Henry More (1614–1687), theologian, and philosopher, is usually regarded as characteristic of a group of broadly like-minded thinkers, discerned by historians and designated by them as the Cambridge Platonists. Certainly, More's dualistic theology of body and soul was heavily indebted to Neoplatonic thought, but the philosophical theology which he developed through the 1650s and 1660s should be recognised as almost entirely idiosyncratic, even though, in some respects it was closely paralleled in the philosophy and theology of his friend and colleague, Ralph Cudworth (1617–1688), and to a lesser extent in the works of his followers, George Rust (c.1628–1670) and Joseph Glanvill (1636–1680). More is notable as a rationalist theologian who tried to use the details of the mechanical philosophy, as developed by René Descartes, Robert Boyle and others, to establish the existence of immaterial substance, or spirit and, therefore, God. In particular he is known for developing a concept of a Spirit of Nature, an intermediary between God and the world which was supposedly required to account for those physical phenomena which could not be explained by the mechanical philosophy, and a concept of an infinite absolute space which was also made to represent immaterial reality, and even to share a number of the attributes of God.
- 1. Early Life and Writings
- 2. Cartesianism and Natural Theology
- 3. The Spirit of Nature
- 4. Restoration Cambridge and Latitudinarianism
- 5. Absolutist Ethics and Necessitarian Theology
- 6. More's Manual of Metaphysics
- 7. Kabbalism and Quakerism
- 8. Necessitarian Theology and New Threats
- 9. Posthumous Reputation
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Born in Grantham, Lincolnshire, on 12 October 1614, More was the seventh son of Alexander More, sometime alderman and mayor of Grantham, and his wife, Anne (née Lacy). After initial schooling at Grantham grammar school, he was sent to Eton College in 1628. In 1631, his uncle, Gabriel More, who was a fellow at Christ's College, Cambridge, arranged for Henry to enter his college. This was to be the setting for the rest of More's life. He took a BA in 1636, the MA in 1639, and was made a fellow of the college in 1641. More had already begun to familiarise himself with Neoplatonic philosophy during his undergraduate years, and began to develop his own dualistic ideas, emphasising the immateriality of the soul, in philosophical poems approximating to the mode of Edmund Spenser's Faerie Queen (1590), which he wrote in 1639 and 1640. He ventured into print with the first of these, the Psychodia Platonica (“Platonic Song of the Soul”) in 1642 (Crocker 2003).
It seems clear that from very early on More developed ambitions to promote his own understanding of true Christianity. Indeed, if his autobiographical memoir, written as a preface to his Opera omnia of 1679, is to be believed, More began to develop his own ideas as a result of a schoolboy rejection of the Calvinist doctrine of predestination, which he saw as a morally indefensible position for God to uphold, and therefore could not be part of true religion (translated into English in Ward 2000, 15–16). This recollection is certainly revealing, not only about More's beliefs, but also about his whole approach to religion. Like Calvin himself, More wanted to establish a system of belief which conformed to what he saw as the dictates of reason. But reasoning from different starting points can lead to very different conclusions. Calvin wanted a God who was immutable and so the concept of predestination seemed to follow as a rational requirement. More, by contrast, wanted a God who was, above all, morally perfect and unimpeachable. His different starting point from that of Calvin led him to a very different rational theology. More's was a theology in which God was obliged by his goodness to conform to absolute standards of morality, and therefore to create a world which was, as Voltaire's (1694–1778) Dr Pangloss would have said, the best of all possible worlds (Voltaire  1966, 2). More's motive in promoting this theology was not to solve the so-called “problem of evil” (why God allows so much suffering in the world), as it was later for Leibniz (and Dr Pangloss), but to ensure that God created a world which was (according to More at least) most capable of establishing the Creator's own existence. More believed that the best of all possible worlds was one which demonstrated its dependence upon God and thereby made atheism an untenable position. It was the effort to demonstrate that God had indeed created the world this way which dictated all the various idiosyncrasies of More's philosophical theology.
The earliest aspect of this was the attempt in his philosophical poems to establish a strict categorical separation between body and the incorporeal soul. The Psychodia platonica consisted of four parts, the first two, on the life of the soul (Psychozoia) and on its immortality (Pyschathanasia), presented More's views. The third and fourth parts were refutations of contemporary views of the soul which threatened More's strict dualistic ontology. Antipsychopannychia was concerned to reject the belief of the so-called mortalists that the soul sleeps in the grave after death, only to be awoken at the same time as the resurrection of the body. Antimonopsychia rejected the notion, usually attributed to the Arabic commentator on Aristotle know to the Latin West as Averroes (Ibn-Rushd), that the only tenable notion of the soul in Aristotle was not a personal soul, but a single general soul of humanity. Originally introduced into the West by a number of anti-Scholastic Aristotelian naturalists (from Siger of Brabant in the thirteenth century to Pietro Pomponazzi in the sixteenth) this idea was again becoming current among atheistic contemporaries of More.
More followed this up with what he called an essay, but which was still written in sub-Spenserian stanzas, on “the Infinity of Worlds out of Platonick Principles”. Democritus Platonissans (1646), accordingly, is the part of More's philosophical poem cycle which deals with the material side of the dualist dichotomy. He may have been inspired here by the Two Treatises of Sir Kenelm Digby (1603–1665) which had just appeared (1644), and which he mentions in the notes to his poem. Digby developed a version of atomistic natural philosophy and argued that all change is nothing more or less than a re-arrangement of the material atoms comprising all bodies. Consequently, Digby went on to argue, immaterial souls cannot change, and must therefore be immutable and immortal. More used the same general stratagem with regard to the relationship between body and soul in his poem, and it was presumably during the writing of Democritus Platonissans that More first became interested in the latest developments in natural philosophy. In particular, it was at this time that More began to study the philosophy of Descartes (1596–1650) (Gabbey 1982). Clearly, More was sufficiently aware of developments in natural philosophy to know that Digby's atomistic system was derivative from, and by no means as powerful as, the Principia philosophiae published in the same year as Digby's Two Treatises by the great French mathematician turned metaphysician and physicist.
At around this time, More also began to embrace another Platonic idea, and one which had been introduced into Christian thought in the third century by Origen (though never accepted as orthodox), namely the pre-existence of the individual soul before its incarnation. He devoted another poem to his first exposition of this, The Praeexistency of the Soul, which was included in his collected Philosophical Poems of 1647. This is a clear example of how More's pursuit of a rational theology led him to unusual, if not entirely idiosyncratic, positions. His Platonic insistence on the immortality of the soul led him to reject the notion that every individual human soul was created at its conception, in favour of the Origenian position that all intellectual natures were created equal and alike from the beginning of eternity (Scott 1991). This was also bound up with More's concern for the perfect goodness of God—More did not want to involve God in colluding with the illicit sexual acts of sinners by intervening in their acts to create souls for their illegitimate progeny. As More later put it in the notes to his edition of George Rust's Origenian Discourse of Truth (1682), God must not be made to “bear a part amongst Pimps and Bawds, and pocky whores and Whoremasters, to rise out of his Seat for them, and by a free Act of Creation of a Soul, to set his seal of connivance to their Villanies” (More 1682, 9). Furthermore, while he was adopting ideas from Origen, More also embraced the Origenian belief in universal salvation—the idea that all souls would eventually be saved and rewarded with heavenly bliss. Again, this was an idea which seemed to More to be the only morally defensible position, and therefore the one which must be part of the true faith (Walker 1964).
The decision to present and to defend what purported to be a rationally-based pneumatology in poetic form is certainly puzzling to the modern reader, but it was also rather unusual in More's own day. Although there were clear ancient precedents, such as the epic presentation of Epicurean atomism in the De rerum natura of Lucretius, the poetical presentation of philosophical ideas seemed to be most common in alchemical, astrological, and other magical works, such as the Compound of Alchymy by George Ripley (c. 1471), and the Zodiacus vitae of Marcellus Palingenius (c. 1531). It seems that More's determination to present his ideas in verse is a manifestation of an undeniable tendency in him towards emotional rapture, particularly where matters of religion are concerned. Although intellectually committed to rationalism in religion, More's personal religious feelings were obviously deep-seated and could easily become highly emotional, and even close to what was decried at the time as a dangerous tendency in religion, namely “enthusiasm”. This was noted by More's earliest biographer, Richard Ward:
He hath indeed confess'd in a certain Place; That he had a Natural touch of Enthusiasme in his Complexion; but such as (he thanks God) was ever governable enough; and which he had found at length perfectly Subduable. So that no Person better understood the Extent of Phansy, and Nature of Enthusiasme, than he himself did (Ward  2000, 35).
For the most part, More did manage to subdue these potentially dangerous tendencies, but he often walked a razor's edge (Crocker 1990, 2003). It seems clear that More was torn between what he saw as the need for a rational theology on the one hand and a much more emotional submission to religious sensibilities. As Ward wrote approvingly:
such is the Nature of his Noble Principles and Theories, such the Frame of his Conceptions; that they cannot fail (where embraced) of more than ordinarily moving, and even enravishing, at times, the Mind of Man; and Carrying it away Captive into All the Highest Joy, Admiration, and Affection, that the Humane Nature is capable of. They will either find or make Enthusiasts of this kind… He himself, with the Holy Psalmist, and others of the Divine Writers, shews a frequent Enthusiasme in this way… (Ward 2000, 36).
This aspect of More's mental life must be borne in mind in any attempt to assess the coherence of his philosophy, and his significance as a philosopher. It was surely the demands of More's religious concerns which account for those places (some of which will be discussed below) where his philosophical acuity seemed to desert him.
More can be seen to be walking along a narrow ledge above a precipice of religious enthusiasm in his polemic against the alchemist Thomas Vaughan (1621–1666). Writing as Alazonomastix Philalethes, More launched an attack against Vaughan's recently published Neoplatonic and alchemically inspired views of man and nature. These were More's first publications after finishing his cycle of poems. More felt obliged to attack Vaughan in print precisely because, to the undiscerning eye, their philosophies might seem to be congruent. As More wrote:
I was afraid that men judging that this affectation of Platonisme in you, might well proceed from some intemperies of bloud and spirit; and that, there [being] no body else besides us two dealing with these kinds of notions, they might yoke me with so disordered a companion as yourself: Reasoning thus with themselves; Vaughan of Jesus in Oxenford holds the pre-existence of the Soul, and other Platonick Paradoxes, and we see what a pickle he is in: What think you of More of Christ's that wrote the Platonicall Poems? (More 1651, 36)
Although More professes to subscribe to a philosophy which is significantly distinct from that of Vaughan, it is by no means clear that contemporary readers would have been able to see what the differences were. With hindsight, it can be seen that in these two polemical works More was trying to protect the concept which he had very briefly introduced in his poetical works and which was to prove so important in his subsequent philosophy, namely the Spirit of Nature. What is most obvious here, however, is not how More conceived of this universal spirit, but that he did not see it in the same way that Vaughan did in his Anima magica abscondita: Or, A Discourse of the universall Spirit of Nature (1650). He objects unequivocally, for example, to the fact that Vaughan seems to imply (on More's reading, anyway) that a universal world spirit or soul is divided and parcelled up into all creatures, to give them life. More objects not only to Vaughan's suggestion that the whole world is “an Animal”, but also to the idea that the world soul can be “either barrel'd up or bottled up, or tied up in a bag, as a pig in a poke!” (More 1650, 51). More's objection, reflecting his strict dualism, is that an immaterial soul could not be trapped inside body. When More subsequently develops his own concept of the Spirit of Nature into its mature form it is to be a continuous and all pervasive immaterial (but extended) substance which is capable of operating within bodies by virtue of its ubiquity, but is not confined by them. The contemporary reader, however, could not have gleaned from More's Observations upon Anthropospophia Theomagica (1650), or his Second Lash of Alazonomastix (1651), anything other than his objections to Vaughan's views; there was little or no intimation of More's own still developing ideas.
Furthermore, even here, while vigorously decrying Vaughan's “enthusiasm”, More cannot prevent himself from revealing his own tendencies in the same direction (Crocker 1990, 2003, Guinsberg 1980). The real nature of the union between soul and body, More at one point unwisely declared, is “more Theomagicall then our Theomagician himself is aware of” (More 1650, 52). It is a sign of the tension between More's rationalism and his need to express his religious devotion that he persisted in writing enthusiastically even when he was aware of so doing. His apologetic attempts to defend himself were hardly convincing: “Nor am I at all, Philalethes, Enthusiastical. For God doth not ride me as a Horse, and guide me I know not whither my self; but converseth with me as a Friend; and speaks to me in such a Dialect as I understand…” (More 1651, 178).
More read Descartes's Principia philosophiae in 1646, and it had a very profound effect upon him and upon the subsequent development of his own philosophy. “All that have attempted anything in naturall Philosophy hitherto are mere shrimps and fumblers in comparison of him”, More wrote in 1648 (Letter to Hartlib, 11 December 1648, Webster 1969, 365). Accordingly, he began to teach Descartes's mechanical philosophy to interested students in Cambridge, and so became one of the earliest conduits for the dissemination of Cartesianism in Britain. More is credited with inventing the word, Cartesianism, and has been said to be behind the strangely Platonic reading of Descartes's methodology in the anonymous preface to the first English translation of the Discourse of a Method (1649) (Cristofolini 1974). In his later writings, however, More is much more critical of this new philosophy. It used to be assumed that More began as a follower of Descartes and became more critical of his philosophy as his own philosophy matured. It is now recognised, however, that More was always critical of certain aspects of Cartesianism, and that the increasingly negative attitude towards Cartesianism reflects a growing realisation that Descartes's errors (as More saw them) were not simply infelicities, which might be corrected by philosophical negotiation, but were defining characteristics of Cartesianism, particularly as the philosophy was developed by his followers, after his own untimely death (Gabbey 1982, 1990).
There is an interesting contrast here with More's response to Vaughan. More was immediately aware that, although he and Vaughan might seem to be fellow-travellers, their philosophies—and their underlying beliefs—were in fact very different. In the case of Descartes, however, More seems to have genuinely believed they were fellow-travellers, both committed to the establishment of a dualism of body and soul in the service of religion, even though they might seem to onlookers to have been very different. More expressed this in 1662 in the Preface to his Collection of Philosophical Writings:
We both setting out from the same Lists, though taking several ways, the one travelling in the lower rode of Democritism, amidst the thick dust of Atoms, and flying particles of Matter, the other tracing o'er the high and aiery hills of Platonism, in that more thin and subtle Region of immateriality, meet together notwithstanding at last (and certainly not without a Providence) at the same Goal, namely the Entrance to the holy Bible, dedicating our joint labours to the use and glory of the Christian Church… (More 1662, I, xii)
Right from his first acquaintance with Descartes's philosophy, therefore, More believed that, like him, Descartes supposed that explanations of physical phenomena in terms of material principles could only take us so far, and beyond that point it was necessary to acknowledge the role of incorporeal active principles. In so far as Descartes did believe this, for him the boundary demarcating what could be explained in material terms and what could not, was a long way beyond where More would want to place it.
More's interest in Descartes's philosophy was so profound that his acquaintance, Samuel Hartlib (c.1600–1662), an assiduous “intelligencer” who keenly promoted (and facilitated) philosophical correspondence, persuaded More to write to Descartes in December 1648. More wrote four letters in all, but only received replies to the first two before Descartes's death in 1650. He received an unfinished third reply from Claude Clerselier in 1655, while Clerselier was preparing his edition of Descartes's Lettres (1657), which prompted More's Responsio ad fragmentum Cartesii. It is clear from these letters that More's differences with Descartes were (as we might expect) considerable and more serious than More realised.
More had some detailed criticisms of Cartesian physics, including his account of refraction, and his vortex theory of celestial motions (which, More pointed out, ought to have given rise to celestial cylinders, rather than spheres) but the more philosophical criticisms revealed the most significant differences between them. More's belief in an absolute space and time, which was going to play a major role in his subsequent philosophy, was foreshadowed here in his critique of the Cartesian concepts. He rejected not only Descartes's distinction between a universe which is indefinite in extent and one which can be concluded to be infinite, but also Descartes's definition of body as extension, and the concomitant impossibility of void space (Koyré 1957, Grobet 2010). Another group of criticisms derived from More's dissatisfaction with Descartes's version of mind-body dualism, including aspects of the union and interaction of body and soul, the denial of souls in animals, and major differences about what can be achieved by matter in motion, and what for More requires a more active (and therefore immaterial) principle (Henry 1986, 1989).
The Cartesian claim that animals were more splendid versions of artificial automata, “which move without thought” (Letter to More, February 1649; Descartes 1991, 366), for example, was seen by More as providing hostages to atheists. In the scholastic tradition the ability to move oneself was seen as evidence of the presence of a soul, and therefore of life. Descartes, pointing out that clocks and other automata are capable of moving themselves, denied this traditional view and held the soul to be responsible only for thinking; movement was exclusively a feature of bodies. In the Cartesian system, consequently, plants and animals were living creatures without souls. Evidently, More regarded this position as likely to lead to the conclusion that humans could also be counted as living creatures without souls (it is not clear whether there were contemporary Cartesians who held this, but it certainly became a common view in the period of the Enlightenment).
Anxious to defend the concept of immaterial souls from all atheist threats, More insisted that the soul was necessary for life. He was therefore opposed not only to Descartes, but also to traditional scholastic views. The motions of plants and animals (plants being capable of internal motions associated with nutrition, reproduction, and growth), according to scholastics, proved the existence only of vegetative and animal souls respectively. Both of these kinds of souls were regarded as material, however, being composed of subtle fluids or tenuous but nonetheless material spirits in the body. Descartes simply absorbed the functions of these material souls into his mechanistic theory of creature-as-automaton. By contrast, More, pursuing his over-riding concern to deny atheists any footholds, ran counter to both Aristotelians and Cartesians and insisted on the immateriality of animal souls (and presumably vegetative souls, though he does not seem to discuss them). In More's version of dualism only immaterial entities are self-active and capable of initiating movement in other entities, and so the fact that plants and animals can move themselves is taken to prove that they must have immaterial souls (Henry 1989, Reid 2012). It should be noted, therefore, that underlying More's argumentation is a commitment to the belief that matter is essentially passive (capable only of inertial motions), and that only immaterial entities are active. This commitment, however, is not based on any original philosophical arguments developed by More himself. It is simply based on what More sees as a fundamental premise of Cartesianism, namely, that matter or body is completely inert and passive. This is why More seized upon Cartesianism so keenly. If matter is inert then the activity we see all around us must have another source, which must be immaterial. Underlying this, of course, was a desire to deny the claims of contemporary materialist (and therefore atheist) philosophers.
More also took issue with Descartes's account of colliding bodies. In Descartes's system the amount of motion was always maintained at a constant level (guaranteed by God) and this was made manifest in collisions, where motions could be seen to be transferred from one body to another. For More, this seemed too materialistic an explanation, and failed to pay due attention to the role of immateriality. The nub of the matter was that, as More saw it, matter in motion was allowed to explain too much by Descartes. The system could be (as indeed it was) appropriated by atheists, who would simply dismiss God's role and turn it into an entirely materialist philosophy. In More's mature natural philosophy matter was going to be held to be not merely passive but absolutely inert. That is to say, while passive matter might be held to carry on moving after being given an initial push (indeed it must do so because it cannot stop itself), More developed the claim that matter was completely incapable of moving by itself. Consequently, all activity in any system (even what might otherwise look like merely passive inertial motion) was to be introduced by, or was the result of, the working of immaterial spirit. More did not want anything to blur the distinction between non-active matter and active spirit, and so he could not allow that matter might be set in motion and continue to move of its own accord, or by its own nature; this looked too much like matter having activity of its own. The beginnings of this strict dualism were already present at this early stage of his career (and could be seen for example in his insistence that animals must have immaterial souls to give them movement), and so it was important for him to stress the role of immaterial principles, analogous to mental acts, in collisions:
I feel more disposed to believe that motion is not communicated, but that from the impulse of one body another body is so to speak roused into motion, like the mind to a thought on this or that occasion, and that body does not take as much motion as it needs for movement, being reminded of the matter by the other body. And as I said a short while ago, motion bears the same relation to a body as a thought does to the mind: neither is received into the subject, in fact, but both arise from the subject in which they are found. And everything that is called body I hold to be alive in a sottish and drunken way… (More, letter to Descartes, 23 July 1649, quoted from Gabbey 1982, 211).
But it is important to note here that although More seems to be allowing bodies to be active, even alive, this does not sit square with most of his other pronouncements on the nature of body. Either More is talking loosely, and means to imply there is some active immaterial principle involved in the transfer of motions in collisions, or he has not yet properly grasped how best to use such signs of sottish life in inanimate bodies to show the limits of Cartesian mechanism, and the need for separate (non-material) principles of activity in the world. The latter seems more likely, since there are clear signs of development in More's works from vaguely formed starting points to more carefully wrought and internally consistent mature positions (Reid 2003, 2007). What we see in this comment to Descartes is a belief that inert matter cannot do what Descartes claims, but needs some active principle to accompany it, and take part in its actions. Here, More suggests it might be a kind of life in inanimate matter, but it is not long before More remembers the dangers to religion (as he sees it) of inherently active matter, and accordingly re-asserts its absolute inertness. He is then able to use the behaviour of bodies in collisions to confirm the intervention of a necessarily immaterial principle of activity.
Be that as it may, Descartes's initial response to this comment (end of August 1649), which he never managed to send before his death, was that More was inventing principles which were surplus to requirements, and therefore detrimental to philosophy:
I will say here once and for all that nothing diverts us more from discovering the truth than when we declare to be true something of which we are persuaded for no positive reason, but only by our will. That is, when we have fancied or invented something , and then afterwards our fabrication pleases us, as in your case, with corporeal Angels, the shadow of the divine essence, and such like, none of which ought to be adopted by anyone, because this is the very thing that bars us from the road to truth (quoted from Gabbey 1982, 212).
This was an extremely perceptive comment. More was going to go on to develop his concept of the Spirit of Nature (alluded to here as “the shadow of the divine essence”, but which More later referred to as “the vicarious power of God”) which would draw similar criticisms from the leading natural philosophers, Robert Boyle (1627–1691) and Robert Hooke (1635–1703). For them it was merely a fabrication which explained nothing that could not be explained more simply without it; and “Truth”, as Boyle was later to say (1672), “ought to be pleaded for only by Truth” (Boyle 1999, 184; Henry 1990). More did not see Descartes's comment until 1655, by which time it was too late. By then, More was already committed to his Spirit of Nature, which he saw as an indispensable feature of the world system. It is doubtful, however, that More would have been diverted from this course by Descartes's words, even if he had seen them in time. The Spirit of Nature was not just pleasing to More; he made it an indispensable feature of his philosophical theology.
One of More's students at Cambridge, who was clearly impressed by his account of Cartesianism, was John Finch (1626–1682), son of Heneage Finch (1580–1631), Speaker of the House of Commons. Finch introduced More to his half-sister, Anne, who later became Vicountess Conway and Killultagh (1631–1679). Anne had a passion for learning and More tutored her in philosophy, and particularly in Cartesianism, but their relationship soon developed into one of friendship. Although they remained friends to the last, the relationship of tutor and pupil eventually gave way to one of equals, and Anne developed sufficiently to produce a philosophical theology that was very much her own, and was effectively a rejection of More's (Conway 1996, Hutton 2004). The Cambridge Platonist did not just benefit from the delights of Anne's company, however; the Conway family was to prove a powerful patron and supporter for More after the Restoration, when his former allegiance to the Protectorate drew potentially dangerous criticism. Indeed, Edward, Lord Conway (c. 1623–1683) even arranged a bishopric in Ireland for More, and an appointment as prebend of Worcester, but More preferred to remain in Cambridge.
It was during the Protectorate that More produced a remarkable group of philosophical writings. There is a sense in which the four works which he published throughout the 1650s can be seen as a summation of More's philosophical system. This is perhaps evident from the fact that, shortly after the appearance of the last of them, The Immortality of the Soul of 1659, he re-issued them all together in his Collection of Philosophical Writings (1662). The essentially pragmatic aim of More's philosophy was made plain in the title of the first of these, An Antidote Against Atheism (1653)—the collection as a whole might well have been called an antidote against contemporary threats to religion: atheism, and enthusiasm.
The Antidote deserves to be better known as one of the earliest contributions to what later became a vigorous tradition in British natural philosophy, namely natural theology. Although there is a sense in which natural theology, or the attempt to establish the existence and attributes of God by studying nature, can be found among Thomas Aquinas's five proofs of the existence of God, it was only in the seventeenth century that this enterprise began to be worked out in detail, usually alongside the promotion of the new atomistic philosophies which seemed to offer the best alternative to the traditional “hand-maiden” to Christian theology, Aristotelianism. The very first contributions to natural theology, published long before the tradition's Newtonian heyday, were Walter Charleton's Darknes of Atheism dispelled by the Light of Nature (1652), and More's Antidote.
The Antidote begins by borrowing Descartes's ontological proof of the existence of God, but he went on from there to consider other aspects of the fact that we have an “indelible” idea of God and, as Descartes showed, other innate ideas. This led him to consider, for example, the final cause of our idea of God, which in turn led him to consider our innate knowledge of good and evil. The first book is also concerned with the nature of the soul itself, in which More takes pains to persuade his reader that it is distinct from the substance of the body, and that the body is completely incapable not only of thought, without the incorporeal soul, but also of movement. The second book develops the argument from design to oppose atheism, and the third introduces a favourite stratagem of More's, the rehearsal of well-known or well-attested stories of witchcraft, snake-charming, raising of tempests by the power of words, and other “spiritual” phenomena as evidence for the existence of an immaterial realm (Coudert 1990, Crocker 2003). Throughout More builds up a picture of immaterial spirit as the only substance capable of spontaneous activity, and insists that inert matter is incapable of explaining all physical phenomena on its own.
More's next work, the Conjectura Cabbalistica: Or, A conjectural Essay of interpreting the minde of Moses according to a threefold Cabbala, viz., literal, philosophical, mystical, or divinely moral, published in the same year as the Antidote, is a strange exercise, supposedly based on the premise that the first three chapters of Genesis contain a summation of all wisdom but hidden under a veil. It can be seen as an attempt not just to link natural philosophy with religion (which could result in a merely deistic natural theology), but to link it with revealed religion, as taught in Scripture. Written at the request of Anne Conway, it is an exercise in imaginative scholarship, seeking to show, for example, that ancient Pythagoreanism, which gave rise to Platonism, was in fact derived from an earlier Mosaical philosophy, and can now be seen, thanks to More, as tantamount to Cartesianism:
The Cartesian Philosophy being in a manner the same with that of Democritus; and that of Democritus the same with the Physiological part of Pythagoras his Philosophy; and Pythagoras his Philosophy, the same with the Sidonian, as also the Sidonian, with the Mosaical; it will necessarily follow, that the Mosaical Philosophy in the Physiological part thereof is the same with the Cartesian. And how fitly the Cartesian Philosophy suits with Moses his Text, I have again and again taken notice (More 1712, quoted from Crocker 2003, 70).
One of the ways in which More tries to establish the link between Cartesianism and the teachings of Moses is by arguing for a close parallel between the three types of matter, or three elements, discerned by Descartes, and the three successively rarefied “vehicles” of the soul in Platonised versions of Christian doctrine, the terrestrial, the aerial, and the aetherial. It is perhaps worth pointing out that this work owes little or nothing to the Jewish tradition of Kabbalah, but should be seen as a late contribution to the Renaissance tradition of Christian cabbala first introduced by Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (1463–1494) (Coudert 1992, Crocker 2003).
Having directly attacked atheism, and shown the close relationship between the Bible and the latest philosophical ideas, More then turned his attention to what was widely perceived as the other contemporary threat to sound religion, enthusiasm. The Enthusiasmus Triumphatus of 1656 is concerned with the different kinds of religious fanaticism, their causes, and how to cure them. Among the specific writers singled out by More are the founders of the so-called Family of Love, David George (fl. 1550?), and Henry Nicholas (c. 1501– c. 1580), the alchemist and “Luther of medicine”, Paracelsus (1493–1541), and the German mystic, Jacob Boehme (1575–1624). The cure prescribed by Dr More required temperance, humility, and reason. Here again, however, we can see More's over-riding concern with a failure to distinguish between matter and spirit:
Our exorbitant Enthusiasts professe that everything is God in love and wrath: Which if I understand anything is no better then Atheisme. For it implies that God is nothing else but the Universall Matter of the World, dressed up in severall shapes and forms, in sundry properties and qualities… But to slice God into so many parts is to wound him and kill him, and to make no God at all (More 1656, 48).
The final book in this series, and for the time being the culmination of More's philosophical ambitions, was the Immortality of the Soul, So farre forth as it is demonstrable from the Knowledge of Nature and the Light of Reason (1659). As is evident from the title, the book marks a return to natural theology, but it also returns to other earlier themes, including the parallel between Cartesian matter theory and the three “vehicles” of the soul, and the reality of spiritual phenomena as revealed in accounts of witchcraft, apparitions, and the like. A major new focus of concern is the philosophy of Thomas Hobbes, whose Leviathan had appeared in 1651. More decries Hobbes for his materialism, his determinism, and his mortalism (emphasising the resurrection of the body on a far distant Day of Judgment, with no interim post mortem punishment, or reward), all of which, of course, are seen by More as incompatible with Christian theism.
Perhaps as a result of the perceived atheism of Hobbes, and More's increasing awareness that the philosophy of Descartes had also been appropriated by atheists and twisted to serve their purposes, More presents his own would-be cure for atheism in its most cogent and most powerful form in The Immortality of the Soul. The main focus of the three books are the establishment of dualism and the nature of incorporeal substance, the relationship of the soul to the body, and the life of the separated soul in the after-life; but along the way More deals with many associated phenomena, such as the souls of animals, and the pre-existence of the human soul. In particular, it is in this work that he develops most fully his concept of the Spirit of Nature. Although the Spirit of Nature is More's most characteristic contribution to the history of natural philosophy, his pronouncements about it have only very recently been properly examined (Henry 1990, Reid 2012. It is not hard to see why this is so. The concept was vigorously opposed by contemporary natural philosophers, from leading figures such as Boyle and Hooke, down to a dilettante virtuoso such as Sir Matthew Hale (1609–1676). The concept had very little influence, therefore, beyond More's own circle of devoted followers. The only other philosopher to take it seriously was, for example, More's close friend and colleague, the Master of Christ's College, Ralph Cudworth (1617–1688). Since our immediate concern here is the philosophy of Henry More, irrespective of its influence, we must look closely at his most distinctive contribution to natural philosophy.
We have already seen that More admired the philosophy of Descartes precisely because he felt that it showed that matter alone cannot explain all phenomena. He reiterated this in the Immortality, recommending that the French philosophy should be taught in all the universities of Europe,
That the Students of Philosophy may be thoroughly exercised in the just extent of the Mechanical Powers of Matter, how farre they will reach, and where they fall short. Which will be the best assistance to Religion that Reason and the Knowledge of Nature can afford (More 1662, I, 21).
The perceived short-fall would be helpful to religion, according to More, precisely because the deficit could only be made good by acknowledging the role of an immaterial, active principle. This principle was the Spirit of Nature.
More accepts that “Matter it self once moved can move other Matter”, but insists that it cannot move itself. So far, Descartes would agree. Unlike Descartes, however, More refuses to accept that all the phenomena of the universe can follow from an original push by God, setting in train an endless cosmic chain reaction of colliding particles. Even though Descartes talks of the continued action of God in preserving the same quantity of motion in the world, as far as More is concerned the Cartesian account is too materialistic. Although both More and Descartes agree that God, the primary cause of all things, operates in the world by means of delegated secondary causes, they differ radically about the correct secondary causes. For Descartes, bodies in motion (acting in conformity with his laws of nature and rules of collision) are the secondary causes, but More cannot accept that bodies can perform all that is required. More recognises that this view could undermine his own prior commitment to his dualistic theology, because it could be made to lead to a monistic materialist system of mechanical philosophy (in which God's role is simply written out). In an attempt to avoid this, More says that the fact that matter can be brought to rest “is an Argument not only that Self activity belongs to a Spirit, but that there is such a thing as Spirit in the world”. Presumably the point is that if matter was self-active it could not stop its own activity, and therefore could never come to rest. Anyone who denies this, More insists, “must of necessity (as I have intimated already) confess that this Matter moves it self, though it be very incongruous so to affirm” (More 1662, II, 21, 31).
Accordingly, More concludes that there must be an active principle at work to take care of those things which cannot be accomplished by the “Mechanical Powers of Matter”:
I ask… if there be not in nature an incorporeal substance which, while it can impress on any body all the qualities of body, or at least most of them, such as motion, figure, position of parts, etc… would be further able, since it is almost certain that this substance removes and stops bodies, to add whatever is involved in such motion, that is it can unite, divide, scatter, bind, form the small parts, order the forms, set in circular motion those which are disposed for it, or move them in any way whatever, arrest their circular motion and do such similar things with them as are necessary to produce… light, colours and the other objects of the senses… (More, letter to Descartes, 5 March 1649, in More 1662, I, 79–80).
But how is it that this incorporeal substance can “actuate grand proportions of matter”? Here More draws on Neoplatonic emanationism. The Spirit of Nature, he says, actuates matter as it emanates outward in a “sphere of life and activity” (More 1662, II, 27). It does so because it is axiomatic that an “Emanative Cause” is “such a cause as merely by Being, no other activity or causality interposed, produces an Effect.” There must be such a cause in the world, he says, because “something must move itself” (More 1662, II, 27–8).
It should be noted that More's Spirit of Nature must be extended in space, if it can be said to emanate spherically. This marks More's notion of spirit out from Descartes's res cogitans. For Descartes, matter is extended and souls are not; strictly speaking (although there was some room for manoeuvre, Reid 2008), souls are non-spatial entities and do not exist in space. For More, this is an idea of existence which makes no sense. For something to exist, it must exist somewhere; it must occupy space. The same is true of God, no less than the Spirit of Nature, or individual souls.
More has a ready answer to those for whom extension implies divisibility, and who therefore object that, if More were right, God and souls would be divisible. More simply declares that extension does not imply divisibility. He draws on the long-standing exemplar of Neoplatonic emanation theory to make his point—light. A luminous orb of light, he says, “does very much resemble the nature of a Spirit, which is diffus'd and extended, and yet indivisible” (More 1662, I, 150). No engine or art could separate one luminous ray from another, and
The parts of a Spirit can be no more separated, though they be dilated, then you can cut off the Rayes of the Sun by a pair of Scissors made of pellucid Crystall (More 1662, I, 16).
In Ancient emanation theory, of course, the ultimate source from which all things emanated was God, and it seems clear that More follows suit here as well. The Spirit of Nature is “the first step to the abstrusest mysteries in Natural Theologie”, More writes, because it is “the vicarious Power of God upon the Matter” (More 1662, II, 13). But this seems to open More up to another charge, namely that he has abandoned any pretence to a natural philosophy, seeking to explain phenomena in terms of secondary causation, and simply defers all things to the direct action of God.
But More is adamant that the Spirit of Nature is a “Secondary or Emanatory Substance” (More 1662, II, 28), and should correctly be seen as a secondary cause. Responding to the charge that he has “introduced an obscure Principle for ignorance and Sloth to take sanctuary in… and hinder that expected progress that may be made in the Mechanick Philosophy” (More 1662, II, 11), More insisted that the Spirit of Nature was a help, not a hindrance. Speaking of this instrument of the “vicarious Power of God”, he wrote:
Nor needs the acknowledgment of this Principle to damp our endeavours in the search of the Mechanical causes of the Phaenomena of Nature, but rather make us more circumspect to distinguish what is the result of the more mechanical powers of Matter and Motion, and what of an Higher Principle (More 1662, II, 12–13).
One of the ways in which More supported this claim was to repeatedly insist that the Spirit of Nature operated blindly, without perception or intelligence (and so was not in any sense the manifestation of the direct action of God). He illustrates this by reference to the new experiments with an air-pump conducted by Robert Boyle. If the air-pump is fitted with a valve, the air beating against the valve will not only close the valve against itself, but “will bear up with it a ten-pound weight” (More 1662, I, 44). This kind of “self-thwarting” activity (since the air really “intends” to fill up the vacuum in the chamber of the pump) shows not only that the air has “no Power, Knowledge, and liberty of will”, but also that there are no “Divine particles interspersed in the Aire that have”. More concludes at this point,
that the Impetus of Motion in all matter is blinde and necessary, and that there is no Matter at all that is free and knowing but moves and acts of it self… according to the mere Mechanical laws of Motion (More 1662, I, 44).
Elsewhere More says,
That no matter whatsoever of its own Nature has any active Principle of Motion, though it be receptive thereof; but that when God created it, he superadded an impress of Motion upon it, such a measure and proportion to all of it, which remains still much-what the same for quantity in the whole, though the parts of Matter in their various occursion of one to another have not always the same proportion of it… (More 1662, II, 47–8).
Here, then, More fully accepts the precepts of the mechanical philosophy, but he refuses to accept that Cartesianism can account for all phenomena. As in his letters to Descartes, for example, he points out that the mechanical vortex theory should result in cylindrical heavenly bodies, so the Spirit of Nature must make them spherical. He also points to magnetism and gravity as phenomena which are not convincingly explained by Descartes, as well as condensation and rarefaction. He also points to the Achilles heel of the mechanical philosophy, the generation and development of plants and animals, as well as the instinctive behaviour of animals.
In all these cases the Spirit of Nature is required to intervene, although More is vague upon precisely how it intervenes. At one point he seems to imply that it simply communicates the laws of nature to the relevant systems, since he describes it as “a mute copy of the eternal Word (that is, of that Divine Wisedome that is entirely everywhere)” which
is in every part naturally appointed to do all the best services that Matter is capable of… according to that Platform of which it is the Transcript, I mean according to the comprehension and Purpose of those Idea's [sic] of things which are in the eternal Intellect of God.
Accordingly, the Spirit of Nature “is the lowest Substantial Activity from the all-wise God, containing in it certain general Modes and Lawes of Nature” (More 1662, I, xv-xvi). Similarly, in his defence of the concept of the Spirit of Nature against the criticisms of Sir Mathew Hale, More declares:
it is manifest that there is a more noble and divine Being in the world that gave this inferiour immaterial Being its existence and allotted to it in measure, or limited out to it these general Laws of vital activity, which we discover in it in the Phaenomena of Nature (More 1676, 190).
But More is less concerned about the details of how the Spirit of Nature fulfils its functions, than he is with establishing that it must exist. As he goes on to say immediately after the last quotation:
this certainty of the existence of the Spirit of Nature demolisheth the strongest bulwark that ordinarily the Atheist has, namely his confidence that there is no such thing as a Spirit or Immaterial Being in the World. Whence he securely hugs himself in that fond and foul Conclusion, That there is no God (More 1676, 190).
Having pointed to phenomena in nature which cannot be explained in terms of the mechanical philosophy, More can introduce the concept of an active Spirit of Nature to fill in the lacunae. He therefore has provided, according to his own lights, a rational, philosophical, basis for the necessary existence of the Spirit of Nature, and by extension of spirit, or incorporeal substance more generally. This is crucial, of course, for More's dualistic theology. It seems clear to us, as it must have for many contemporary readers, that the Spirit of Nature did not emerge from More's understanding of the natural world, but from the demands of his rational dualist ontology. Preoccupied as he was with the need to establish a categorical dualism between inert matter and active incorporeal spirit, he was quick to see those parts of Descartes's natural philosophy which were least plausible, or completely unconvincing, as providing what he took to be evidence for the necessary existence of the Spirit of Nature.
The year after the appearance of the Immortality of the Soul, More published his Explanation of the Grand Mystery of Godliness (1660). Although Richard Ward tells us that More vowed to write this book during a “dangerous fit of Sickness, if it should please God to recover him from it” (Ward 2000, 335), there is every reason to suppose that, after the Immortality, More felt he had said enough about the philosophical background to his beliefs, and fully intended to turn to an explication of his faith. Furthermore, the decision to write an exposition of his religious ideas may have been influenced by the political upheaval following the death of Oliver Cromwell in 1659, and the restoration of the monarchy. More had taken the Engagement late in 1650 (engaging to be true and faithful to the Commonwealth of England) (Gabbey 1992, 113–4) and was therefore in a precarious position on the reinstatement of the exiled and ejected fellows who had refused the Engagement.
By this time More's anti-Calvinism and his emphasis upon rational theology ensured that he was branded as a “Latitude-man” by more conservative divines, and with the return of the exiles to Cambridge the Latitudinarians came to be seen as potentially subversive in both politics and religion (Crocker 2003). If More did write his Grand Mystery of Godliness partially as a response to his precarious situation in Cambridge he did not engage in dissimulation of his beliefs. Evidently More believed that his position was so reasonable that a clear statement of his beliefs would win over his critics and result in his complete rehabilitation. More's chief purpose in the book was to persuade believers that there are only a few essential doctrines of the Church, all other details of one's faith being indifferent to one's salvation, and that all that was required of a good Christian was to recognise and adhere to these essentials.
Unfortunately, but perhaps predictably, More's stratagem did not win over all his readers. For one thing, there were too many people at Cambridge who had a vested interest in bringing him down (as a leading Latitudinarian), and for another, More, typically, could not prevent himself from introducing more theological niceties into his discussion than were compatible with his irenic purposes. In particular, while discussing the dual nature of Christ, as both human and divine, More could not forebear from bringing in the doctrine of the pre-existence of souls, and suggested that Christ's human soul had been in perpetual union with the Father for all eternity (and was in this respect uniquely different from other human souls). More also went on to use his own theory of the three “vehicles” of the soul, aetherial, aerial, and terrestrial, as a way of persuading doubters of the reasonableness of accounts of Christ's resurrection and ascension.
Joseph Beaumont (1616–1699), who had been established as Master of Jesus College after the Restoration but had just moved to become Master of Peterhouse, privately circulated a manuscript raising ten major objections against More's Grand Mystery of Godliness in 1663. More was evidently beleaguered by more widespread opposition in Cambridge at this time, and Edward, Lord Conway, at the urging of his wife, Anne, arranged a preferment for More in Ireland. More weathered the storm, however, even after his Apology of Dr Henry More (1664), a response to Beaumont and other critics, elicited Some Observations on the Apologie of Dr. Henry More (1665) from an unconvinced Beaumont. More's ideas drew further implicit criticism the following year from Samuel Parker (1640–1688), later to become Bishop of Oxford (1686), in his A Free and Impartial Censure of the Platonick Philosophie (1666).
More's position improved as Latitudinarianism came to be seen more sympathetically in Restoration England. Where it was once a disparaging term for someone with a “broad swallow”, who would accept anything, and so was taken to be insincere in everything, it later came to be seen as a genuinely irenic position, and perhaps the best hope for reconciling all factions. It has to be said, however, that as Latitudinarianism came to be seen in this more positive light, More was increasingly exposed, ironically, as too idiosyncratic, too much committed to rather outlandish theological positions, such as his Origenianism, to count as a typical Latitudinarian, who would insist only on a very few fundamental doctrines, all of which were (supposedly) immediately acceptable to all Christians.
One aspect of this can be seen in More's attempts to offer the correct interpretation of the Revelation to St John, which must have reminded some contemporaries of the importance of prophecy and chiliastic claims to many of the radical sectarian groups of the Interregnum period. Perhaps this was another case of More's own tendency towards religious enthusiasm resurfacing. He pursued his interpretation of prophecy in his Synopsis prophetica of 1664 and the Exposition of the Seven Epistles to the Seven Churches of 1669 (and revisited these studies towards the end of his life with a verse by verse analysis of the Revelation in Apocalypsis apocalypseos, 1680, and other apocalyptic works) (Almond 1993, Hutton 1994). In keeping with his dualistic theology, More rejected chiliastic or millenarian expectations of a Day of Judgement which would see a general resurrection of all the bodies of past ages, and argued instead for a more spiritual Second Coming and resurrection. Here again, More drew on his ideas about the aetherial and aerial vehicles of the soul, which he was able to link to the resurrection in heavenly and incorruptible form as conceived by St Paul (1 Corinthians 15, 45–55).
If More's apocalypticism was taking him away from the more anodyne and irenic concerns of the increasing community of Latitudinarian thinkers in England, he showed no regrets. Indeed, from now on More's theology was to develop along increasingly idiosyncratic, and dogmatic lines.
Since the Restoration More had concentrated exclusively on religious writings, some of which were demanded by the writings of his critics. In 1667, however, he produced a work on moral philosophy, the Enchiridion ethicum. It is known that More wrote Latin with difficulty, and it is not clear why he did not publish this in English. It is possible that he hoped to reach a wider, European audience—certainly this would be the motivation, a few years later, for translating his earlier works into a Latin Opera omnia (1675–79)—but this seems an unlikely book with which to introduce oneself to a European readership. There is another possible explanation, with much more restricted local concerns: More published it in Latin to leave room for his friend and colleague Ralph Cudworth to publish his very similar system of ethics in English.
The fact is, as with so many other aspects of their thinking, More and Cudworth shared essentially the same moral philosophy. Cudworth had been preparing his own book on ethics for a number of years but in the event he never published anything in this area. It seems that he abandoned the project when he heard that More was also working on a book on ethics. Cudworth's system was posthumously published under the title, A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality (1731), but it is a title that More might also have used. One of the main aims of More's Manual of Ethics was to leave the reader in no doubt that there are absolute values of good and evil which are co-eternal with God. That is to say, More wished to refute the theological position that whatever God decrees to be good is good, in favour of the alternative theological position, that God wills what is good (and he does so necessarily because He himself conforms to an absolute standard of goodness).
This marks a new phase in More's life-long opposition to Calvinism. The theology of Calvinism is known as voluntaristic theology because it emphasises God's will in the Creation. God can, and did, create the world freely by the power of his omnipotent will. He was constrained by no prior considerations. The opposing view, represented by More, is known as necessitarian, or intellectualist, or even rationalist theology, and is most familiar to modern readers through the satirical representation of it in Voltaire's Candide (1759). In this theology, God cannot create a world arbitrarily, unconstrained by any prior considerations; because God is supremely good he must create the best possible world. The clear implication of this is that what makes a good world, or a better one, and what makes the best one possible, can be specified independently of God. More believed the concepts of good and evil were absolute terms, presumably co-eternal with God, and must necessarily guide, and indeed restrain, God's creative omnipotence.
More's necessitarian theology is very much to the fore in the Divine Dialogues of 1668. Although this is intended to present the main features of his philosophical theology to a much wider audience, it is presented, as the extended title makes plain, in the context of a discussion about the nature of God's Providence. At one point More tells us that “all the Orders of the Creation in the whole Universe” issue from God's “infinite Goodness, Wisdome and Power”, and that His goodness is
So perfect, immutable and permanent, as never… to be carried otherwise than to what is the best, and his wisdome never at a loss to discern, nor his power to execute it…
It is repugnant to reason, More insists, that God “should ever will any thing but what is absolutely for the best” (More 1668, II, 24–25).
More's new theological emphasis is also evident in the rather different attempt to reach a wider audience, this time a learned Latinate audience across Europe, which he published in 1671, his Enchiridion metaphysicum. The Manual of Metaphysics is a major re-statement of More's views on incorporeal substance, or spirit. The main claims are familiar from his earlier philosophical works, therefore, but there are two new, and highly significant, features. Firstly, More fully develops his ideas on absolute infinite space and presents it as a major exemplar of incorporeal spirit (Koyré 1957, Reid 2007, 2012). Secondly, while drawing on contemporary experimental natural philosophy to provide him with examples of phenomena which cannot be explained solely in terms of matter and motion, More explicitly draws upon a specific experiment performed by Robert Boyle, and published by him in his New Experiments Physico-mechanicall touching the Spring of the Air (1660). If Boyle knew of More's Immortality of the Soul (and it is almost certain that he did), he never troubled to comment publicly upon it. Once his own experiments, and his own name, were deliberately invoked to support More's philosophical theology, however, Boyle could not let it pass (Henry 1990).
After an opening discussion in which More argues that the proper subject of metaphysics is incorporeal being, or spiritual substance, More launches into a discussion of the nature of space, which he presents as an exemplary immaterial entity. More dismisses Aristotle's and Descartes's concepts of space before presenting his own in some detail. More's concept will be familiar to modern readers who are acquainted with Newton's notion of absolute space. It is essentially a three-dimensional Euclidean space which is infinite in extent, completely isomorphous, and void except where it is occupied by body. For More, however, it is also the best example of immaterial—and therefore spiritual—reality in the world. What makes it the best example for More is that it is completely undeniable. As one of the characters in More's Divine Dialogues (1668) is made to say, referring to the scholastic tradition of calling the supposed infinite space beyond the sphere of the fixed stars, “imaginary space”: space is “so imaginary that it cannot be dis-imagined by human understanding” (More 1668, 54).
The famous culmination of More's arguments is to draw close parallels between absolute space and God by enumerating “about twenty titles which the metaphysicians attribute to God and which fit the immobile extended [entity] or internal place”. It is worth quoting in full:
When we shall have enumerated those names and titles appropriate to it, this infinite immobile, extended [entity] will appear to be not only something real (as we have just pointed out) but even something Divine (which so certainly is found in nature); this will give us further assurance that it cannot be nothing since that to which so many and such magnificent attributes pertain cannot be nothing. Of this kind are the following, which metaphysicians attribute particularly to the First Being, such as: One, Simple, Immobile, External, complete, Independent, Existing in itself, Subsisting by itself,, In corruptible, Necessary, Immense, Uncreated, Uncircumscribed, Incomprehensible, Omnipresent, Incorporeal, All-penetrating, All-embracing, Being by its essence, Actual Being, Pure Act.
There are not less than twenty titles by which the Divine Numen is wont to be designated, and which perfectly fit this infinite internal place (locus) the existence of which in nature we have demonstrated; omitting moreover that the very Divine Numen is called, by the Cabbalists, MAKOM, that is, Place (locus) (More 1671, 69–70).
More goes through each of the divine attributes in turn to show how they apply to space. He even contrives to apply the final notion, “Pure Act”, to space: “it is aptly called being in act as it cannot but be conceived as existing outside of its causes. And, finally, pure Act, since it exists from itself necessarily, nor is it affected by any other thing, by which it can be completed or acted on in some way” (More 1671, 72).
It is difficult to be sure precisely how closely More wants us to take the analogy between God and space. Clearly space and God are not one and the same, but More at the very least regards space as an instrument, or organ, through which God creates and maintains the world, and without which He could not have created it. It is this last point which is crucial. The beauty, and the forcefulness, of using space as the exemplar of spirit is that (for More at least) its existence cannot be denied. It cannot be denied not just because everyone is aware of space by virtue of everyday experience, but also because, according to More, it is inconceivable that the world could exist without a space for it to occupy. “For we must either acknowledge”, More wrote, “that there is a certain extended [entity] besides matter, or that God could not create finite matter” (More 1671, 42). Herein lies the importance of More's necessitarian theology: not even God could create a material world without first having to create an immaterial space to receive it. Accordingly, the world is necessarily dualistic; God cannot freely create a monistic world, comprised solely of matter. If he chooses to create matter, he must also create spirit, at least in the form of space, if not in other forms (though, of course, More wants to move from space to other immaterial entities).
More's concept of space is crucially important, therefore, for making the truth of his dualistic world picture undeniable, or so he believes. To reinforce the truth of his concept of space More also dismisses what he calls nullibism, the Cartesian view that souls can exist nowhere, or not in space. Clearly, this view completely undermines More's position, and so he dismisses it as nonsensical—for something to exist, More insists, it must exist in space. He also dismisses the view (having previously held it himself, Reid 2003), which he calls holenmerianism, that the immortal soul exists in its entirety in every part of the human body. This is the traditional view in Christian theology, which holds that the soul is in all parts of the body (since all parts are alive), but as the soul is indivisible it cannot be extended through the body (otherwise a severed arm might contain part of the soul, separated from the rest of the soul), but must exist everywhere as a whole (and evidently immediately abandons a severed limb). Again, this is a notion of physical presence which clouds More's claims about the straightforward relationship between existence and space, and so must also be dismissed (Henry 1986, Reid 2003). Indeed, More's objection to holenmerianism, as with nullibism, was that it is nonsensical and merely likely to make the common reader dismiss it out of hand, and by extension, dismiss the concept of soul.
In More's mature philosophy, then, there was a strict dichotomy between matter and spirit but that dichotomy was not defined, as it was in Cartesianism, in terms of extension and non-extension. Because More was committed to the idea that all real entities must exist in space, spirit, no less than body, was extended. Accordingly, body was defined as “A Substance impenetrable and discerpible”, and spirit as “A Substance penetrable and indiscerpible”. Discerpible and indiscerpible, neologisms of More's, can be replaced with divisible and indivisible. Presumably More preferred his new terms because, for those readers who knew Latin, it conveyed a notion of tearing a piece off. More perhaps wanted to avoid objections to the indivisibility of extended spirits of the kind levelled against the concept of atoms: if an atom has dimensions, however small, it is conceptually divisible, even if atomists wish to claim it is physically indivisible. Presumably, More would concede that an extended spirit could be conceptually divided, but his point was that it is impossible (even in thought) to grab hold of a spirit and tear a piece off it. If you are thinking in those terms, you are not thinking properly about the nature of spirit. The other major distinguishing feature of body and spirit, of course, as we have seen, was that bodies were inert and passive, and immaterial spirits were naturally active, and indeed responsible for all activity in the world (Henry 1986, Reid 2003, 2012).
Returning to the Enchiridion metaphysicum, as in the Antidote Against Atheism, and the Immortality of the Soul, More also draws upon various physical phenomena which he believes cannot be explained in terms of the mechanical philosophy, and can only be understood if some other factor is at work, namely the Spirit of Nature. More included an example drawn from the series of experiments Boyle had conducted using the newly invented air-pump, and which he had published in 1660. It is essentially the experiment described in the Immortality of the Soul, in which the piston of the pump lifts a heavy weight (this time 100 pounds, rather than ten), against gravity. The crucial difference is that here it is explicitly described as Boyle did it, and explicitly named as Boyle's experiment.
Although More clearly believed he was engaged in establishing the true religion, and the true philosophy to support it, not everyone agreed. As soon as the Somerset virtuoso, John Beale (1608–1683), saw it, he wrote to Henry Oldenburg, Secretary of the Royal Society, in strident tones:
Did not I tell yu, wt was to be expected from Dr H. M. His confidence is as strong as Enthusiasme; & yet yu see what he does. As if he had a minde to drawe a suspicion, or (at least) to rayse the style of Infamy agst ye R[oyal] S[ociety] & candid Experiment, as to be so Magicall as to call in ye ayde of Spirits & Angels. If Honble Mr Boyles health will bear it, He owes him a chastisement… (Letter, 24 June 1671, Oldenburg 1971, 120).
The chastisement came in Boyle's Hydrostatical Discourse of 1672. Furthermore, it is evident from Boyle's comments that he objected not only to More's bad physics, but also to what he saw as potentially divisive theology. After all, Boyle pointed out, even “Heathen Philosophers” were convinced by their studies of nature of the existence of God, and they had no need to suppose an intermediary Spirit of Nature: “taking no notice of an immaterial principium hylarchicum, they believed things to be managed in a mere physical way according to the General Laws, settled among things Corporeal, acting upon one another” (Boyle 1999, 184). Boyle believed in incorporeal substance but objected to the attempt to prove its existence by relying on a “precarious Principle” such as the Spirit of Nature (Boyle 1999, 184).
Boyle was not alone in his criticisms. Sir Mathew Hale took time off from his legal studies to publish two critiques, which More tried to answer in his Remarks upon two late ingenious Discourses (1676). Somehow Lady Conway heard that “Mr Boyle sayes you had better never have printed it, for you are mistaken in all your experiments” (Nicolson 1992, 420). The German physicist, Johann Christoph Sturm (1635–1703) dismissed More's interpretation of Boyle's experiments in 1676 in Epistola ad Virum Celeberrimum Henricum Morum de Spiritu ipsius Hylarchio. Robert Hooke took the opportunity to reject More's views in his Lampas: or, Descriptions of some Mechanical Improvements of Lamps & Waterpoises of 1677.
It is known that Boyle was intermittently writing a study throughout these years of the various different concepts of Nature at use in different discourses. When this finally appeared in print in 1686 as the Free Enquiry into the Vulgarly Received Notion of Nature, More's ideas were included as a target for Boyle's critical barbs. But Boyle did not just attack More's views on the Spirit of Nature, he also took the opportunity to dismiss More's necessitarian theology, in favour of his own voluntarist theology:
God is a free agent, and created the world, not out of necessity, but voluntarily, having framed it, as he pleased and thought fit, at the beginning of things, when there was no substance but Himself, and consequently no creature, to which he could be obliged, or by which he could be limited (Boyle 2000, 566).
Boyle was not the clearest writer and often garbled his arguments but the implication here (seen more clearly in the claim that he created the world as he pleased than in the claim that he was not obliged to any creature) is that God did not have to create a world in accordance with pre-established values of goodness (Henry 1990). Certainly, he had already denied the claim that God had been obliged to create the best of all possible worlds:
I think it very unsafe to deny that God, who is almighty and omniscient, and an owner of perfections which, for ought we know, are participable in more different manners and degrees than we can comprehend, could not display… them, by creating a work more excellent than this world. And, his immense power and unexhausted wisdom considered, it will not follow either, that because this world of ours is an admirable piece of workmanship, the divine architect could not have bettered it… (Boyle 2000, 495)
In October 1670 More was visited at Cambridge by Francis Mercury van Helmont (1614–1698), son of the famous iatrochemist, Jan Baptista van Helmont (1579–1644), and a student of Jewish Kabbalah. More asked van Helmont if we would visit Anne, Lady Conway, with a view to trying to treat the incessant debilitating headache which had troubled her for many years (and which had defeated every other medical practitioner). As a result of meeting Anne, van Helmont became her resident physician, living at Ragley Hall in Warwickshire, where More himself was a frequent visitor. Van Helmont was a friend and collaborator of the leading Christian cabbalist of the day, Christian Knorr von Rosenroth (1631–1689), and More now had the opportunity to learn about the Jewish Kabbalah. It should be noted that although his own version of the cabbala, as published in his Conjectura Cabbalistica, was nothing more than a method of scriptural interpretation of his own invention, More nevertheless felt that the original Jewish Kabbalah, deriving ultimately from Moses, was the true source of the philosophical theology which More had managed to “reconstruct”.
It came as quite a shock to More, therefore, to learn through van Helmont and through correspondence with von Rosenroth that the Kabbalah, as developed especially by the leading sixteenth-century Kabbalist, Isaac Luria (1534–1572), was a long way from what he had imagined. Its “invincible obscurity” was distasteful to More's rationalist sensibilities, and he also discerned monistic materialism in it, and even pantheism. More's critical writings on Lurianic Kabbalah were included by von Rosenroth in his Kabbala denudata of 1677, and included by More in his Opera omnia in 1679 (Coudert 1992, Crocker 2003).
Unfortunately for More, his failure to be convinced by the spiritual worth of mystical Kabbalah contributed to an increasing distance between him and his great friend Anne Conway. Van Helmont had become interested in Quakerism and introduced Anne to a number of leading Quakers, including George Fox (1624–1691), Robert Barclay (fl. 1670), George Keith (1638?–1716), and William Penn (1644–1718). Evidently the Quakers favoured the Kabbalah and Anne, increasingly favoured the Quakers. During this time Anne was writing her own philosophical system which was published posthumously as The Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy (1690 in Latin, 1692 in English). It is essentially a monistic system in which all things are made of spirit, and she criticises during the course of it not only the materialism of Hobbes and Spinoza, but also the dualism of Descartes, and her erstwhile mentor, More (Conway 1996, Hutton 2004). It seems clear that Anne was growing intellectually, and spiritually, away from More, and seems to have regarded her new Quaker friends, a number of whom evidently now colonised Ragley Hall, as closer to her own developing beliefs. A letter from Lord Conway of 1677 even says that the Quakers in the Hall “have free access to my wife, but I believe Dr. More, though he was in the house all the last summer, did not see her above twice or thrice” (Nicolson 1992, 439–40). More himself during this period seems to have been torn between trying to dissuade her from joining the Quakers, and respect for Anne's carefully thought-out decision to embrace their teachings. Indeed, More even showed a grudging respect for the Quakers themselves, who were obviously serious and sincere, and in some respects their enthusiasms matched his own tendencies in that direction.
It is perhaps worth noting also that John Finch, More's former student and Anne's half-brother, also moved away from More's way of thinking at this time. During his time in Turkey as a diplomat (1674–1681), Finch wrote a large manuscript Treatise of natural philosophy which remains unpublished. Finch's philosophy is materialist and based on an empiricist epistemology, and is highly critical of many of More's views. Rejecting More's dualism, Finch takes an almost Hobbesian line, but couples it with fideism in religion: we cannot prove the existence of God or immaterial substances by the use of reason and so must trust in the Gospels (Crocker 2003).
If nothing else, the fact that two such close admirers of More as John Finch and Anne Conway both came to reject his philosophy shows not only that his philosophy was not as cogent and compelling as he thought, but also that his attempt to use philosophy in the service of religion was seen as unconvincing, or even subversive.
More knew, from the time he wrote his Antidote Against Atheism, that Descartes's philosophy was being appropriated by atheists for their own purposes. It must have been with some dismay that he realised this was a rising tide which his own writings did nothing to quell. And then, as if Cartesian atheism and Hobbesianism were not enough, he heard in the 1670s of new threats to sound religion. One of these was Spinozism, which appalled More as much as it did every other devout believer. The other atheistic threat, dubbed hylozoism by More, was represented by the much less well known English medical writer, Francis Glisson (1597–1677), formerly Regius professor of Physick (i.e. medicine) at Cambridge.
More wrote two short attacks on Spinoza, one against the Tractatus theologico-politicus (1670), which More read in 1677, and one against the “two pillars” of Spinoza's atheism, the necessary existence of substance and that there is only one substance. However, he seems to have written them both hurriedly as he was preparing the Latin translations of his works for inclusion in the second and third volumes of his Opera omnia in 1679 (volume 1 had already appeared in 1675). Indeed, he told Anne Conway that he “could not forbeare” from confuting Spinoza while he was still in the process of reading him. Both of these critiques of Spinoza, were included at the end of volume two and there is little evidence that they made any impression (Hutton 1984, Henry 1987).
In the attack on Spinoza's Tractatus, however, More included an attempted refutation of the claims of Francis Glisson (which More likened to Spinoza's views) that all matter, whether animate or inanimate, is capable of perception, is appetitive, and therefore in some sense alive. This did attract critical attention. Glisson had arrived at his position as a result of physiological research on the stomach and intestines, in which he noticed that these and other parts of the body were sensitive to touch even though there were no nerves present. This is the phenomenon now known as irritability, but in his efforts to explain it Glisson had developed a general theory of matter and body and had published it in his Treatise on the Energetic Nature of Substance (Tractatus de natura substantiae energetica, seu, de vita naturae, 1672).
More's attack on Glisson drew a response from the leading Presbyterian divine, Richard Baxter (1615–1691). Glisson had been Baxter's physician, so presumably Baxter knew him not to be an atheist, but Baxter was not motivated to defend Glisson merely by friendship. As a Calvinist, Baxter subscribed to a voluntarist theology and was appalled by the implications of More's necessitarian theology. More's rejection of Glisson's theory depended upon his claim that matter had to be necessarily inert and that only spirit could be self-active—according to More, not even God could change this, because it was inherent in the very nature of matter that it must be inert, and definitive of spirit that it must be active. For Baxter this was an intolerable circumscription of God's omnipotence on the mere whim of an all too fallible thinker. In a letter to More written in 1681, Baxter said,
I confess I am too dull to be sure that God cannot endue matter itself with the formal virtue of Perception… That Almighty God cannot make perceptive living matter… I cannot prove, or I think you: Where is the contradiction that makes it impossible? (Baxter 1682, 28–9)
As Baxter made clear, he was unimpressed by More's claim that Glisson's view might lead to a denial of the existence of God and the immortality of the soul. For Baxter, More's claim that “God cannot do this” was just as likely to lead to atheism (Baxter 1682, 29).
More published Baxter's letter and his reply to it, An Answer to a Letter of a Learned Psychopyrist, in his edition of Joseph Glanvill's Saducismus Triumphatus of 1682. Glanvill, one of More's most devoted followers, had died before he could produce his response to the anti-witchcraft treatise of John Webster (1611–1682), The Displaying of Supposed Witchcraft (1677), which had attacked Glanvill's earlier books on the reality of witchcraft (Crocker 2003). But Glanvill's books on witchcraft were largely intended as contributions to More's own long standing campaign for proving the existence of a spiritual realm by anecdotal evidence, and so More saw the work through the press. He took the opportunity, however, to add his own most recent attempts to impress his theories on the reading public, including his response to Baxter, an English translation of two chapters from the Enchiridion metaphysicum which defined the nature of spirit, and yet more stories of witchcraft and apparitions which More himself had collected.
More published another work of Glanvill's at this time, his Lux orientalis, a survey of early views on the pre-existence of souls, again intended by Glanvill as a contribution to More's own religious campaign. This was published together with George Rust's Discourse of Truth in a work which More entitled, Two Choice and Useful Treatises (1682). Rust had been a student of More's in the 1650s and had remained a devoted follower while developing his own Origenian theology. More's annotations to Rust's Discourse included a lengthy reply to Baxter's response to An Answer to a… Learned Psychopyrist.
The short pieces in these two collections represent More's final contributions to philosophical theology. Otherwise his final years were devoted to works on the interpretation of the prophetic books of the Bible.
It seems fair to say that although More had a small number of like-minded and devoted followers during his own lifetime, his philosophical theology was for the most part regarded with suspicion by his contemporaries. Even some of those who had been tutored by him, and who admired him personally, most notably John Finch and Anne Conway, could not go along with his claims about the necessity of a dualistic ontology. For those who failed to share More's necessitarian theology, such as Boyle and Baxter, More's views were dangerous to religion. There were others, however, who believed that More's dichotomy between passive matter and active spirit was invaluable for combatting atheism. It was More's anti-atheistic stratagem which lay behind the rejection of John Locke's speculation about the possibility of thinking matter by the Bishop of Worcester, Edward Stillingfleet (1635–1699). If matter could think, then the dichotomy between passive matter and active spirit did not hold, and it would be impossible (the Bishop thought) to use the presence of activity in the world to establish the existence of a necessarily spiritual realm. Locke, like Baxter, merely objected that Stillingfleet's insistence that not even God could make matter capable of thinking, undermined God's omnipotence, and thereby was likely to undermine the faith (Henry 2011).
It was only really after his death that More's reputation began to rise. There was renewed interest in his writings in the early eighteenth century, when More's combination of rationalism with a passionate, almost enthusiastic, faith must have proved heartening to churchmen living in an age of deism. The natural theology which flourished in the age after Isaac Newton led to an increased emphasis on rationalism in religion but it was important for the clergy to avoid descending into deism, and to combine their natural theologies with a belief in Scripture, and with what More would have called the “Grand Mysteries” of religion. His reputation was also helped by the fact that he was seen as a prominent member of the early Latitudinarians, and as this rational and liberal approach to belief became dominant, More could be seen as one of the movement's heroes (even though More himself had always been too dogmatically insistent on recondite matters like pre-existence of souls, the Spirit of Nature, and the whole edifice of necessitarian theology to really be counted as a Latitudinarian). Furthermore, while More had been trying to promote necessitarian theology at a time when voluntarist theology was very much in the ascendant, the eighteenth century saw a reversal, and necessitarian theology, as Voltaire's Candide plainly shows, became characteristic of the Age of Reason. As the eighteenth century progressed More's reputation as a theologian, if not as a philosopher, became assured and it has remained high ever since.
In more recent scholarship More has been seen as a possible influence upon Isaac Newton, particularly his ideas on absolute space, and this, together with his role in introducing Cartesianism into England, has assured his continual inclusion in histories of science of the period. Newton, of Trinity College, is known to have visited More in Christ's College to discuss an interest that they both definitely shared: interpretation of the prophetic scriptures. It is very possible, therefore, that Newton read and was influenced by More's views on space, as presented in the Enchiridion metaphysicum. Like More, Newton also believed that for something to exist it must exist in space, and he identified the immensity of infinite space with the extension of God. Notwithstanding the similarities between their views, it is impossible to be sure whether there was a direct influence. Newton's alchemical interests led him into his own studies of Neoplatonic thought, and it would not have taken much imagination to link these to the idea of space which derived from ancient atomism, and which had been recently revived by Pierre Gassendi (1592–1655), introduced into England by Walter Charleton (1620–1707), and was certainly known to Newton (Hall 1990). Furthermore, it seems highly likely that Newton, like Boyle, Hooke, and other natural philosophers, would not have held More in high esteem as a natural philosopher; far from it. It is known that Newton read the Immortality of the Soul shortly after its publication, but there is no evidence that he ever read the Enciridion metaphysicum. Nor did they share similar religious views. Newton disagreed with More's interpretation of the Book of Daniel and the Revelation, and Newton was very much a voluntarist in his theology and so would have been opposed to More's necessitarianism. Even so, the similarities between their views of space, and its relationship to God, are remarkable (Henry 1993). It seems certain, therefore, that no definitive answer can be given to this issue and debate will continue. What is certain, however, is that More's position in the history of philosophy, and in the history of relations between science and religion, is secure.
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- –––, 1987, “Medicine and Pneumatology: Henry More, Richard Baxter and Francis Glisson's Treatise on the Energetic Nature of Substance”, Medical History, 31: 15–40.
- –––, 1989, “The Matter of Souls: Medical Theory and Theology in Seventeenth-Century England”, in R. K. French and A. Wear (eds), The Medical Revolution in the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 87–113.
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- –––, 1993, “Henry More and Newton's Gravity”, History of Science, 31: 83–97.
- –––, 2011, “Omnipotence and Thinking Matter: John Locke and the Use of Reason in Religion”, in D. Giovannozzi and M. Veneziani (eds), Materia, Atti del XIII Colloquio Internazionale del Lessico Intelletuale Europeo (Roma, 7–9 gennaio, 2010), Florence: Leo S. Olschki, pp. 357–79.
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- –––, 2004, Anne Conway: A Woman Philosopher, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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- –––, 2007, “The Evolution of Henry More's Theory of Divine Absolute Space”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 45: 79–102.
- –––, 2008, “The Spatial Presence of Spirits among the Cartesians”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 46: 91–118.
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