The Definition of Lying and Deception

First published Thu Feb 21, 2008

Questions central to the philosophical discussion of lying to others and other-deception (or interpersonal deceiving) may be divided into two kinds. Questions of the first kind are definitional. They include the questions of how lying is to be defined, and how deceiving is to be defined, and whether lying is a form of intended deception. Questions of the second kind are moral. They include the questions of whether lying and deceiving are (defeasibly) morally wrong, and whether, if either lying or deception, or both, are defeasibly morally wrong, they are ever morally obligatory, and not just merely morally permissible. In this entry, we only consider questions of the first kind.


1. Definition of lying

There is no universally accepted definition of lying to others (Kagan 1998, 113). The OED definition of lying is as follows:

To lie =df to make a false statement with the intention to deceive.

There are several problems with this definition. According to it, a person who makes a statement that she believes to be true — a person who makes a truthful statement — with the intention to deceive another person, is lying, if, unbeknownst to her, the statement is false. For example, if A tells B that there is not a board meeting on Thursday, which A believes to be true, with the intention that B believe there is no board meeting this week, which A believes to be false (since A believes there is a board meeting on Wednesday), then A is lying to B, if A is mistaken, and there is a board meeting on Thursday. Also, according to this definition, conspirators who knowingly make untruthful and false statements to each other, without the intention to deceive each other, but with the intention to deceive eavesdroppers, are lying. Both of these cases are controversial, and it is not clear that we should classify either of these cases as lies.

The most commonly accepted definition of lying that manages to avoid these problems is the following: “I take a lie to be an assertion, the content of which the speaker believes to be false, which is made with the intention to deceive the hearer with respect to that content” (Williams 2002, 96); or, more formally:

To lie =df to make an assertion that is believed to be false to some audience with the intention to deceive the audience about the content of that assertion.

This definition is normally unpacked as follows: “A person lies when he asserts something to another which he believes to be false with the intention of getting the other to believe it to be true” (Kupfer 1982, 104); “[lying is] making a statement believed to be false, with the intention of getting another to accept it as true” (Primoratz 1984, 54n2). More formally:

To lie =df to make a believed-false statement to another person with the intention that that other person believe that statement to be true.

Let us call this the most common definition of lying. According to this definition, there are at least four necessary conditions for lying. First, lying requires that a person make a statement (statement condition). Second, lying requires that the person believe the statement to be false, that is, lying requires that the statement be untruthful (untruthfulness condition). Third, lying requires that the untruthful statement be made to another person (addressee condition). Fourth, lying requires that the person intend that that other person believe the untruthful statement to be true (intention to deceive addressee condition).

These four putative necessary conditions for the most common definition of lying need to be explained, before objections to this definition can be entertained, and before alternative definitions of lying can be considered.

1.1. Statement condition

According to the statement condition of the most common definition of lying, lying requires that a person make a statement. A person may be said to make a statement when a person believes that there is some expression, and some language, such that one of the standard uses of the expression in that language is that of expressing some proposition, and the person utters, writes or signs that expression with the intention that it be believed that she intended to utter (etc.) that expression with that standard use (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 150; Newey 1997, 95). Making a statement therefore requires the use of conventional signs, as opposed to natural or causal signs (Pierce, 1955), since it requires the uttering (etc.) of an expression in a language. It is possible for a person to sign expressions using American Sign Language, smoke signals, Morse code, semaphore flags, and so forth, as well as by making specific bodily gestures whose meanings have been established by convention. Hence, it is possible for a person to make statements by making smoke signals, or by nodding her head in response to a question. Hence, it is possible for a person to lie by making smoke signals, or by nodding her head in response to a question. Insofar as a person is not signing (etc.) an expression in a language when, for example, a person wears a wig or gives a fake smile, it follows that a person cannot be lying by wearing a wig or giving a fake smile, even if the person intends to deceive by these means (Siegler 1966, 128).

Insofar as a person is not signing (etc.) an expression in a language when, for example, she wears a wedding ring when she is not married, or wears a police uniform when she is not a police officer, it follows that a person cannot be lying by wearing a wedding ring when she is not married, or wearing a police uniform when she is not a police officer, even if she intends to deceive by these means. In the case of a person who does not utter (etc.) a declarative sentence, but who, for example, curses, or makes an interjection or an exclamation, or issues a command or an exhortation, or asks a question, or says “Hello”, then, if it is not one of the standard uses of that expression in that language to express some proposition, and the person does not intend that it be believed that she intended to utter (etc.) that expression with that standard use, it follows that she is not making a statement when she does any of these things (but see Leonard 1959). If she is not making a statement when she does any of these things, she cannot be lying when she does any of these things.

Finally, since lying requires that a person utter (etc.) an expression, it is not possible for a person to lie by omission (Mahon 2003, 2006a). That is, it is not possible for a person to lie by omitting to utter (etc.) an expression. It is possible for a person to lie by remaining ‘silent’, if the ‘silence’ is a previously agreed upon signal with others that is equivalent to uttering an expression in a language (Fried 1978, 57). However, such a lie would not be a lie of omission.

1.2. Untruthfulness condition

According to the untruthfulness condition of the most common definition of lying, lying requires that a person make an untruthful statement, which is a statement that the person believes to be false. The condition that the statement be believed to be false is not the condition that the statement be false (Grotius LWP: 611; Krishna 1961, 146). Statements that are untruthful, according to this sense of untruthful, may be true, and statements that are truthful may be false (Bok 1998). If a person who makes a statement does not believe that statement to be false, then, according to this condition, she cannot be lying, even if that statement is false, and she intends the other person to believe it to be true. If A makes the statement to B that “The enemy has weapons of mass destruction”, with the intention that B believe that statement to be true, and that statement is false, then A is not lying, if A does not believe that statement to be false. According to this condition, if the person who makes the statement does not believe the statement to be false, then even if she makes that statement with the intention to deceive another person, she is not lying. Consider the following exchange between two travelers on a train from Moscow (Cohen 2002, 328):

Trofim: “Where are you going?”

Pavel: “To Pinsk.”

Trofim: “Liar! You say you are going to Pinsk in order to make me believe you are going to Minsk. But I know you are going to Pinsk.”

Pavel does not lie to Trofim, since his statement to Trofm is truthful, even if he intends that Trofim believe it to be false, and hence, intends that Trofim be deceived by it.

The untruthfulness condition is to be distinguished from the putative necessary condition for lying that the statement that the person makes be false (falsity condition), which is not a necessary condition for lying for the most common definition. In Jean-Paul Sartre's short-story, The Wall, set during the Spanish Civil War, Pablo Ibbieta, a prisoner sentenced to be executed by the Fascists, is interrogated by his guards as to the whereabouts of his comrade Ramon Gris; mistakenly believing Gris to be hiding with his cousins, he makes the untruthful statement to them that “Gris is hiding in the cemetery”, with the intention that they believe this statement to be true. As it happens, the statement is true. Gris is arrested at the cemetery, and Ibbieta is released (Sartre 1937; cf. Siegler 1966: 130). According to the most common definition, Ibbieta lied to his interrogators, although the untruthful statement he made to them was true, and he did not deceive them about the whereabouts of Gris (Isenberg 1964, 466; Mannison 1969, 138; Lindley, 1971; Kupfer 1982, 104).

One implication of the untruthfulness condition is that if a person makes a statement that she believes to be neither true nor false, then she cannot be lying (Siegler 1966, 133; cf. Strawson 1952, 173). For example, if a person begging for money says “All my children need medical attention”, but believes that this proposition is neither true nor false, because he has no children, then he is not lying, even if he is attempting to deceive (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 155-6; but see Siegler 1966, 135).

1.3. Addressee condition

According to the addressee condition of the most common definition of lying, lying requires that a person make an untruthful statement to another person. That is, lying requires that a person address another person. According to this condition, it is not possible to lie to no one or to an eavesdropper. If A pretends to be talking to another person on the phone, and makes the untruthful statement to no one, “The pick-up is tomorrow at 6:00 p.m.”, with the intention that eavesdropping B believes that statement to be true, then A is not lying, even if A is attempting to deceive. According to this condition, however, it is possible to lie to a general audience. It is possible for a person to lie by sending an untruthful e-mail to everyone on a mailing list, or by publishing an untruthful report about an event (Kant LE, 203), or by making an untruthful statement on a tax return, or by making an untruthful claim in a magazine advertisement or a television commercial.

1.4. Intention to deceive addressee condition

According to the intention to deceive addressee condition of the most common definition of lying, lying requires that a person make an untruthful statement to another person with the intention that that other person believe that statement to be true. That is, there is more to lying than being untruthful. According to this condition, writing fiction, telling tall tales, cracking jokes, making ironic statements, using literally false metaphorical language, playacting, playing devil's advocate, and so forth, without the intention that the addressee believe these untruthful statements to be true, is not lying: “this is somewhat similar to the requirement in law that, to be convicted of fraud, a person must be shown to have intended to defraud his victim” (Morris 1976, 391). According to this condition, lying necessarily involves an intention to communicate with another person by means of a statement. It is not possible to lie to those whom you believe or know to be infants, insane adults, etc., or to dogs, goldfish, etc., who (or which) cannot understand statements made to them.

According to this condition, if a first person makes an untruthful statement to a second person, without the intention that the second person believe that untruthful statement to be true, but with the intention that that second person believe something else to be true, something else that the first person believes to be true, then she is not lying. For example, if A makes the untruthful statement to B, “She is not at home”, without the intention that B believe it to be true that she is not home, but with the intention that B believe it to be true that it is inconvenient for her to see B now, then according to the most common definition, A is not lying (Isenberg 1964, 473); however, for A to intend that B believe this, it must be the case that A believes that this is how B understands “She is not at home”.

According to this condition, it is not merely the case that the person who makes the untruthful statement intends that some other person believe that untruthful statement to be true; the person intends that the addressee believe that untruthful statement to be true. If A makes the untruthful statement “There are no police on the road in front of us” to his accomplice, B, without the intention that B believe that statement to be true, but with the intention that eavesdropping C believe that statement to be true, then A is not lying, since C is not A's addressee (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 156).

According to this condition, it is also not merely the case that the person intends that the addressee believe some statement to be true that the person believes to be false; the person intends that the addressee believe the untruthful statement that is made to the addressee to be true (Williams 2002, 96). If A is a crime boss, and B is one of A's henchmen, whom A secretly believes is a police informant, and A makes the untruthful statement to B “There are no informants in my organization”, without the intention that B believe that statement to be true, but with the intention that B believe something else to be true, namely, that A believes that there are no informants in his organization, then according to the most common definition of lying, A is not lying, since A does not intend that B believe A's untruthful statement to be true. In this example A has, of course, attempted to deceive B.

According to this condition, it is sufficient for lying that the person who makes the untruthful statement intends that the addressee believe the untruthful statement to be true; it is not necessary that the addressee believe the untruthful statement to be true. That is, a lie may be disbelieved. If A makes the untruthful statement to B “I didn’t get any homework today”, with the intention that B believe that statement to be true, and if B does not believe that statement to be true, then A is still lying. According to this condition, ‘lie’ is not an achievement or success verb, and an act of lying is not a perlocutionary act — the existence of an act of lying does not depend upon the production of a particular response or state in the addressee (Mannison 1969, 135; Wood 1973: 199; MacCormick 1983, 9 n. 23).

Finally, according to this condition, lying is neither necessary nor sufficient for perjury. If a person, under oath to testify, declare, depose, or certify truly, before a competent tribunal, officer, or person, willfully makes an untruthful and false statement as to facts material to the hearing (Green 2006, 133), but without the intention that any other person believe that untruthful and false statement to be true, then the person commits perjury, but does not lie. If a person, under oath (etc.), willfully makes an untruthful statement as to facts material to the hearing, with the intention that another person (e.g., members of the grand jury) believe that untruthful statement to be true, and that untruthful statement happens to be true, then the person lies, but does not commit perjury.

1.5. Objections to the definition of lying

A number of objections have been made to the most common definition of lying. These objections are of two kinds. First, objections have been made to each of the necessary conditions being necessary conditions for lying. Second, objections have been made to the necessary conditions being jointly sufficient for lying.

Against the statement condition, it has been objected that the making of a statement is not necessary for lying. Any form of behavior, the function of which is make others form false beliefs or to deprive them of true beliefs, is lying (Vrij 2000, 6; O'Neill 2003 — see Other Internet Resources; Smith 2004, 14). This behavior can simply be a matter of withholding information, without saying anything untruthful (Ekman 1985, 28; Scott 2006, 4).

Against the untruthfulness condition, it has been objected that untruthfulness is not necessary for lying; any statement made with an intention to deceive is a lie, including a believed-true statement that is made with an intention to deceive (Bok 1978, 13; Barnes 1994, 11; Davidson 1980, 88). It has also been objected that it is not necessary for lying that the statement that is made be believed to be false; it is only necessary that the statement that is made be believed not to be true, or be believed to be probably false, or be not believed to be true (Carson 2006, 298).

Against the addressee condition, it has been objected that it is sufficient for lying that an untruthful statement is made; it does not have to be made to anyone, not even to oneself (Shibles 1985: 33; Griffiths 2004, 31). It has also been objected that it is possible to lie to an eavesdropper (Newey 1997, 95), and that it may be possible to lie to an animal or to a “computing machine”, or to what is falsely believed to be another person — for example, an imagined burglar (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 157-8).

Against the intention to deceive addressee condition it has been objected that no intention to deceive is required for lying (Shibles 1985, 33; Kemp and Sullivan 1993, 153; Griffiths 2004, 31 (but see Feehan 1988); Carson et al. 1982; Carson 1988, 2006; Sorensen 2007, 252). If a sworn-in witness in a trial of a violent criminal goes on the record and gives untruthful testimony, without any intention that that testimony be believed to be true by any other person (not the jury, the judge, the lawyers, the audience, etc.), in order to avoid being physically harmed by the defendant or his criminal associates, then the witness is lying (but see Jones 1986).

It has also been objected that even if an intention to deceive the addressee is required for lying, it is not necessary that it be an intention to deceive the addressee about the contents of the untruthful statement (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 152). If A makes the untruthful statement “There are no informants in my organization” to believed informant B, without the intention that B believe that statement to be true, but with the intention that B believe it to be true that A believes that statement to be true, then A is lying.

Objections have also been made to these necessary conditions being jointly sufficient for lying. It has been objected that making an untruthful statement to another person with the intention that that other person believe that untruthful statement to be true is not sufficient for lying, because in addition it is necessary that the untruthful statement be false (falsity condition) (Coleman and Kay 1981, 28; Moore 2000; Saul 2000; Carson 2006, 284).

It has also been objected that making an untruthful statement to another person with the intention that that other person believe that statement to be true is not sufficient for lying, because it is also necessary to have the intention that that other person believe that that statement is believed to be true (believed truthfulness condition) (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 152; Simpson 1992, 625; Frankfurt 1999, 5; Faulkner 2007, 527). If A makes the untruthful statement “I have no change in my pocket” to B, then A is only lying if, in addition to intending that B believe it to be true that A has no money in A's pocket, A intends that B believe that A believes it to be true that A has no money in A's pocket (Frankfurt 1988, 120).

1.6. Alternative definitions of lying

With these objections in mind, a number of alternative definitions of lying have been advanced. One modified version of the most common definition of lying avoids the objection that the four necessary conditions are not sufficient for lying by adding the necessary condition that the person who makes the untruthful statement has the intention that the addressee believe that the person believes the untruthful statement to be true (believed truthfulness condition), which constitutes a second intention to deceive addressee condition (Frankfurt 1988, 1999, 2002; cf. Kupfer 1982, 116):

To lie =df to make a believed-false statement to another person with the intention that that other person believe that statement to be true and the intention that that other person believe that that statement is believed to be true.

A second alternative definition of lying also avoids the objection that the four necessary conditions are not sufficient for lying by adding the second intention to deceive addressee condition (believed truthfulness condition); however, it dispenses with the first intention to deceive addressee condition. It also adds the necessary condition that the person who makes the untruthful statement intends that the addressee believe that the person who makes the untruthful statement intends that the addressee believe that the person who makes the untruthful statement believes the untruthful statement to be true, thus eliminating the possibility of lying to eavesdroppers. Finally, it amends the untruthfulness condition slightly to allow that the statement can be believed not to be true (Chisholm and Feehan 1977):

To lie =df to make a believed-not-true or believed-false statement to another person, under conditions that are such that the person making the statement believes (a) that the person hearing the statement is justified in believing that the person making the statement believes the statement to be true, and (b) that the person hearing the statement is justified in believing that the person making the statement intends that the person hearing the statement believes that the person making the statement believes the statement to be true.

A third alternative definition of lying avoids the objection that the four necessary conditions are not sufficient for lying by combining the previous two alternative definitions of lying. According to this definition, there are three deceptive intentions in lying: the intention to deceive the liee about the content of the statement; the intention to deceive the liee about the liar's beliefs; and the intention to deceive the liee about the liar's being sincere. According to this definition, lying necessarily trades on being insincere about being sincere: “The liar is doubly insincere in that he or she insincerely presents a belief and insincerely invokes trust in this presentation. So in lying the liar intends to deceive the liee regarding some matter, and intends to satisfy that first intention (at least partly) by deceiving the liee regarding the liar's belief regarding that matter. In lying, however, there is a third level of deceptive intention. For the liar intends to satisfy the secondary intention (at least partly) by establishing the mutual recognition of the sincerity of that belief, and in that being insincere” (Simpson 1992, 625). It is the liee's false belief in the sincerity of the liar that justifies the liee in taking the liar's intention that the liee believe the statement to be true to be a reason for believing the statement to be true: “A speaker S's assertion to an audience A that p is a lie if and only if: (1) S believes that p is false; and (2) S intends that (i) A come to believe that p, (ii) A recognizes his intention that (i), and (iii) A's believing that S believes that p is A's reason for (ii) being a reason for (i)” (Faulkner 2007, 527-8). This definition of lying is as follows:

To lie =df to make a believed-false statement to another person with the intention that that other person believe that statement to be true, and with the intention that that other person believe that that statement is believed to be true, and with the intention that that other person believe that it is intended that that other person believe that that statement is believed to be true.

All three of these alternative definitions are vulnerable to the following counterexample (Newey 1997, 98). Say that S, with collaborator C, wants to play a confidence trick on A, in order to get A to buy a lot of shares in the company that S works for. S gets C, whom A trusts, to tell A that “Sproggit plc is about to launch a takeover bid for the company,” which both S and C correctly believe to be false. S also gets C to tell A that S, whom A distrusts, mistakenly believes that it is false that Sproggit plc is about to launch a takeover bid for the company. S then makes the untruthful statement to A that “Sproggit plc is about to launch a takeover bid for the company.” S makes this untruthful statement to A with the intention that A believe this statement to be true. S also makes this untruthful statement to A with the intention that A believe that S intends that A believe that S believes this untruthful statement to be true. That is, S intends that A believe that S is intending to be truthful. However, S does not intend that A believe that S believes this statement to be true. That is, S does not intend that A believe that S is being truthful. Rather, S intends that A believe that S believes this statement to be false. That is, S intends that A believe that S is being untruthful. Only if A believes that S is being untruthful will A believe this statement to be true. According to both of the alternative definitions of lying, S is not lying to A. However, this seems false.

This objection to all three alternative definitions could be avoided by adapting the first alternative definition of lying so that untruthfulness, combined with either of the two deceptive intentions, is sufficient for lying. A fourth alternative definition of lying (Mahon 2008) is as follows:

To lie =df to make a believed-false statement to another person with the intention that that other person believe that statement to be true, or the intention that that other person believe that that statement is believed to be true, or both.

All four alternative definitions of lying so far considered involve an intention to deceive. A fifth alternative definition of lying avoids the objection that an intention to deceive an addressee is necessary for lying by dispensing with any intention to deceive addressee condition (Carson 2006). According to this definition, lying is not necessarily a form of intentional deception. In place of an intention to deceive an addressee, it substitutes two further necessary conditions, namely, that the context is one which warrants the truth of the untruthful statement to the addressee, and that the person who makes the untruthful statement does not take herself to be not warranting the truth of the untruthful statement to the addressee. It also adds a third necessary condition that the untruthful statement be false (falsity condition), and amends the untruthfulness condition slightly to allow that the statement can simply be not believed to be true:

To lie =df to make a not-believed-true statement that is false to another person in a context which warrants the truth of that statement to that other person, where the person making the statement does not take herself to be not warranting the truth of that statement to that other person.

Whether or not a person is in a context that warrants the truth of her statement to another person is independent of whether or not the person believes that she is in that context. One objection that has been made to this fifth alternative definition of lying (Fallis 2008 — see Other Internet Resources) is that, according to it, for example, a politician who falsely believes himself to be giving a speech to an audience that is expecting a serious speech, and who does not take himself to be not warranting the truth of that statement to his audience, and who makes a statement to his audience that he believes to be false and that is false, when his audience is expecting a humorous speech, is not lying, since the context is one which does not warrant the truth of that statement to the audience. However, it seems false that the politician is not lying in this case, because his audience is expecting a humorous speech.

A sixth alternative definition of lying also avoids the objection that an intention to deceive an addressee is necessary for lying, by dispensing with any intention to deceive addressee condition (Fallis 2008 — see Other Internet Resources). In place of an intention to deceive an addressee, it substitutes the necessary condition that the person making the untruthful statement believes that she is in a context in which the Gricean norm of quality of communication — “Do no say what you believe to be false” (Grice 1989, 27) — is in place. This definition is as follows:

To lie =df to make a believed-false statement to another person while believing that the context is one in which the norm ‘Do not say what you believe to be false’ is in effect.

One objection that can be made to this definition is that even if a person believes herself to be in a context in which the Gricean communication norm ‘Do not say what you believe to be false’ is in effect, she may not care that this norm is in effect, and may make untruthful statements without any intention that they be believed. A witness in a trial who believes the norm to be in effect may attempt to disrupt the trial by making obviously and outrageously false statements, such as “I am a Giant Panda”. It seems false that she is lying, however.

According to all of the definitions of lying so far considered, it is not part of the meaning of lying that it is morally wrong, either defeasibly or indefeasibly. According to these definitions, the claim that lying is morally wrong, either defeasibly or indefeasibly, is “a synthetic judgment and not an analytic one” (Kemp and Sullivan 1993, 153). However, ‘lie’ is considered by some philosophers to be a thick ethical term (Williams 1985, 140); they hold that it both describes a type of action and morally evaluates that type of action negatively. For some philosophers, “the wrongfulness of lying is… built into the definition of the term” (Kemp and Sullivan 1993, 153), and the claim that lying is defeasibly morally wrong, or indefeasibly morally wrong, is a tautology (Margolis 1962).

Some rigorist moral philosophers have defined lying in such a way that the claim that lying is indefeasibly morally wrong is a tautology. These philosophers have incorporated moral necessary conditions into their definitions of lying. According to one such alternative definition, it is part of the “stricter meaning” of a lie that it involves “a conflict with the existing and continuing right of him to whom the speech or sign is addressed”, where “that right is nothing else than the liberty of judgement which, as if by some tacit agreement, men who speak are understood to owe to those with whom they converse” (Grotius LWP, 613-4). Note that this right of liberty of judgment — the right to arrive at one's own judgments based on the truthful non-deceptive statements of others — can be “taken away” or “annulled by another right which supervenes”, and can be “abrogated by the express consent of him with whom we are dealing”, and also “may be cancelled by tacit consent, or consent assumed on reasonable grounds, or by the opposition of another right which, in the common judgement of all men, is much more cogent” (Grotius LWP, 614). Furthermore, a lie “in the strict sense” is “harmful” (Grotius LWP, 614). This definition of lying is as follows:

To lie =df to make a believed-false statement to another person, with the intention that that other person believe that statement to be true, violating that person's right of liberty of judgment, with the intention to harm that other person.

Since, according to this definition, lying is always a violation of another person's right of liberty of judgment with the intention to harm that other person, and because, according to those who defend this definition, it is indefeasibly wrong to do this, for these philosophers, the claim that lying is indefeasibly morally wrong is a tautology.

According to this definition of lying, it is not possible to lie to children or the insane: “since infants and insane persons do not have liberty of judgement” (Grotius LWP, 614). It is also not possible to tell an intentionally benevolent lie — “whenever it is certain that he to whom the conversation is addressed will not be annoyed at the infringement of his liberty in judging, or rather will be grateful therefore, because of some advantage which will follow, in this case also a falsehood in the strict sense, that is a harmful falsehood, is not perpetrated” — and hence a person does not lie when she “comforts a sick friend by persuading him of what is not true” (Grotius LWP, 616). It is also not a case of lying when “one who has a right that is superior to all the rights of another makes use of this right either for his own good or for the public good” (Grotius LWP, 616-7). Hence, if legitimate political leaders make intentionally deceptive untruthful statements to others for the public good, they are not lying. Finally, it appears that when someone “can in no other way be diverted from the accomplishment of a wicked crime” (LWP, 617), what would otherwise be lying is not lying, because, it seems, the right of liberty of judgment of the would-be murderer (etc.) is cancelled by “the opposition of another right which, in the common judgement of all men, is much more cogent”. According to this definition, therefore, “speaking falsely to those — like thieves — to whom truthfulness is not owed cannot be called lying” (Bok 1978, 14).

At least one implication of this definition of lying is that there cannot be such a thing as a “white Lie”, that is, a lie that “is not intended to injure any Body in his Fortune, Interest, or Reputation” (OED), or, more generally, a lie that is not intended to harm in any way. A ‘white lie’ is a contradiction in terms.

According to another, similar alternative definition of lying that incorporates moral necessary conditions (Donagan 1977, 88-9), lying is necessarily a free communication between fully responsible and rational persons:

To lie =df to freely make a believed-false statement to another fully responsible and rational person with the intention that that other person believe that statement to be true.

Since, according to this definition, lying is always a free communication between fully responsible and rational persons, and because, according to those who defend this definition, it is indefeasibly “impermissible for anybody, in conditions of free communication between responsible persons, to express an opinion he does not hold” (Donagan 1977, 88; cf. 1986), for these philosophers, the claim that lying is indefeasibly morally wrong is a tautology.

According to this definition of lying, it is not possible to lie to “children, madmen, or those whose minds have been impaired by age or illness” (Donagan 1977, 89), since they are not fully responsible and rational persons. It is also not possible to lie to “a would-be murderer who threatens your life if you will not tell him where his quarry has gone” (Donagan 1977, 89), and in general to those who place you under duress, since statements made in such circumstances are not freely made. ‘Lying under duress’ is a contradiction in terms.

Against these alternative definitions of lying that incorporate moral necessary conditions, and that define lying in such a way that the claim that lying is indefeasibly morally wrong is a tautology, it has been objected that such definitions are unduly narrow and restrictive (Bok 1978). Surely, for example, it is possible to lie to a would-be murderer, whether it is impermissible (Augustine OL; Aquinas ST (cf. MacIntyre 1995b); Kant GMM (cf. Mahon 2006c); Newman 1880; Geach 1977; Betz 1985) or permissible (Constant 1964; Mill 1863; Sidgwick 1981; Bok 1978; MacIntyre 1995a). It has also been objected against these definitions that they are morally lax (Kemp and Sullivan 1993, 158-9), since, by rendering certain deceptive untruthful statements to others not lies, they make it permissible to act in a way that would otherwise be open to moral censure. In general, even those philosophers who hold that all lies have an inherent negative weight, albeit such that it can be overridden, and hence, who hold that lying is defeasibly morally wrong (Bok 1978; Kupfer 1982; cf. Wiles 1988), do not incorporate moral necessary conditions into their definitions of lying.

2. Definition of deception

The OED definition of deception (that is, other-deception (Baron 1988, 444 n. 2)) is:

To deceive = df to cause to believe what is false.

There are several problems with this definition (Barnes 1997; Mahon 2007). According to it, a person who inadvertently causes another person to have a false belief deceives that other person. If A believes that there is a talk on David Lewis and the Christians on Friday, and A tells B that “There is a talk on Lewis and the Christians on Friday”, and as a result B believes that there is a talk on C. S. Lewis on Friday, then, according to this definition, A deceives B.

A possible modified version of the OED definition of deceiving that does not allow for inadvertent deceiving is as follows:

To deceive =df to intentionally cause another person to have a false belief.

There are several problems with this definition also, however (Barnes 1997; Mahon 2007). According to it, a person who intentionally causes another person to have a false belief that she mistakenly believes to be true deceives the other person. If A mistakenly believes that there is a philosophy talk on Friday, and A tells B “There is a philosophy talk on Friday”, and as a result B believes that there is a philosophy talk on Friday, then according to this definition, A deceives B.

Although a number of philosophers hold that deceiving may be inadvertent or mistaken (Demos 1960; Chisholm and Feehan 1977; Adler 1997; Gert 2005; Fuller 1976), many other philosophers have argued that it is not possible to deceive inadvertently or mistakenly (Linsky 1970, 163; van Horne 1981, 172; Barnes 1997). They reserve the term ‘mislead’ to cover cases such as those above, and hold that in these cases A inadvertently misleads B, and mistakenly misleads B, respectively, rather than that A deceives B in either case.

A possible modified version of the OED definition of deceiving that does not allow for either inadvertent or mistaken deceiving is as follows:

To deceive =df to intentionally cause another person to have a false belief that is truly believed to be false by the person intentionally causing the false belief.

According to this definition, ‘deceive’ is an achievement or success verb (Ryle 1949); an act of deceiving is not an act of deceiving unless the result is that another person has a false belief. According to this definition, there is no statement condition for deception, and deception does not require an intention to communicate with another person. It is possible to deceive known infants, insane adults, dogs, etc., who can be intentionally caused to have false beliefs without making statements to them (Russow 1986). It is possible for a person to deceive using natural or causal signs, such as a wig or a smile, or non-linguistic conventional signs, such as a wedding ring or a police uniform (Mahon 2006b). It is possible for a person to deceive without uttering (etc.) a declarative sentence, by cursing, making an interjection or an exclamation, issuing a command or an exhortation, asking a question, saying “Hello”, and so forth. It is also possible to deceive by omitting to make certain statements, or by remaining silent.

Since there is no statement condition for deception, a fortiori there is no untruthfulness condition for deception. It is possible for a person to deceive by making a truthful and true statement (Adler, 1997). If Pavel truthfully and truly tells Trofim that he is going to Pinsk, with the intention that Trofim falsely believe that Pavel is going to Minsk, and as a result Trofim falsely believes that Pavel is going to Minsk, then Pavel deceives Trofim. According to this definition of deceiving, there is no addressee condition for deception, and it is possible to deceive an eavesdropper. If A pretends to be talking to another person on the phone, and makes the untruthful and false statement to no one, “The pick-up is tomorrow at 6:00 p.m.”, with the intention that eavesdropping B believes that statement to be true, and as a result B believes that statement to be true, then A deceives B. It is also possible to deceive an addressee about some matter other than the content of the statement made, whether that statement be truthful or untruthful, true or false. Finally, deception is neither necessary nor sufficient for perjury, as defined above.

2.1. Objections to the definition of deception

At least two objections can be made to the definition of deception provided above. First, it can objected that it is not sufficient for deception that a person intentionally cause another person to have a false belief that she truly believes to be false; it must also be the case that that false belief is caused by evidence, and that that evidence is brought about by the person in order to cause the other person to have the false belief (Linsky 1970, 163; Fuller 1976, 23; Schmitt 1988, 185; Barnes 1997, 14). If A intentionally causes B to believe falsely that there are vampires in England by, for example, operating on B's brain, or giving B an electric shock, or drugging B, then A does not deceive B about there being vampires in England. Also, if A causes B to believe falsely that there are vampires in England by getting B to read a book that purports to demonstrate that there are vampires in England, then A does not deceive B about there being vampires in England. However, if A writes a book that purports to demonstrate that there are vampires in England, and B reads the book, and as a result comes to believe that there are vampires in England, then A does deceive B about there being vampires in England.

A second objection that can be made to this definition is that it is not necessary for deception that a person intentionally cause another person to have a new false belief; it is sufficient to intentionally cause another person to continue to have a false belief (Fuller 1976, 21; Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 144).

2.2. Alternative definition of deception

A modified definition of deceiving that avoids both of the objections given above is as follows (Mahon 2007, 189-90):

To deceive =df to intentionally cause another person to have or continue to have a false belief that is truly believed to be false by the person intentionally causing the false belief by bringing about evidence on the basis of which the other person has or continues to have that false belief.

Two objections can be made to this definition. The first is that it is also possible to deceive another person by causing the other person to cease to have a true belief, or preventing the person from acquiring a true belief (Chisholm and Feehan 1977, 144). However, to this objection it can be replied that merely causing another person to cease to have a true belief, or preventing a person from acquiring a true belief, without causing the person to have or continue to have a false belief, is better described as causing another person be ignorant, or keeping another person ignorant, rather than deceiving another person (Mahon 2006b, 433; 2007, 187).

A second objection that can be made to this definition is that it is not necessary for deception that the person who intentionally causes the other person to have the false belief truly believes the false belief to be false (van Frassen 1988, 124; Barnes 1997, 11). If A does not falsely believe that a bridge is safe, and A does not truly believe that the bridge is dangerous — if A has no belief regarding the condition of the bridge — but A nevertheless convinces B that the bridge is safe, and the bridge happens to be dangerous, then A deceives B about the bridge being safe. Or, if A places a fake rabbit in B's garden, in which lives a reclusive rabbit, in order to guarantee that B believes that B is seeing a rabbit in her garden, and B sees the fake rabbit and calls A and tells A “I am seeing a rabbit in my garden”, then A has deceived B that she is seeing a rabbit in B's garden, although A does not truly believe that B is seeing a fake rabbit. However, this objection is not necessarily compelling (Mahon 2007, 191-2). It may be argued that A has merely misled B, as opposed to deceived B, about the bridge, although A may have deceived B about A's beliefs. It may also be argued that what A lacks is the true belief that she has deceived B about seeing a rabbit in her garden, rather than that she has deceived B about seeing a rabbit in her garden, but lacks the true belief that B's false belief is false.

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