The Definition of Lying and Deception

First published Thu Feb 21, 2008; substantive revision Tue Jun 30, 2015

Questions central to the philosophical discussion of lying to others and other-deception (interpersonal deceiving) may be divided into two kinds. Questions of the first kind are definitional (or conceptual). They include the questions of how lying is to be defined, how deceiving is to be defined, and whether lying is always a form of deceiving. Questions of the second kind are normative (more particularly, moral). They include the questions of whether lying and deceiving are (either defeasibly or non-defeasibly) morally wrong, whether lying is morally worse than deceiving, and whether, if lying and deception are defeasibly morally wrong, they are merely morally optional on certain occasions, or are sometimes morally obligatory. In this entry, we only consider questions of the first kind.

1. Traditional Definition of Lying

There is no universally accepted definition of lying to others. The dictionary definition of lying is “to make a false statement with the intention to deceive” (OED 1989) but there are numerous problems with this definition. It is both too narrow, since it requires falsity, and too broad, since it allows for lying about something other than what is being stated, and lying to someone who is believed to be listening in but who is not being addressed.

The most widely accepted definition of lying is the following: “A lie is a statement made by one who does not believe it with the intention that someone else shall be led to believe it” (Isenberg 1973, 248) (cf. “[lying is] making a statement believed to be false, with the intention of getting another to accept it as true” (Primoratz 1984, 54n2)). This definition does not specify the addressee, however. It may be restated as follows:

  • (L1) To lie =df to make a believed-false statement to another person with the intention that the other person believe that statement to be true.

L1 is the traditional definition of lying. According to L1, there are at least four necessary conditions for lying. First, lying requires that a person make a statement (statement condition). Second, lying requires that the person believe the statement to be false; that is, lying requires that the statement be untruthful (untruthfulness condition). Third, lying requires that the untruthful statement be made to another person (addressee condition). Fourth, lying requires that the person intend that that other person believe the untruthful statement to be true (intention to deceive the addressee condition).

These four necessary conditions need to be explained before objections to L1 can be entertained and alternative definitions can be considered.

1.1 Statement Condition

According to the statement condition, lying requires that a person make a statement. Making a statement requires the use of conventional signs, or symbols. Conventional signs, such as “WOMEN” on the door to a restroom, are opposed to natural or causal signs, or indices, such as women coming in and out of a restroom, as well as signs that signify by resemblance, or icons, such as a figure with a triangular dress on the door to a restroom (cf. Grotius 2005, 2001; Pierce 1955; Grice 1989). Making a statement, therefore, requires the use of language. A commonly accepted definition of making a statement is the following: “x states that p to y =df (1) x believes that there is an expression E and a language L such that one of the standard uses of E in L is that of expressing the proposition p; (2) x utters E with the intention of causing y to believe that he, x, intended to utter E in that standard use” (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 150).

It is possible for a person to make a statement using American Sign Language, smoke signals, Morse code, semaphore flags, and so forth, as well as by making specific bodily gestures whose meanings have been established by convention (e.g., nodding one's head in response to a question). Hence, it is possible to lie by these means. If it is granted that a person is not making a statement when he wears a wig, gives a fake smile, affects a limp, and so forth, it follows that a person cannot be lying by doing these things (Siegler 1966, 128). If it is granted that a person is not making a statement when, for example, she wears a wedding ring when she is not married, or wears a police uniform when she is not a police officer, it follows that she cannot be lying by doing these things.

In the case of a person who does not utter a declarative sentence, but who curses, or makes an interjection or an exclamation, or issues a command or an exhortation, or asks a question, or says “Hello,” then, if it is granted that she is not making a statement when she does any of these things, it follows that she cannot be lying by doing these things (Green 2001, 163–164; but see Leonard 1959).

An ironic statement, or a statement made as part of a joke, or a statement made by an actor while acting, or a statement made in a novel, is still a statement. More formally, the statement condition of L1 obeys the following three constraints (Stokke 2013a, 41):

  1. If x makes a statement, this does not entail that x believes the statement to be true;
  2. If x makes a statement, this does not entail that x intends her audience to believe the statement to be true;
  3. If x makes a statement, this does not entail that x intends her audience to believe that x believes the statement to be true.

The statement condition is to be distinguished from a different putative necessary condition for lying, namely, the condition that an assertion be made. The assertion condition is not a necessary condition for lying, according to L1. For example, if Yin, who does not have a girlfriend, but who wants people to believe that he has a girlfriend, makes the ironic statement “Yeah, right, I have a girlfriend” in response to a question from his friend, Bolin, who believes that Yin is secretly dating someone, with the intention that Bolin believe that he actually does have a girlfriend, then this ‘irony lie’ is a lie according to L1, although it is not an assertion.

According to the statement condition, it is not possible to lie by omitting to make a statement (Mahon 2003; Griffiths 2004, 33). So-called ‘lies of omission’ (or ‘passive lying’ (Opie 1825)) are not lies (Douglas 1976, 59; Dynel 2011, 154). All lies are lies of commission. It is possible for a person to lie by remaining ‘silent,’ if the ‘silence’ is a previously agreed upon signal with others that is equivalent to making a statement (Fried 1978, 57). However, such a lie would not be a ‘lie of omission’ (see People v. Meza (1987) in which, on the basis of Californian Evidence Code that “‘Statement’” included “nonverbal conduct of a person intended by him as a substitute for oral or written verbal expression,” prospective juror’s Eric Luis Meza’s silence and failure to raise his hand in response to questions was “taken for a negative answer, i.e., a negative statement” (People v. Meza 1987, 1647) and he was found guilty of perjury).

Note that the statement condition, all by itself, does not require that the statement be made to another person, or even that it be expressed aloud or in writing. One’s inner statements to oneself are statements, and, if other conditions are also met, can be “internal lies” (Kant 1996, 553–554).

1.2 Untruthfulness Condition

According to the untruthfulness condition, lying requires that a person make an untruthful statement, that is, make a statement that she believes to be false. Note that this condition is to be distinguished from the putative necessary condition for lying that the statement that the person makes be false (Grotius 2005, 1209; Krishna 1961, 146). The falsity condition is not a necessary condition for lying according to L1.

Statements that are truthful may be false. If George makes the statement to Hillary (with the intention that Hillary believe that statement to be true), “The enemy has weapons of mass destruction,” and that statement is false, he is not lying if he does not believe that statement to be false.

Statements that are untruthful may be true. In Jean-Paul Sartre’s short-story, The Wall, set during the Spanish Civil War, Pablo Ibbieta, a prisoner sentenced to be executed by the Fascists, is interrogated by his guards as to the whereabouts of his comrade Ramon Gris. Mistakenly believing Gris to be hiding with his cousins, he makes the untruthful statement to them that “Gris is hiding in the cemetery” (with the intention that they believe this statement to be true). As it happens, Gris is hiding in the cemetery, and the statement is true. Gris is arrested at the cemetery, and Ibbieta is released (Sartre 1937; cf. Siegler 1966: 130). According to L1, Ibbieta lied to his interrogators, although the untruthful statement he made to them was true, and he did not deceive them about the whereabouts of Gris (Isenberg 1973, 248; Mannison 1969, 138; Lindley, 1971; Kupfer 1982, 104; Faulkner 2013).

If a person makes a truthful statement with the intention to deceive another person, then she is not lying, according to the untruthfulness condition. For example, if John and Mary are dating, and Valentino is Mary’s ex-boyfriend, and one evening “John asks Mary, ‘Have you seen Valentino this week?,’” and “Mary answers: ‘Valentino’s been sick with mononucleosis for the past two weeks,’” and “Valentino has in fact been sick with mononucleosis for the past two weeks, but it is also the case that Mary had a date with Valentino the night before” (Coleman and Kany 1981, 31), then Mary is not lying to John, even if she is attempting to deceive John. This is what is called a palter (see Schauer and Zeckhauser 2009; although they illegitimately add that a palter must succeed in deceiving).

In addition to palters not being lies, a double bluff is not a lie either according to the untruthfulness condition. If one makes a truthful statement, intending one’s addressee to believe that the statement is false, then one is not lying. Consider the following joke about two travelers on a train from Moscow (reputed to be Sigmund Freud's favorite joke) (Cohen 2002, 328):

Trofim: Where are you going?
Pavel: To Pinsk.
Trofim: Liar! You say you are going to Pinsk in order to make me believe you are going to Minsk. But I know you are going to Pinsk.

Pavel does not lie to Trofim, since his statement to Trofim is truthful, even if he intends that Trofim be deceived by this double bluff.

One implication of the untruthfulness condition is that if a person makes a statement that she believes to be neither true nor false, then she cannot be lying (Siegler 1966, 133; cf. Strawson 1952, 173). For example, if a person begging for money says “All my children need medical attention,” but believes that this proposition is neither true nor false, because he has no children, then he is not lying, even if he is attempting to deceive (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 155–6; but see Siegler 1966, 135).

It is a matter of debate as to whether it is possible to lie using metaphors. For example, if a gardener who has had a very bad crop of tomatoes says “We’ve got tomatoes coming out of our ears,” intending to deceive about his having a bumper crop, then this untruthful statement made with an intention to deceive is typically not considered a lie, because the untruthful statement is metaphorical (Saul 2012, 16). Nevertheless, some argue that it is possible to lie using metaphors (Griffiths 2004, 36; Dynel 2011, 149). If literally false metaphorical statements can be truthful statements, according to the beliefs of the speaker, and hence, can be untruthful statements, according to the beliefs of the speaker, then the deceptive gardener is lying in this example according to L1.

1.3 Addressee Condition

According to the addressee condition, lying requires that a person make an untruthful statement to another person (or, strictly speaking, to a believed other person, since one might, e.g., mistake a waxed dummy for another person, and lie to it). That is, lying requires that a person address another person (Simpson 1992, 626). According to L1, it is not possible for me to lie to no one whatsoever (i.e., not even myself), and it is not possible to lie to someone whom one is not addressing but whom one believes is listening in on a conversation. For example, if Mickey and Danny both believe that the F.B.I. is monitoring their telephone conversation, and Mickey says to Danny, “The pick-up is at midnight tomorrow,” with the intention of deceiving the FBI agents listening in, then Mickey is not lying to the F.B.I. agents (this is a “bogus disclosure” (Newey 1997, 115)).

According to L1, it is possible to lie to a general audience. It is possible for a person to lie by publishing an untruthful report about an event (Kant 1997, 203), or by making an untruthful statement on a tax return, or by sending an untruthful e-mail to everyone on a mailing list, or by making an untruthful statement in a magazine advertisement or a television commercial. In these cases, the readers, hearers, watchers, etc., are the addressees.

According to the addressee condition, lying necessarily involves addressing someone whom you believe to be a person capable of understanding your statement and forming beliefs on that basis. It is not possible to lie to those whom you believe to be non-persons (goldfish, dogs, robots, etc.) or persons whom you believe cannot understand the statements that are made to them (infants, the insane, etc., as well as those whom you believe cannot understand the language you are speaking in). It is possible to lie to other persons via intermediaries which are not persons, however (e.g., entering false answers to questions asked by a bank’s ATM).

1.4 Intention to Deceive the Addressee Condition

According to the intention to deceive the addressee condition, lying requires that a person make an untruthful statement to another person with the intention that that other person believe that untruthful statement to be true. Making ironic statements, telling jokes, writing fiction, acting in a play, and so forth, without the intention that the addressee believe these untruthful statements to be true, is not lying (Morris 1976, 391).

If x makes an untruthful statement to y, without the intention that y believe that untruthful statement to be true, but with the intention that y believe something else to be true that x believes to be true, then x is not lying to y, according to L1. Examples of such non-deceptive untruthful statements include polite untruths (Kant 1997, 27; Mahon 2003, 109). For example, if servant Igor makes the untruthful statement to unwelcome visitor Damian, “Madam is not at home,” without the intention that Damian believe it to be true that she is not home (that would be lying on Igor’s part), but with the intention that Damian believe it to be true that it is inconvenient for Madam to see Damian now, something that Igor believes to be true, then according to L1, Igor is not lying to Damian (Isenberg 1973, 256). However, for Igor to intend that Damian believe this, it must be the case that Igor believes that this is how Damian understands “Madam is not at home.” Polite untruths may be said to be examples of “falsifications but not lies,” since the person “says just what etiquette demands” (Shiffrin 2014, 19). As it has been said about untruthful statements situations “in which politeness requires some sort of remark” and the other person “knows quite well that the statement is false,” such statements “are not really lies” (Coleman and Kay 1981, 29). They are better considered as cases of speaking in code. Another example of a non-deceptive untruthful statement is what has been called an “altruistic lie” (Fallis 2009, 50; cf. Augustine 1952, 57), such as when a speaker makes an untruthful statement to a hearer whom he believes distrusts him, in order that the hearer will believe something that the speaker believes to be true. This is not a lie according to L1.

Such non-deceptive untruths are not to be confused with white lies, i.e., harmless lies (Bok 1978, 58; Sweetser 1987, 54; 52 n. 73) or prosocial lies (also called social lies), i.e., lies that do not harm social life but protect it (Meibauer 2014, 152; Sweetser 1987, 54), or fibs, i.e., inconsequential lies told for selfish reasons (Sweetser 1987, 54). White lies, prosocial lies, and fibs are all intentionally deceptive, and are all lies according to L1 (Green 2001, 169). For example, “both American and Ecuadorian cultures would probably consider Jacobo’s reply to be a white lie,” and hence deceptive, in the following case presented to Ecuadorians by linguists: “Teresa just bought a new dress. Upon trying it on for the first time, she asks her husband Jacobo, “Does it look good on me?” Jacobo responds, “Yes” even though he really thinks that the dress is ugly and too tight” (Hardin 2010, 3207; cf. Dynel 2011, 160). Or, to take another example, “Some people would call it a white lie to tell a dying person whatever he or she needs to hear to die in peace” (Sweetser 1987, 54). Note that both white lies and prosocial lies are to be distinguished from “lies which most people would think justified by some higher good achieved but which would not be called white lies [or prosocial lies], since their informational consequences are too major (however moral),” such as “to lie to the Gestapo about the location of a Jew” (Sweetser 1987, 54).

According to the untruthfulness condition, it is not merely the case that the person who makes the untruthful statement intends that some other person believe the untruthful statement to be true; the person intends that the addressee believe the untruthful statement to be true. Also, according to this condition, it is not merely the case that the person intends that the addressee believe some statement to be true that the person believes to be false; the person intends that the addressee believe to be true the untruthful statement that is made to the addressee. If Maximilian is a crime boss, and Alessandro is one of his henchmen, whom he secretly believes is a police informant, and Maximilian makes the untruthful statement to Alessandro “There are no informants in my organization,” without the intention that Alessandro believe that statement to be true, but with the intention that Alessandro believe that Maximilian believes that statement to be true, then Maximilian is not lying according to L1 (Mahon 2008, 220). (Maximilian has, of course, attempted to deceive Alessandro). This conclusion has prompted some to revise L1 to include more than one intention to deceive.

According to this condition, it is sufficient for lying that the person who makes the untruthful statement intends that the addressee believe the untruthful statement to be true; it is not necessary that the addressee believe the untruthful statement to be true. That is, a lie remains a lie if it is disbelieved. If Sophie makes the untruthful statement to Nicole “I didn’t get any homework today,” with the intention that Nicole believe that statement to be true, and if Nicole does not believe that statement to be true, then Sophie is still lying. This is because ‘lie’ is not an achievement or success verb, and an act of lying is not a perlocutionary act. The existence of an act of lying does not depend upon the production of a particular response or state in the addressee (Mannison 1969, 135; Wood 1973: 199; MacCormick 1983, 9 n. 23; but see Reboul 1994). As it has been said, “It is very odd to think that whether a speaker lies hinges upon the persuasiveness of the speaker or the credulity of the listener” (Shiffrin 2014, 13).

Because L1 does not have an assertion condition, however, according to L1 it is possible to lie by making ironic statements, telling jokes, writing fiction, acting in a play, and so forth, if the person making the untruthful statement (somehow) intends that it be believed to be true, as in the case of the ‘irony lie’ above. Similarly, if someone intends to deceive using a joke—for example, if con artist David says “Yeah, I am a billionaire. That's why I am in this dive” to his mark, Greg, at a bar, intending that Greg believe that David is a billionaire who is attempting to to pass incognito in a bar—then this ‘joke lie’ is a lie according to L1. If a novelist were to write a novel with the intention that her audience believe that this was a true story disguised as a novel—a pretend roman à clef—then this ‘fiction lie’ would be a lie according to L1. If an actor in a play were to deliver an untruthful statement with the intention that his audience believe the statement to be true—say, if an an actor delivered a line about his life being too short with the intention that the audience believed that the actor was actually dying from some disease (“it is possible that the performance is part of an elaborate deception aimed at getting members of the audience to believe that the particular line from the play is actually true” (Fallis 2009, 56))—then this ‘acting lie’ would be a lie according to L1.

1.5 Objections to the Traditional Definition of Lying

Two kinds of objections have been made to L1. First, objections have been made to each necessary condition, on the basis that it is not necessary for lying. According to these objections, L1 is too narrow. Second, objections have been made to the four necessary conditions being jointly sufficient for lying, on the basis that some further condition is necessary for lying. According to these objections, L1 is too broad.

1.5.1 Conditions Are Not Necessary

Against the statement condition of L1 it has been objected that the making of a statement is not necessary for lying. Lying to others may be defined as “any form of behavior the function of which is to provide others with false information or to deprive them of true information” (Smith 2004, 14), or as “a successful or unsuccessful deliberate attempt, without forewarning, to create in another a belief which the communicator considers to be untrue” (Vrij 2000, 6). Importantly, this entails that lying can consist of simply withholding information with the intent to deceive, without making any statement at all (Ekman 1985, 28; Scott 2006, 4). Those who make this objection would make lying the same as intentionally deceiving (Ekman 1985, 26).

Against the untruthfulness condition of L1 it has been objected that an untruthful statement is not necessary for lying. This objection comes in a variety of forms. There are those who argue any statement made with an intention to deceive is a lie, including a truthful statement that is made with an intention to deceive (Barnes 1994, 11; Davidson 1980, 88). Lying may thus be defined as “any intentionally deceptive message that is stated” (Bok 1978, 13). There are also those who, relying upon a Gricean account of conversational implicature (Grice 1989, 39)), argue that someone who makes a truthful statement but who thereby conversationally implicates a believed-false statement is lying (Meibauer 2011, 285; cf. 2014a). Importantly, such an “untruthful implicature” (Dynel 2011, 159–160) is “directly intended” (Adler 1997, 446). Thirdly, there are those who argue for the possibility of “lying ironically” (Simpson 1992, 631), or indirect lying. If a speaker makes an ironic untruthful statement, then “Through this presentation of himself as insincerely asserting he presents himself as believing” the opposite of what he says, which is “capacity to… assert in-effect” (Simpson 1992, 630). If the person is “insincere in this” and actually does believe in the truth of what he states, despite invoking trust in his believing its opposite, then “this is a lie (an indirect lie, we might say)” (Simpson 1992, 630). For example, if a person who is listening to a sappy pop song at a party is asked if she likes this kind of music and replies, ironically, “Yeah, right, I love this kind of music,” then she is lying if she actually does love this kind of music (cf. Dynel 2011, 148–149).

Against the untruthfulness condition it has also been objected that it is not necessary for lying that the statement that is made is believed to be false; it is sufficient that the statement is not believed to be true, or is believed to be probably false (Carson 2006, 298; 2010, 18). As it has been claimed, “Agnostics about the truth of their assertions who nonetheless assert them without qualification tell lies” (Shiffrin 2014, 13).

Against the addressee condition of L1 it has been objected that it is sufficient for lying that the untruthful statement is made, even if it is made to no one — not even to oneself (Griffiths 2004, 31). Lying may thus be defined as “conscious expression of other than what we believe” (Shibles 1985, 33). It has also been objected that it is possible to lie to third parties who are not addressees. In general, it is possible to distinguish between cases where “the hearer eavesdrops, unbeknown to the first and second parties” (eavesdropping), cases where “the speaker utters p to the interlocutor while the hearer, with the awareness of both other parties, listens in and knows that the first- and second-party know he is listening in… although it is for the interlocutor that the utterance is intended” (kibbitzing), as well as cases similar to kibbitzing except that “the utterance is also intended for the hearer [who knows that they know that he is listening in]” (disclosure), and cases similar to disclosure “except that although the first and second parties know that the hearer is listening in, the hearer does not know that they are listening in” (bogus disclosure) (Newey 1997, 115). Even if it is not possible to lie to eavesdroppers, or to those merely listening in, as in the case of kibbitzing, it may be possible to lie in the cases of bogus disclosure, such as in the example above of Mickey saying to Danny, “The pick-up is at midnight tomorrow,” with the intention of deceiving the F.B.I. agents listening in. It may even be possible to lie in the case of of disclosure. In the 1978 thriller Capricorn One, about a Mars landing hoax, during a nationally televised transmission between the astronauts ‘in space’ and their wives at the control center, which is being monitored closely by NASA handlers, Colonel Charles Brubaker tells his wife Kay to tell his son that “When I get back, I’m gonna take him to Yosemite again, like last summer.” In fact he brought his son to a different place the previous summer (Flatbush, where a movie was being shot), something that his wife knows. According to this objection, Brubaker can be said to be lying to his NASA handlers about what he did last summer.

Against the addressee condition it has also been objected that it is possible to lie to an animal, a robot, etc., as well as to what might be another person—for example, if a home owner, woken up in the middle of the night and wondering if there are burglars below the stairs, shouts down, “I’m bringing my rifle down there,” although he has no rifle (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 157).

Against the intention to deceive the addressee condition of L1 it has been objected that, even if an intention to deceive the addressee is required for lying, it is not necessary that it be an intention to deceive the addressee about the content of the untruthful statement; it may be an intention to deceive the addressee about the beliefs of the speaker abut the statement—specifically, the belief that the untruthful statement is true (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 152; Williams 2002, 74; Reboul 1994, 294; Mahon 2008, 220; Tollefsen 2014, 24).

There are at least two ways in which L1 could be modified in response to this objection. First, it could held that what is essential to lying is the intention to deceive the hearer about the speaker’s belief that the untruthful statement is true: “x utters a sentence, “S,” where “S” means that p, in doing which either x expresses his belief that p, or x intends the person addressed to take it that x believes that p” (Williams 2002, 74) and “the speaker believes [p] to be false” (Williams 2002, 96–97). L1 could therefore be modified as follows:

  • (L2) To lie =df to make a statement that p, where p is believed to be false, to another person, with the intention that the other person believe that p is believed to be true. (cf. Williams 2002, 74, 96–97)

Alternatively, L1 could be modified to incorporate either intention, as follows:

  • (L3) To lie =df to make a believed-false statement (to another person), either with the intention that that statement be believed to be true (by the other person), or with the intention that it be believed (by the other person) that that statement is believed to be true (by the person making the statement), or with both intentions. (Mahon 2008, 227–228)

Against this condition it has also been argued that it is not necessary that it be an intention to deceive the addressee about either the content of the untruthful statement or about the beliefs of the speaker about the untruthful statement. It is sufficient that there is an intention to deceive about some matter—that is, it is sufficient that the speaker intend that the hearer believe to be true something that the speaker believes to be false. Note that those who make this objection would turn lying into any deception involving untruthful statements. If this objection were combined with the objection that lying could be directed to third parties (as in bogus disclosure, or disclosure), L1 could be modified, as follows:

  • (L4) To lie =df to make a believed-false statement, to another person or in the believed hearing of another person, with the intention that some other person—the person addressed or the other person in the believed hearing—believe some believed-false statement to be true. (Newey 1997, 100)

Against this condition it has also been objected that although there is “a necessary relationship between lying and deception,” nevertheless this intention should be understood merely as the intention to be deceptive to another person, which is the intention “to conceal information” from the other person (Lackey 2013, 5–7). According to this objection, concealing evidence, understood as hiding evidence or keeping evidence secret, counts as being deceptive to another person. L1 could be modified, as follows:

  • (L5) x lies to y if and only if (i) x states that p to y, (ii) x believes that p is false and (iii) x intends to be deceptive to y in stating that p. (Lackey 2013, 237)

Finally, against this intention to deceive the addressee condition it has been objected that no intention to deceive is required for lying (Shibles 1985, 33; Kemp and Sullivan 1993, 153; Griffiths 2004, 31; Carson et al. 1982; Carson 1988; 2006; 2010; Sorensen 2007; 2010; 2011; Fallis, 2009; 2010; 2012; 2015; Saul, 2012a; 2012b; Stokke 2013a, 2013b; 2014; Shiffrin 2014). If the sworn-in witness in the trial of a violent criminal goes on the record and gives untruthful testimony—in order, for example, to avoid being killed by the defendant or any of his criminal associates—without any intention that that testimony be believed to be true by any person (not the jury, the judge, the lawyers, the journalists covering the trial, the people in the gallery, the readers of the newspaper reports, etc.), then the witness is still lying (but see Jones 1986). Such non-deceptive lies are lies according to this objection (but see Lackey 2013 for the argument that these lies are intentionally deceptive, and Fallis 2015 for the argument that they are not intentionally deceptive).

1.5.2 Conditions Are Not Jointly Sufficient

It has been objected that L1 is not sufficient for lying because it is also necessary that the untruthful statement be false (Coleman and Kay 1981, 28; OED, 1989; Moore 2000). This is the the falsity condition for lying (Grimaltos and Rosell, forthcoming—see Other Internet Resources). For most objectors the falsity condition supplements L1 and makes this definition of lying even narrower (e.g., Coleman and Kay, 1981). For other objectors the falsity condition is part of a different definition of lying, and makes that definition narrower (Carson 2006, 284; 2010, 17; Saul 2012b, 6).

It has been objected that L1 is not sufficient for lying because it is also necessary to intend that that other person believe that that statement is believed to be true (Frankfurt 1999, 96; Simpson 1992, 625; Faulkner 2007, 527). If Harry makes the untruthful statement “I have no change in my pocket” to Michael, but Harry does not intend that Michael believe that Harry believes it to be true, then Harry is not lying to Michael, even if Harry intends that Michael believe it to be true (Frankfurt 1986, 85; 1999, 96). This additional condition would make L1 even narrower, since it would have the result that Maximilian is not lying to Alessandro in the example above.

Finally, it has been objected that L1 is insufficient because lying requires that an untruthful assertion be made, and not merely that an untruthful statement be made. This is the assertion condition for lying. According to this objection, one is not lying when one makes a deceptive untruthful ironic statement (‘irony lie’), or a deceptive untruthful joke (‘joke lie’), or a deceptive untruthful fiction (‘fiction lie’), or deceptive untruthful acting (‘acting life’), since in none of these cases is one making an assertion. For most objectors the assertion condition supplements L1 and makes L1 even narrower (Chisholm and Feehan 1977; Fried 1978; Simpson 1992; Williams 2002; Faulkner 2007). For others the assertion condition is part of a different definition of lying, and makes that definition narrower (Sorensen 2007; Fallis 2009; Stokke 2013a).

The most important objection to L1 is that lying does not require an intention to deceive. This has led to a division amongst those writing on the definition of lying.

2. Deceptionism vs. Non-Deceptionism About Lying

There are two positions held by those who write on the definition of lying: Deceptionism and Non-Deceptionism (Mahon 2014). The first group, Deceptionists, hold that an intention to deceive is necessary for lying. Deceptionists may be divided further in turn into Simple Deceptionists, who hold that lying requires the making of an untruthful statement; Complex Deceptionists, who hold that lying requires the making of an assertion and a breach of trust; and Moral Deceptionists, who hold that lying requires the violation of a moral right of another or the moral wronging of another. The second group, Non-Deceptionists, hold that an intention to deceive is not necessary for lying. They see the traditional definition as both incorrect and insufficient. Some Non-Deceptionists hold that lying requires warranting the truth of what is stated, and the Non-Deceptionists hold that lying requires the making of an assertion.

2.1 Simple Deceptionism

Simple Deceptionists include those who defend L1 (Isenberg 1973; Primoratz 1984) as well as those who defend the modified versions of this definition: L2 (Williams 2002), L3 (Mahon 2008), L4 (Newey 1997), and L5 (Lackey 2013). For Simple Deceptionists, lying requires the making of an untruthful statement with an intention to deceive, but it does not require the making of an assertion or a breach of trust.

2.2 Complex Deceptionism

Complex Deceptionists hold that, in addition to requiring an intention to deceive, lying requires the making of an assertion, as well as a breach of trust. Roderick Chisholm and Thomas Feehan hold that one is only making an assertion to another person if one makes a statement to another person and one believes that the conditions are such that the other person is justified in believing both that one believes one’s statement to be true and that one intends that the other person believe that one believes one’s statement to be true: “x asserts p to y =df x states p to y and does so under conditions which, he believes, justify y in believing that he, x, not only accepts p, but also intends to contribute causally to y’s believing that he, x, accepts p” (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 152).

A lie is an untruthful assertion, that is, the speaker believes the statement that is made is not true, or is false:

x lies to y =df There is a proposition p such that (i) either x believes that p is not true or x believes that p is false and (ii) x asserts p to y. (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 152)

In the case of a lie, the speaker is attempting to get the hearer to believe a falsehood. Note, however, that this falsehood is not (normally) what the speaker is stating. Rather, the falsehood that the speaker is attempting to get the hearer to believe is that the speaker believes the statement to be true. This is the intention to deceive in lying (although, strictly speaking, deception is foreseen and not intended (“Essentially, under this definition, you are only lying if you expect that you will be successful in deceiving someone about what you believe” (Fallis 2009, 45)).

The speaker is also attempting to get the hearer to have this false belief about what the speaker believes “in a special way—by getting his victim to place his faith in him” (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 149). This is the breach of trust or breach of faith in lying: “Lying, unlike the other types of deception, is essentially a breach of faith” (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 153). Their complete definition of a lie may be stated as follows:

  • (L6) To lie =df to (i) make a believed-false or believed-not-true statement to another person; (ii) believe that the conditions are such that the other person is justified in believing that the statement is believed to be true by the person making the statement; (iii) believe that the conditions are such that the other person is justified in believing that the person making the statement intends to contribute causally to the other person believing that the statement is believed to be true by the person making the statement. (Chisholm and Feehan 1977; cf. Guenin 2005)

According to L6 it not possible to lie if the speaker believes that the conditions are such that the hearer is not justified in believing that the speaker is making a truthful statement. Kant provides an example in which a thief grabs a victim by the throat and asks him where he keeps his money. If the victim were to make the untruthful statement, “I have no money,” Kant says that this is not a lie, “for the other knows that… he also has no right whatever to demand the truth from me” (Kant 1997, 203; but see Mahon 2009). Chisholm and Feehan hold that the victim is not making an assertion, and hence, is not lying, given that the victim believes that the thief is not justified in believing that the victim is being truthful (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 154–155; but see Strudler 2009 (cf. Strudler 2005; 2010), for the argument that the thief can believe that the victim is credible, even if not trustworthy, because he is motivated by the threat of violence).

Charles Fried also holds that lying requires an assertion and a breach of faith, but he rejects L6, arguing that it is possible for the victim to lie to the thief in Kant’s example (Fried 1978, 55 n1). According to him, making an assertion involves making a statement and intending to cause belief in the truth of that statement by giving an implicit “warranty”or an implicit promise or assurance that the statement is true” (Fried 1978, 57). When one asserts, one intends to “invite belief, and not belief based on the evidence of the statement so much as on the faith of the statement” (Fried 1978, 56). A lie is simply an untruthful assertion. The speaker intends to cause belief in the truth of a statement that the speaker believes to be false. Hence, a lie involves an intention to deceive. The speaker implicitly assures or promises the hearer that the statement that is made is true. Hence, the speaker is giving an insincere assurance, or breaking a promise— “in lying the promise is made and broken at the same moment”— and every lie involves a “breach of trust” (Fried 1978, 67).

Fried’s definition of lying may be stated as follows (modified to include cases in which speakers only intend to deceive about their beliefs):

  • (L7) To lie =df to (i) make a believed-false statement to another person; (ii) intend that that other person believe that the statement is true [and that the statement is believed to be true] [or intend that the other person believe that the statement is believed to be true]; (iii) implicitly assure the other person that the statement is true; (iv) intend that that other person believe that the statement is true [and that the statement is believed to be true] [or intend that the other person believe that the statement is believed to be true] on the basis of this implicit assurance. (Fried 1978)

David Simpson also holds that lying requires an assertion and a breach of faith. In asserting “we present ourselves as believing something while and through invoking (although not necessarily gaining) the trust of the one” to whom we assert (Simpson 1992, 625). This “invocation of trust occurs through an act of ‘open sincerity’” according to which “we attempt to establish… both that we believe some proposition and that we intend them to realize that we believe it” (Simpson 1992, 625). Lying is “insincere assertion” in the sense that “the asserter’s requisite belief is missing” (Simpson 1992, 625). This entails that someone who lies aims to deceive in three ways. First, “we have the intention that someone be in error regarding some matter, as we see the fact of the matter” (Simpson 1992, 624). This is the “primary deceptive intention” (Simpson 1992, 624). Second, we intend to deceive the other person “regarding our belief regarding that matter… We don’t lie about this belief, but we intend to deceive regarding it” (Simpson 1992, 624). We intend that they be deceived, about whatever matter it is, on the basis of their being deceived about our belief in this matter. Finally, someone who lies “insincerely invokes trust” (Simpson 1992, 625). We intend that they be deceived about our belief in this matter on the basis of this insincere invocation of trust. Other forms of intended deception that are not lies do not attempt to deceive “by way of a trust invoked through an open sincerity” (Simpson 1992, 626). This is what makes lies special: “it involves a certain sort of betrayal” (Simpson 1992, 626).

Since it is possible to lie without having the primary deceptive intention, Simpson’s definition needs to be modified accordingly:

  • (L8) To lie =df to: (i) make a statement to another person; (ii) lack belief in the truth of the statement; (iii) intend that the other person believe: (a) that the statement is true and that the statement is believed to be true [or (b) that the statement is believed to be true]; (iv) intend that the other person believe: (c) that it is intended that the other person believe that the statement is true; (d) that it is intended that the other person believe that the statement is believed to be true; (v) invoke trust in the other person that the statement is believed to be true by means of an act of ‘open sincerity’; (vi) intend that the other person believe (a), or (b), on the basis of (v). (Simpson 1992)

Paul Faulkner holds that lying necessarily involves telling someone something, which necessarily involves invoking trust. He distinguishes between telling and making an assertion, and argues that in certain cases the implication of my assertion “is sufficiently clear that I can be said to have told you this” (Faulkner 2013, 3102) even if I did not assert this. He defines telling as follows: “x tells y that p if and only if (i) x intends that y believe that p, and (ii) x intends that y believe that p because y recognizes that (i)” (Faulkner 2013, 3103). In telling another person something, the speaker intends that the hearer believe what she is stating or implying, but she intends that the hearer believe what she is stating or implying for the reason thaty [the hearer] believes x [the speaker]” (Faulkner 2013, 3102). It follows that tellings “operate by invoking an audience’s trust” (Faulkner 2013, 3103). In lying, the speaker intends that the hearer believe what she is stating or implying on the basis of trust: “In lying, a speaker does not intend his audience accept his lie because of independent evidence but intends his audience accept his lie because of his telling it. The motivation for presenting his assertion as sincere is to thereby ensure that an audience treats his intention that the audience believe that p as a reason for believing that p” (Faulkner, 2007, 527) A lie is an untruthful telling. The speaker believes that what she asserts or implies is false, she intends that the hearer believe that what she states or implies is true, she intends that the hearer believe that she intends this, and she intends that this be the reason that the hearer believes that what she states or implies is true: “x’s utterance U to y is a lie if and only if (i) in uttering U, x tells y that p, and (ii) x believes that p is false” (Faulkner 2013, 3103).

Faulkner’s definition of lying also needs to be modified to include cases in which speakers only intend to deceive about their beliefs:

  • (L9) To lie =df to (i) utter some proposition to another person; (ii) believe that the proposition is false; (iii) intend that the other person believe that the proposition is true and is believed to be true [or intend that the other person believe that the proposition is believed to be true]; (iv) intend that the other person believe that it is intended that the other person believe that the proposition is true; (v) intend that the other person believe that the proposition is true and is believed to be true [or intend that the other person believe that the proposition is believed to be true] for the reason that it is intended that the other person believe that the proposition is true. (Faulkner 2007; 2013)

It is an implication of Complex Deceptionist definitions of lying that certain cases of putative lies are not lies because no assertion is made. Consider the following case of an (attempted) confidence trick double bluff (Newey 1997, 98). Sarah, with collaborator Charlie, wants to play a confidence trick on Andrew. She wants Andrew to buy shares in Cadbury. She decides to deceive Andrew into thinking that Kraft is planning a takeover bid for Cadbury. Sarah knows that Andrew distrusts her. If she tells him that Kraft is planning a takeover bid for Cadbury, he will not believe her. If she tells him that there is no takeover bid, in an (attempted) double bluff, he might believe the opposite of what she says, and so be deceived. But this simple double bluff is too risky on its own. So Sarah gets Charlie, whom Andrew trusts, to lie to him that Kraft is about to launch a takeover bid for Cadbury. She also gets Charlie to tell Andrew that she believes that it is false that Kraft is about to launch a takeover bid for Cadbury. Sarah then goes to Andrew, and tells him, “Kraft is about to launch a takeover bid for Cadbury.” She does not intend that Andrew believe that she believes that Kraft is about to launch a takeover bid for Cadbury. However, she intends that he believe that she is mistaken, and that in fact Kraft is about to launch a takeover bid for Cadbury. As a result, he will be deceived.

According to L6, L7, L8, and L9, Sarah is not lying, because she is not asserting anything. According to Simpson, for example, Sarah would only be “pretending to invoke trust” (Simpson 1992, 628), and would not be invoking trust. In such a case, the speaker intends to represent himself as “intending to represent himself as believing what he does not” (Simpson 1992, 628). In order to lie, “one must pretend sincerity, but also act on an intention that this sincerity be accepted—otherwise one is pretending to lie, and not lying” (Simpson 1992, 629). Sarah would be merely pretending to lie to Andrew, in order to (actually) deceive him.

Another case of a putative lie that is not a lie according to Complex Deceptionist definitions of lying is a triple bluff (cf. Faulkner 2007, 527). Imagine an even more devious Pavel, from the example above, telling an openly distrustful Trofim, in response to Trofim's question, that he is going to “Pinsk.” He is actually going to Minsk, but he answers“Pinsk” in order to have Trofim believe that he is attempting a double bluff. If it works, Trofim will respond by telling him “Liar! You say you are going to Pinsk in order to make me believe you are going to Minsk. But I know you are going to Pinsk.” According to L6, L7, L8, and L9, Pavel is not lying to Trofim. He is pretending to attempt to deceive him with a double bluff, in order to actually attempt to deceive him with a triple bluff. At no point is he invoking trust, and breaching that trust.

2.3 Moral Deceptionism

Moral Deceptionists hold that in addition to an intention to deceive, lying requires the violation of a moral right of another, or the moral wronging of another.

According to Chisholm and Feehan, every lie is a violation of the right of a hearer, since “It is assumed that, if a person x asserts a proposition p to another person y, then y has the right to expect that x himself believes p. And it is assumed that x knows, or at least that he ought to know, that, if he asserts p to y, while believing himself that p is not true, then he violates this right of y’s” (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 153, [variables have been changed for uniformity]). Nevertheless, it is not part of their definition of lying that lying involves the violation of the right of another person. According to most philosophers, the claim that lying is (either defeasibly or non-defeasibly) morally wrong is “a synthetic judgment and not an analytic one” (Kemp and Sullivan 1993, 153). However, ‘lie’ is considered by some philosophers to be a thick ethical term that it both describes a type of action and morally evaluates that type of action negatively (Williams 1985, 140). For some philosophers, “the wrongfulness of lying is… built into the definition of the term” (Kemp and Sullivan 1993, 153). For these philosophers, the claim that lying is (either defeasibly or non-defeasibly) morally wrong is a tautology (Margolis 1962).

According to Hugo Grotius, it is part of the meaning of ‘lie’ when it is “strictly taken” that it involves “the Violation of a Real right” of the person lied to, namely, “the Freedom of him… to judge” (Grotius 2005, 1212). One can only lie to someone who possesses this right to exercise liberty of judgment. Grotius’s definition lying is therefore as follows (modified accordingly):

  • (L10) To lie =df to make a believed-false statement to another person, with the intention that that other person believe that statement to be true (or believe that the statement is believed to be true, or both), violating that person’s right to exercise liberty of judgment. (Grotius 2005)

According to L10, one cannot lie to “Children or Madmen,” for example, since they lack the right of liberty of judgment (Grotius 2005, 1212). One cannot lie to someone who has given “express Consent” to be told untruths, since he has given up the right to exercise his liberty of judgment about these matters (Grotius 2005, 1214). One cannot lie to someone who by “tacit Consent” or presumed consent “founded upon just Reason” has given up the right to exercise his liberty of judgment about some matter, “on account of the Advantage, that he shall get by it,” such as when “a Person… comforts his sick Friend, by making him believe what is false,” since “no Wrong is done to him that is willing” (Grotius 2005, 1215–1217). Furthermore, “he who has an absolute Right over all the Rights of another,” is not lying when he “makes use of that Right, in telling something false, either for his particular Advantage, or for the publick Good” (Grotius 2005, 1216–1218). The right to exercise one’s liberty of judgment can also be taken away in cases “When the life of an innocent Person, or something equal to it,” is at stake, or when “the Execution of a dishonest Act be otherwise prevented” (Grotius 2005, 1221). In such a case, the person has forfeited his right, and “speaking falsely to those—like thieves—to whom truthfulness is not owed cannot be called lying” (Bok 1978, 14).

Alan Donagan also incorporates moral conditions into his definition of lying (modified to include cases in which speakers only intend to deceive about their beliefs):

  • (L11) To lie =df to freely make a believed-false statement to another fully responsible and rational person, with the intention that that other person believe that statement to be true [or the intention that that other person believe that that statement is believed to be true, or both]. (Donagan 1977)

According to L11, it is not possible to lie to “children, madmen, or those whose minds have been impaired by age or illness” (Donagan 1977, 89), since they are not fully responsible and rational persons. It is also not possible to lie to “a would-be murderer who threatens your life if you will not tell him where his quarry has gone” (Donagan 1977, 89), and in general when you are acting under duress in any way (such as a witness in fear of his life on the witness stand, or a victim being robbed by a thief), since statements made in such circumstances are not freely made.

It has been objected that these moral deceptionist definitions are unduly narrow and restrictive (Bok 1978). Surely, for example, it is possible to lie to a would-be murderer, whether is impermissible, as some absolutist deontologists maintain (Augustine 1952; Aquinas 1972 (cf. MacIntyre 1995b); Kant 1996 (cf. Mahon 2006); Newman 1880; Geach 1977; Betz 1985; Pruss 1999; Tollefsen 2014), or permissible (i.e., either optional or obligatory), as consequentialists and moderate deontologists maintain (Constant 1964; Mill 1863; Sidgwick 1981; Bok 1978; MacIntyre 1995a; cf. Kagan 1998).

It has also been objected that these moral deceptionist definitions are morally lax (Kemp and Sullivan 1993, 158–9). By rendering certain deceptive untruthful statements to others as non-lies, they make it permissible to act in a way that would otherwise be open to moral censure. In general, even those philosophers who hold that all lies have an inherent negative weight, albeit such that it can be overridden, and hence, who hold that lying is defeasibly morally wrong, do not incorporate moral necessary conditions into their definitions of lying (Bok 1978; Kupfer 1982; cf. Wiles 1988).

2.4 Non-Deceptionism

Non-Deceptionists hold that an intention to deceive is not necessary for lying. Because they dispense with the condition of an intention to deceive, they require a further condition, in addition to untruthfulness, in order to differentiate lying from being ironic, acting, etc. For some some non-deceptionists, that condition is warranting the truth of the untruthful statement. For other non-deceptionists, that condition is making an assertion.

Thomas Carson holds that it is possible to lie by making a false and untruthful statement to an addressee without intending to deceive the addressee, so long as the statement is made in a context such that one “warrants the truth” of the statement (and one does not believe oneself to be not warranting the truth of the statement), or one intends to warrant the truth of the statement:

  • (L12) A person x tells a lie to another person y iff (i) x makes a false statement p to y, (ii) x believes that p is false or probably false (or, alternatively, x does not believe that p is true), (iii) x states p in a context in which x thereby warrants the truth of p to y, and (iv) x does not take herself to be not warranting the truth of what she says to y. (Carson 2006, 298; 2010, 30)
  • (L13) A person x tells a lie to another person y iff (i) x makes a false statement p to y, (ii) x believes that p is false or probably false (or, alternatively, x does not believe that p is true), and (iii) x intends to warrant the truth of p to y. (Carson 2010, 37)

Carson includes the falsity condition in both of his definitions; however, he is prepared to modify both definitions so that the falsity condition is not required (Carson 2010, 39). He also holds that the stronger untruthfulness condition is not stringent enough, since, if a speaker simply does “not believe” her statement to be true (but does not believe it to be false), or believes that her statement is “probably false” (but does not believe it to be false), then she is lying.

Carson gives two examples of non-deceptive lies: a guilty student who tells a college dean that he did not cheat on an examination, without intending that the dean believe him (since “he is really hard-boiled, he may take pleasure in thinking that the Dean knows he is guilty”), because he knows that the dean’s policy is not to punish a student for cheating unless the student admits to cheating, and a witness who provides untruthful (and false) testimony about a defendant, where there is a preponderance of evidence against the defendant, without the intention that the testimony be believed by anyone, in order to avoid suffering retaliation from the defendant and/or his henchmen (Carson 2006, 289; 2010, 21). Neither person is lying according to the definitions of lying of Simple Deceptionists (L1, L2, L3, L4, and L5) or Complex Deceptionists (L6, L7, L8, and L9) (cf. Simpson 1992, 631) or Moral Deceptionists (L10, L11). Both are lying according to L12 and L13, because each warrants the truth of his statement, even though neither intends to deceive his addressee.

It has been argued that the witness and the student do have an intention to deceive (Meibauer 2011, 282; 2014a, 105). It has also been argued that they are being deceptive, even if they lack an intention that their untruthful statements be believed to be true (Lackey 2013; but see Fallis 2015). However, it may also be argued that they fail to warrant the truth of their statements.

Carson has said that “If one warrants the truth of a statement, then one promises or guarantees, ether explicitly or implicitly, that what one says is true” (Carson 2010, 26) and “Warranting the truth of a statement presupposes that the statement is being used to invite or influence belief. It does not make sense for one to guarantee the truth of something that one is not inviting or influencing others to believe” (Carson 2010, 36). The result is that to lie is to breach or betray trust: “To lie, on my view, is to invite others to trust and rely on what one says by warranting its truth, but, at the same time, to betray that trust by making false statements that one does not believe” (Carson 2010, 34). The combination of warranting the truth of one’s statement and breaching trust would appear to make Carson’s definition of lying similar to that of Complex Deceptionists such as Chisholm and Feehan. It would also appear to produce similar results. For example, Carson says the following about negotiators:

In the US, it is common and often a matter of course for people to deliberately misstate their bargaining positions during negotiations. Such statements are lies according to standard dictionary definitions of lying—they are intentional false statements intended to deceive others. However, given my first definition of lying [L12], such cases are not lies unless the negotiator warrants the truth of what he says… Suppose that two “hardened” cynical negotiators who routinely misstate their intentions, and do not object to when others do this to them, negotiate with each other. Each person recognizes that the other party is a cynical negotiator, and each is aware of the fact that the other party knows this. In this sort of case, statements about one’s minimum or maximum price are not warranted to be true. (Carson 2010, 191)

If a negotiator makes an untruthful statement, “That is the highest I can go,” to another negotiator, then, since the negotiator believes that the other negotiator believes that he is making an untruthful statement, he cannot intend to warrant the truth of his statement, and/or the context (of negotiation) is such that he is not warranting the truth of his statement. As a result, he is is not lying, according to L12. He is not lying according to L13, either, at least if it is true that you cannot “intend to do something that you do not expect to succeed at” (Fallis 2009, 43 n 48; cf. Newey 1997, 96–97).

It seems that the same thing can be said about the student and the witness. If the student believes that the dean already knows he is guilty, and if the witness believes that the jury, etc., already knows that the defendant is guilty, then it seems that neither can intend to warrant the truth of his statement, and/or the context is such that neither is warranting the truth of his statement. If this is so, then neither is lying according to L12 and L13. Carson has said, about their Complex Deceptionist definition of lying, “Chisholm and Feehan’s definition has the very odd and unacceptable result that a notoriously dishonest person cannot lie to people who he knows distrust him” (Carson 2010, 23). It does seem, however, that Carson’s definition has the same result.

Jennifer Saul also holds that it is possible to lie without intending to deceive. She has provided a modified version of L12 that combines the warranting context condition, and the not believing that one is not warranting condition, in the single condition of believing that one is in a warranting context:

  • (L14) If the speaker is not the victim of linguistic error/malapropism or using metaphor, hyperbole, or irony, then they lie iff (i) they say that p; (ii) they believe p to be false; (iii) they take themselves to be in a warranting context. (Saul 2012, 3)

According to Saul, it is not possible to lie if one does not believe that one is in a warranting context. Saul considers the case of a putative lie told in a totalitarian state: “This is the case of utterances demanded by a totalitarian state. These utterances of sentences supporting the state are made by people who don’t believe them, to people who don’t believe them. Everyone knows that false things are being said, and that they are only being said only because they are required by the state. […] It seems somewhat reasonable to suggest that, since everyone is forced to make these false utterances, and everyone knows they are false, they cease to be genuine lies” (Saul 2012, 9). Saul adds that “People living in a totalitarian state, making pro-state utterances, are a trickier case (which they should be). Whether or not their utterances are made in contexts where a warrant of truth is not at all clear” (Saul 2012, 11). If a speaker is making an untruthful statement to a hearer, and “Everyone knows that false things are being said,” that is, the speaker knows that the hearer knows that the speaker is being untruthful, then the speaker does not believe that she is in a warranting context. According to L14, the speaker is not lying. However, it is arguable that in both the student and the witness cases, “Everyone knows that false things are being said,” and hence, that the speaker does not believe that he is in a warranting context. If this is so, then according to L14, neither the student nor the witness is lying.

Roy Sorensen agrees with Carson that lying does not require an intention to deceive, and that there can be non-deceptive “bald-faced” lies (Sorensen 2007) and “knowledge-lies” (Sorensen 2010). However, he rejects L12, since it entails that one cannot lie when the falsity of what one is stating is common knowledge: “Carson’s definition of lying does not relieve the narrowness. The concept of warrant is not broad enough to explain how we can lie in the face of common knowledge. One can warrant p only if p might be the case. When the falsehood of p is common knowledge, no party to the common knowledge can warrant p because p is epistemically impossible” (Carson 2007, 254). According to Sorensen, a negotiator who tells “a falsehood that will lead to better coordination between buyer and seller” is telling a bald-faced lie (Sorensen 2007, 262).

Sorensen defines lying as follows: “Lying is just asserting what one does not believe” (Sorensen 2007, 256). It is a condition on telling a lie that one makes an assertion. Sorensen differentiates between assertions and non-assertions according to “narrow plausibility”: “To qualify as an assertion, a lie must have narrow plausibility. Thus, someone who only had access to the assertion might believe it. This is the grain of truth behind ‘Lying requires the intention to deceive.’ Bald-faced lies show that assertions do not need to meet a requirement of wide plausibility, that is, credibility relative to one’s total evidence” (Sorensen 2007, 255).

Sorensen provides, as examples of assertions, and hence, lies, the servant of a maestro telling an unwanted female caller that the sounds she hears over the phone are not the maestro and that the servant is merely “dusting the piano keys,” and a doctor in an Iraqi hospital during the Iraq war telling a journalist who can see patients in the ward in uniforms that “I see no uniforms” (Sorensen 2007, 253). The claim that these are assertions, however, and therefore lies, is controversial. These statements neither express the speaker’s belief, nor aim to affect the belief of the addressee in any way, since their falsehood is common knowledge (cf. Williams 2002, 74). As it has been said: “Sorensen does not offer a definition of asserting a proposition (with necessary and sufficient conditions)… To the extent that he does not fully analyze the concept of assertion, Sorensen’s definition of lying is unclear” (Carson 2010, 36).

Don Fallis also holds that it is possible to lie without intending to deceive. He has also defended the assertion condition for lying: “you lie when you assert something that you believe to be false” (Fallis 2009, 33). He has held that you assert something when you you make a statement and you believe that you are in a situation in which the Gricean norm of conversation, ‘Do not say what you believe to be false,’ is in effect. His definition of lying was thus as follows:

You lie to x if and only if (i) you state that p to x, (2) you believe that you make this statement in a context where the following norm of conversation is in effect: Do not make statements that you believe to be false, and (iii) you believe that p is false. (Fallis 2009, 34).

Counterexamples to this definition (Pruss 2012; Faulkner 2013; Stokke 2013a) have prompted a revision of this definition in order to accommodate these counterexamples:

  • (L15) You lie if and only if you say that p, you believe that p is false (or at least that p will be false if you succeed in communicating that p), and you intend to violate the norm of conversation against communicating something false by communicating that p (Fallis 2012, 569)
  • (L16) You lie if and only if you say that p, you believe that p is false (or at least that p will be false if you succeed in communicating that p), and you intend to communicate something false by communicating that p. (Fallis 2012, 569)

Both L15 and L16 are able to accommodate the following counterexample to the earlier definition: “when Marc Antony said to the Roman people, “Brutus is an honorable man”… the citizens of Rome know that (a) Antony did not believe that Brutus was an honorable man, that (b) Antony was subject to a norm against saying things that he believed to be false, and that (c) Antony had been a cooperative participant in the conversation so far. Thus, they were led to conclude that Antony was flouting the norm in order to communicate something other than what he literally uttered. In fact, the best explanation of his statement was that he wanted to communicate the exact opposite of what he literally uttered” (Fallis 2012, 567). Since Antony does not intend to violate the norm of conversation against communicating something that he believes to be false (that Brutus is an honorable man) by saying “Brutus is an honorable man,” or, more simply, since Antony does not intend to communicate something false with his untruthful statement, it follows that Antony is not lying. However, in the case of a guilty witness, Tony, against whom there is overwhelming evidence, who says “I did not do it,” without the intention that anyone believe him, he does intend to violate the norm of conversation against communicating something that he believes to be false (that he did not do it) by saying “I did not do it,” or, more simply, he does intend to communicate something believed-false with his untruthful statement, even though he does not intend that anyone believe this.

It has been contended that non-deceptive liars do not intend to communicate anything believed-false with their untruthful statements, and, indeed, may even intend to communicate something believed-true with their untruthful statements (Dynel 2011, 151). Fallis rejects the claim that non-deceptive liars do not intend to communicate anything believed-false, even if they intend to communicate something believed-true: “Bald-faced liars might want to communicate something true. For instance, Tony may be trying to communicate to the police that that they will never convict him. But that does not mean that he does not also intend to communicate something false in violation of the norm. He wants what he actually said to be understood and accepted for purposes of the conversation. It is not as if “I did not do it” is simply a euphemism for “You’ll never take me alive, coppers!” (Fallis 2012, 572 n 24). However, in the case of polite untruths, such as “Madam is not at home,” the untruthful statement is simply a euphemism: “For example, the words “She is not at home,” delivered by a servant or a relative at the door, have become a mere euphemism for indisposition or disinclination” (Isenberg 1973, 256). In the case of polite untruths, it seems, there is no intention to communicate anything believed-false. In the case of the servant who tells the female caller, “I’m dusting the piano keys,” or the Iraqi doctor who tells the journalist “I see no uniforms,” or the negotiator who tells the other negotiator “That is the highest I can go,” or the person living in the totalitarian state who makes the pro-state utterance, it is also arguable that there is no intention to communicate anything believed-false. If this is true, then there is some support for the claim that non-deceptive liars do not intend to communicate anything believed-false with their untruthful statements, and hence, that they are not lying according to L15 or L16.

Andreas Stokke also holds that it is possible to lie without intending to deceive. He has also defended the assertion condition for lying: “you lie when you assert something you believe to be false” (Stokke 2013a, 33). According to Stokke, to “assert that p is to say that p and thereby propose that p become common ground” (Stokke 2013a, 47). A proposition, p, becomes common ground in a group “if all members accept (for the purpose of the conversation) that p, and all believe that all believe that all accept that p, etc.” (Stokke 2013a, 49, quoting Stalnaker 2002, 716). Stokke thus defines lying as follows:

  • (L17) x lies to y if and only if … x says that p to y, and … x proposes that p become common ground, and … x believes that p is false. (Stokke 2013a, 49)

In the case of a speaker making an ironic untruthful statement, the speaker does not propose that the believed-false proposition (e.g., “Brutus is an honorable man”) become common ground (Stokke 2013a, 50). However, in the case of a non-deceptive liar, the speaker does propose that the believed-false proposition (e.g., “I did not cheat”) become common ground (Stokke 2013a, 52). The fact that in the case of a non-deceptive lie it is common knowledge that what the speaker is saying is (believed to be) false does not alter the fact that the speaker is proposing that the believed-falsehood become common ground. Indeed, even if the (believed) truth is initially common ground, before the speaker proposes that the believed-falsehood become common ground, it is still the case that the non-deceptive liar is proposing to “update the common ground with her utterance” (Stokke 2013a, 54). For example, in the case of the student and the dean, “The student wants herself and the Dean to mutually accept that she did not plagiarize” (Stokke 2013a, 54).

It is possible to argue that Stokke’s account of assertion, and hence L17, is faced with a dilemma when it comes to non-deceptive lies. Either, in the case of a non-deceptive lie, the speaker does propose that the believed-false proposition become common ground, but becoming common ground is too weak to count as asserting, or becoming common ground is strong enough to count as asserting, but, in the case of a non-deceptive lie, the speaker does not propose that the believed-false proposition become common ground. Stokke considers Stalnaker’s example of a guest at a party saying to another guest, “The man drinking a martini is a philosopher,” and of the two guests proceeding to talk about the philosopher, when it is common knowledge that the drink in question is not a martini. About this example Stalnaker says: “perhaps it is mutually recognized that it is not a martini, but mutually recognized that both parties are accepting that it is a martini. The pretense will be rational if accepting the false presupposition is an efficient way to communicate something true” (Stalnaker 2002, 718). However, if proposing that a believed-false proposition become common ground can mean engaging in and sustaining a “pretence,” possibly in order to communicate truths, then it is not clear that this counts as making an assertion. Hence, a non-deceptive liar may be proposing that her believed-false proposition become common ground without this being an act of making an assertion. Alternatively, if proposing that a believed-false proposition become common ground means something more than this, such that the speaker intends or wants herself and her hearer “to mutually accept” her believed-false proposition, then it is not clear that a non-deceptive liar intends or wants this. If this is correct, then non-deceptive lies fail to be lies according to L17.

3. Traditional Definition of Deception

The dictionary definition of deception is as follows: “To cause to believe what is false” (OED 1989). There are several problems with this definition, however (Barnes 1997; Mahon 2007; Carson 2010). The principal problem is that it is too broad in scope. On this definition, mere appearances can deceive, such as when a white object looks red in a certain light (Faulkner, 2013). Furthermore, it is possible for people to inadvertently deceive others. If Steffi believes that there is a talk on David Lewis and the Christians on Friday, and she tells Paul that “There is a talk on Lewis and the Christians on Friday,” and as a result Paul believes that there is a talk on C. S. Lewis and the Christians on Friday, then Steffi has deceived Paul. Also, it is possible for people to mistakenly deceive other people. If Steffi mistakenly believes that there is not a philosophy talk on Friday, and she tells Paul that there is not a philosophy talk on Friday, and he believes her, then then Steffi has deceived Paul.

Although some philosophers hold that deceiving may be inadvertent or mistaken (Demos 1960; Fuller 1976; Chisholm and Feehan 1977; Adler 1997; Gert 2005), many philosophers have argued that it is not possible to deceive inadvertently or mistakenly (Linsky 1970; van Horne 1981; Barnes 1997; Carson 2010; Saul 2012; Faulkner 2013). They hold that deception, like lying, is intentional. They reserve term “mislead” to cover cases of causing false beliefs either intentionally or unintentionally (Carson 2010, 47).

A modified version of the dictionary definition that does not allow for either inadvertent or mistaken deceiving is as follows:

  • (D1) To deceive =df to intentionally cause to have a false belief that is known or believed to be false.

D1 may be taken as the traditional definition of deception, at least in the case of other-deception (Baron 1988, 444 n. 2). As contrasted with ‘lying,’ ‘deceive’ is an achievement or success verb (Ryle 1949, 130). An act of deceiving is not an act of deceiving unless a particular result is achieved. According to D1, that result is a false belief. Note that D1 is not restricted to the deception of other persons by other persons; it applies to anything that is capable of having beliefs, such as (possibly) chimpanzees, dogs, and infants.

There is no statement condition for deception. In addition to deceiving by means of lying, it is possible to deceive using natural or causal signs (indices), such as packing a bag as though one were going on a holiday, in order to catch a thief (Kant 1997, 202). It is possible to deceive by using signs that work by resemblance (icons), for example by posting a smiley face emoticon about a news item that one is actually unhappy about. Finally, it is possible to deceive by non-linguistic conventional signs (symbols), such as wearing a wedding ring when one is not married, or wearing a police uniform when one is not a police officer. It is also possible for a person to deceive by cursing, making an interjection or an exclamation, issuing a command or an exhortation, asking a question, saying “Hello,” and so forth. It is also possible to deceive by omitting to make certain statements, or by remaining silent.

There is also no untruthfulness condition for deception. It is possible to deceive by making a truthful and true statement that intentionally implies a falsehood. This is a palter. Palters include Bill Clinton stating “There is no improper relationship,” with the intention that it believed that there was never an improper relationship (Saul 2012, 30), greeting a famous person by his or her first name with the intention that other people believe that you are a close friend of his, or making a reservation for a restaurant or a hotel as “Dr.,” intending to be believed to be a (typically wealthier) physician rather than a (typically less wealthy) academic (Schauer and Zeckhauser 2009, 44). If Pavel truthfully and truly tells Trofim that he is going to Pinsk, with the intention that the distrustful Trofim believe falsely that Pavel is going to Minsk, and as a result Trofim believes falsely that Pavel is going to Minsk, then Pavel deceives Trofim (a double bluff). It is also possible to deceive using truthful statements that are not assertions, such as jokes, ironic statements, and even the lines of a play delivered on stage, so long as the intention to deceive can be formed. If, for example, I am asked if I stole the money, and I reply in an ironic tone, “Yeah, right, of course I did,” when I did steal the money, intending that I be believed to have not stolen the money, and if I am believed, then I have deceived using a truthful statement (it is unclear if such cases of “telling the truth falsely” (Frank 2009, 57) are to be considered as cases of paltering).

There is also no addressee condition for deception. In addition to deceiving addressees, it is possible to deceive those listening in, as in a bogus disclosure (e.g., deceiving F.B.I. agents secretly known to be listening in on a telephone conversation) or a disclosure (e.g., deceiving NASA handlers openly listening to exchanges between astronauts and their wives in Capricorn One). It is also possible to deceive an addressee about some matter other than the content of the statement made (e.g., making a truthful statement, but faking an accent).

3.1 Objections to the Traditional Definition of Deception

Several objections can be made to D1. One objection is that it is not necessary that the deceiver causes another person to have a false belief that is (truly) believed to be false by the deceiver: “if I intentionally cause you to believe that p where p is false and I neither believe that p is true nor believe that p is false” (Carson 2010, 48) then this is still deception (van Frassen 1988; Barnes 1997; cf. Shiffrin 2014, 13). For example, if Michael has no belief whatsoever regarding the condition of the bridge, but he convinces Gertrude that the bridge is safe, and the bridge happens to be dangerous, then Michael deceives Gertrude about the bridge being safe (van Frassen 1988, 124). Or, if Alyce places a fake rabbit in Evelyn’s garden, in which lives a reclusive rabbit, in order to guarantee that Evelyn believes that she is seeing a rabbit in her garden (one way or the other), and Evelyn sees the fake rabbit, and calls Alyce on the phone and tells her “I am looking at a rabbit in my garden!” then Alyce has deceived Evelyn, even though she cannot believe or know that Evelyn is seeing the fake rabbit rather than the real rabbit (Barnes 1997, 11). Although this objection to D1 is not necessarily compelling (Mahon 2007, 191–2), a modified definition of interpersonal deception that incorporates this objection is as follows:

  • (D2) A person x deceives another person y if and only if x intentionally causes y to believe p, where p is false and x does not believe that p is true. (Carson 2010, 48)

The most common objection to D1 is that it is not necessary that the deceiver intentionally cause another person to have a new false belief. Although this form of deception, according to which a person intentionally brings about “the change from the state of not being deceived… to that of being deceived” (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 144), is the most normal form of deception, it is not the only form. A person may deceive another person by causing that person to continue to have a false belief (Fuller 1976, 21; Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 144; Mahon 2007 189–190; Carson 2010, 50; Shiffrin 2014, 19). This is where, “but for the act” of the deceiver, the person “would have lost or given up” the false belief (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 144), or least have a greater chance of losing the false belief. A modified definition of interpersonal deception that incorporates this objection is the following:

  • (D3) A person x deceives another person y if and only if x intentionally causes y to believe p (or persist in believing p), where p is false and x knows or believes that p is false. (Carson 2010, 50)

A further objection to D1 (and D2 and D3) is that it is not sufficient for deception that a person intentionally causes another person to have a false belief that she truly believes or knows to be false; it must also be that this false belief is caused by evidence, and that the evidence is brought about by the person in order to cause the other person to have the false belief (Linsky 1970, 163; Fuller 1976, 23; Schmitt 1988, 185; Barnes 1997, 14; Mahon 2007). If Andrew intentionally causes Ben to believe (falsely) that there are vampires in England by, for example, operating on Ben’s brain, or giving Ben an electric shock, or drugging Ben, then Andrew does deceive Ben about there being vampires in England. Also, if Andrew causes Ben to believe falsely that there are vampires in England by getting Ben to read a book that purports to demonstrate that there are vampires in England, then Andrew does not deceive Ben about there being vampires in England. However, if Andrew writes a book that purports to demonstrate that there are vampires in England, and Ben reads the book, and as a result Ben comes to believe that there are vampires in England, then Andrew does deceive Ben about there being vampires in England (Fuller 1976). A modified definition of interpersonal deception that incorporates this objection is the following:

  • (D4) To deceive =df to intentionally cause another person to have or continue to have a false belief that is known or truly believed to be false by bringing about evidence on the basis of which the person has or continues to have the false belief. (Mahon 2007, 189–190)

All of the definitions so far considered are definitions of positive deception, where a person “has been caused to add to his stock of false beliefs” or has been caused to continue to have a false belief (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 144). A further objection to D1 (and D2, D3, and D4) is that it is not necessary for deception to cause a new belief or to cause to continue to have a false belief. One can deceive another person by causing the person to cease to have a true belief, or by preventing the person from acquiring a true belief. These are both cases of negative deception, according to which a person “has been caused to lose one of his true beliefs” or been prevented from gaining a true belief (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 143–144). For example, if I intentionally distract someone who is prone to forgetting things irretrievably when distracted, in order to make that person forget something irretrievably, and, as a result, that person loses a (veridical) memory irretrievably, then I have caused him to cease to have a true belief. (In science-fiction the same result can be achieved by using a memory-erasing device, as in the neuralyzer used in the 1997 science-fiction film Men in Black). Also, if I hide a section of the newspaper from someone in order to prevent her from learning about some news item, such as an earthquake in a foreign country that harmed no-one, then I prevented her from acquiring a true belief about a distant earthquake. A modified definition of interpersonal deception that incorporates this objection is the following:

  • (D5) To deceive =df to intentionally cause another person to acquire a false belief, or to continue to have a false belief, or to cease to have a true belief, or to be prevented from acquiring a true belief.

However, this objection to D1 (and D2, D3, and D4) is not necessarily compelling. It may be argued that negative deception is not deception at all. After all, no false belief has been acquired or sustained. It may be argued that to prevent someone from acquiring a true belief is to keep that person in ignorance, or to keep that person “in the dark,” rather than to deceive that person (Mahon 2007, 187–188; cf. Carson 2010, 53). The state of being ignorant is not the same as the state of being mistaken. One may not know what city is the capital city of Estonia (Tallinn); this is different from mistakenly believing that Riga is the capital city of Estonia. Similarly, although it is more unusual, rendering a person ignorant of some matter is not the same as deceiving that person, at least if it results in no false belief. For example, in the 2004 science-fiction film The Eternal Sunshine of the Spotless Mind, people go to Lacuna, Inc., to have their memories of previous relationships, as well their visit, erased. Those who run Lacuna, Inc., make their clients forget things, or render them ignorant of things. They do not deceive them in doing this. Chisholm and Feehan admit that Augustine and Aquinas “do not call it ‘deception’” to “hide the truth” (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 187).

D5 only counts as deception cases of deception “by commission” (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 143–144). According to Chisholm and Feehan, it is also possible to deceive “by omission” (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 143–144). One may allow a person to acquire a false belief, or allow a person to continue with a false belief, or allow a person to cease to have a true belief, or allow a person to continue without a true belief. For example, one may allow a person to read a news story and acquire a belief that one knows is false (e.g., a news story about the CEO of your company resigning for health reasons, when you know he was forced out for mismanagement of funds), and one may allow a person to continue to have a false belief by not correcting the person’s false belief (e.g., not correcting a child’s belief in Santa Claus). Or, for example, one may allow a person to forget a veridical memory by not stopping them from getting distracted, and one may allow a person to continue without knowing about an earthquake that has occurred in a foreign country. According to Chisholm and Feehan, there can positive and negative deception by commission and by omission. A modified definition of interpersonal deception that incorporates this objection is the following:

  • (D6) To deceive =df to intentionally cause another person to acquire a false belief, or to continue to have a false belief, or to cease to have a true belief, or to be prevented from acquiring a true belief, or to intentionally allow another person to acquire a false belief, or to continue to have a false belief, or to cease to have a true belief, or to be prevented from acquiring a true belief.

Finally, D6 only counts as deception actions and omissions that are intentional. According to Chisholm and Feehan, however, deception can be unintentional. A modified definition of interpersonal deception that incorporates this objection is the following:

  • (D7) To deceive =df to cause another person to acquire a false belief, or to continue to have a false belief, or to cease to have a true belief, or be prevented from acquiring a true belief, or to allow another person to acquire a false belief, or to continue to have a false belief, or to cease to have a true belief, or be prevented from acquiring a true belief. (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 145).

The objection to D5 that negative deception is not deception also applies to D6 and D7.

Bibliography

  • Adler, J., 1997. ‘Lying, deceiving, or falsely implicating’, Journal of Philosophy, 94: 435–452.
  • Aquinas, T., ‘Question 110: Lying’, in Summa Theologiae (Volume 41: Virtues of Justice in the Human Community), New York: McGraw-Hill, 1972.
  • Augustine, ‘On Lying,’ trans. M. S. Muldowney (pp. 51–110), and ‘Against Lying,’ trans. H. B. Jaffee (pp. 121–179), in R. J. Deferrari (ed.) Fathers of the Church (Volume 16: Treatises on Various Subjects), New York: Fathers of the Church, 1952.
  • Baron, M., 1988. ‘What Is Wrong with Self-Deception?’, in B. P. McLaughlin and A. Oksenberg Rorty (eds.), Perspectives on Self-Deception, Berkeley: University of California Press, 431–449.
  • Barnes, A., 1997. Seeing through self-deception, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Barnes, J. A., 1994. A Pack of Lies: Towards A Sociology of Lying, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Betz, J., 1985. ‘Sissela Bok on the Analogy of Deception and Violence,’ Journal of Value Inquiry, 19: 217–224.
  • Bok, S., 1978. Lying: Moral Choice in Public and Private Life, New York: Random House.
  • –––, 1998. ‘Truthfulness’, in Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, New York: Routledge, 480–485.
  • Bronston v. United States, 409 U.S. 352 (1973).
  • Carson, T. L. 1988. ‘On the Definition of Lying: A reply to Jones and revisions,’ Journal of Business Ethics, 7: 509–514.
  • –––, 2006. ‘The Definition of Lying,’ Noûs, 40: 284–306.
  • Carson, T. L., R. E. Wokutch, and K. F. Murrmann, 1982. ‘Bluffing in Labor Negotiations: Legal and Ethical Issues,’ Journal of Business Ethics, 1: 13–22.
  • Chisholm, R. M., and T. D. Feehan, 1977. ‘The intent to deceive,’ Journal of Philosophy, 74: 143–159.
  • Cohen, G. A., 2002. ‘Deeper Into Bullshit,’ in Contours of Agency: Essays on Themes from Harry Frankfurt, (eds.) S. Buss and L. Overton. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. 321–339.
  • Coleman, L. and P. Kay, 1981. ‘Prototype Semantics: The English Verb ‘lie,’’ Language, 57: 26–44.
  • Constant, B., 1964. Des réactions politiques, in O. P. di Borgo (ed.), Écrits et discours politiques, Paris: Pauvert.
  • Davidson, D., 1980. ‘Deception and Division,’ in J. Elster (ed.), The Multiple Self, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. 79–92
  • Demos, R., 1960. ‘Lying to Oneself,’ Journal of Philosophy, 57: 588–595.
  • Donagan, A., 1977. A Theory of Morality, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • –––, 1986. ‘Comment on Wheeler,’ Ethics, 96: 876–877.
  • Douglas, J., 1976. Investigative Social Research: Individual and Team Field Research, Beverly Hills: Sage Publications.
  • Dynel, M., 2011. ‘A Web of Deceit: A Neo-Gricean View on Types of Verbal Deception,’ International Review of Pragmatics, 3: 139–167.
  • Ekman, P., 1985. Telling Lies: Clues to Deceit in the Marketplace, Marriage, and Politics, New York: W.W. Norton.
  • Fallis, D., 2009. ‘What is Lying?,’ Journal of Philosophy, 106: 29–56.
  • –––, 2010. ‘Lying and Deception,’ Philosophers’ Imprint, 10: 1–22
  • –––, 2012. ‘Lying as a Violation of Grice’s First Maxim of Quality,’ Dialectica, 66: 563–581.
  • –––, 2013. ‘Davidson was Almost Right about Lying,’ Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 91: 337–353.
  • –––, 2015. ‘Are Bald-Faced Lies Deceptive After All?’ Ratio, 28: 81–96.
  • Faulkner, P., 2007. ‘What is Wrong with Lying?,’ Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 75: 524–547.
  • –––, 2013. ‘Lying and Deceit,’ in International Encyclopedia of Ethics, Hugh Lafollette (ed.), Hoboken, NJ: Wiley-Blackwell, 3101-3109.
  • Feehan, T. D., 1988. ‘Augustine on Lying and Deception,’ Augustinian Studies, 19: 131–139.
  • Frank, M. G., ‘Thoughts, Feelings, and Deception,’ in Brooke Harrington, (ed.), Deception: From Ancient Empires to Internet Dating, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2009. 55–73.
  • Frankfurt, H. G., 1986. ‘On Bullshit,’ Raritan, 6: 81–100.
  • –––, 1999. ‘The Faintest Passion,’ in Necessity, Volition and Love, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2002. ‘Reply to G. A. Cohen,’ in Contours of Agency: Essays on Themes from Harry Frankfurt, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. 340–344.
  • Fried, C., 1978. Right and Wrong, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Fuller, G., 1976. ‘Other-Deception,’ The Southwestern Journal of Philosophy, 7: 21–31.
  • Geach, P., 1977. The Virtues, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gert, B., 2005. Morality: Its Nature and Justification, 6th edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Green, S. P., 2001. ‘Lying, Misleading, and Falsely Denying: How Moral Concepts Inform the Law of Perjury, Fraud, and False Statements,’ Hastings Law Journal, 53: 157–212.
  • Grice, H. P., 1989. Studies in the Ways of Words, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Griffiths, P. J., 2004. Lying: An Augustinian Theology of Duplicity, Grand Rapids, Michigan: Brazos Press.
  • Grotius, H., [LWP]. The Law of War and Peace, F. W. Kelsey (trans.), Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1925.
  • Guenin, L. M., 2005. ‘Intellectual Honesty,’ Synthese, 145: 177–232.
  • Hardin, K. J., 2010. ‘The Spanish notion of Lie: Revisiting Coleman and Kay,’ Journal of Pragmatics, 42: 3199–3213.
  • Isenberg, A., 1973. ‘Deontology and the Ethics of Lying,’ in Aesthetics and Theory of Criticism: Selected Essays of Arnold Isenberg, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1973. 245–264.
  • Jones, G., 1986. ‘Lying and intentions,’ Journal of Business Ethics, 5: 347–349.
  • Kagan, S., 1998. Normative Ethics, Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Kant, I., Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, The Metaphysics of Morals, and On a supposed right to lie from philanthropy, Mary J. Gregor (trans.), in Immanuel Kant, Practical Philosophy, Allen W. Wood and Mary J. Gregor (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • –––, Lectures on Ethics, Peter Heath (trans.), Peter Heath and J. B. Schneewind (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Kemp, K. W. and T. Sullivan, 1993. ‘Speaking Falsely and Telling Lies’, in Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association, 67: 151–170.
  • Krishna, D., 1961. ‘‘Lying’ and the Compleat Robot’, The British Journal of the Philosophy of Science, 12: 146–149.
  • Kupfer, J., 1982. ‘The Moral Presumption Against Lying,’ Review of Metaphysics, 36: 103–126.
  • Lackey, J., 2013. ‘Lies and deception: an unhappy divorce,’ Analysis, 73: 236–248.
  • Leonard, H. S., 1959. ‘Interrogatives, Imperatives, Truth, Falsity and Lies’, Philosophy of Science, 26: 172–186.
  • Lindley, T. F., 1971. ‘Lying and Falsity’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 49: 152–157.
  • Linsky, L., 1963. ‘Deception’, Inquiry, 6: 157–169.
  • MacCormick, N., 1983. ‘What Is Wrong With Deceit?,’ Sydney Law Review, 10: 5–19.
  • MacIntyre, A., 1995a. ‘Truthfulness, Lies, and Moral Philosophers: What Can We Learn from Mill and Kant?’, in The Tanner Lectures on Human Values, Salt Lake City: University of Utah Press, 16: 307–361.
  • –––, 1995b. ‘Lying,’ in T. Honderich (ed.), The Oxford Companion to Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 515.
  • Mahon, J. E., 2003. ‘Kant on Lies, Candour and Reticence,’ Kantian Review, 7: 101–133.
  • –––, 2006. ‘Kant and the Perfect Duty to Others Not to Lie,’ British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 14: 653–685.
  • –––, 2007. ‘A Definition of Deceiving,’ International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 21: 181–194.
  • –––, 2008. ‘Two Definitions of Lying,’ International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 22: 211–230.
  • –––, 2009. ‘The Truth About Kant On Lies,’ in Clancy Martin (ed.), The Philosophy of Deception, New York: Oxford: 201–224.
  • –––, 2014. ‘History of Deception: 1950 to the Present,’ Encyclopedia of Deception, New York: Sage, 618–619.
  • Mannison, D. S., 1969. ‘Lying and Lies,’ Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 47: 132–144.
  • Margolis, J., 1962. ‘“Lying Is Wrong” and “Lying Is Not Always Wrong,”’ Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 23: 414–418.
  • Meibauer, J., 2005. ‘Lying and falsely implicating,’ Journal of Pragmatics, 37: 1373–1399
  • –––, 2011. ‘On lying: intentionality, implicature, and imprecision,’ Intercultural Pragmatics, 8: 277–292.
  • –––, 2014a. Lying at the Semantics-Pragmatics Interface, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • –––, 2014b. ‘A lie that's told with bad intent: Lying and implicit content,’ Belgian Journal of Linguistics, 28: 97–118.
  • Mill, J. S., 1863. Utilitarianism, London: Parker, Son and Bourne.
  • Moore, J. G., 2000. ‘Did Clinton lie?’, Analysis, 60: 250–254.
  • Morris, J., 1976. ‘Can computers ever lie?’, Philosophy Forum, 14: 389–401.
  • Newey, G., 1997. ‘Political Lying: A Defense’, Public Affairs Quarterly, 11: 93–116.
  • Newman, J. H., 1880. Apologia Pro Vita Sua (A Defense of One's Life), Martin J. Svaglic (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • O’Neil, C., 2012. ‘Lying, Trust, and Gratitude,’ Philosophy & Public Affairs, 40: 301–333.
  • Opie, A., 1825. Illustrations of Lying in All Its Branches, London: Longman, Hurst, Rees, Orme, Brown and Green.
  • Oxford English Dictionary, 1989. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • People v. Meza, 188 Cal. App. 3d. 1631 (1987).
  • Pierce, C. S., 1955. ‘Logic as Semiotic: The Theory of Signs,’ in Justus Buchler (ed.), Philosophical Writings of Peirce, New York: Dover Publications, 98–119.
  • Primoratz, I., 1984. ‘Lying and the “Methods of Ethics,”’ International Studies in Philosophy, 16: 35–57.
  • Pruss, A., 1999. ‘Lying and speaking your interlocutor’s language,’ The Thomist, 63: 439–453.
  • –––, 2012. ‘Sincerely asserting what you do not believe,’ Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 90: 541–546.
  • Reboul, A., 1994. ‘The description of lies in speech act theory,’ in H. Parret (ed.), Pretending to Communicate, Berlin: De Gruyter, 292–298.
  • Rotenstreich, N., 1956. ‘On Lying,’ Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 10: 415–437.
  • Russow, L-M., 1986. ‘Deception: A Philosophical Perspective,’ in R. W. Mitchell and N. S. Thompson (eds.) Deception: Perspectives on Human and Non-Human Deceit, Albany: SUNY Press, 41–52.
  • Ryle, G., 1949, The Concept of Mind, London: Hutchinson.
  • Sartre, J-P., 1937. ‘Le Mur’, La Nouvelle Revue Francaise, 286: 38–62.
  • Saul, J., 2000. ‘Did Clinton say something false?,’ Analysis, 60: 255–257.
  • –––, 2012a. ‘Just Go Ahead and Lie,’ Analysis, 72: 3–9.
  • –––, 2012b. Lying, Misleading, and What Is Said, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schauer, F. and Zeckhauser, R., 2009, ‘Paltering,’ in B. Harrington (ed.), Deception: From Ancient Empires to Internet Dating, Stanford: Stanford University Press, pp. 38–54.
  • Schmitt, F. F., 1988. ‘Epistemic Dimensions of Self-Deception,’ in B. McLaughlin and A. O. Rorty (eds.), Perspectives on Self-Deception, Berkeley: University of California Press, pp. 183–204.
  • Scott, G. G., 2006. The Truth About Lying, Lincoln, NE: ASJA Press.
  • Shibles, W., 1985. Lying: A Critical Analysis, Whitewater, Wisconsin: The Language Press.
  • Shiffrin, S. V., 2014. Speech Matters, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Sidgwick, H. [ME], The Methods of Ethics (7th edition), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1981.
  • Siegler, F. A., 1966. ‘Lying,’ American Philosophical Quarterly, 3: 128–136.
  • Simpson, D., 1992. ‘Lying, Liars and Language,’ Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 52: 623–639.
  • Smith, D. L., 2004. Why We Lie: The Evolutionary Roots of Deception and the Unconscious Mind, St. Martin's Press.
  • Solan, L. M. and Tiersma, P. M., 2005. Speaking of Crime: The Language of Criminal Justice, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Sorensen, R., 2007. ‘Bald-Faced Lies! Lying Without The Intent To Deceive,’ Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 88: 251–264.
  • –––, 2010. ‘Knowledge-lies,’ Analysis, 70 (4): 608–615.
  • Stalnaker, R., 2002. ‘Common Ground,’ Linguistics and Philosophy, 25: 701–721.
  • State v. Rosillo, 282 N.W. 2d 872 (Minn. 1979).
  • Stokke, A., 2013a. ‘Lying and Asserting,’ Journal of Philosophy, 110: 33–60.
  • –––, 2013b. ‘Lying, Deceiving, and Misleading,’ Philosophy Compass, 8(4): 348–359.
  • –––, 2014. ‘Insincerity,’ Noûs, 48: 496–520.
  • Strawson, P. F., 1952. Introduction to Logical Theory, London: Methuen.
  • Strudler, A., 2005. ‘Deception Unraveled,’ The Journal of Philosophy, 102: 458–473.
  • –––, 2009. ‘Deception and Trust,’ in Clancy Martin (ed.), The Philosophy of Deception, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 139–152.
  • –––, 2010. ‘The Distinctive Wrong in Lying,’ Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 13: 171–179.
  • Sweetser, E. E., 1987. ‘The definition of lie: An examination of the folk models underlying a semantic prototype,’ in D. Holland and N. Quinn (eds.) Cultural Models in Language and Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 3–66.
  • Tollefsen, C. O., 2014. Lying and Christian Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Van Fraassen, B. C., 1988. ‘The Peculiar Effects of Love and Desire,’ in B. McLaughlin and A. O. Rorty (eds.), Perspectives on Self-Deception, Berkeley: University of California Press, pp. 124–156.
  • Van Horne, W. A., 1981. ‘Prolegomena to a Theory of Deception,’ Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 42: 171–182.
  • Vrij, A., 2000. Detecting Lies and Deceit, Chichester: Wiley.
  • Wiles, A. M., 1988. ‘Lying: Its Inconstant Value,’ Southern Journal of Philosophy, 26: 275–284.
  • Williams, B., 1985. Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2002. Truth and Truthfulness: An Essay in Genealogy, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Wood, D., 1973. ‘Honesty,’ in A. Montefiore (ed.), Philosophy and Personal Relations: An Anglo-French Study, London: Routledge, 192–218.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2015 by
James Edwin Mahon <mahonj@wlu.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free


The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to neh50@neh.gov.