God. For example, Green observed in his lay sermon on Faith that “[t]he death and resurrection of Christ … became past events by which certain blessings had been obtained for us, or divine testimony given to an authority claiming our obedience” (F 257). In this way the creation of a theology caused Christians to tend to look to church doctrine for spiritual guidance, rather than looking to the inner voice of conscience. This helped transform Christianity into a faith whose adherents saw themselves as constrained to conceptualise their spirituality within a static framework of authorised concepts and beliefs. This ensured that God could only ever be conceived as external to the individual's highest being, meaning that Christian truth could be held only in word and not in power. It is for this reason that Green believed that “[d]ogmatic theology is quite other than the Christian life” (WG 238). He developed this line by arguing that the transformation of the individual's spiritual intuition into the dogma of the (human) church is akin to idolatry (F 257–60). In following church dogma, the individual turns to the worship of a hypostatised representation of God, rather than to his actual, dynamic presence in the world.
The contrast between sight and faith is a crucial facet of Green's religious thought. Whereas “sight” denotes the acceptance of the divinity of Christ and the existence of God as a result of physical evidence, “faith” can be characterised as belief in Christ and God without the need for earthly signs: “the true or highest faith [is] represented as that which by a purely spiritual act takes Christ, as the manifestation of God, into the soul without waiting for conviction by sensible signs” (F 253). Those who look for miraculous signs of God's presence before they will believe can only ever conceive of them as “mere wonders, not a medium for the spirit that quickeneth” (F 255). Green regarded miracles as unintelligible in the orthodox sense given to the idea of a miracle (CP 189). His position is essentially the same as St. Paul's. Whereas John writes of miracles strengthening the belief of those who already possess faith, Paul argues that miracles are the creation of faith, rather than its cause or support. Indeed, “If we knew God as we know anything else, if his nature had been revealed to us by miraculous evidence of a kind with that which convinces us of matters of fact, then would faith be no more faith” (F 268). Paul's vision on the road to Damascus, for example, was only significant as a revelation to his inward consciousness, and not to his senses (CD 165–7). Or again, “The resurrection of Christ is to [the believer] not evidence of a revelation, but the thing revealed” (F 256). The same holds true for knowledge of God's word. Studying the Scriptures does not add totally new elements to the individual's spiritual knowledge so much as it brings to his consciousness that which had been present to him inchoately (CD 161).
Nevertheless, reason remains an essential element in human salvation even though faith “is a primary formative principle” (F 263). Thus, Green argues that “this rational self-consciousness … is an element of identity between us and a perfect being, who is in full realisation what we only are in principle and possibility” (F 267–8). When properly exercised reason brings the individual to a more developed and compelling understanding of the spiritualised world. Furthermore, it brings the believer to a clearer recognition of his own true nature. Consequently, the individual becomes more aware of his reliance on God for his knowledge and existence, and his love for God grows as a result. When concerned with moral objects, reason speaks to man in the form of conscience. God's law is only truly found within conscience — that is, within the conscience of every human being. Conscience is the presence of God within man and thereby in the world: “we may say that we are reason of his reason and spirit of his spirit” (WNT 221). Indeed, as the voice of the divine in man, the individual should use conscience to question church orthodoxy.
This brings us to one of the most controversial elements of Green's religious thought: his christology. Green rejected the orthodox Christian belief that, in Nettleship's words, Jesus “was born and died under conditions [which are] impossible to other human beings” (Nettleship, p.c). Hence he attacked the Nicene council for seeking to repress the idea that Jesus was born a normal human being. By denying this aspect of the Scriptures, “[t]he orthodox representative of the Nicene council … is no longer conscious of a kingdom of God within him. … Jesus of Nazareth was not divine from his birth, but had attained to that moral perfection in which by God's pleasure the attributes of the Son and the worship due to the Son had been transferred to him” (CD 173, 174). In an important sense then, Jesus became Christ because of the temporal circumstances in which he was born and raised: “the Christian life, in its primary [i.e. earliest] exhibition, was perhaps only possible under the peculiar circumstances of Galilee during the Roman dominion” (CD 184).
Hence, the central message of the Scriptures is that everyone has the potential to become Christ through the possession of faith and the guidance of conscience as the voice of reason. The hope brought by Jesus is explicable only when one appreciates that he was essentially human in the same way that we all are. Jesus realised the highest human potential: salvation through conscientious action. It is only now that we can appreciate this truth, for,
though the religious imagination may require, as historically it did require (whether it does [now] is not so certain), (a) a belief in the manifestation of God under the ordinary conditions of a human life as its starting-point, it equally requires that this belief should pass into (b) a belief in a person now spiritually present to and in us. (I 217)
Jesus continues to bring hope to us all precisely because he attained salvation without standing in a unique relation to the indwelling spirit of God (WNT). Judaism fails to offer hope in the same way that Christianity does because the Jew believes God's will to be expressed as an externally sanctioned commandment. The difference between the immanent and ‘external’ conceptions of God becomes particularly significant over time. The despair felt by the non-Christian becomes increasingly acute as obedience to the law brings him closer to God. It gives him a more immediate and intense sense of his true nature, and consequently, of the implications of his imperfect condition (WG 236). For the Jew, the believer's relationship with God is a confused and frightening one. Firstly, having an awareness of God's law, he sees what he should not do. Secondly, the Jew sees the divine law as being imposed by another being who yet does not give the necessary “strength to obey in those to whom it is presented” (JF 203). Moreover, the Jew faces the mystery of why following the law allows him to become divine with God (CP 187–8). The true Christian, on the other hand, has no such difficulty as he recognises that God is eternally with him. Man's divinity is always present to the true Christian as his own potential. Like Paul, he is reborn within and by his new consciousness of his inward, essential human relationship to God. For him, the paradox disappears.
Green explores this need to internalise God in the Justification by Faith. Man can only attain salvation when he intuitively acts in accordance with God's will, rather than following it as a commandment given by another. Thus, Green writes that in Christ “[all] live in freedom, as having the mind of God for an inward principle, not an outward restraint” (JF 196). This intuition of Christ is the necessary awareness of the rebirth of the believer in Christ — “the spiritual act by which the individual appropriates, is ‘clothed upon by,’ the being of the Son of God, who is the new man” (CD 166). This is the true meaning of salvation (CD 170).
The true Christian consults his conscience in order to discover how best to honour and know God as an indwelling spirit (CP 188). Nevertheless, the human predicament is that man's ability to satisfy his innate drive to make explicit the spiritual aspect of his existence — which is the moral goal of his being — is constantly hindered by the physicality of human life. As Green puts it, “the conditions of human existence in this world are such that [the truly divine life] can never be completely attained” (I 216). This deficiency has a number of manifestations. First, in relation to our epistemic self, man possesses an “infirmity of [his] … discursive understanding” (CP 145). Thus, although he comes to recognise new facts and new relations between facts, from studying the world, inevitably the individual “loses” (or forgets) others. Consequently, “we never reach the totality of apprehension through which alone we could know the world as it is and God in it” (CP 145). Second, every individual is concerned to gain some level of temporal good while still feeling the need for spiritual fulfilment. Consequently, everyone feels torn between gaining earthly pleasure and living as an embodiment of God in the temporal world. The former, the life of the flesh, arises from “the animal element in man, sense and appetite” (I 207). Yet his “senses and appetites” are transformed by this self-awareness, thereby enabling him to live the life of the spirit. In being self-aware in this sense, the individual necessarily becomes self-referential, both in terms of looking to one's own interests at the expense of other people who are more deserving, and in seeking earthly glory (WG 233).
In the New Testament ‘flesh’ generally means sense and appetite as these are for man, i.e. false intellectual interpretations of sensation, and sensual pleasure selfishly sought; in other words, delusion and vice. From this again it comes to mean human nature as subject to delusion and vice, human ignorance and selfishness. (I 207)
The essence of salvation is found in the life of “the spirit.” True salvation is only found in the rejection of the need for earthly recognition of one's temporal power and even one's spiritual purity on the one hand, and the realisation that one must look to one's own relationship with God as the only thing of ultimate value on the other. This is the true meaning of Christ's message that one must die in order to live. Indeed, Green's lack of concern with the existence or otherwise of a life after one's physical death is itself revealing (IM).
Even though the search for earthly glory is a result of sinful pride, Green does not believe that the true Christian should withdraw from society. In fact there are many reasons why he should do quite the reverse (WNT 223). The most significant of these arises from the fact that faith “works from within [itself] outwards … [Faith is] revealed in one man, awakening an answer from the same spirit, hitherto silent, in another” (F 255). Thus, the spirit of the Lord communicates with itself to bring faith into the world, through communication between believers. This represents “the communication of God to himself”, as Green puts it in The Witness of God (WG 241).
[The individual should look to] the authority of what he is apt to call his conscience, the authority of his own moral nature. Of this, however incompletely it may be actualised in himself, he in a sense feels the possibilities, unless selfish interests have closed the avenues of his heart, through sympathy with the higher life of society about him. It is an ultimate fact of which the true interpretation is all-important. (WNT 223)
In short, the true believer should test for himself his own beliefs against the beliefs of the fellow members of his spiritual community. It is in this fraternal clash of consciences that God's word becomes clearer in the mind of men. Green's characterisation of this Christian community is transformed into the social theory outlined below.
It should be clear by now that Nettleship was correct to ask in what sense Green was a Christian. Green rejects the authority of the creeds and questions the usefulness of miracles, he humanises the notion of immortality and radically reinterprets the core article of orthodox faith: the unique divinity of Jesus Christ. Yet, there is one area of Green's religious thought that has not been touched on in any real depth yet: his conception of God, or in his terms “the eternal consciousness.” This is one of the most important and controversial aspects of both his religious thought and his philosophical system. Indeed we shall see in the next section that this notion marks the transition from religion to philosophy.
Over the years, scholars have disagreed significantly about the relation of Green's religious thought to his wider philosophical position. Some of the obscurity has resulted from the lack of a sustained discussion of the relation of substantive religious issues to substantive philosophical ones (as opposed to the more abstract methodological discussions about the relations between these two modes of experience). Fortunately, this lacunae has been addressed to some degree by the recent publication of a series of Green's lecture notes from the late 1860s and early 1870s. (It appears under the title of “Metaphysic of Ethic, Moral Psychology and Sociology or the Science of Sittlichkeit” (ME).) Together, these lectures constitute an early version of Green's greatest philosophical work, Prolegomena to Ethics (1883). In these earlier lectures, Green develops a theory of the creation of ethical subjects and objects, before turning to issues of motivation and responsibility, freedom, duty, the moral development of the will, the deficiencies of the leading eighteenth century British ethical theories, and finally the universality of the moral law. Throughout his lectures of individual will and Sittlichkeit, Green returns to the question of the relation of God to the moral world. To this extent, he anticipates his mature writings, where he often equates the actualisation of ‘the eternal consciousness’ with both the unfolding of the individual's will, and the actualisation of the Christian God in the world. Turning now to this mature position, typically, he refers to the eternal consciousness as “the law of nature or the will of God or its ‘idea’” (DSF 17), or “freedom in the conscious union with God, or harmony with the true law of one's being … freedom in devotion to self-imposed duties” (DSF 17). He argues that what changes when one moves between these different phrases are “the words, but not the meaning” (DSF 17). The unfolding of the eternal consciousness is the increasing manifestation of God in the world. That is, the growing unity of men's will and reason with the will and reason of God. Green argues in his lay sermon on Faith that although that ultimate reality of God never changes, society is “always keeping before man in various guises, according to the degree of his development, an (unrealised) ideal of a best which is his God, and giving divine authority to the customs and laws by which some likeness of this ideal is wrought into the actuality of life” (F 269–70). In this sense, “The notions of God, of duty of an ideal life have been constantly shifting. They have developed” (F 271). Thus, through his society the individual tends to reach an increasingly clear and sophisticated recognition of what is ultimately true and good (PE 319). The imperatives of divine reason are communicated to the individual through the assimilation and reformulation of the accumulated social wisdom by individual conscience (PE 318) (see the previous section). In this way, God's earthly presence increases.
The thrust of Green's immanentism was clearly heretical in his day, and this heresy underlies many of his arguments regarding the nature and dynamics of the eternal consciousness. It appears that God has no existence that is both complete in itself and independent of the individual (except as the abstract idea of an unrealised potential). Hence, Green argues that “the true lesson which [the Bible] teaches is that God is not to be sought in nature, nor in any beginning or end of nature, but in man himself” (F 265). “God's fulfilment of himself”(F 265) is then the growing explicitness of the eternal consciousness in the life of man — a growth which is self-generating. Thus, Green argues that for God to truly exist He must be actualised in this world. To the extent that individuals fail to be conscious of His nature and fail to act on that consciousness in their own lives, God does not properly exist. Hence not only is man dependent upon God, but God is dependent on man (F 271–2). This implies that in worshipping God, the individual is of necessity worshipping the best parts of himself (in their potential, developing and realised forms).
He is not merely a Being who has made us, in the sense that we exist as an object of the divine consciousness in the same way in which we must suppose the system of nature so to exist; with whom we are in principle one; with whom the human spirit is identical, in the sense that He is all which the human spirit is capable of becoming. (PE 187)
The spark of the eternal consciousness in every individual (that aspect of the individual which is God) drives its manifestation in the individual's consciousness and praxis. Remembering Hegel's contention that “what is rational is actual, what is actual is rational,” this manifestation represents an increasing rationalisation and actualisation of God and the individual. As Olive Anderson puts it, “Green's constant aim was the separation of the spiritual and the supernatural … God must be sought in each person's soul, and would be found through the life of Christian love” (Anderson, 1991, 685).
It is beyond reasonable dispute that Green honestly felt his own religious writings to contain a more accurate statement of the true Christian message than that found in the various theological systems of orthodox forms of Christianity. Yet the thrust of his argument is sufficiently radical to make one question whether or not he retained a serious belief in the existence of the omniscient, omnipotent supreme being such as stands at the heart of these more traditional forms. Even so, many commentators have claimed that the depth and sophistication of Green's religious faith prevents his philosophy from being available to atheists. There are good reasons for rejecting this claim. Green makes clear that although religious inspiration can uncover certain truths about the nature of the individual, as well as the latter's ethics and relationships to other persons (all aspects of Green's mature philosophical system), a radical distinction remains between the analysis of religious intuition on the one hand and the justification of philosophical truths on the other.
Christian dogma, then, must be retained in its completeness, but it must be transformed into a philosophy. Its first characteristic, as an intuition become abstract, must vanish, that it may be assimilated by reason as an idea. The progress of thought in general consists in its struggle to work itself free from the mere individuality and outwardness of the object of intuition. The thing as sensible, i.e., as presented in an individual moment in time and space, must become the thing as known. … To the modern philosopher … Christ is the necessary determination of the eternal subject, the objectification by this subject of himself in the world of nature and humanity. … If the idea of the philosopher is the truth, it may be said the intuition of the philosopher must be delusion. On examination, however, it will be found that there is a sense in which the idea is at once the complement of the intuition and its justification. (CD 182–3)
Not only does the philosopher operate according to different criteria of meaning and truth than the religious believer, but the philosopher's analysis and critique has precedence over religious intuition, in the sense that ultimately specific religious intuitions have validity only if they can be restated in philosophical terms and then justified on purely philosophical grounds. This claim informs Green's own exposition and defence of the eternal consciousness in the first book of his major philosophical work, Prolegomena to Ethics (1883). Often this book is taken as setting out an epistemological or metaphysical theory. Yet it is better read as a transcendental deduction of the nature of consciousness (cf. ‘Kant’, e.g. 9–27, 70–84). Read in this way, the first book of the Prolegomena can avoid the endlessly disputed question of the ontological status of the objects that appear to play a necessary role in the origination of sense data in the human mind. This explains why even though Green stated explicitly that it is ridiculous to doubt the existence of a mind-independent world, he did not waste time attempting to prove or analyse the nature of its existence. The latter task was irrelevant to his proof of the existence of the eternal consciousness. Nevertheless we should not go the extreme of holding that Green thought of the eternal consciousness as a mere presupposition of thought, a postulate to complete our world-view and make it internally consistent (Dimova Cookson, 2002, chapter 1). In reality Green did not bracket off the question of the ontological status of the eternal consciousness. His religious thought and his conception of its relationship to the philosophy strongly suggests that he believed the eternal consciousness did exist within every human being, whether or not its existence was recognised and irrespective of the apparent logic of the particular individual's particular life-world.
So, how does Green justify his philosophical claim that every human being is to some degree a partial manifestation of the eternal consciousness? He begins from the assertion that the mind of the individual experiences sensations. This particular mind examines, categorises and then groups these sensations in accordance with the qualities which it perceives them to share with its other perceived sensations. It conceives of these sensations within a framework of other categories and relations such as time and space. In this way the individual mind understands these sensations to demonstrate the presence of a particular object in a particular temporal and spatial location. This object is in Green's sense a creation of the perceiving mind (irrespective of whether or not the initial sensations were caused by, say, a mind-independent lump of matter). Following his great mentor Immanuel Kant, Green notes that the most basic categories employed by the perceiver cannot be derived from experience because they are the preconditions of there being any experiences at all. The basic laws underlying the ways in which these basic categories can be related cannot be derived from experience for precisely the same reason. Complex categories and relations on the other hand — such as ‘gothic arch’ — are constructed by the mind from these basic categories and laws of relation. In short again like Kant, Green believes that the individual attempts to discover “an objective world, … [by which] is meant a world of ascertainable laws, as distinguished from a world of unknowable ‘things-in-themselves’” (PE 38). Green calls this world ‘nature’.
Notice that from Green's perspective every relation must be mental because he is concerned only with the logical structure of the individual's ability to categorise and relate sensations that are perceived by his own mind and to draw implications from these perceptions. He goes on to argue that individuals feel a natural drive to understand their perceived world as being underlain by a system of categories and relations that is complete and internally harmonious. He calls this system ‘the eternal consciousness’. It is ‘eternal’ in the rather unusual sense that it is the precondition of temporal experiences, and it is a consciousness in the sense that it concerns only mental entities. This is Green's reason for holding it to be an “irrefragable truth involved in the [Kantian] proposition that ‘the understanding makes nature’” that,
a single active self-conscious principle, by whatever name it is called, is necessary to constitute such a[n objective] world, as the condition under which alone phenomena, i.e. appearances to consciousness, can be related to each other in a single universe. (PE 38)
Even more strongly, Green argues a little later that, “[a]part from the unifying principle the manifold world would be nothing at all” (PE 75).
Possession of a partially explicit spark of the eternal consciousness is a prerequisite for the acquisition of any knowledge. Green theorises the progressive element of experience (involving the construction of complex mental objects) claiming that as more sensations are experienced the individual comes to recognise that the system of categories and relations ‘comprehended’ by the eternal consciousness (‘nature’) is a unified entity. The telos of every human is to know this system, yet this realisation can only be achieved through the progressive development of humanity as a species of intelligent, self-conscious beings. The individual needs other persons to provide a basis — an inheritance of knowledge — from which to build as well as to provide a social setting in which there can be a rational division of labour and fruitful exchange of ideas when the scope of knowledge becomes significantly complex. The need for others to help us to foster the development of the eternal consciousness within each of us as individuals is one consequence of the fact that as individuals we are “a certain reproduction of itself on the part of the eternal self-conscious subject of the world — a reproduction of itself to which it makes the processes of animal life organic, and which is qualified and limited by the nature of the nature of those processes” (PE 99). Another consequence is that the concrete beliefs which we hold will depend to a large degree on the experiences we have and the bodies of knowledge into which we are born. Nevertheless, the eternal consciousness is always the ultimate critical principle that tests the adequacy of these concrete beliefs. Interpreted in this way, the eternal consciousness is a heuristic ideal which must be posited by every individual rational being who holds itself to be able to possess knowledge (rather than merely having beliefs). Its existence is, in this sense, a logical presupposition of our respective individual convictions that individually we can know things. Green holds that every rational being is driven to give content to this ideal. This has two striking consequences. Firstly, the eternal consciousness a construction of individual consciousnesses. As Green writes in section 149 of the Prolegomena to Ethics: “we only find unity in the world because we have an idea that it is there, an idea which we direct our powers to realise.” Secondly, this means the justification of the existence of the eternal consciousness relies logically on positing the presupposition the existence of individual consciousnesses. Consequently, it is logically incoherent to deny the existence of discrete individual consciousnesses while affirming the existence of an eternal consciousness. In other words, our individual consciousnesses are not mere adjuncts of a single eternal consciousness. (This interpretation is defended at length in Tyler, 2010, especially chapter 4).
Green extends the world of the eternal consciousness to encompass the world of values as well as the world of facts. One must examine his theory of the will to understand how he achieves this.
This section examines the ways in which the eternal consciousness develops through the minds of individuals and the institutions of society. It begins by examining Green's conceptions of freedom, the will and reason. It then sketches his theory of man's essential reliance on society, and the latter's possibilities for interpreting social forms at a higher level. The interlinking of social norms and laws, individual freedom, and morality is a recurring theme of this discussion.
what is it exactly that we mean by [the] self or man? … We mean by it a certain reproduction of itself on the part of the subject of the world. (PE 99)
To understand Green's position on morality, one must first understand his analysis of the human will, for in many ways the most fundamental question is “what makes the will free?” This question can restated by asking, “what is the difference between the good and bad will?”, because Green sees the truly free will as being by definition the truly good will (PE 154).
Green argues that desires are emotional impulses felt by the individual and recognised by him as forming an indispensable part of his being. In desiring, one is necessarily acknowledging one's own existence as a person, as one is necessarily self-conscious. Usually, individuals will desire many objects at the same time. Often, holding them simultaneously is impossible, and so one is forced to decide which object to actively attempt to possess; that is, one will have to choose which object to will to possess. In this way, choice represents the adoption of a motive by the self as the determination of action — that is, as the will (PE 103). For example, I may desire to own a book and a statue. However, as I can afford one but not both (and buying them is the only way to gain either), I must choose between them. In choosing, say, the statue, it then becomes my will to possess the statue — it is no longer merely a desire. My motivation is one on its own — whereas my desire can be one of many. In willing, firstly one must desire (and by desiring acknowledge one's existence). Secondly, one must make the object part of oneself because, in the act of willing, one necessarily makes the chosen object impossible to understand without reference to one's act of choice. In Green's terminology, the nature of the object is in part created by the individual's will to possess it. As he writes, such objects are “objects which only the intercourse of self-conscious agents can bring into existence” (PE 126). For this reason, my relationship to (and hence the nature of) the object is transformed by my choice of it; it is transformed by my act of willing, because obtaining the willed object is then the source of my self-satisfaction (PE 154).
To understand what Green means here, one must bear in mind that he is talking not in metaphysical, but in epistemic terms. This argument echoes his claim that nature's ‘creation’ is an epistemic process, not a metaphysical one. Green uses terms such as ‘creation’, ‘nature’ and ‘reality’ in very different ways to their common usages. Hence, ‘the world’ and ‘nature’ are the ‘creation’ of the human mind. They exist only in the consciousness of the individual perceiver. This contention becomes relatively uncontroversial when the way in which Green uses his terms is understood. In this instance he is arguing that one cannot know what the chosen object is without recognising that possession of it is willed by a person.
Green argues that a man's will must always be free in at least one sense: “since in all willing a man is his own object to himself, the object by which the act is determined, the will is always free … [that is] willing constitutes freedom” (DSF 1). Self-satisfaction is always free and is always the object of the will. There are several things to notice here. Firstly, in willing something, the individual must deliberate. When willing, the individual is “seeking to realise an idea of his own good which he is conscious of presenting to himself” (PE 106). Action which occurs without deliberation — unthinking action — is not an act of will and hence is not free. Secondly, Green argues that the “motive” for the determination of the will is part of the will itself. For this reason, it is wrong to ask whether a man is “being himself” when he is willing a particular course of action; for example, taking drugs for the first time. Thus, “in being determined by a strongest motive, in the only sense in which he is really so determined, the man … is determined by himself — by an object of his own making” (DSF 11).
This argument can be extended. For Green, desires are not something external to and acting on the individual — they are part of his very essence. For example, Green warns against talking “of Desire moving us to act in such or such a way, misleading us, or overcoming us, conflicting with Reason, &c. — then ‘Desire’ is a logical abstraction which we are mistaking for reality” (PE 129). By “Desire” (as opposed to “desires”) here, Green means “the man's self, as conscious of itself and consciously seeking in the satisfaction of desires the satisfaction of itself” (PE 129). Desire is then unified in the self by its relation to intellect which ensures that no object of understanding would be what it is without the presence of Desire, and vice versa (PE: 130). In that these elements of the self are unified, the will is always in a sense free.
Yet, Green also claims that, “[t]he question as to the freedom of the will we take to be a question as to the origin of [one's] … strongest motive” (PE 97). Bearing in mind that Green has already said that “willing constitutes freedom”, this statement seems prblematic. He appears to be arguing that to will is to be free at the same time as arguing that the will is not always free. In other words, Green seems to be arguing simultaneously that the will must be and may not be free. However, the important point to grasp here is that up until this point Green's statements had been concerned only with one sense of the term “freedom”. That the will originates in the strongest motive (self-satisfaction), and that this in turn originates in the person's “circumstances and character” has radical implications (PE 98). Examining the inability of one's character to determine the individual's will sufficiently for an action to be ‘truly’ free helps to explain why “circumstances” (as Green uses the term) are so important to the exercise of a completely free will. Circumstances and character determine acts of will by giving the individual his specific motivations and by giving his motivations their relative strengths.
By “circumstances”, Green does not mean merely the immediate situation in which the individual makes his particular decision, together with its antecedent causes. He means in addition “the state of [the individual's] health, the outward manner of his life (including his family arrangements and the mode in which he maintains himself and his family), and the standard of social expectations on the part of those whom he recognises as his equals” (PE 98). The individual's self-satisfaction is determined by his circumstances. Thus, circumstances are necessarily formative of his particular free will. At the same time, human reason shapes these circumstances so as to foster the increasingly explicit embodiment of the external consciousness in the world. It may seem strange that Green is arguing that the individual's will (which is, by definition, free) is determined at least in part by things which appear to be external to him. However, the influence of circumstances is an essential part of man. Without influences such as his family structure and social expectations (and hence customs and society's values), the individual would have to create his own character from pure thought, which he cannot do. This claim needs to be examined in greater depth.
By “character”, Green means the eternal consciousness' at least partial “reproduction of itself” (PE 99) within a particular person. (The complex question of deciding in more detail what the eternal consciousness is is discussed later.) By virtue of this reproduction, the individual is, and recognises himself as being, a moral agent — as an agent who is able to act deliberately in ways that are either praiseworthy or blameworthy. Willing involves choice, and so Green argues reason is central to freedom, for it is by employing one's rationality that an agent makes choices. Green holds that “by reason, in the practical sense, [is meant] the capacity on the part of [the individual] to conceive of a better state of [himself] as an end to be attained by action” (PE 177). Reason and will are then connected in such a way as to allow the individual to seek to attain an “ideal”, understood as a state of affairs which the individual prefers to his present situation. For example, reason allows me to conceive of my present state as being improved by developing my painting talents. More than this however, Green holds that man's reason is in an underdeveloped state to the extent that it fails to recognise man's absolute goal as the attainment of that set of circumstances and character which accords with the ultimate harmony of the world; that which obtains when the eternal consciousness is fully explicit in the world. Moreover, the individual's will is only truly free when reason draws man to chose that state which is absolutely preferable in this way. This means that when the eternal consciousness is not fully explicit in the world, reason and will do not necessarily recognise the same end as good. In other words, when the eternal consciousness is merely becoming, “[this] self-realising principle, … in the form which it takes as will[,] at best only tends to reconciliation with itself in the form which it takes as reason” (DSF 21). What does this rather obscure proposition actually mean?
The unimpeded action of the eternal consciousness via the individual's free exercise of reason is a prerequisite for the action of his absolutely free will. The degree to which the eternal consciousness is merely implicit in the individual's actions determines the degree to which the individual is capable of exercising free will. In other words, a human's will is not free if the objects willed are counter to “the law of his being” (DSF 1). He is free to the extent that he wills his embodiment of the eternal consciousness.
In more specific terms, that which is ultimately (and hence truly) sought by the moral agent is the full realisation of his “moral capabilities” (PE 172). This is his “permanent good” (DSF 5). Unfortunately, as these moral capabilities are at present only partially realised, man cannot fully understand what they are. They can only be known “in negative” even at the civilised individual's current stage of development (PE 172). By this, Green means that even though one cannot know which state is absolutely the best for man, in practice, one will usually be able to recognise which of two options is better.
Yet, while reason remains underdeveloped, human judgement remains imperfect. One result of this is that the eternal consciousness itself can be the source of both virtue and vice (PE 176). It is the source of vice when it pushes the individual to be self-seeking in a counter-productive way, such as when he wills the attainment of “pleasure-in-itself” as their ultimate end. Importantly, Green argues that as reason develops, the individual will come to recognise that there is an associated growth of “institutions and habits which tend to make the welfare of all the welfare of each” (PE 172). In this way, the development of reason in the world makes the role and importance of “circumstances” in the determination of the individual's will more obvious. The individual's capacities need to be given content so that they can be realised, thereby making him truly satisfied and complete as a person.
This process of self-realisation occurs only for and within individuals. Yet, it is not driven consciously by individuals. In other words initially at least it is not the result of their own conscious choice. The individual develops by sublimating desires and instincts that initially he merely feels as emanations from his unconscious (Tyler 2010, chapter 5).
It is helpful to summarise the argument to this point. The distinguishing characteristic of the truly free will is found in the object towards which it is directed (PE 155). That object which is “best” will be “the end in which the effort of a moral agent can really find rest” (PE 171). It is in attaining this object (strictly, “state”) that the individual gains the greatest self-satisfaction. In this sense the attainment of this object is what the individual truly wills (PE 172). For this reason, self-satisfaction should not be confused with satisfying one's strongest desire. Indeed, once the individual has reached a certain stage of development, the strongest desire cannot be followed if it is counter to a man's character — “his strength of character overcomes the strength of desire” (PE 105). The motive (which determines the will) is not a desire in this case; the former is the habitual determination for that which the individual regards as his permanent good. The latter, when destructive, “is incompatible with [the individual's] steady direction of himself towards certain objects in which he habitually seeks satisfaction” (PE 105). Consequently, it is incompatible with his true freedom, even though at one level it may be part of the individual's will.
Green holds that the individual's application of moral rules is itself a form of moral education. In many ways, therefore, each new experience tends to push men forward, which entails in turn an at least partial development of social institutions. This development shapes the ways in which the individual experiences the world. Thus, in the case of law the individual should find himself faced by an external expression of his true will. By following such a law, one is following one's own will, for the abstract nature of law reflects, firstly, the abstract idea of man as a “self-conscious and self-realising subject” whose wayward tendencies (desires which do not push him to realise his telos) must be restrained to enable the will's “attainment of its own perfection” (DSF 21). When following the law then, the individual acknowledges his ability to become that which he is not at present. Secondly, law helps to form the individual in the sense of reinforcing his values, views and the actions of the eternal consciousness as it exists in his world at the time. In this way, the individual is increasingly brought into line with “the law of his being” (DSF 22).
This is the ideal. In reality, the currently existing laws (and the underlying social institutions, values and so on) are imperfect in that their presuppositions contradict the logical structure of the eternal consciousness. Recognition of these imperfections awakens an innate drive in the individual to correct them. In fact actualising the idea of perfection found in reason increasingly becomes the source of self-satisfaction contained in the individual's will (DSF 23).
However, Green argues that without recognition of a common good underlying your relations with your fellow citizens, there could not be “intelligent co-operating subjects of law and custom” (PE 203). Only where such a common good is present will a society hold together without the use of coercion (PE 202). There are two connected elements here. Firstly, the individual's reason allows him to conceive of a good towards which he should work as a person. Secondly, Green holds that a stable society can only rest on institutions which are based on a conception of a common good. As Aristotle writes that “it is a characteristic of man that he alone has any sense of good or evil, of just and unjust, and the like, and the association of living beings who have this sense makes a family and a state” (Politics, 1253a15–18). In fact the development of a person's practical morality requires him to recognise through his exercise of reason that he should pursue certain ends because they serve the common good of his society. The individual comes to realise that no purely private object he wills and attains can ever make him truly happy. It becomes more obvious to him as he lives and wills that only attaining what is good for all will bring him complete satisfaction. This very significant contention needs to be explained.
Green argues that it is important to recognise that the individual's ultimate good is only fully actualised following the movement of his society through the “lesser” ends embedded in different earlier imperfect societies. These various ends serve to determine the goals of the individual members of the various societies. However, the ultimate goal of individuals as human beings is to become totally rational, that is to perfectly embody the eternal consciousness. Crucially, this realisation requires the individual to possess a sense of self-worth, and recognise and understand what is of ultimate value within their society. In this way, the individual should come to possess “an idea of an absolute good, common to him with [all other members of society] — an idea indefinable indeed in imagination, but gradually defining itself in act” (PE 202). This good exists in a sense independently of any particular impulse and is founded on the absolute nature of man. As Kant expresses part of the idea Green now reiterates, individuals come to recognise a “much more worthy purpose of existence [than private pleasure] … to which … as a supreme condition the private purposes of man must for the most part be subordinated” (G 64). For Green, this object will be sought because “its desirableness … is a fulfilment of the capacities of which a man is conscious in being conscious of himself” (PE 193). Thus, the good act will be performed because it brings the individual to a greater awareness of himself and his nature, and hence to a greater awareness of what it is that best serves his most permanent interests as an embodiment of the eternal consciousness. That object is truly good, therefore, which is internal to the individual, and which the individual seeks as a fully self-conscious person. Green contends that this good is pursued because it affirms man to himself as a rational, self-satisfiable human being (PE 279).
What is the nature of such a “good for all”? Unfortunately, no one can truly answer this question until the good life has been fully actualised. Until then, the life aimed at the perfection of one's personality must be sought. Hence, Nicholson argues that “Green … centres his moral philosophy not on a system of all-encompassing substantive principles from which one can deduce the acts which ought to be done, but on a type of character in moral agents” (Nicholson, 1990, p.78). This type of character is based on conscience in its truest sense that is, conscientious judgement which has not been perverted by short-sighted self-interest (PE 293). It is in this move that the individual's liberty becomes an essential element of moral progress.
The type of character that Green wishes to promote is based on the individual's rational but personal evaluation of moral situations, social norms and laws. The agent must question his motives — self-reflection is essential for a pure conscience. Such a conscience requires the moral agent to pursue that course of action which he truly believes will most fully promote the embodiment of the eternal consciousness in human life. Such self-examination should be rooted in a real desire to act virtuously, not in self-seeking self-deception (PE 297).
Conscience operates by studying existing social conventions, and abstracting that which is permanent in them from that which is contingent and transient. But how does one recognise what is permanent and what is not? Green argues that usually this can be done accurately by the individual to the extent that he embodies the eternal consciousness. The eternal consciousness shows men what are necessary parts of the moral ideal (PE 279). The degree to which the eternal consciousness is already explicit in the mind of the conscientious citizen determines the degree to which he is able to recognise the true permanency or transitoriness of specific customs and institutions. Moreover it determines the extent to which the ideal can be approached from its present basis given a limited life span. (By this logic, therefore, the closer one is to the ideal the faster one moves towards it.)
But is man's understanding of the eternal consciousness so vague that Green's theory is useless as a practical guide to individuals? Nicholson notes commentators' frequent accusations of vagueness, but argues such accusations are often based on misunderstandings of Green's thought (Nicholson, 1990, pp.71–80). This is something I wish to examine now.
The true reformer seeks to actualise that state of affairs which he honestly feels to be an improvement on the current state of the world. He acts from a personal motive, which is a natural outgrowth of his possession of the eternal consciousness. As Green writes “he feels a personal responsibility for realising … [that which] is part and parcel of the practical idea itself, of the form of consciousness which we so describe” (PE 299). Thus, in most cases the truly contentious man knows instinctively which rules and practices to follow in society and which to seek to change, because of the partially developed eternal consciousness within himself (PE 308). Just as the initial progress of man requires the spark of the eternal consciousness, so the good man's actions grow out of the self-realising principle embodied in his nature (his character) and his social background (his circumstances).
The accusation may be made that this merely gives each individual license to act as they happen to prefer at the time. Yet, Green need not be drawn to this conclusion. As has been said, the eternal consciousness is alive in everyone as a voice of guidance (although muffled to varying degrees depending on the individual). Also, it is present although imperfectly in the social institutions which make up society. The fact that the individual may resist the conclusions of his moral sense, and so may follow his short-sighted “self-serving” egoism is an important point, but it is not an objection to Green's theory unless it is also an objection to nearly every other ethical theory as well. Indeed, Green argues that as humanity progresses individuals will naturally come to truly follow their consciences more easily (PE 328).
Nevertheless, the criticism of vagueness may persist. The argument that the eternal consciousness is imperfect in everyone, but more developed in some, has important consequences for such criticisms. Firstly, there will be some people who are able to “in a certain sense … [transcend] ‘the law of opinion’ of social expectation, … [but they] only [do] so by interpreting it according to its higher spirit” (PE 301). It is in this way that new duties come to be recognised in the world and man progresses (PE 301). These individuals are saints and reformers. Yet, depending on the past effects of the eternal consciousness on the mind of the individual, different interpretations of this higher spirit will be made by each particular reformer: “It speaks with different voices” (PE 301). However, every interpretation when made by a contentious individual tends to uncover aspects of the underlying rationality of these “social opinions”. Here Green echoes Mill's contention that, “[i]n proportion to the development of his individuality, each person becomes more valuable to himself, and is therefore capable of being more valuable to others” (Mill, 1972 131).
Secondly, when living “their” good life most people will merely follow the accepted social norms, feeling unable to find fault with or improve upon them. The reformer and the saint are the exceptions in society. Hence, Green writes that “[i]n fulfilling the duties which would be recognised as belonging to his station in life by any one who considered the matter dispassionately … we can seldom go wrong and when we have done this fully, there will seldom be much more that we can do” (PE 313). On the rare occasions that the individual suffers a “perplexity of conscience”, the difficulties can be traced either to differing conceptions of the man's telos, or differing ideas of the best means of actualising the individual's socially endorsed telos (PE 314).
Yet, it is still the case that people frequently expect too much. To reiterate, “Moral philosophy as [Green] conceives it can take one only so far: it cannot resolve every moral issue and practical dilemma” (Nicholson, 1990, p.79). As the eternal consciousness is variously manifested in people, philosophy can provide no general rules for guidance except that one should examine one's motives carefully in each particular instance. The ultimate goal must be the actualisation of one's conception of the moral end of man (PE 316). The individual's rules of conduct are then in a sense present within himself.
It is in this way that for Green, “[t]here is no such thing as a conflict of duties” (PE 324). Given more than one possible course of action, the problem is in deciding which course of action it is truly one's duty to follow, and this problem is often one of choosing between inconsistent “injunctions given by external authorities” (PE 324). In a sense, the philosopher's task is to allow the individual to decide which “authority” is false and therefore external, and which is good and therefore internal, in that it best serves the unfolding of the eternal consciousness (PE 325). The philosopher performs this function by making the individual aware of the ends served by the norms, customs, institutions and laws of his society (PE 326), and by helping him recognise that, “[r]ules are made for man, not man for rules” (PE 316). Nevertheless, the philosopher must not merely attempt to knock down existing institutions and replace them with “an improvised [purely personal] conscience” which sets up the individual as the only practical source of law (PE 326). We should not forget that the individual must have a society if he is to have a conscience at all (PE 327). “No individual can make a conscience for himself. He always needs a society to make it for him” (PE 321). Thus, in many ways, the philosopher's task is to promote understanding and rational harmony in society by allowing individuals to come to their own recognition of the rationality which is inherent in themselves and their society (PE 327/8). They should encourage personal liberty, rather than personal license.
Yet there remains a fundamental tension between individual freedom and the necessity for political structures which must be faced by any philosophical doctrine. It is to Green's statement of this problem and his proposed solution to it that we should turn now.
Green holds that the state should foster and protect the social, political and economic environments in which individuals will have the best chance of acting according to their consciences. Notice that in principle Green is not concerned to allow all actions, no matter what their origin. He himself was a temperance reform for example, and stated time and again that the state could legitimately curtail the individual's freedom to accept the slavery of alcoholism (LFC). Yet, the state must be careful when deciding which liberties to curtail and in which ways to curtail them. Over-enthusiastic or clumsy state intervention could easily close down opportunities for conscientious action thereby stiffling the moral development of the individual. The state should intervene only where there was a clear, proven and strong tendency of a liberty to enslave the individual. Even when such a hazard had been identified, Green tended to favour action by the affected community itself rather than national state action itself — local councils and municipal authorities tended to produce measures that were more imaginative and better suited to the daily reality of a social problem. Hence he favoured the ‘local option’ where local people decided on the issuing of liquor licences in their area, through their town councils (see Nicholson, 1985).
Green stressed the need for specific solutions to be tailored to fit specific problems. This is not to say that all problems would be dealt with most effectively at the local or municipal levels. The national state was the only political institution powerful enough to wage war internationally for example. Moreover it was the institution most likely to be able to resist vested interests such as those found in the manufacturing sector, meaning that it was the national government that should pass regulations on terms and conditions at work say, or on the sale and control of land. Yet, Green stressed that there are no eternal solutions, no timeless division of responsibilities. The distribution of responsibilities should be guided by the imperative to enable as many individuals as possible to exercise their conscientious wills in particular contingent circumstances, as only in this way was it possible to foster individual self-realisation in the long-run. Hence deciding on the distribution of responsibilities was more a matter for practical politics than for ethical or political philosophy. Experience may show that the local and municipal levels are unable to control the harmful influences of, say, the brewery industry. When it did show this, the national state should take responsibility for this area of public policy.
Green held that the ultimate power to decide on the allocation of such tasks should rest with the national state (in Britain, embodied in Parliament). The national state itself is legitimate for Green to the extent that it upholds a system of rights and obligations that is most likely to foster individual self-realisation. Yet, the most appropriate structure of this system is determined neither by purely political calculation nor by philosophical speculation. As we shall see, it is more accurate to say that it arose from the underlying conceptual and normative structure of one's particular society.
If the individual is to follow his conscience, then he must be free from external interference. He needs “fences” to protect his freedom of thought, action, and so on. In Western societies these fences are rights, and one of the most important parts of Green's political philosophy is his theory of rights. The sense of “rights” with which Green is fundamentally concerned in his Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation can be understood as Kant understood “ein Recht”; that is, “[to have] a title … to coerce others through [one's] mere will to do or omit something that is otherwise indifferent to freedom” (Kant, quoted in Mulholland, 1990, 5). More specifically, Green argues that,
A right is a power of which the exercise by the individual or by some body of men is recognised by a society either as itself directly essential to a common good or as conferred by an authority of which the maintenance is recognised as so essential (LPPO 103).
Green is primarily concerned with what I shall call for the moment “moral rights”: that is, those rights which are justified and recognised on ethical and not purely legal grounds. Moral rights exist prior to the law. We shall see that even though moral rights are conceptually distinct from legal rights, they should still find expression in law in order to make them effective regulators of human action. Therefore, the role of the state is to uphold the rights which originate in society as part of the unfolding of the eternal consciousness.
Green attacks the view that there are moral rights which people possess merely as individuals: that is, moral rights which they possess without reference to their existence as members of a society founded on a common purpose. In this sense, moral rights are necessarily social. The idea that men could possess (“natural”) rights in a “state of nature” is ridiculous for Green (LPPO 9). Particular rights are only “natural” in the sense that they are “necessary to the end which it is the vocation of human society to realise” (LPPO 9). Hence, “A law is not good because it enforces ‘natural rights’, but because it contributes to the realisation of a certain end. We only discover what rights are natural by considering what powers must be secured to a man in order to the attainment of this end” (LPPO 20). Yet, rights only truly exist when they are the basis of “the control of the conduct of men according to certain regular principles by a society recognising common interests” (LPPO 103). Before the slave comes to see his life as part of a goal-determined, rationally-ordered co-operative scheme, he has no true rights then. His rights are “in suspense” (LPPO 103). Having said this, there does remain a sense in which certain rights have always existed where there was any society, even though it may take many generations for these rights to be recognised by and granted to anyone — “just as one may hold reason to be eternal, and yet hold that it takes time for this or that being to become rational” (LPPO 103). What does this mean?
A shared conception of a collective end — a common good — is the basis of society's existence, and is also the basis of the individual's existence as a moral agent (LPPO 114). Hence, achieving the moral end of man is dependant on the recognition of one's self as a purposeful agent who can only progress within a society of other purposeful moral agents. This echoes the Kantian idea that a fundamental element of rights is adherence to the categorical imperative. A violation of my rights is “an infringement upon my freedom that can co-exist with the freedom of everyone in accordance with a universal law” (Kant, 1991, p.5). Rights represent means of bringing about the correct regulation of human interaction by giving formal expression to this fundamental human equality. Thus, rights only extend as far as individuals recognise the rights of others. The possession of a right hence marks an individual out as a person who is worthy of respect (because he is a developing entity), and who also respects the “personhood” of his fellows (LPPO 140). Green extends this argument to claim that, by virtue of his possession of rights within a particular society, the individual has the right to non-interference from all members of all societies (to the extent that he recognises their rights to non-interference). He extends it in this manner because he holds that all individuals should respect the moral agency of anyone who is recognised as a moral agent by anyone else. Such actual recognition implies and requires the possibility of recognition by everyone. As Green writes, “[m]embership of any community is so far in principle membership of all communities as to constitute a right to be treated as a freeman by all other men, to be exempt from subjection to force except for prevention of force” (LPPO 140).
From this, Green adopts the Hegelian line that a slave has a right to his freedom in that he is engaged in social relations founded on the movement to attain a common good. The slave's partial recognition of equality within society comes from the influence of the “signs and effects of this system [of social interrelations] all about him” (LPPO 114) which acquaint him with certain abstract concepts, and which place him in certain relationships to other members of that society. He goes some way to conceiving of the abstract possibility of an agent's life based on the pursuit of a common good in society. He then comes to recognise himself and his fellow slaves (and possibly his masters) as potentially or actually sharing a common purpose in their lives. This necessarily creates the slave's right to equal freedom with all other persons. The slave's rights become real when they are embodied in social institutions; that is, when they are actualised in formalised social relations (LPPO 114). The slave-owner's right to the free use of his possession — that is, the slave — is, thus, nullified as it rests on the non-recognition of the slave's right to freedom (LPPO 146).
Moral rights should be used to criticize legal rights. For a start, “[n]o one would seriously maintain that the system of rights and obligations, as it is enforced by law, … is all that it ought to be” (LPPO 9). For this reason “actual states at best fulfil but partially their ideal function” (LPPO 143). In fact Green argues that the individual has a duty to resist the law when his conscience tells him that the law fails to foster the development of his fellow citizens. Green enters one qualification to this. The state may, on balance, serve the eternal consciousness more than it hinders it. It should only be resisted where the effect on the state would not be so severe as to seriously undermine the social development which it generally supports (LPPO 104).
Green argues that where there are severe conflicts between groups which were subject to the same political sovereign — such as in the former Yugoslavia — no true rights exist. That is, in times of total social disharmony there are no true rights for there is no true control of society. In these cases, one should decide which of the possible courses of action is better or worse by referring to attaining the ideal of developing the eternal consciousness (LPPO 104).
One may question Green's consistency here. He appears to be arguing, firstly, that societies are defined by the possession of a common end; and, secondly, that conflicts between social groups can lead to the break-up of society. However, he has defined these social groups as collections of individuals united by a common purpose — at worst, their particular — but, in Green's eyes, temporary — self-advancement. Thus, they are, from Green's perspective, still societies. In a sense, what has happened is that the original society has been destroyed and the former members have formed into other smaller societies which are then in conflict. As they are still in societies, their members possess rights which no one should violate. All that Green can consistently argue is that the political unit — such as the nation-state — has broken down without being replaced by another political unit (but by social groupings). However, rights are dependant not on the existence of any political unit, but on the existence of social units.
So far, Green has only been concerned with rights as they existed in Europe in the late nineteenth century (LPPO 5). However, the gradual unfolding of the eternal consciousness is evidenced in the historical movement from family-, to tribe-, and then to state-centred ethics. Green does not make it clear how significant this movement (in its “rights-aspect”) actually is (PE 206-217). That is what I want to do now.
Families and tribes begin to interact with one another giving rise to more complex forms of social interconnections (PE 207). Social instability increases as social realities increasingly come into conflict with established moral values. Eventually, rights arise which are not based on the primacy of these earlier, less developed social institutions, but on the idea of persons as discrete and potentially rational individuals. Green believes that in this way the world tends to become more rational and more harmonious. This rational harmony must be based on the correct treatment of all humans as equals, which in turn is founded on the correct understanding of the individual as a self-determining agent (PE 208).
There are several elements to such an understanding. First, each moral agent should be recognised as an end in himself (PE 199). Kant articulates this fundamental idea as follows, “Act in such a way that you always treat humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, never simply as a means, but always at the same time as an end” (Kant, 1964, p.96 Prussian Academy), Kant's italics). In willing his own good then, the individual should recognise himself as a human being and therefore an end-in-himself. Yet on grounds of consistency he should also recognise all other humans as ends-in-themselves (PE 195). In this way it should be recognised that all of humanity is owed duties by virtue of its inherent rationality, irrespective of its members' particular gender, “race, religion or status” (PE 207). The understanding of who is one's “neighbour” gradually comes to be widened, and gradually “the exclusive dependence of moral claims on relations of family, status or citizenship disappears” (PE 208). Also, the widening of the practical conception of a “neighbour” gives an extra spur to the explicit development of the eternal consciousness in that it leads to the extension to everyone of the same right to freedom. Thus, “[f]aculties which social repression and separation prevent from development, take new life from the enlarged co-operation which recognition of equal claims in all men brings with it” (PE 208). Thus, the process is self-promoting. The inherent logic of treating people as equals is the increasing recognition of the moral centrality of the species as a whole, rather than one of its sub-groups.
This last move gives some content to the end which should be promoted, even if only by excluding some options for moral action. Thus, the interests which must be fulfilled are not, for example, the maximisation of pleasure, because this would mean that some end other than the inherent nature of man is being served (PE 194). Also, real interests and self-satisfaction cannot be found in “animal impulses” as such, because these impulses are not founded of necessity on respect for the person as an end in itself (PE 200). It is only by helping individuals to actualise their telos that one truly shows them respect, and thus, truly treats them as ends-in-themselves. Consequently, as individuals come to be recognised as ends-in-themselves, larger groups such as the family and tribes tend to be seen as less worthy of respect in themselves. Ultimately, “it is human society as a whole that we must look upon as the organism in which the capacities of the human soul are unfolded” (PE 273).
Now, this process of history is evidenced in the widening of the moral community which must necessarily accompany the growing recognition that it is ultimately the spark of humanity which requires respect — not national or class allegiance. As Kant puts it, the “perfect political constitution” is perfect precisely because its existence is essential to the realisation of “all [of the] natural capacities of mankind” (Kant, 1991a, p.50). For this reason, the individual comes to recognise more people as his moral equals by virtue of their sharing his (implicit and ultimate) conception of the common good. Green does not make totally clear how radical this line of argument actually is; indeed, he may not have recognised it himself.
The form of the modern state and its laws is dependant on the stage of development reached by the society from which it springs. The state makes explicit in legal terms then, the moral views and relations which are already present within society. (The laws may lag behind the social mores, but they are still ultimately brought closer to the full embodiment of the eternal consciousness by these values.) As history progresses, rights and all other expressions of the current stage of social development tend to become universalised — that is, extended to more and more groups. Hence, slavery is abolished and women come to gain the same rights as men. This also extends to members of other nation-states. A nation is defined by its members' possession of the perception of a common telos, and the basis of attaining rights becomes the perceived potential for attaining this common telos. Hence, rights tend to be universalised (importantly, across nations) as the telos of each nation converges. Nations merge and nationhood declines as a motivating force of human action.
The thrust of Green's argument is that it is historically inevitable that the nation-state will disappear as a form of political organisation, as the eternal consciousness becomes more explicit in the world. The ultimate reference is “universal Christian citizenship” (PE 206). This is a human's truly rational community, whose common goal is to live in full accord with the eternal consciousness. It will be a community of free individuals, each possessing the same rights, the same duties, and the same allegiances.
This section has examined Green's claim that rights are necessarily social. It has been shown that moral rights only exist where they are recognised as contributing to the common good; that is, where they are seen to push society to attain its telos. Legal rights may or may not embody moral rights, but the ideal is the empowering of all and only moral rights through law. An essential part of rights is their rational coherence — that is, they must conform to Kant's categorical imperative. The second part of this section examined the effect of this argument when combined with the growing explicitness of the eternal consciousness in the world. The Kantian respect for persons, thus, spreads from families to tribes, and, finally, to individuals as members of the human species. Implicit in this, it has been argued, is the supercession of the nation-state.
Green writes that “[a]ppropriation is an expression of … [the individual's] consciousness of a possible self-satisfaction as an object to be attained” (LPPO 213). The individual is thus conscious of himself as a “permanent subject” to be served by his own use of material things (LPPO 214). In this way, man comes to recognise nature as a pool of raw materials and resources which he can use to express his own personality, development, and moral value (LPPO 223). So, by labouring on an object, the individual gains a greater sense of his own potentials, thereby becoming more likely to develop them and so to become a more complete being. This means many things in practice. It is inextricably linked to Green's understanding of the will. Green writes:
[t]he rationale of property, in short, requires that everyone who will conform to the positive condition of possessing it, viz. labour, and the negative condition, viz. respect for it as possessed by others, should, so far as social arrangements can make him so, be a possessor of property himself — and of such property as will at least enable him to develop a sense of responsibility, as distinct from mere property in the immediate necessaries of life. (LPPO 221)
This passage sets out Green's reasons for believing that private property is morally important in his society. Negatively, one cannot rationally claim a right for one's self on the strength of one's ability to freely determine the course of one's own life while denying the same right to anyone else who also possesses these qualities. This is an application of Kant's categorical imperative in exactly the same way that Kant and Hegel applied in their respective theories of property. The positive condition initially seems to echo the Lockeian argument that the individual's right to hold private property is established through the exercise of his labour. However, for Locke, the mixing of one's labour with an object is understood in far more physical terms than either Green or Hegel understand it. For them, the fundamental point is that deliberately forming an object is a process of externalising one's will.
In part, Green is concerned to show that property is an expression of one's being and worth. In appropriating something, one is able to say “this shall be mine to do as I like with, to satisfy my wants and express my emotions as they arise” (LPPO 213). Owning private property is a sign of the individual's power to will and be self-creating. The individual becomes aware that the object he owns and controls is present because of his labour and talents. This labour and these talents are, in turn, understood as the outward expression of his own will and capacities — in a sense, his power — and, hence, worth. This recognition enables the individual to conceive of future wants and desires which it is possible for him to satisfy, thereby representing a development of his will and reason. From this stage, the individual can conceive of himself as a being possessing self-satisfiable desires and needs as a generic category — that is, in abstraction from any particular need. It is in this sense that the individual becomes increasingly conscious of himself as a being that is at least potentially self-actualising and so self-fulfilling.
However, the development of the will necessarily entails the growing tendency to recognise “an idea of an absolute good, common to [the individual] … with [all other members of society]” (PE 202). It is with this mind that one can understand Green's assertion that holding private property tends to develop a man's “a sense of responsibility” (LPPO 221). In part Green is arguing that through holding property privately, humans increasingly come to recognise the value of Kant's maxim that people should never be treated “simply as a means, but always at the same time as an end” (Kant, 1964, p.96, Prussian Academy).
Yet, Green argues that the way to reach this stage of rational respect and personal development will vary between individuals. Partially for this reason, property should be held privately. Communal ownership of resources necessarily inhibits individual choice and imposes certain allocations and uses, whilst restraining others (LPPO 218). Private property relations allow the individual to choose which things to labour on and with, and hence how to develop. As Green notes, “[t]his appropriation must vary in its effects according to talent and opportunity, and from that variation again result differences in the form which personality takes in different men” (PE 191). Here, firstly Green advocates a system of property based on distribution according to the use of one's “talents and opportunity”, in line with the above argument. Secondly, he adopts Hegel's argument that different distributions of material goods to specific individuals tend to make explicit different personalities in these individuals. This is different from but does not contradict what was argued previously. Green is now also saying that property is important to human development in a non-neutral way. For example, an artist as an artist requires access to certain resources that a farmer as a farmer would find useless. Hence, if individuals wish to control their own development according to their will, they need to control the distribution of resources through a system of private property relations.
It is important to remember Green's argument that the truly moral life must be self-imposed. A person who is forced to live in a certain way, for example, by communal property relations and communal rights of appropriation, cannot live a truly morally life. This is because without the experience of choosing bad ways to live, the individual cannot value or know what better living is (LPPO 219). This is the case even if the outward appearance is perfection, because even then the way of life has not been internalised, it has not been freely chosen (PE 219).
Yet, in many ways the most significant benefit of a system of private property relations is the self-discipline it produces in the individual (LFC 194–196). If the individual does not learn to act in such a way that he can achieve his long-term goals, then he will be unable to develop the strength of character needed to overcome the short-sighted desires which he experiences but which if followed would prevent him from gaining true self-satisfaction (LFC 200).
Notice that Green is not concerned merely with private ownership, but with ownership resulting from the individual's own free labour. Hence, Green writes of the individual taking part in “a process in which each, while working freely or for himself, i.e., as determined by a conception of his own good, at the same time contributes to the social good” (LPPO 223). The state should not freely distribute goods to people who are capable of working for it themselves. The state should only distribute goods in this way when the individual cannot gain the resources for himself, for example, because he is disabled. Striving to attain private property is instrumentally valuable.
The consequences of this freedom include the creation of different levels of resource-holdings between individuals. That is, the resulting society is not egalitarian (LPPO 223). However, an unequal distribution of resources is morally defensible in Green's eyes, because it is in this way that the different talents possessed by different people are actualised to the greatest possible extent (LPPO 220). Hence, both rich and poor are best served in this way. Green recognises the naivety of supporting extreme inequality of wealth on the grounds that the system which has allowed it is essential for the poor's moral development (LPPO 221). His point is that these inequalities are necessary to raise everyone's standard of living to a level sufficient for moral development.
Why does Green believe this? It could be argued that the capitalist market necessarily operates in such a way that some people inevitably suffer such extreme poverty that their lives will be meaningless. This is an argument that Green acknowledges and tries to explore (LPPO 220–232). He recognises that there are many people who, while being formally able to appropriate, have no real power to do so. They are left with no way of “providing means for a free moral life, of developing and giving reality or expression to a good will, an interest in social well-being” (LPPO 228). Hence, Green refers to the growth “of an impoverished and reckless proletariate” (LPPO 227). The workers are “too badly reared and fed to be efficient labourers” (LPPO 220). For this reason, they cannot command a wage in the market which is sufficient to empower their formal ability to appropriate. They will not bother to save as they are so cynical about their prospects for self-advancement and breed so quickly that they merely perpetuate these evils (LPPO 228). Furthermore their poverty forces them to accept a state of near-slavery — enduring bad working conditions, hours and housing which causes which cause ill-health and even death. They are thereby forced to seek comfort in alcohol and shallow past-times, and to neglect their own education and that of their children (LFC 201–204). In short, there is “a lowering of the moral forces of society” (LFC 201). This situation is particularly important in that “[l]eft to itself, or to the operation of casual benevolence, a degraded population perpetuates and increases itself” (LFC 203).
Green's criterion for assessing the illegitimacy of any economic practice is whether “one set of men are secured in the power of getting and keeping the means of realising their will, in such a way that others are practically denied the power” (LPPO 221). Indeed, this is the ground on which he analyses, for example, his contemporary factory legislation (LFC 195–200) and licensing laws (LFC 209–212).
He argues that the fundamental cause of the conditions of the working classes is the manner in which current land holdings were acquired. He notes that, for the most part, “[t]he original landlords have been conquerors” (LPPO 228). This has had at least two effects. Firstly, it has meant that, “[l]andless countrymen, whose ancestors were serfs, are the parents of the proletariate of great towns” (LPPO 229). The workers have been conditioned to take orders and not to exercise their own judgement. They are forced to accept any work they can find and so to endure low wages and poor conditions. This leads to little incentive to either save or make long-term plans. Thus, the proletariat have not come to see themselves as capable of or deserving of freedom, nor as having any real family responsibilities. In this way, workers have been denied the power to develop. They cannot actualise their potential to become self-conscious and self-determining beings.
Secondly, landlords have been given rights which they should not possess; that is, rights which are contrary to the development of the species. One example is the right to unlimited appropriation of the land. Thus, although things other than land can be legitimately appropriated without restraint, the acquisition of land must be regulated. Land is the precondition of all other forms of ownership, and so must be granted to everybody to some degree (LPPO 229). A fundamental difference between land and other things (particularly capital) is that “one man cannot acquire more land without others having less” (LPPO 229). For example, everyone must occupy some area of land, even if it is merely the land under your feet. If all land was (privately) owned by landlords, everyone else could justly be excluded from the world. This would be an incredible infringement of the development of the eternal consciousness.
In more realistic terms, private control of land allows private control of what happens on that land. The landlords would then have the power to restrict the workers' free exercise of their consciences and the free execution of their life plans. These restrictions on the free exercise and hence the development of their will include “building houses in unhealthy places or of unhealthy structure, … stopping up means of communication, or forbidding the erection of dissenting chapels” (LPPO 229). Also, Green draws attention to the infringement of workers' freedom under the system of “open” and “closed” villages. The basis of rights — the service of the eternal consciousness — is contradicted. Without real freedom, individuals are denied the chance to realise their personal conception of the good. They do not have the opportunity to implement long-term plans, nor the self-discipline which an autonomous life brings. This is yet another reason why rights to land cannot be absolute — “no man's land is his own for purposes incompatible with the public convenience” (LFC 206). One interesting point is that landlords could and sometimes did serve the eternal consciousness by banning public houses from their land. However, this furtherance of the eternal consciousness does not affect Green's basic and very valid point.
The common benefits which private control of land — interestingly, “if it is to be allowed at all” (LPPO 229) — have been lost, because of these illegitimate rights and bad customs which paradoxically restrict landlords' freedom to use the land (LPPO 229). Yet, exactly how the state should regulate private property in land will depend on national circumstances and history (LPPO 231). Given Green's ambivalence to private ownership of land, systems of communal ownership with private use may well have been acceptable to him They are at least broadly consistent with his wider moral theory.
Does this apply to wealth? As was shown, Green's presumption is for private ownership. Land was special because of its limited supply and its importance for all other property holdings. Hence, he argues that the problem is not with having wealth as such, but is with producing and distributing it. In his discussion, he highlights two difficult areas — freedom of bequest and free trade (LPPO 222). The problem is that they may both lead to great concentrations of wealth, and hence of power to restrict others' liberty (LPPO 224).
Green argues that a necessary part of planning one's future for one's self is deciding the fate of one's wealth (LPPO 222). For example, part of holding private property is being able to act benevolently through giving to charity and other gifts. This includes the right to determine the distribution of one's wealth immediately after one's death. For example, Green argues that a man's children are “included in his forecast of his future” (LPPO 224). By this, Green means that a man's actions are partially geared towards certain goals which are based on the existence and life of his children and friends. The removal of the individual's ability to execute his Will is, thus, a restriction on his will.
Now, Reeve argues that it is uncertain whether Green sees “the primary right” as “inheritance or bequest”, for Green does also argue that children have a prima facie claim on their parents for a certain level of care and consideration (Reeve, 1986; 160). In fact, Green is only really concerned with bequest. He is less sympathetic to inheritance for many reasons. For example, no child has laboured for the wealth he inherits. This is important because, as was shown, the positive condition for holding property is labour. Also, Green states explicitly that a man is perfectly justified in not leaving his wealth to a child whose actions he disapproves of (LPPO 225). The right of the child in this passage (LPPO 225) is couched far more in terms of the right to being correctly brought up. Indeed, the right of bequest is vital here as it allows the possibility of not letting one's children inherit equally or at all, and hence, exercising a man's mind in such a way as to create a sense of “family responsibility” in him — one of the main benefits of freedom of bequest is that it fosters his care and respect for others and allows him to make long-term plans by which he can actualise his true will.
Reeve is also wrong to argue that Green's theory of bequest says nothing “about the position of the childless” (Reeve, 1986 160). Green explicitly says that a man should be free to distribute his wealth “as he likes among his children (or, if he has none, among others)” (LPPO 224, my italics). He must argue this to be consistent. The important point about the right of bequest is that it enables a person to make a certain sort of plan which affects the manner in which he lives his life, and in which he raises his children, and makes explicit judgements about those he believes will outlive him.
Still, there is a problem in that such freedom of bequest helps to maintain the inequalities of wealth in society. The poor are apparently condemned to remain in poverty, because wealth can be kept within the same family, or, at best, class. Green argues that there are several reasons for believing that this concentration of wealth will be avoided, reduced or offset in society. Firstly, natural family affection will counter customs and laws which support the giving of wealth to one child only — usually the eldest son (LPPO 225). Indeed, a law of primogeniture is illegitimate as it inhibits a man's right to distribute his wealth as he wishes (LPPO 224). Secondly, the inheritor “may yet by his labour contribute largely to the social good, and a well-organised state will in various ways elicit such labour from possessors of inherited wealth” (LPPO 224). Presumably, this is a larger contribution than he would have made if he had not inherited the wealth.
The third reason, and the most promising for Green, is that it is legitimate for the state to tax the individual's income and wealth, on the grounds that it provides security for his holdings and acquisitions (LPPO 224). This is an important and powerful argument. Yet, interestingly, Green's benefit theory denies an individual's absolute right to private property in capital. For taxation to be consistent with purely private property, the individual must in some sense give his consent for his money to be taken. However, for Green, there need not be even tacit consent for taxation to be legitimate. The state has a right to raise taxation from inheritance because of the benefits it gives, rather than the consent it receives. He argues that redistributive taxation is legitimate, because the state protects the individual's rights to inheritance and bequest. Rights are only legitimate when they serve the development of the eternal consciousness. Taxation can do this, and when it does, the state has right to tax the individual which overrides the latter's right to private property. There is a call for a right to gain private property at the same time as it is partially denied. Yet, Green's justification is always explicitly limited by the need to be of service to the eternal consciousness. Thus, Green states that “[i]t is only through the guarantee which society gives him that [a man] … has property at all, or, strictly speaking, any right to his possessions” (LFC 200). Green's advocacy of redistributive taxation is, thus, consistent with his wider teleological theory.
Green begins his discussion of free trade in the Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation by arguing that it produces a redistribution of resources from “where they are of least use … [to] where they are of most use” (LPPO 224). I assume that Green broadly equates “use” with personal need as judged by the particular individual. In this way, the self-interested activities of businessmen also serve the social good. However, this is an incredible oversimplification of what actually happens in the market. For Green's assertion to be valid, he must assume that each individual has the same purchasing power. Only in this way will each pound which is spent represent the same level of need. The problem is that given inequalities of wealth in the economy (which Green sees as inevitable and often beneficial under capitalism), the value of each pound does not represent the same level of need irrespective of who spends it. For example, an extra hundred pounds is worth far more to a poor man than it is to a rich one. The distribution of goods within the capitalist market is, thus, far more concerned with demand from blocks of wealth rather than genuine need. The inequalities of wealth which arise in capitalism are too great for his present argument to be taken seriously.
Also, he argues that there is no formal block on workers setting up their own co-operative societies “for the investment of savings”, and, so in England, “the better sort of labourers do become capitalists” (LPPO 227). This is good, because in becoming a successful capitalist, the worker must learn to plan and execute his actions coherently. This requires rational thought and self-discipline. Green admits that in practice there may be blocks on this “development”, but says that these are the result of non-capitalist practices. For example, the poor are so “impoverished and reckless” (LPPO 227) that often they cannot form such societies.
Green's last justification of capitalism to be discussed here is his most powerful. It must be remembered, Green argues, “that the increased wealth of one man does not naturally mean the diminished wealth of another” (LPPO 226); and capitalism benefits everyone in the long-run. Even the poor are made better off because the wealth held by the rich is used in such a way that is raises the standard of living of everyone in society. The significant rise in the standard of living of the British working classes since the Industrial Revolution has been the result of free trade and government legislation to protect the workers' from exploitation (LFC 201–204). This is Green's most powerful justification for private property.
It has been shown that Green's theory of property is — or, at least, tries to be — based squarely on his teleology. Thus, he argues that generally a system of private property is the best arrangement for promoting the eternal consciousness in society as a whole. Where it contradicts this end, private property is illegitimate. This creates his ambivalence about the private ownership of land and his call for the taxation of bequests. Whilst his arguments for free trade are interesting, they are also often limited by his economic naivety. For example, he underestimates the power of the rich to exclude the poor from economic success. Bearing this in mind, one must question the consistency of his attachment to private property. Although he argues, as Nicholson writes, that “private property is necessary to morality because it is necessary to will (which is necessary to morality)” (Nicholson, 1990, p. 97), one should not forget the developmental nature of the will. It may well be that communal property “is not available as a present resource”, as Mill puts it, merely because the human will is not developed enough. Rights to property may have moved from the family to the individual, but that does not mean that they cannot move on to the species. Indeed, this would seem to be the logical conclusion of Green's argument that the individual must come to recognise that their truly common telos is in living as members of the human race.
Despite this, Green's discussions of property are always based on his assessment of whether, in general, a given practice or property right serves the development of the eternal consciousness. In this way, his argument is consistent.
Green's influence and philosophical reputation remained strong well into the early years of the twentieth century. Followers such as Edward Caird, Bernard Bosanquet and Francis H Bradley did much refine Green's thought and to extend his principles to the circumstances of a new epoch. The resulting British Idealist movement was eventually transformed into the ‘New Liberalism’ of L. T. Hobhouse and J. A. Hobson amidst growing dissatisfaction with Idealist metaphysics and a general reaction in Britain against ‘all things German’ that resulted from the First World War. The mid-twentieth century saw a number of influential attacks being launched against the movement, most notably from H. A. Prichard, John Plamenatz, Isaiah Berlin, and Melvin Richter. Interest in Green's thought has gradually revived not least due to the work of Alan Milne and Peter Nicholson. A number of new works on Green and Idealism have been produced in recent years (see the bibliographical entries for David Brink, Thom Brooks, Matt Carter, Alberto de Sanctis, Maria Dimova-Cookson, Michael Freeden, Denys P. Leighton, Rex Martin, Avital Simhony, Geoffrey Thomas, Colin Tyler, David Weinstein, Ben Wempe, and Andrew Vincent, amongst many others). An important collections of new essays appeared in 2006 (Dimova-Cookson and Mander, eds.). A new edition of Green's Works was published in 1997, which includes over 500 pages of previously unpublished material edited by Peter Nicholson. Alberto de Sanctis has edited Green's remaining undergraduate essays (de Sanctis, 2005, pp.175–196.) I have edited a number of previously-unavailable manuscripts, including the remaining parts of Green's lectures on the John's Gospel (‘The Incarnation’), Romans ('The Pauline conception of justification by faith') and Galatians ('The Incarnation') (Tyler, ed., 2005, vol. 1, pp.1–188). Clarendon reprinted the fifth edition of Green's Prolegomena to Ethics in 2003, replacing Edward Caird's preface with an introductory essay by David Brink. Conferences are held frequently on the thought of Green and the other Idealists in Britain, Canada and the USA, many of which are organised by the Centre for Idealism and the New Liberalism at the University of Hull, the British Idealism Specialist Group of the Political Studies Association, and the British Idealism and Collingwood Centre, Cardiff University.
Abbreviations of Principal Works
CD ‘Essay on Christian Dogma’, in Works, vol. III CP ‘The Conversion of Paul’, in Works, vol. III DSF ‘Different Senses of “Freedom” as Applied to Will and the Moral Progress of Man’, in in Harris and Morrow, 1986 F ‘Faith’, in Works, vol. III I ‘Incarnation’, in Works, vol. III IM ‘Immortality’, in Works, vol. III JF ‘Justification by Faith’, in Works, vol. III ‘Kant’ ‘Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant’, in Works, vol. II LFC ‘Lecture on Liberal Legislation and Freedom of Contract’, in Works, vol. III LPPO ‘Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation’, in Harris and Morrow, 1986 ME ‘Metaphysic of Ethics, Moral Psychology, Sociology or the Science of Sittlichkeit’, in C. Tyler, ed., Unpublished Manuscripts in British Idealism, vol. I PE Prolegomena to Ethics WG ‘Witness of God’, in Works, vol. III WNT ‘Word is Nigh Thee’, in Works, vol. III
- Collected Works of T. H. Green, R. L. Nettleship and P. P. Nicholson (eds.), 5 volumes, Bristol: Thoemmes, 1997.
- Works of T. H. Green, R. L. Nettleship (ed.), 3 volumes, London: Longmans Green, 1885–8.
- Prolegomena to Ethics, A. C. Bradley (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon, 1883.
- P. Harris and J. Morrow (eds.), T. H. Green: Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation and Other Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
- ‘Appendix: A Selection of Green's Undergraduate Essays’, in A. de Sanctis, The ‘Puritan’ Democracy of Thomas Hill Green with some unpublished writings, Exeter and Charlottesville, VA: Imprint Academic, 2005, pp. 175–196.
- Unpublished Manuscripts in British Idealism: Poltical philosophical, theoology and social thought, 2 volumes, C. Tyler (ed.), Bristol: Thoemmes Continuum, 2005, Volume 1, pp. 1–188.
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- Dimova-Cookson, M., 2001, T. H. Green's Moral and Political Philosophy, Houndsmill: Palgrave, 2001.
- Dimova-Cookson, M., 2011, ‘Justice as a secondary moral ideal: The British idealists and the personal ethics perspective in understanding social justice’, 10 (1): 46–70.
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- Harris, P., 1988–9, ‘Moral Progress and Politics: The Theory of T. H. Green’, Polity, 21: 538–562.
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