Metaphor is a poetically or rhetorically ambitious use of words, a figurative as opposed to literal use. It has attracted more philosophical interest and provoked more philosophical controversy than any of the other traditionally recognized figures of speech.
- 1. Naming of Parts
- 2. The Ancient Accounts
- 3. Paraphrase
- 4. Four Traditions
- 5. Recent developments
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1. Naming of Parts
But soft, what light through yonder window breaks?
It is the east and Juliet is the sun!
(William Shakespeare, Romeo and Juliet, 2. 2. 2–3)
—History, Stephen said, is a nightmare from which I am trying to awake.
(James Joyce, Ulysses, chap. 2)
A work is a death mask of its conception.
(Walter Benjamin, Einbahnstraße)
When we resort to metaphor, we contrive to talk about two things at once; two different and disparate subject matters are mingled to rich and unpredictable effect. One of these subject matters is already under discussion or at least already up for consideration when a speaker resorts to metaphor in the first place. This is the metaphor’s primary subject or tenor: the young girl Juliet in the case of Romeo’s metaphor; history, Ireland’s history or the world’s, in the case of Stephen’s; works, prose writings in general, in the case of Benjamin’s. The second subject matter is newly introduced with an eye to temporarily enriching our resources for thinking and talking about the first. This is the metaphor’s secondary subject or vehicle: the sun; nightmares from which one tries to awake; death masks, i.e., death masks in general. The primary subject of a metaphor may be a particular thing, or it may be a whole kind of thing, and likewise for the secondary subject—with the result that the metaphor itself may take the verbal form of an identity statement (X is Y) as with Romeo; a predication or membership statement (X is a G) as with Stephen Daedalus; or a statement of inclusion (Fs are Gs) as with Benjamin.
If we ask how primary and secondary subjects are brought into relation by being spoken of together in a metaphor, it seems natural to say that metaphor is a form of likening, comparing, or analogizing. The maker of a metaphor (or the metaphor itself) likens the primary subject to the secondary subject: Romeo (or Romeo’s speech) likens Juliet to the sun, Stephen likens history to nightmares, Benjamin likens works in prose to death masks. But it is unclear what we mean when we say this, to the point where some are reluctant to appeal to likeness or similarity in explaining what metaphor is or how it works. Much of the power and interest of many a good metaphor derives from how massively and conspicuously different its two subject matters are, to the point where metaphor is sometimes defined by those with no pretensions to originality as “a comparison of two unlike things.” The interpretation of a metaphor often turns not on properties the secondary subject actually has or even on ones it is believed to have but instead on ones we habitually pretend it to have: think of what happens when we call someone a gorilla.
Metaphor is but one of many techniques, named and unnamed, for likening one thing to another by means of words. We may employ an explicit comparison of one thing to another, built around like, as, or some other explicit comparative construction, in what’s known as simile:
One walking a fall meadow finds on all sides
The Queen-Anne’s lace lying like lilies on water.
(Richard Wilbur, “The Beautiful Changes”)
He looked about as inconspicuous as a tarantula on a slice of angel food.
(Raymond Chandler, Farewell, My Lovely, chap. 1)
We may interweave parallel observations about two different subject matters by means of so and too and thus. We may liken a whole bunch of things to one another by making conspicuously parallel statements about each, inviting our listener to register the parallelism and ponder its significance. Or we may simply juxtapose mention of a first thing with mention of a second in a suitably conspicuous and suggestive manner:
The apparition of these faces in the crowd;
Petals on a wet, black bough.
(Ezra Pound, In a Station of The Metro)
Part of what is distinctive about metaphorical likening in particular is that in resorting to it, we speak of one thing or kind (the primary subject) as and in terms of a second thing or kind (the secondary subject). Our deployment of language takes place as if primary subject and secondary subject (Juliet and the sun) were one and the same; or as if the primary subject (history) were an instance of the secondary subject (nightmares); or as if the primary subject (works) were included within the secondary subject (death masks). In this sense, the primary subject is spoken of as the secondary subject. Words, idioms, and other ways of talking customarily deployed in connection with the secondary subject (the sun, death masks) are appropriated and redeployed for use in thinking and talking about the primary subject (Juliet, prose works). In this sense, the primary subject is spoken of and thought about in terms of the secondary subject. It is easy to feel that in Romeo’s metaphor, familiar fragments of sun-talk come to be about Juliet without ceasing to be about the sun. If so, the double aboutness exhibited by metaphorical language is something philosophers must strive to understand.
A sentence metaphor typically likens many things or kinds to many other things or kinds at a single verbal stroke. Benjamin’s terse little aphorism manages to liken works to death masks, conceptions to living human beings, the changes a conception undergoes before being incorporated into a finished work to life, the stabilization and stultification it allegedly undergoes after such incorporation to death—and so on. In the context provided by the rest of his speech, Romeo’s exclamation manages to liken Juliet to the sun, her room and balcony to the east, Romeo himself to creatures dependent on the sun for warmth and light and nurturance, Romeo’s old love Rosaline to that lesser light the moon, the sight of Juliet to the light of the sun, Juliet’s appearance at her window as the sun’s rising in the east—and so on. Only some of a metaphor’s primary subjects and some of its secondary subjects are explicitly referred to by any verbal expression contained therein. Listeners must work the others out for themselves. In this respect, every metaphor leaves something implicit.
Nevertheless, some metaphors are explicit in the sense that they liken one or more named things or kinds to one or more other named things or kinds by means of locutions regularly found in overt literal statements of identity, membership, or inclusion:
I am a moth and you are a flame.
I, Ahab, am a speeding locomotive.
while other metaphors are implicit in that they eschew such simple alignments, mingling primary subject language and secondary subject language almost at random, yet in such a way as to leave listeners able to work out which is which and what’s being likened to what else:
I shall flutter helplessly closer and closer until you burn me to death at last.
The path of my fixed purpose is laid with iron rails, whereon my soul is grooved to run. Over unsounded gorges, through the rifled hearts of mountains, under torrents’ beds, unerringly I rush. Naught’s an obstacle, naught’s an angle to the iron way!
—Ahab (Melville, Moby-Dick, chap. 38)
Within the confines of a given metaphor, we distinguish pretty readily between words and phrases that are to be taken metaphorically and others that are to be taken only literally. To take an expression metaphorically is one way to take it figuratively, and to take an expression figuratively is to reinterpret it, to construe it in a manner that departs from but remains informed by some relevant prior literal construal of it. Various other kinds of figurative reinterpretation are exhibited in various other recognized figures of speech: metonymy (This policy covers you from the cradle to the grave), irony (You’re a fine friend), hyperbole (loud enough to wake the dead), and so on.
The portion of a metaphor that undergoes figurative reinterpretation is its focus and the rest is its frame. The focus of a metaphor may be a single word drawn from almost any part of speech. It may be a multi-word phrase like the sun or death mask. It may consist of scattered parts of an extended sentence, the remainder of which is to be taken only literally:
If, baby, I’m the bottom, you’re the top. (Cole Porter)
The path of my fixed purpose is laid with iron rails, where on my soul is grooved to run.
Or it may be an extended phrase, rich in internal syntactic structure:
An aged man is but a paltry thing,
A tattered coat upon a stick …
(W.B. Yeats, “Sailing to Byzantium”)
Philosophers need to elucidate (a) the nature of the difference between taking language literally and taking it metaphorically, the nature, if you will, of the reinterpretation language undergoes when we take it metaphorically, and (b) the nature of the division of expressive labor between a metaphor’s focus and its frame.
Literary theorists regularly acknowledge the existence of extended metaphors, unitary metaphorical likenings that sprawl over multiple successive sentences. There are also contracted metaphors, metaphors that run their course within the narrow confines of a single clause or phrase or word. They reveal themselves most readily when distinct metaphors are mixed to powerful, controlled, anything but hilarious effect:
Philosophy is the battle against [the bewitchment of our intelligence by means of our language]. (Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, §109)
Not all sentence metaphors take the form of declarative sentences by any means: there are metaphorical questions, metaphorical commands, metaphorical optatives, etc. Despite these complications, modern metaphor theory tends to treat the freestanding declarative metaphorical sentence as the fundamental unit of metaphorical action.
2. The Ancient Accounts
This is a distinctively modern development. Ancient philosophers and rhetoricians viewed metaphor as a temporary self-explanatory change in the usage of a general or singular term, typically a noun or noun phrase. When we resort to metaphor, a term that routinely stands for one thing or kind is made to stand for another, suitably related thing or kind instead, and this change in what the term stands for occurs on the fly, without warning and without special explanation. The effect is to transfer the term in question from its accustomed place in our verbal classificatory scheme to some other unaccustomed place for special temporary expressive purposes. For Aristotle, writing in the middle of the fourth century BCE, the figurative redeployment of term counts as a metaphor regardless of precisely how the term’s usual referent and its special temporary referent are related (Poetics 21 1457b ff. See also Rhetoric 3.2 1404b-1505b, 3.4 1406b–1407a, 3.10–11 1410b–1413b). By the time Quintilian and Cicero come along, metaphor is one of many distinct recognized figures of speech, and a self-explanatory terminological transfer counts as metaphorical only if it is based on a real or supposed analogy or likeness between the regular referent and the special temporary one. This matters less than one might expect, since although Aristotle recognized four different kinds of metaphor, he regarded the analogy-based kind as far and away the most interesting and devoted the bulk of his discussion to it.
Sometimes we resort to metaphor because there’s no established term for the thing we want to talk about and no need to contrive a new term that will refer to it once and for all. More often and more interestingly, we resort to metaphor for the sake of the pleasure our audience will take in puzzling it out, the persona it allows us to adopt in addressing our audience, and the quasi-sensory vividness it brings to the audience’s apprehension of whatever we say with its help. (See Cicero, De Oratore, 55 BCE, 3.159–60)
Aristotle portrays the understanding of a simple metaphor as a stimulating exercise in analogical equation solving. Suppose Empedocles employs the term ‘old age’ under circumstances where it looks for all the world as if what is really being discussed is the course of a single day. Old age itself lacks any immediate bearing on efforts to understand the course of a single day, so we conjecture that on this special occasion, the term “old age” stands for something with the kind of immediate bearing on efforts to understand the course of a single day that old age itself has on efforts to understand some other subject matter readily called to mind by invoking old age—namely, the course of a single human life. Just as old age constitutes the final stage of the course of a single life, what constitutes the final stage of the course of a single day is evening. Old age is to a life as evening is to a day. We thus infer that on this special occasion, “old age” is being employed to refer to evening, and we interpret the sentence in which it figures accordingly (Poetics 10 1457b).
In working this out, we activate and begin to explore a complex and potentially fruitful analogy between the way a person’s physical and intellectual powers wax and wane over the course of a single human life and the way the sun’s powers wax and wane over the course of a single day, between the way individual human lives repeat each other with variations in the course of an extended human lineage and the way individual days do so over the course of a year, and so on. The effort to recover a simple metaphorical meaning (evening) for the term “old age” calls forth a beneficial, pleasurable, complex intellectual effort from us. The sentence we thereby come to understand may say something simple and unambitious that could easily be said without resorting to metaphor, but the effort to recover this meaning has a cognitive value transcending that of the meaning itself. Something happens to the terms on which we access our own thoughts about days and how they run: evening is set before our eyes in the suggestive and instructive guise of an elderly human being. For discussion see Ricoeur (1997, 9–43), Moran (1996), Halliwell (2003, 189–191). On ancient rhetoric and poetics more generally, see the entries Aristotle’s Rhetoric and Plato on Rhetoric and Poetry in this encyclopedia.
As modern poetics developed out of ancient rhetoric, the temptation to regard metaphors as meaning or communicating or at the very least suggesting something inherently complex, open-ended, and resistant to compact literal statement became stronger and stronger.
Sometimes the effort to render a given original in a given medium requires approximation and elaboration of various sorts, so that any rendering of the given original in the given medium will be correct only up to a point and incorrect thereafter (such is approximation) and more complex or longwinded than the thing rendered (such is elaboration). When this is the case we often call our renderings paraphrases of their originals. Sometimes originals and paraphrases are both verbal, and the aim of the paraphrase is to explain or exposit the original: think of a lawyer’s paraphrase of an obscure statute or a preacher’s paraphrase of a cryptic Bible passage. Sometimes neither original nor paraphrase is verbal and the aim is to adapt the original in some sense or other: think of a polyphonic paraphrase by Palestrina of a snatch of medieval plainsong or the paraphrase of an acanthus leaf in the design of a Corinthian capital.
The effort to translate a literary work from one language to another, to render the original work in a language not its own, involves a complex mixture of exposition and adaptation. Translational rendering is especially likely to resort to approximation and elaboration—paraphrase—when confronted by metaphors and other figures of speech. Yet it is often said that poetry is what’s lost in translation, to the point where Coleridge proposed “untranslatableness in words of the same language without injury to the meaning” as “the infallible test of a blameless style” (Biographia Literaria, chap. 22.) If metaphor is a form of poetry, it might seem to follow that paraphrase in words of the same language is impossible or uncalled for where metaphor is concerned. The American New Critic Cleanth Brooks argued as much in a famous essay called “The Heresy of Paraphrase” (1947).
Nevertheless, there is a familiar way of registering how one takes or understands a given metaphor, naturally called paraphrase, such that dispensing with it entirely would condemn articulate consumers of metaphor to an unproductive silence. It is hard not to sympathize with Stanley Cavell when he writes in “Aesthetic Problems of Modern Philosophy” (1969):
Now suppose I am asked what someone means who says, “Juliet is the sun.” … I may say something like: Romeo means that Juliet is the warmth of his world; that his day begins with her; that only in her nourishment can he grow. And his declaration suggests that the moon, which other lovers use as an emblem of their love, is merely her reflected light, and dead in comparison; and so on. In a word, I paraphrase it. Moreover, if I could not provide an explanation of this form, that is a very good reason, a perfect reason, for supposing that I do not know what it means. Metaphors are paraphrasable.
The “and so on” which ends my example of paraphrase is significant. It registers what William Empson called the “pregnancy” of metaphors, the burgeoning of meaning in them… The over-reading of metaphors so often complained of, no doubt justly, is a hazard they must run for their high interest.
Perhaps we can agree that explications of the sort Cavell has in mind exist and have some legitimate role to play in the understanding and appreciation of metaphor—and agree to call such explications paraphrases—while agreeing to disagree about how they relate to the language they purport to explain.
4. Four Traditions
The mid twentieth century saw a striking renewal of interest in metaphor theory, marked by interdisciplinary collaboration of a close and ongoing kind. Poets and novelists, linguists and literary critics, analytic philosophers and continental philosophers all got in on the act and followed each other’s work with remarkable care and closeness. Accounts of metaphor developed in this period fall into four basic types.
4.1 Semantic Twist Accounts
Semantic Twist Accounts hold that metaphor results from the interaction or interanimation of words and word meanings as they are brought together and act on each other in the settings provided by particular utterances made on particular concrete occasions.
When we take an uttered sentence as a metaphor, we assign it a new and distinctively metaphorical meaning. The assignment of fresh meaning to the sentence as a whole results from a more local assignment of fresh meaning to one or more of the sentence’s constituent words or phrases, the ones we take metaphorically, the focal words or phrases. The meanings assigned the remainder of the sentence, the framing words or phrases, remain unchanged. (Here it’s taken for granted that whatever meanings may be, they obey a compositionality principle, according to which the meaning of a complex expression is a function of the meanings of its elementary components and the manner in which those components are woven together by the complex expression’s syntax.)
The frame isn’t a passive bystander to changes in the interpretation of the focus: it induces and controls these changes. When we attempt to take each and every part of the sentence in the most literal and straightforward way possible, there proves to be something deviant, incongruous, or otherwise out of order—something semantically or pragmatically inappropriate, something incoherent at worst and strained at best—about how we must then take the sentence as a whole. If unstrained, coherent, contextually appropriate sense is to be made of the sentence as a whole, something’s gotta give. What in fact does give is our straightforward literal understanding of the focal expressions. The meanings of these expressions undergo a metaphorical twist, a twist produced by the more unyieldingly literal meanings of the expressions that serve as the metaphor’s frame.
Metaphor results from a kind of tension between the literal meanings accruing to the focus and the literal meanings accruing to the frame, a tension which disappears when we alter the meanings accruing to the focus just enough to make it disappear. Paraphrase is an effort to re-express the new metaphorically determined sentence meaning in more literal or at least, less ambitiously metaphorical terms. Influential early semantic twist accounts were provided by I.A. Richards (1936), Max Black (1954), and Monroe Beardsley (1962).
An especially lucid and careful version is offered by the literary scholar Harold Skulsky (1986, 1992). Skulsky maintains that when a speaker speaks figuratively, he switches from ordinary vernacular English to an improvised dialect, a metaphorese, that is richer than the vernacular in the speech act potentials it accords certain particular sentence forms, the meanings it accords certain particular words or phrases, or both—a dialect the listener must master on the spot and on the fly, treating the speaker’s tiny specimen of correct usage as her main concrete guide to how it differs from the familiar vernacular. We have willful and challenging linguistic innovation on the part of a speaker, followed by a resourceful struggle to keep up on the part of a listener, “a distinctive kind of cooperative activity halfway between a game and a rite” that requires and thereby elicits a special cognitive rapport between speaker and listener (1992, 24).
Figuration occurs only when:
(a) The speaker’s utterance proves gratuitously “confusing” as long as we attempt to interpret it in accord with established vernacular rules assigning speech act potentials to sentence forms and meanings to words or phrases.
(b) Speaker and listener alike are well acquainted with a shared stock of methods for equipping sentence forms with temporary non-vernacular speech act potentials (schemes) and words and phrases with temporary non-vernacular meanings (tropes). Schemes and tropes provide ways of being conventionally unconventional in our employment of language.
Many schemes and tropes are such that the innovations they license at a given point depend on what’s mutually understood to be the case for present communicative purposes, what’s implicitly taken as true or at least truistic, at the point where the innovation occurs. Any such assumption is what Skulsky calls a talk postulate. Something may be a talk postulate because it’s so widely and firmly believed as to be obvious (and obviously obvious), or because we’re assuming it for the time being for purposes of argument, or simply because it’s something we routinely pretend to believe in particular conversational settings. The crucial points are three:
(a) Talk postulates needn’t be believed, either by people in general or by the parties to the particular conversation at hand.
(b) It is talk postulates, not the actual or presumed beliefs of the participants, that determine what can and can’t be intelligibly asserted, ordered, asked, etc. in a given conversational setting.
(c) Talk postulates are and need to be community property, with the consequence that the broader the community is in which they are to function, the harder it becomes to modify them by means of individual conversational moves.
The conventional vernacular use of a declarative form like “You laughed” is to assert and thereby inform you that you just now did just that—laugh. But asserting this to you or informing you of it is out of the question if you’ve just burst out laughing at a funeral; under the circumstances, your laughter can’t conceivably come as news to you. A scheme, call it the scheme of rebuke, enables me to use this sentence form in a conventionally unconventional manner to blame you for your laughter or scold you for your laughter when (and because) informing you of it is manifestly out of the question.
A trope, by contrast, is a recipe for turning out new word or phrase meanings when none of the vernacular ones will do. Hyperbole and metonymy may be understood as tropes in this sense, and so can metaphor:
Consider what the murderers say when Macbeth asks if they’re kindly disposed toward their oppressor: “We are men, my liege” [3.1.96]. … The sentence as uttered is pointlessly true; but this time [unlike the laughing at a funeral case], what needs reinterpreting isn’t the vernacular force of the sentence; asserting is a good move after a question. Here the culprit is “men,” which can’t be taken at face value. In context the vernacular meaning has to yield to another one related to it in some familiar way, maybe by a loose kind of implication. When it comes to feelings about oppressors, the relevant truism or folklore assumption about being men is that they’re the kind of creatures that keep track both of injuries and chances to get even. “Men” here means creatures like that. (1992, 9–10)
Here being G is an implication of being F in a particular conversational setting just in case it readily follows from talk postulates conspicuously active there that whatever is F is also G. In the Macbeth case, whatever is a man is such that he keeps track of injuries and is ready to avenge himself on those who injure him whenever he can. The recipe for metaphor, then, might read something like this:
If being F is what it would take for the term T to apply in some conversationally salient vernacular sense, and being G is an implication of being F given the talk postulates active in the current conversational setting, then being G will be what it takes for T to apply in one available temporary, non-vernacular, metaphorese sense. Whether T actually takes on this sense depends on how T is best disambiguated in metaphorese given the current conversational setting.
4.2 Pragmatic Twist Accounts
Pragmatic Twist Accounts maintain that when we resort to metaphor, we use words and phrases with their standard literal meanings to say one thing, put one thing into words, yet we are taken to mean, taken to assert or acknowledge or otherwise indicate, something entirely different. Our sentence as used by us means one thing, we in using it mean or are properly construed as meaning something entirely different. Metaphor is a genre of deliberate and overt suggestion, one by means of which speakers commit themselves to, implicitly vouch for the truth of, the things they suggest. Paraphrase is an effort to get at what is metaphorically suggested by putting it (or some part of it, or some approximation to it) directly into words, thereby explicitly saying (more or less fully and more or less accurately) what was implicitly vouched for by the original metaphorical utterance.
The thought that metaphor concerns what speakers mean as opposed to what their words mean is old and widespread. Often it comes with the further thought that metaphor reveals by concealing—revealing things in the end by concealing them at the outset.
The poet says B but he means A. He hides A in B. B is the normal everyday meaning that the words so to speak “ought” to have on the face of them, and A is what the poet really has to say to us, and which he can only say through or alongside, or by modifying, these normal everyday meanings. A is his own new, original, or poetic meaning. (Barfield, 1962)
The first concerted attempt to build a philosophical account of metaphor around these familiar ideas was Grice’s account of conversational implicature in the second of his 1967 William James Lectures, which appeared with various supplementations and afterthoughts as Grice (1989).
The following exposition lightly modernizes Grice’s own at certain points. For fuller discussions of Grice’s work as a whole see the entries concerning Paul Grice, implicature, and pragmatics. Detailed elaborations of Grice’s account of metaphor were offered by Searle (1979a) and Martinich (1984).
A conversation is a loosely collaborative exchange of information having one or more mutually understood aims. Participants presume they share certain pertinent information already, but each is presumed to need further information the others might be in a position to provide. In conversations we can and regularly do hold the other participants responsible for the truth of both more and less—in some ways more, in other ways less—than they explicitly put into words. For once a conversation is under way, each of us is entitled to interpret the words of the others in light of the supposition that they are cooperative, rational, and unconfused about the current state of conversational play, even if there is good reason to doubt or disbelieve this supposition, e.g. even if they exhibit troubling signs of recklessness or deceitfulness. This is an application to speech of a much more general principle: in improvised voluntary collaborations of any sort, the responsibilities a given party shoulders are those he willingly lets himself seem ready to shoulder, no more and no less.
So my words may imply something I don’t: if something my words imply is manifestly so firmly accepted already as to need no certification from me, or so firmly rejected or patently unknowable by me as to be unable to benefit from any certification I might attempt, it forms no part of what I commit myself to in speaking my words. On the other hand, I may imply something my words don’t: I can and do vouch for the truth of a thing that isn’t implied by the words I speak when my audience can square my utterance of those words with the supposition that I am cooperative, rational, and unconfused about the state of conversational play only by assuming that I am in a position to vouch for that thing’s truth (in that I believe it and have good grounds for believing it) and am prepared to actually do so. Such, nearly enough, was how Grice defined the special kind of speaker meaning he dubbed conversational implicature.
This tells us what implicature is but not how it happens. For that we need four more ideas. (1) Declarative sentences are standing equipment for calling attention to the propositions they express: the proposition an uttered sentence calls to mind most immediately, reliably, and deliberately is the one it semantically expresses. (2) Once a conversation is under way I can vouch for the truth of any proposition whatsoever by calling attention to it with a sufficient show of deliberateness, if I am plausibly in a position to vouch for its truth and if no other plausible motive for calling attention to it can be expected to come to mind. (3) Suppose I call attention to a thing of any sort with a sufficient show of deliberateness. If the thing strikes my audience as a fully appropriate object of attention in its own right, their attention will dwell on it and go no further; they’ll treat my drawing their attention to it as an end in itself, as it were. But if the thing doesn’t strike them as an appropriate resting place for their attention, they’ll view my drawing their attention to it as a means to some further attentional end, an effort to refer attention onward to some further, ultimately more worthy object. (4) What a cooperative, rational, unconfused speaker is out to vouch for as true in speaking as she does includes both what she is out to get across, the part expected to address her listener’s presumed informational needs, and a rudimentary rationale for speaking as she does, serving to reconcile the words she produces with the supposition that she is cooperative, rational, and unconfused. For without a reputation for being cooperative, rational, and unconfused, a speaker simply won’t be able to collaborate effectively with her audience. Of course, parts of what she is out to vouch for may do double duty, meeting the listener’s informational needs while at the same time helping to preserve or cultivate her own reputation.
So: if she is cooperative, rational, and unconfused, a speaker does her best to endow her contribution—the content she is out to vouch for, the part of that content she is out to get across, and the verbal form she employs for these purposes—with certain features that are manifestly desirable from her listener’s point of view. She does her best to comply with certain familiar conversational maxims:
Quality: Be truthful: vouch only for what you believe and is well supported by your evidence.
Quantity: Make what you are out to get across informative but not overinformative, appropriate in scope and shape to what a listener can readily absorb in a single conversational turn.
Relation: Make what you are out to get across relevant to the listener’s presumed informational needs.
Manner: Manage the relation between what you are out to get across and the words by means of which you endeavor to get it across so as to render your utterance clear, unambiguous, efficient, and orderly. (26–7)
(The maxims concern characteristics that are matters of degree, so the best way to read them is a matter of some controversy. On the interpretation adopted here, I obey Relation if and only if what I am out to get across is both (a) adequately relevant and (b) about as relevant as I can readily make it without sacrificing anything of comparable importance. Similarly for the other maxims. On this interpretation, Gricean maxims don’t call on us to maximize anything.)
Listeners know that cooperative, rational, unconfused speakers do their best to comply with the maxims. So speakers can arrange for a difference between what they express and what they are properly taken to vouch for by speaking so as to put their reputation for cooperativeness, rationality, and unconfusedness in a kind of controlled short-term jeopardy from which their listeners can readily rescue them.
Suppose speaker S expresses proposition P in words W. And suppose circumstances are such that if we were to understand S as out to vouch for the truth of P and P alone, no more and no less, in uttering W, we would thereby portray S as avoidably violating maxim M or at least, avoidably inviting the suspicion that she is avoidably violating it, with the consequence that either her contribution is gratuitously unresponsive to her audience’s informational needs or she is gratuitously neglecting to maintain her reputation as cooperative, rational, and unconfused. In either case, she wouldn’t be behaving as a cooperative, rational, unconfused speaker must. To clear her her of this charge, to square our interpretation of her words with the governing supposition that she is behaving as a cooperative, rational, unconfused speaker must, we need to find something more or something else she might be out to vouch for.
Four basic scenarios are possible here.
(1) Sometimes P and P alone is what S is out to get across, despite the fact that getting P and P alone across by means of W manifestly violates some particular maxim. In that case S may be designedly calling attention to, hence trying to vouch for the truth of, some plausible account of why her informational and expressive resources leave her in a position where some such violation couldn’t be helped—confront her with a clash of maxims.
A: Where does C live?
B: Somewhere in the South of France.
[B implicitly signals that he can’t be adequately informative and truthful at the same time, hence implicates that he doesn’t know which town C lives in.] (32)
(2) Sometimes getting P and P alone across by means of W would manifestly violate some maxim or other if S were in a position to vouch for any of various manifestly more desirable propositions by expressing one of them via any of various manifestly available sequences of words. In that case S may be designedly calling attention to, hence trying to vouch for the truth of, some plausible account of why she couldn’t do this—why her respect for the maxims actually puts each of these more desirable-looking contributions off limits.
A: Some students passed. [A implicitly signals that he isn’t in a position to offer the more informative, equally compact All students passed, hence implicates that (for all he knows) some students didn’t pass.]
(3) Sometimes the expression of P by means of W would manifestly violate some particular maxim if P and P alone were what S was out to get across, but the natural inference is that what she was out to get across was P and then some: the expression of P by means of W readily calls to mind some unique more inclusive story Q about the world of which P forms an essential part, such that S might plausibly be in a position to vouch for Q’s truth and such that doing so by means of W, if it could be managed, might plausibly comply with all the maxims. In that case S may be designedly calling attention to, hence trying to vouch for the truth of, the whole of Q.
A: I am out of petrol.
B: There’s a garage around the corner.
[B implicates that the garage in question may be open and may have gas to sell, hence may be an efficient way to satisfy A’s declared need, since only against this background could the expressed fact that the garage is around the corner be expected to be relevant to A’s informational needs.] (32)
(4) Last but not least, sometimes the expression of P by means of W would manifestly violate some particular maxim if P formed any essential part of what S was out to get across, and the natural inference is that what she was out to get across is something entirely different: the expression of P by means of W readily calls to mind some unique alternative message Q about the world of which P forms no part whatsoever, such that S might plausibly be in a position to vouch for Q’s truth and such that doing so by means of W, if it could be managed, might plausibly comply with all the maxims. (Such is the residual force of the idea that verbal expressions of P are equipment for asserting P that S will still be viewed as vouching for the truth of P as well unless doing so is manifestly out of the question in the circumstances at hand, as it often will be. What she won’t be vouching for is P’s value or interest in the light of her listener’s presumed informational needs.)
When such a Q readily comes to mind, S may be designedly calling attention to, hence trying to vouch for the truth of, Q. In such a case, S is enabled to fulfill a conversational maxim (by meaning something other than what she actually expresses) precisely by speaking in such a way that she would flout the maxim, blatantly violate it, if she were to mean what she says. Grice speaks in such cases of exploiting the maxim in question. To exploit a maxim is to fulfill it “at the level of” what one means by manifestly and avoidably violating it—flouting it—“at the level of” what one expresses.
There are two main ways to play out this scenario.
On the first, Q admits of intelligible and compact expression but is something the speaker is understandably reluctant to assert outright. The notorious letter of recommendation example is of this kind.
A: Dear Sir, Mr. X’s command of English is excellent, and his attendance at tutorials has been regular.
“[A] cannot be unable, through ignorance, to say more, since the man is his pupil; moreover, he knows more information than this is wanted [and information of a different kind: A would be in violation of Quantity if what he said formed any part of what he meant]. He must, therefore, be wishing to impart information he is reluctant to write down. This supposition is only tenable if he thinks Mr. X is no good at philosophy. This, then, is what he is implicating.” (33)
On the second, Q is so extensive or so resistant to intelligible compact expression for other reasons that the benefits to speaker and listener alike of a terse and simple utterance outweigh the inferential costs to the listener involved in extracting a large message from a small package. This is often the case with allusions, for instance. Where outright explicit assertion can’t be managed or can be managed only with excessive effort on both sides, suggestion has to suffice and will violate no general conversational norms.
Grice proposes that metaphor exemplifies this second playing out of the flouting scenario. Suppose I say to you, “you’re the cream in my coffee.” No human being literally is or literally could be a dollop of viscous potable dairy product I could literally stir into a piping hot breakfast beverage. This is a commonplace your acceptance of which isn’t about to be shaken by any words from me. So for you to take me as out to get that across, alone or in combination with other things, would be for you to take me to be “blatantly and inexplicably” violating Quantity (and/or Relation); you’d be portraying me as being utterly, obviously, and to all appearances pointlessly untruthful, uninformative, and irrelevant. But in circumstances such as these, the proposition that you’re the cream in my coffee reliably calls to mind a certain particular other proposition, “attributing to [you] some feature or features in respect of which [you] resemble (more or less fancifully) the mentioned substance.” Perhaps it’s the proposition that you’re such a comforting luxury (for me) that you’ve become a necessity (for me) for most intents and purposes—a proposition whose explicit expression is regrettably clumsy and longwinded and ungenerous. (In fact the 1924 DeSylva, Brown, and Henderson lyric Grice is quoting from continues as follows: “You’re the cream in my coffee, / You’re the salt in my stew, / You will always be / My necessity, / I’d be lost without you…”) The only obvious reason I could have for calling your attention to this proposition in these circumstances is in order to get it across and hence, vouch for its truth. So I do vouch for its truth.
By speaking of “more or less fanciful resemblance,” Grice reinstated the ancient idea that metaphor is a special figure based in some special way upon likeness or analogy. Subsequent advocates of an implicature approach to metaphor were sometimes skeptical about this feature of the account. Searle, for instance, found it hard to see any real resemblance between literally cold things and metaphorically cold people. After starting a long list of possible relations between what a metaphorical speaker says about an object and what she should be taken to mean, he despairs of completing it:
The question, “How do metaphors work?” is a bit like the question, “How does one thing remind us of another thing?” There is no single answer to either question… (Searle, Introduction to Expression and Meaning, 1979, x)
This registers an important general fact about pragmatic explanations in the Gricean style. Conversational implicatures can come off only if something in particular reliably comes to mind once there is an appearance of a maxim violation to explain or explain away. Often enough, something in particular does reliably come to mind, but Gricean conversational principles in and of themselves do nothing to explain what comes to mind or why it does so.
One and the same metaphor can often be plausibly paraphrased in substantively different ways. Yet Grice’s account appears to depend on there being some unique alternative message that reliably comes to mind when the speaker’s words are pondered. It has struck some commentators that metaphorical interpretation involves a kind of indeterminacy Gricean implicature theory can’t readily accommodate. See Davis (1998), 70–74 and the response by Saul (2001) for the main arguments on both sides.
There is also the phenomenon of twice-apt metaphor (Hills, 1997, 2008). Consider Romeo’s death speech:
Romeo: Here’s to my love! [He drinks] O true apothecary!
Thy drugs are quick. Thus with a kiss I die.—5.3.119–120
Who’s the true apothecary? The impoverished pharmacist who sold Romeo the poison, or death itself? Both, surely. From time to time we are induced to construe one and the same utterance both literally and metaphorically. In such cases an utterance is already apt, already in complete accord with pertinent conversational norms, when regarded as an effort to mean what one says, no more and no less. Yet a metaphoric reconstrual of the utterance comes to mind anyway, without the spur of any threatened impropriety in the initial literal construal on which it is based, and listeners view the speaker as vouching for the truth of both construals at once.
Determinacy worries help motivate one influential and sweeping reworking of Gricean pragmatics, the relevance theory of Sperber and Wilson (1995, also Wilson and Sperber 2002). In an early and somewhat simplified formulation (Sperber and Wilson 1985), relevance theory takes metaphor to be an especially dramatic form of loose talk and takes talk in general to be at least somewhat loose most of the time. What is meant typically departs from what is said, to the point where all a speaker ever commits herself to in expressing a proposition is a noteworthy interpretive resemblance between this proposition and the one whose truth she is out to vouch for. (Two propositions bear an interpretive resemblance to one another in a given setting to the extent that they have similar consequences, given whatever is mutually taken for granted in that setting.) And speakers can anticipate what competent listeners will take them to mean only up to a point. What they can most firmly anticipate being taken to mean is strongly implied by their utterance, what they may or may not be taken to mean, depending on facts about the listeners they aren’t in a position to know, is only weakly implied. The result is that what’s meant by an utterance, what the speaker vouches for in speaking as she does, isn’t sharply delimited but trails off, in much the way that good paraphrases typically trail off.
When a listener L provisionally decides that utterance U is worth processing, he goes into the deductive inference business in the following highly specific manner:
(a) L starts with U alone as his premise set P, but he gradually adds auxiliary assumptions to P, starting with what’s most salient (in the present context) and most firmly taken for granted (for present conversational purposes), but proceeding eventually to add assumptions that are progressively less and less salient, less and less firmly taken for granted.
(b) L proceeds to derive consequences from his slowly expanding premise set P, starting with the most immediate and easily derived ones, but proceeding eventually to derive others that are more and more remote, more and more difficult to derive.
(c) As he does so, L retains any derived consequences he judges to be sufficiently novel, sufficiently credible, and sufficiently worthy of his attention, given an understanding of his needs and interests and responsibilities as a consumer of information that’s presumptively shared by himself and the speaker, accumulating these consequences in a set C.
(d) L continues until he finally harvests a set of consequences C he regards as adequately compensating him for the effort it took to obtain it—or he despairs of reaching such a point and casts about for some other stimulus to process instead.
In the former case, where L does eventually feel adequately compensated for his processing of U, he stops processing U at this break-even point and takes U to properly convey the consequence set C. In the latter case, L doesn’t treat U as properly conveying anything at all.
In general C will be in some ways stronger, in other ways weaker, than U itself. In some ways stronger, since auxiliary hypotheses have got in on the act. In other ways weaker, since various parts of U’s own content that have been judged to be old news, obviously false, or simply not worth attending to have fallen by the wayside.
Suppose this is how listeners always process utterances. Then to the considerable extent that speakers can anticipate the course of such processing (what will get added to the premise set, what consequences will get drawn, what will get discarded along the way, where the break-even point will be reached), speakers can anticipate what listeners will make of their words. Yet they can’t anticipate the course or extent of listeners’ processing in complete detail, with the result that their responsibility for what a listener makes of their words, the degree to which they can be said to have vouched in advance for the results of the listener’s processing, trails off as this processing continues. Sperber and Wilson contend that this processing model accounts for standard Gricean implicatures, metaphors included, without requiring the listener to reconstruct the speaker’s precise rationale for speaking as she did and without a rich and contentious set of conversational norms.
But why should we believe that this is how listeners always process inferences?
First, it is a general principle of human cognition (and one whose truth we all implicitly recognize) that our attention always goes to whatever stimulus in our environment (if any) looks to be most worth processing then and there, whatever looks then and there to be “optimally relevant” (if anything does). A stimulus counts as just plain relevant if it’s worth processing at all, and how relevant or worth processing a stimulus actually is depends jointly on two things about it:
(a) how much novel and pertinent information one could extract by processing the stimulus, and
(b) how little processing effort it would cost us to extract this information.
The processing of any stimulus takes the form of extracting more and more remote consequences from the conjunction of it with less and less antecedently salient, less and less antecedently taken-for-granted, auxiliary assumptions. Such is the Cognitive Principle of Relevance.
Second, in claiming the attention of a listener at all, a speaker implicitly assures him that the stimulus she’s offering him is relevant and indeed optimally relevant—the most relevant stimulus within reach. (In view of the Cognitive Principle, he wouldn’t process her utterance unless he took it to be the most relevant stimulus within reach, so to induce him to process it, she must get him to take it to be the most relevant stimulus within reach.) Such is the Communicative Principle of Relevance.
From these principles, Sperber and Wilson deduce two key corollaries:
(I) When I provisionally deem a stimulus optimally relevant, I undertake to keep processing it until one of two things happens: (a) I reap a consequence set that strikes me as worth the effort I’ve so far invested, or (b) I change my mind about whether the stimulus is indeed optimally relevant. Whether it would seem worth my while to process this stimulus any further once I reached the break-even point would depend on further information available to me if and when I actually reach that point.
(II) In claiming the attention of a listener for her utterance, and thus implicitly vouching for its optimal relevance, the speaker is implicitly vouching for the truth of all the propositions she can expect the listener to collect into his consequence set by processing that utterance to the extent implicitly encouraged by deeming the utterance optimally relevant.
If we grant both (I) and (II), then we have at once a story about why listeners process utterances as relevance theory claims and a story about why speakers implicitly vouch for the results of such processing, insofar as these results are foreseeable. In claiming the attention of L for my utterance U, I’m implicitly vouching for the truth of whatever I can expect L to come up with if he processes U the way he’d process any promising stimulus and continues to do so until it yields a result that adequately repays his investment of effort to date. But this is all I implicitly vouch for in speaking as I do. After that, the listener is on his own.
The trickiest part of this is the argument for (II). Suppose some significant part of the consequence set C that L can be expected to extract from U is either (undetectably) false or (undetectably) undeserving of L’s attention. This would detract in a very substantial way from the relevance of U: falsity of the part detracts very substantially from overall truth, and lack of pertinence in the part detracts very substantially from overall pertinence. So substantially, in fact, that S will almost always have available to her some other utterance U* the processing of which would have yielded L more in the way of overall pertinent truth than U does—even if we make allowances for motives S may have to conceal part of what she knows from L. If this is the case, then U will scarcely be optimally relevant, the most relevant stimulus within reach, since U* is more relevant and it’s definitely within reach as well.
It’s possible to suspect that this argument equivocates in its final stages. Until then, “U is optimally relevant” appears to mean:
U is the most relevant to L of the various actual stimuli it is in L’s power to attend to here and now, given L’s presumed informational needs.
This is what S implicitly claims in inviting L to attend to her utterance. Yet in those final stages, “U is optimally relevant” needs to mean instead:
U is the most relevant to L among the various possible stimuli it’s in S’s power to offer L here and now, given S’s information and L’s presumed informational needs.
4.3 Comparativist Accounts
Ancient Greek poetry was rich in extended explicit comparisons—similes—of the sort we now call epic or Homeric. At Iliad 20.164–73, Aeneas is bearing down on Achilles when the roles of attacker and attacked are abruptly reversed; this is a literal rendering from (Stott, 2006):
… He rushed against him like a rapacious lion
that men are eager to kill, the whole town,
once they have gathered. He ignores them
going his own way, but when one of the young men, swift in battle,
strikes him with a spear, then he crouches down with open mouth,
foam appears around his teeth, and his brave spirit groans in his heart,
and he lashes his ribs and flanks with his tail
on both sides, urging himself to fight.
With glowing eyes he charges forcefully forward
to see if he will kill one of the men or himself be slain in the crowd.
Ancient rhetoricians would maintain that Homer’s simile and a metaphor employing the epithet “the lion” so as to manifestly refer to the man Achilles are alike in that they make or present one and the same comparison, each in its own way: both bits of language compare Achilles to a lion. Aristotle goes on to contend that “similes are metaphors needing an explanatory word” (Poetics 1407a)—as if the difference between the “The lion [Achilles] rushed” (metaphor) and “He [Achilles] rushed as a lion” (simile) came down to the presence in the latter of a stage direction indicating that Achilles went on the attack in the guise of a lion. A simile is thus a lengthened metaphor. Quintilian turns things round, speaking of metaphors as shortened similes:
In general terms, Metaphor is a shortened form of Simile; the difference is that in Simile something is [overtly] compared with the thing we wish to describe, while in metaphor one thing is substituted for the other.—Institutio Oratoria, ca. 95 AD, 8.6, 8–9.
Like his fellow ancients, Quintilian conceived metaphor as an affair of terms rather than as an affair of sentences. A metaphorical employment of the term “lion” to refer to the man Achilles doesn’t say that Achilles is like a lion, since it doesn’t say anything at all. Namings aren’t sayings; they merely pave the way for sayings. What Quintilian meant, then, is that a simile states the real or alleged similarity (of Achilles to lions) which the corresponding metaphorical substitution leaves to a listener’s imagination.
Once we come to view the sentence as the fundamental unit of metaphorical action, Quintilian’s remark suggests something to us that it couldn’t suggest to Quintilian himself: what a simple sentence metaphor (Juliet is the sun, History is a nightmare) really says is that Juliet is like the sun, history like a nightmare—where the extent and nature of the alleged likeness are things listeners must infer from the concrete conversational setting in which the metaphor is employed. It suggests that a sentence metaphor is an elliptical simile, a figurative comparison whose key comparative construction is understood to be present but remains unpronounced. Some such comparativist account of metaphor has been proposed from time to time by modern critics (Nowottny, 1962) and by modern linguists (Ortony, 1979).
An especially detailed version was developed by Robert Fogelin (1998) from suggestions by Amos Tversky (1977).
For Fogelin, to speak figuratively is to speak so as to stand corrected, to speak so as to manifestly invite and reliably elicit some particular spontaneous correction from one’s audience. This is easiest to see and easiest to understand when it comes to figurative predications, e.g. instances of irony or understatement. In such cases correcting the speaker consists in correcting what she said by understanding her to have said one thing while meaning another. Listeners take the speaker’s actual words and edit them in the privacy of their own heads, thereby bringing her utterance into accord with the context in which she spoke them as called for by Gricean conversational principles. When a speaker indulges in understatement, correction of what she says involves strengthening it; when she indulges in irony, our correction involves reversing it (in some sense or other, the nature of the reversal varying from case to case), and so forth. Often the value and interest of a thought is enhanced by the listener’s coming up with it for himself and deciding for himself that it is appropriate to the circumstances in which he finds himself. Figurative predication is one way to impose these tasks on a listener; that’s one of our main reasons for resorting to it.
Whether it is to be taken literally or figuratively, an unqualified simple comparison
(an) A is like (a) B
is to be understood as saying that (an) A has enough of the features of (a) B that are salient in the present context. Or if you prefer, (an) A is similar enough to (a) B in respects that concern aspects of (a) B that are salient in the present context. What counts as enough in the way of shared salient B-features or enough in the way of similarity to B in salient B-respects depends in turn on the contextually salient interests or concerns that are understood to motivate the making of the comparison in the first place. So whether they are to be taken literally or figuratively, unqualified simple comparisons have highly context-sensitive truth conditions.
Fogelin follows Tversky in supposing that when we compare (an) A to (a) B, it is the currently salient features or aspects of the second thing or kind of thing that call the tune. This represents a break with how likeness or resemblance or similarity has usually been construed in the philosophical literature—viz., as a symmetric relation, with the result that (an) A is like (a) B just in case, or just to the extent that, (a) B is like (an) A. On the understanding of likeness talk being offered here, this won’t be true at least in general. And Fogelin seems right about this:
To start with a personal experience, I was once struck by the present Pope’s likeness (in a photograph) to Arnold Palmer. [The Pope at the time was John Paul II.] It was not difficult to identify the source of the likeness: the Pope has Arnold Palmer’s eyes. At the same time, I felt no compulsion to say that Arnold Palmer looked like the Pope. Why not? The answer, I think, is that Arnold Palmer’s eyes—that crinkled down-the-fairway squint—are one of the distinctive features of his face: it would appear, for instance, in caricatures drawn of him. On the other hand, Arnold Palmer’s eyes are not distinctive features of the Pope’s face. Put very crudely, it seemed to me that the Pope resembled Arnold Palmer, but not conversely, because the Pope possessed one of Arnold Palmer’s distinctive features whereas Arnold Palmer did not possess a distinctive feature of the Pope. (43)
Comparisons have conversationally adjustable contents, resulting from the attribution of conversationally adjustable contents to comparative constructions such as is like. To assign a comparative statement a particular truth-value, one must bring to bear a conversationally adjustable canon of similarity, telling us how much like (a) B and in what respects a thing A needs to be in order for A to count as unqualifiedly like (a) B for present conversational purposes. For instance, in ordinary contexts governed by a routine default canon of similarity,
(1) A road grader is like a bulldozer
comes out true, since “like bulldozers, road graders are also used to push around large quantities of dirt, the chief difference being that road graders have their blades beneath the chassis rather than in front of them.” (88)
We’re now in a position to draw a distinction between literal comparisons and figurative comparisons, similes, that accords with the idea that to speak figuratively is to speak so as to stand corrected. Figurative comparisons invite a different kind of correction than figurative predications do.
To take a comparison literally is to assess it in the light of a canon of similarity already in play when the comparison is uttered, a generally prevailing or already prevailing canon of similarity. This is how we always take a comparison on first encountering it. And when the content we thereby assign it is fully in accord with Gricean conversational principles, this is the only way we ever do take it, the way we presume we were intended to take it all along. Such is how we take (1), for example.
But sometimes taking a comparison literally yields a content that is manifestly false, manifestly uninformative, or otherwise at odds with conversational principles. Such is the case with
(2) Margaret Thatcher is like a bulldozer.
“Margaret Thatcher cannot, for example, move huge quantities of dirt in an efficient manner” (87) Nor she is she routinely prepared to get dirty in any literal sense. Listeners can be counted on to know as much and notice as much. So confronted with (2), they cast about for a possible adjustment to the previously prevailing canon of similarity that brings the content of (2) into line with conversational principles and is manifestly smaller, manifestly more natural, manifestly easier to make, than any other adjustment that would do the trick. This adjustment relaxes the standards of how like a bulldozer a thing needs to be in order to be just plain like a bulldozer, like a bulldozer without qualification. And it bestows fresh salience on relatively abstract features of bulldozers, features a powerful person might credibly share: an ability to take on large tasks, an ability to wear down large obstacles a little at a time, a certain gracelessness in moment-to-moment operation, etc.
When they think they’ve hit on such a possible adjustment, listeners promptly implement it: they reinterpret the comparison in accord with the adjusted canon of similarity and take the resulting adjusted content to be what the speaker intended to get across all along. (The whole process takes place without conscious inference; indeed, this is part of what makes the adjustment a natural one in Fogelin’s eyes.) To take a comparison figuratively is simply to execute this kind of adjustment in how we interpret it. A simile, a figurative comparative statement, is simply a comparison that manifestly requires and therefore routinely receives this kind of adjusted truth-conditional interpretation. When a simile is figuratively true, it will ordinarily be literally false—it will compare things such that the first is unlike the second by generally prevailing or previously prevailing standards, yet the first is like the second by new standards the simile itself helps to impose; this is the sense in which a simile is an exhibition of unity in variety, a likening of dissimilar things.
This account of how similes differ from more routine literal comparisons predicts that similes exhibit the same kind of reversibility failure as their literal counterparts and do so for fundamentally the same reason. And this prediction seems to be correct. Witness this observation from the novelist William H. Gass:
[In the Song of Solomon, we read] “Thy teeth are like a flock of sheep that are even shorn, which come up from the washing; whereof every one bears twins, and none is barren among them.” … May I comfortably think of those sheep as wandering teeth? (Gass 1995, 40)
As with comparisons generally, our interest in a simile usually isn’t an interest in the bare fact of likeness; it’s an interest in the specific features of (an) A in virtue of which it’s figuratively like (a) B. So: ordinarily a listener is expected to infer for himself or notice for himself what it is about (an) A that’s supposed to make it count as like (a) B by these newly prevailing, adjusted standards:
what it is about A that in fact makes it enough like (a) B by these standards (in the case of figurative truth);
what it is about A that we are supposed to think makes it enough like (a) B by these standards (in the case of figurative falsity).
To do this is to paraphrase the simile in question. In the case of (2), we might come up with something along the lines of
(3) Thatcher is a gross, powerful person who overcomes all obstacles in getting the job done. (Tversky, 1977, 351)
On being told by Gertrude Stein that his portrait of her didn’t look much like her, Picasso is said to have responded, “Don’t worry, it will.” If we call such portraits, portraits that vindicate themselves in the fullness of time by imposing their own novel standards of vindication, Picasso likenesses, we might say that on Fogelin’s account of things, similes are Picasso likenings.
If we can understand
(4) Margaret Thatcher is a bulldozer.
as somehow short for (2), we’ll see how (3) is in order as a paraphrase of (4) as well. We’ll have a ready explanation of the fact that there is all the difference in the world between saying in a spirit of metaphor that money is blood (a stuff which invigorates by circulating and facilitating vital exchanges) and saying in a spirit of metaphor that blood is money (in that parting with it, letting it be shed, is a powerful but drastic way of obtaining precious things). As for the fact that metaphors often invite more subtle and ambitious readings than the corresponding similes would in their place, ellipsis itself has powerful effects on how words are best interpreted in context. Imagine trying to find precise, conversationally natural, non-elliptical equivalents for such cleverly crafted ellipses as these:
Garbage in, garbage out.
From each according to his ability, to each according to his need.
4.4 Brute Force Accounts
Brute Force Accounts maintain that in metaphor, no words go missing and neither words nor speakers are induced to mean anything out of the ordinary. Instead, an utterance that would otherwise be idle or pointless produces something Richard Moran calls a “framing effect”(Moran, 1989): listeners are induced to view or consider or experience the primary subject (or subjects) in a fresh and special light, a light afforded by juxtaposing it (or them) with the secondary subject (or subjects). What makes a remark metaphorical is the fact that it induces this framing effect—together, perhaps, with the specific syntactic strategy it employs for getting the job done. Paraphrase (so-called) is best viewed as an effort to provide a salient and representative sample of the real or apparent truths about the primary subject(s) the framing effect induces us to notice, think about, or dwell upon. It mustn’t be viewed as a restatement of some metaphorically expressed or metaphorically conveyed message, since there is no such message, restatable or otherwise. As Donald Davidson put it in the most influential statement of such an account, “What Metaphors Mean”:
When we try to say what a metaphor “means,” we soon realize there is no end to what we want to mention… How many facts are conveyed by a photograph? None, an infinity, or one great unstatable fact? Bad question. A picture is not worth a thousand words, or any other number. Words are the wrong currency to exchange for a picture. (Davidson 1978, 46–7)
Davidson cheerfully admits that there are things we can naturally and usefully refer to as metaphorical meaning and metaphorical truth. But they aren’t the seeds of metaphorical understanding; they are among its fruits. We mislocate metaphorical meanings if we regard them as accruing to particular words or phrases, the words and phrases we take metaphorically. And we mislocate metaphorical truth if we think of it as accruing to particular sentences, the ones we take to be metaphors.
When it comes to metaphorical meaning: metaphors are subject to interpretation in much the same way or sense as dreams are. We may interpret a dream with an eye to ascribing it a determinate cognitive value or interest, thereby coming to terms with it. Whether an interpretation of a dream and the value or interest it ascribes to the dream in question can be made to stick depends as much on the nature of the interpreter and her concerns as on the nature of the dream and its origins. A successful dream interpretation is the successful outcome of a hermeneutic negotiation between an interpreter and a dream, or between an interpreter and a dreamer, where what counts as a successful outcome depends on what both parties bring to the transaction: “Metaphor is the dreamwork of language, and, like all dreamwork, its interpretation reflects as much on the interpreter as on the originator.” (31)
When it comes to metaphorical truth: there can be truth (call it metaphorical truth) in a sentence that is itself, considered simply as a sentence, simply false, just as there can be truth (call it mythic truth) in a story that is itself, considered simply as a story, simply false. Understood along these lines, metaphorical truth would be something like the revelatory power conferred upon a metaphorical sentence (or on the impulse to use such a sentence) by a successful metaphorical interpretation of the sentence, a successful ascription to it of metaphorical meaning.
Davidson’s own version of a brute-force account has two main positive inspiring ideas.
The first is the analogy between metaphors and jokes, an analogy he may have encountered originally in work of Ted Cohen’s (cf. Cohen 1978). Metaphors and jokes are alike in being small-scale works of verbal art. It takes wit to make jokes and a sense of humor to get them; it takes genius of a certain sort to make metaphors and taste of a certain sort to get them. All four capacities just mentioned are creative capacities, modes of inventiveness—inventive construction in the case of wit and genius, inventive construal in the case of humor and taste. The acquisition of these capacities isn’t simply a matter of assimilating rules, nor is their exercise simply a matter of applying rules. But capacities that are in this sense creative or inventive are already at work in literal construal, even if they don’t have such fancy names.
We get closer to the heart of Davidson’s analogy if we contend that metaphors (taken as metaphors) have meanings only in the same way or sense that jokes (taken as jokes) do: both metaphors and jokes have points, points which will be got by some and missed by others. The point of a joke or metaphor is based on and made possible by appropriate assignments of literal meanings to the words and phrases that go to make up an utterance—based on and made possible by an appropriate literal construal of the utterance. Yet one may manage the called-for literal construal of a joke or metaphor yet nevertheless miss (fail to get) its point.
The point of a joke or metaphor is at once something more than a second meaning or import, assigned in the course of a second act of construal, and something less than this. It is something more, in that producing a joke or metaphor in the first place requires some kind and degree of artistic success: to produce a joke or metaphor at all is to bring something off. Getting (the point of) either kind of verbal contraption involves appreciating what the speaker has brought off in producing it. And no amount of intellectual understanding of the speaker’s ends, the speaker’s means, or the manner in which and extent to which the speaker’s means achieved the speaker’s ends suffices for appreciation. Appreciation involves a capacity and readiness to experience and value the finished contraption in ways called for by what its maker has brought off.
The second inspiring idea is an account of the framing effect itself, on which it consists for the most part in a state of mind in which we are encouraged and enabled to make comparisons, encouraged and enabled to notice similarities and dissimilarities, analogies and disanalogies, between primary and secondary subjects. Metaphor is concerned with likenesses or analogies although it doesn’t state them.
Sometimes a brief but powerful poetic utterance consists solely of the juxtaposed mentionings of two different things or sights or situations, managed so as to suggest that one of the two is there to shed light on the other. In Buson’s haiku:
A sudden chill—
in our room my dead wife’s
comb, underfoot. (Stryk and Ikemoto, 1995, 50)
the light source, the chill, comes first. More commonly, as in Pound’s “In a Station of the Metro,” it comes second. Critics often regard such poetic miniatures as limiting cases—in a nonprejudicial sense, degenerate cases—of metaphor or simile. Northrop Frye (1957, 123) speaks of “metaphor by juxtaposition”; he’d have us regard Pound’s semicolon as the ghost of a departed metaphor-forging form of the verb to be:
These faces in the crowd are petals on a wet black bough.
John Hollander (1985, 278) speaks of “evaded simile”; he’d have us regard the semicolon as the ghost of a departed comparative construction:
These faces in the crowd are like petals on a wet black bough.
Davidson’s idea is the reverse of Frye’s and Hollander’s: he’d have us regard both the is of metaphor and the is like of simile as lengthenings of Pound’s semicolon. What it is about A that lights up or is brought into prominence when A is considered in the light of B is what A shares or at least might be regarded as sharing with B, specific concrete real or putative likenesses between A and B. For Davidson himself, the framing effect is a cognitive affair; it consists in having one’s attention drawn to such real or putative likenesses. Not all advocates of a brute force account would agree with him about this. (See for instance Rorty 1989, 17–18.)
Davidson confronts semantic twist accounts like Skulsky’s with the following thought experiment:
You are entertaining a visitor from Saturn by trying to teach him the word “floor.” You go through the familiar dodges, leading him from floor to floor, pointing and stamping and repeating the word.…
Should we call this process learning something about the world or learning something about language? An odd question, since what is learned is that a bit of language refers to a bit of the world. Still, it is easy to distinguish between the business of learning the meaning of a word and using the word once the meaning is learned. Comparing these two activities, it is natural to say that the first concerns learning something about language, while the second concerns learning something about the world…
Your friend from Saturn now transports you through space to his home sphere, and looking back remotely on earth you say to him, nodding at the earth, “floor.” Perhaps he will think this is still part of the lesson and assume that the word “floor” applies properly to the earth, at least as seen from Saturn. But what if you thought he already knew the meaning of “floor” and you were remembering how Dante, from a similar place in the heavens, saw the inhabited earth as “the small round floor that makes us passionate”? [Paradiso 22.151, trans. Laurence Binyon] Your purpose was metaphor, not drill in the use of the language. What difference would it make to your friend which way he took it? With the theory of metaphor under consideration, very little difference. (36–7)
Semantic twist theory locates metaphor’s specialness in a special kind of on-the-fly language learning. So it is committed to viewing metaphorical understanding as a process in which how we are already disposed to experience, think about, and otherwise respond to the primary and secondary subjects informs how we freshly experience, think about, and respond to words such as “floor.” A process in which what needs attending to, what needs active re-experiencing, is language, not the world. Metaphorical understanding, metaphorical language learning, would be on all fours in this respect with to the prior and more drawn out business of learning the literal meaning of “floor.” But metaphorical understanding isn’t like this at all. On the contrary, it is a process in which how we already experience, think about, and otherwise respond to words such as “floor” informs how we freshly experience, think about, and respond to the primary and secondary subjects. A process in which what needs attending to, what needs active re-experiencing, is the world, not language. Brute force theory gets this exactly right; semantic twist theory gets it exactly wrong.
Roger M. White (1996) agrees with Davidson about the comparison-based nature of the framing effect but rejects his juxtaposition-based account of how metaphors deploy their syntactic raw material. On White’s alternative brute force account, metaphor involves a pair of recoverable parent sentences that have been intertwined or interwoven to yield the sentence actually uttered; metaphor’s characteristic effect on the listener requires the tacit reconstruction by him of those parent sentences, followed by an active comparison of the differing situations those differing sentences would serve to describe. Metaphor still works by inducing a framing effect rather than by formulating or communicating any particular propositional content. But it is a whole situation, not a discrete object or kind of object, that metaphor enables us to view in a new light; the new light is shed by the invocation of second situation of comparable complexity; and the invocation is managed by an interweaving of sentences rather than by a juxtaposition of terms. Such an account might be called conflationism. It’s especially appealing as an account of implicit metaphors such as Ahab’s, and White employs it to offer close readings of ambitious literary metaphors from Shakespeare, Dostoyevsky, and others.
More recently, Lepore and Stone (2010, 2015) have drawn on David Lewis’s work on convention, signaling, and conversational scorekeeping to offer a Davidson-inspired account of how speakers and audiences collaborate in bringing off the special verbal accomplishment that is a metaphor.
It won’t be possible to analyze metaphor in terms of special speaker meanings (in the manner of Grice) or special word meanings (in the manner of Skulsky) unless the words of a metaphor are put to special nonstandard communicative use. Yet not all coordination with an audience by means of conventionally signaled intentions counts as communication with that audience. Say that a speaker S coordinates with his audience in the joint achievement of goal G by means or utterance U when circumstances are such that:
(a) S can motivate his listeners to collaborate with him in achieving G simply by getting them to think he intends that he and they collaborate in achieving it;
(b) Motivating his listeners in this manner pretty much exhausts the contribution S himself needs to make to their joint achievement of G;
(c) S can get his listeners to think he so intends simply by producing something that will function under the circumstances as a conventional signal that he so intends, where conventional signal systems are defined and explained along lines laid down in Lewis (1969);
(d) Understandings already in place between S and his listeners enable his production of U to function as just such a conventional signal of just such an intention on his part; and
(e) S in fact produces U.
Joke-telling and metaphor-making certainly involve coordination with an audience so defined: coordination in a shared relishing of the ridiculousness of some situation or attitude; coordination in a joint exploration of the ramifications of some pregnant comparison; or what have you. But if we follow Lewis (1979), such coordination amounts to communication if and only if either
(1) G simply consists in the addition of particular propositions to some public, jointly maintained conversational score or record; or at least,
(2) all it would take to achieve G under the circumstances is some such addition to some such conversational score or record.
And the goals built into joke-telling and metaphor-making don’t meet this condition. No collaborative adjustment in what is taken for granted for present conversational purposes suffices by itself to make it the case that we relish the ridiculousness of a situation together, explore the ramifications of a comparison together, or what have you. So metaphors and jokes are instances of non-communicative verbal coordination: however much communication bringing off a metaphor or joke may often require, bringing off a metaphor or a joke is not in itself a communicative accomplishment. (The point has an interesting consequence for theories of speech acts. Sometimes speakers collaborate with audiences on the production of a perlocutionary effect without collaborating with them on the production of any enabling illocutionary effect. Such brute perlocutionary acts include the bringing off of metaphors and jokes. When we tell a joke or propound a metaphor, we do something by speaking as we do without doing anything in speaking as we do.)
For detailed critical commentary on Davidson, see Reimer (1996, 2001, 2004).
5. Recent developments
5.1 Metaphor and Cognitive Linguistics
In the 1980s a distinctive style of theorizing about language, thought, and meaning took shape in the work of Charles Fillmore, Eleanor Rosch, George Lakoff, Ronald Langacker and their followers that came to be known as cognitive linguistics (Lee 2001, Croft and Cruse 2004).
Cognitive linguists break with advocates of Chomskian generative grammar, denying that the terms on which words intelligibly combine are set by brute hard-wired principles of universal grammar embodied in a special purpose language module. Instead, the terms on which words meaningfully combine are a direct reflection of the terms on which certain strategies for conceiving concrete situations, strategies the words serve to signal and evoke, can be successfully coordinated with one another. They break with advocates of a Fodorian language of thought, denying that conceiving or thinking is a matter of manipulating sentence-like discursive mental representations in accord with syntactically stated, truth preserving inferential rules. Instead, conceiving is a matter of manipulating unconscious mental imagery so as to let concretely pictured physical objects and situations stand in for the more abstract objects and situations we’re endeavoring to understand.
Verbal and nonverbal signs don’t possess fixed meanings or applicability conditions independent of particular occasions of use. Signs prompt audiences to construct contextually appropriate meanings for them afresh and on the fly, each time would-be communicators resort to them. Communication depends on the would-be communicator’s ability to anticipate and purposefully manipulate the spontaneous, largely unconscious constructions of meaning her signals will elicit from her intended audience.
Concepts are first and foremost techniques for coping with their subject matters; only secondarily are they means of referring to particular constituents of those subject matters for the purpose of framing discursively structured true and false thoughts about them. And talk of discursively structured thoughts needs to be taken with a grain of salt. Tempting as it is to regard the meaning of a concept as a matter of the mind-independent thing or kind or relation to which it refers, tempting as it is to regard the content of a true or false thought as a matter of the mind-independent proposition the thought expresses, tempting as it is to regard the thoughts we think as arranging already meaningful concepts in much the way the sentences we speak arrange already meaningful words, such thinking underestimates the degree to which how we think is implicated in what we are able to think and what we are able to think about. Talk of referents and propositional contents and logical forms belongs to a formalistic picture of what thinking is like, a picture which is at best an intermittently convenient fiction.
Our most basic concepts, our most basic coping strategies, are those we employ incessantly in the course of purposeful voluntary bodily movement executed in response to sense-perceptible features of things in our immediate spatial vicinity. These basic concepts sketch out a world of discrete objects and discrete parcels of various physical stuffs (substances), laid out in space and changing over time as the objects and substances in question come into existence, move about from place to place, and eventually go out of existence. They present this sensorimotor world to us from a particular determinate spatiotemporal perspective, and characterize it for us more or less as follows.
There’s an inherent difference between horizontal and vertical directions; with only one vertical direction but many different horizontal ones. There’s an inherent difference between higher and lower places, hence also an inherent difference between upward and downward motion. Some objects are undifferentiated point particles; others are extended, with distinguishable fronts and backs and sides; a few have distinguishable tops and bottoms as well. (An object’s front is the part of it that normally faces forward as it moves and the part one normally needs to manipulate if one has serious business to transact with the object; a thing’s top is the part that is normally highest up, etc.) Some motions, the forced ones, result from external influences on a moving object or substance, pushes or pulls exerted on it by other objects or substances in its immediate physical surroundings. Others, the spontaneous motions, occur at the initiative of the moving thing itself; these are physical actions on the part of physical agents. Some objects are hollow and can accommodate other objects or substances within themselves, in an interior place that moves around with them whenever they move around; these are the containers. One place or object may be connected to another place or object by a traversible path consisting of intervening locations. Such a path may be short, straight, and direct; or it may be long, crooked, and indirect. Objects and substances stand in relations of fitting, sticking, gripping, supporting and the like, and each of these relations has immediate consequences for how (and how independently) the objects or substances in question can move. Etc.
The concepts that figure in the foregoing remarks outline a kind of folk geometry, folk kinematics, and folk dynamics. The relations with which these concepts are concerned aren’t the only immediate objects of human experience: we are aware of some of our own emotions with equal immediacy. But they are the most “clearly delineated” objects of experience and those with which human thinking is most inevitably and incessantly concerned.
We exhibit these relations to ourselves and make inferences about them by means of simple diagrammatic mental images, images the unconscious employment of which routinely mediates the planning and execution of our voluntary bodily movements: these are sensorimotor image schemas. We use these schemas to monitor and manage our ongoing activities in the here and now, and to envisage possible future circumstances and possible future activities when we speculate or plan. We may also employ them in imagistic demonstrations of important general principles governing the geometric, kinematic, and dynamic relations they serve to depict, truths such as:
(1) If object x is in container c and c itself is in a second container d, then x is in d.
(2) If object x starts out at a and travels continuously in a single direction along a direct path leading from a to b, then x gets closer and closer to b at later and later times until it eventually arrives at b (if it ever does).
Such demonstrations are possible because once properly set up and properly deployed, an image-schematic depiction is often found to possess reality-describing content in excess of what its constructor deliberately imposed in the first place. When this occurs, the depiction is treated by its constructor as carrying information (or misinformation) concerning what situations of the kind she set out to picture typically are or necessarily must be like. Some of this excess information may be presented explicitly and statically, so that she can simply read it off the face of the depiction she has constructed. This is how we might demonstrate (1) to ourselves. Such is structural inference. The rest of it is presented only implicitly and dynamically, so that she can retrieve it only by setting her depiction in motion and letting its changing states tell her how situations of the kind she set out to picture typically would or necessarily must evolve over time. This is how we might demonstrate (2) to ourselves. Such is enactment, also called simulation, elaboration, or running a mental space. (For “structural inference” and “enactment” see Lakoff and Johnson (2003), 257. For “simulation,” “elaboration,” and “running a space,” see Fauconnier and Turner (2002), 42–48.)
Lakoff and his collaborators hold that metaphor is at bottom a conceptual matter, a matter of thinking of one thing as and in terms of another. What Lakoff calls a conceptual metaphor or cross-domain map (e.g. love is a journey) is a standing pervasive culture-wide disposition to conceive one fixed sort of thing (e.g. love affairs), as and in terms of another fixed sort of thing (e.g. journeys). Such a cognitive disposition sets up a standing correspondence between particular standard love-affair concepts on the one hand and particular standard journey concepts on the other, with the effect that each time the relevant conceptual metaphor is invoked (in connection, perhaps, with a new pair of lovers),
The lovers correspond to travelers.
The love relationship corresponds to the vehicle.
The lovers’ common goals correspond to their common destinations on the journey.
Difficulties in the relationship correspond to impediments to travel. (Lakoff 1993, 207)
And so on. By exploiting these correspondences, we can and do redeploy familiar, easy patterns of thinking about one familiar sort of thing lending itself to direct sensorimotor representation (journeys) in novel and strenuous bouts of thinking about a second, more elusive sort of thing (love affairs):
The metaphor involves understanding one domain of experience, love, in terms of a very different domain of experience, journeys… (206)
Metaphor allows us to understand a relatively abstract or inherently unstructured subject matter in terms of a more concrete, or at least more highly structured subject matter. (244–245)
Over time this single cognitive disposition may manifest itself in many different verbal expressions:
Our relationship has hit a dead-end street… Look how far we’ve come. We can’t turn back now. It’s been a long, bumpy road. We’re at a crossroads. We may have to go our separate ways. The relationship isn’t going anywhere. We’re spinning our wheels. Our relationship is off the track. This marriage is on the rocks. We may have to bail out of this relationship. (206)
What makes these verbal expressions metaphorical, according to Lakoff, is the fact that they are direct, conventionally straightforward puttings-into-words of inherently metaphorical thoughts, thoughts constructed in the first place under the supervision of the single conceptual metaphor love is a journey. Activate a conceptual metaphor; use it to think a metaphorical thought; put that thought into words in the usual routine manner, provided for by the usual routine meanings of the words in question; and the result thereby counts as a verbal metaphor. Lakoff effectively defines verbal metaphor as the conventionally straightforward putting-into-words of an inherently metaphorical conceiving, an inherently metaphorical thought. Such is the application to verbal metaphor of the general cognitive linguistic principle that syntactic form is the direct expression of underlying meaning relations.
A mental space is an arrangement of discrete concepts or images deployed so as to represent some familiar recurrent sort of situation. Imaginative manipulation of such a space allows us to anticipate the structure at a time and behavior over time of situations of the sort it is designed to represent. Mental spaces represent ways things can be conceived to be in something of the way possible worlds represent ways they could be. Gilles Fauconnier (1994) proposed them as a basis for interpretations of counterfactuals and propositional attitude constructions he viewed as superior to the standard truth conditional interpretations based on quantification over possible worlds.
Suppose two such spaces, representing distinct sorts of situations, can be viewed as contrasting enrichments of a single generic space representing a more general sort of situation they instantiate in differing and contrasting ways. Concepts or images in the first space correspond to concepts or images in the second if they flesh out the same concept or image in the generic space. One can then construct a fourth blended space deriving some of its representational features from the first input space, some from the second, and still others from general principles of conceptual integration, in hopes that the result may accurately represent—accurately anticipate the structure at a time and behavior over time—of some independently interesting sort of situation. Fauconnier and Turner (2002) offered a general framework for studying blended spaces and the conceptual integration networks that produce them. They envisioned diverse applications of the framework to the study of informal reasoning and the interpretation of ordinary language. One such application was the interpretation of analogical metaphors of the form “X is the Y of Z”—e.g. “Vanity is the quicksand of reason”—a matter Turner explores at length in his (1998).
5.2 Metaphor and the Context Wars
A metaphor’s paraphrasable content isn’t definitively settled by the pertinent literal meanings of its constituent words and phrases. The sun can nourish and illuminate, but it can also parch and dessicate and burn. What I convey about a person by metaphorically likening her to the sun depends on which forms of solar power come to mind when I do so, and that in turn depends in an intricate manner on the concrete conversational setting in which I do so. Metaphors exhibit a profound and conspicuous context-sensitivity, and much of the work done on metaphor over the past few years has been informed by more general debates about the proper treatment of context-sensitivity in systematic philosophy of language.
For the literalist, the primary verbal expressers of propositions, the fundamental verbal bearers of truth-values, are suitably disambiguated sentence types. Hence the primary bearers of referents, extensions, and truth-conditional contents, the fundamental units of account in compositional semantics, are suitably disambiguated word and phrase types. It is easy to see what this comes to in the case of artificial languages suitable to pure mathematics and kindred abstract subject matters. It is harder to see what it comes to in the case of natural languages, where a single sentence type may be used to assert many different propositions with every outward show of candor and directness in as many different concrete conversational settings. The literalist hopes to take the context-sensitivity of indexicals like I and here and now as a model for understanding semantic context-sensitivity more generally.
Here an independently plausible conception of conversational exchange comes to her aid. The utterances of speakers and the interpretive activity of listeners is profoundly and pervasively shaped by the current values of a small number of basic situating parameters. These parameters have fairly determinate values at each stage in a well-run conversation; a wide variety of conversational proprieties and improprieties turn on their current values at any given stage; the values change from utterance to utterance in response to publicly discernible events in a manner governed by simple principles of conversational dynamics, so that careful and well-situated participants have a fighting chance of keeping track of their changing values. Participants need that fighting chance, since fluent unconstrained conversational exchange resulting in full understanding by each of what all the others are saying requires the participants to possess more or less accurate, more or less thoroughgoing mutual knowledge of the values of the parameters at each and every point in the exchange.
The single most obvious and pervasively important situating parameter is what is (pragmatically) presupposed, the set of propositions whose truth is mutually assumed for current conversational purposes. Yet it is easy to make a case for regarding who is speaking, who is being addressed, the time of speaking, relations of relative salience, etc, as additional situating parameters. In fact, the parameters to which the contents of various special “context-sensitive” words and phrases are most obviously sensitive appear to be among the situating parameters mutual knowledge of which is essential to unconstrained conversational coordination more generally. So perhaps we should think of sentence types as expressing propositions, and of word and phrase types as expressing propositional constituents or contents, relative to one or another assignment of values to the various situating parameters that govern ongoing conversational exchange, which will then proceed more or less as follows:
(a) The content accruing to a sentence (type) when it is uttered, the content it has relative to the currently active values of the pertinent situating parameters, serves to determine what can be said or otherwise directly communicated by uttering it.
(b) What is said or otherwise directly communicated by an utterance, together with various other publicly accessible changes in conversational circumstances, serve to determine how situating parameters change in preparation for the next utterance somebody might make.
(c) When the values situating parameters take on in preparation for the next utterance are fully appropriate as they stand to the interpretation of the next utterance when it comes, the content taken on by this utterance when it comes is the content the uttered sentence possesses relative to those preset parameter values.
(d) When the values the parameters take on in preparation for the next utterance are inappropriate as they stand to the next utterance when it comes, but there is a unique simple, feasible, publicly guessable change in those values that would render the utterance appropriate and appropriately interpretable, that change occurs forthwith, and the content taken on by the next utterance when it comes is the one the uttered sentence possesses relative to the freshly minted set of parameter values resulting from this last-minute adjustment. The literature calls this process accommodation.
For purposes of semantic and pragmatic theorizing, we can represent the contexts to which the contents of context-sensitive expressions are sensitive and in relation to which they vary by sets of possible values for the situating parameters. And we can represent the meaning of a given suitably disambiguated word or phrase type by a rule for arriving at an appropriate propositional constituent or truth-conditional contribution or content, given a context thus understood. David Kaplan called such a rule taking us from contexts to contents a character. The technical resources employed by literalism were put in place gradually over the years by Richard Montague (1974), David Kaplan (1989), David Lewis (1979), and Robert Stalnaker (1999), but whether any of them would fully endorse it is open to question. Prominent literalists include Kent Bach (2005), Jason Stanley (2007), and the self-styled semantic minimalists: Emma Borg (2004) and Herman Cappelen and Ernie Lepore (2005).
The contextualist, by contrast, insists that what it would take for an utterance to be true or instead false, what it would take for an uttered sentence type to be true or instead false as uttered, is a matter of what it would take for us to be speaking truly or instead falsely in producing the utterance. When I employ my words with every outward show of candor and directness, there simply isn’t room for a principled and explanatory distinction between what I say and what I mean, the proposition I express and the proposition I communicate. As a general rule, the proposition I express in speaking as I do is what you’d be affirming if you responded with Yes, that’s so; what you’d be denying if you responded with No, that’s not so; what you’d be questioning if you responded with Is that so? Where there is a disparity between what is said and what is successfully meant in either direction, the disparity needs to be pretheoretically discernible at least in broad outline, or Gricean conversational inferences won’t get off the ground in the first place.
Grant me this much, the contextualist continues, and you’ll need to conclude that there’s no assignable limit to the number of contents a term with a given literal meaning can assume, no assignable limit to the features of an occasion of use that can become pertinent to determining which of these contents the term actually will assume on some particular occasion of use, given its literal meaning. Contexts resist summary representation in terms of sets of situating parameter values, and the passage from literal meaning to appropriate content, given a context, can’t be encapsulated in any tidy parametric rule; it is hermeneutic rather than algorithmic in nature. As Charles Travis puts it:
Take any open sentence you like, with any number of supposed places in it, each to be filled with reference to a given sort of thing. Take any sequence of things, each fit for reference in its corresponding place. Then what the open sentence means is compatible with its saying any of indefinitely many things [about] those things, so referred to in some closing of it. For example, there is indefinite variety in the things to be said in saying someone to be home at a time. (Are you at home when your house, you in it, has just slid down the hill?) (Travis 2008, 2).
The contextualist concludes that there is nothing compact and surveyable, relative to which natural language sentence types can be said to express determinate propositions. Indeed, sentence types as such don’t express propositions or possess truth conditions at all. What truth and falsity and propositional content accrue to first and foremost are speakings to particular communicative effect on the part of particular speakers. “Only in the context of a speech act does a sentence express a determinate content”(Recanati, 2004). Prominent contextualists include Travis (2008), John Searle (1979a), François Recanati (2004), Herbert Clark (1992), Stephen Levinson (2000), and latter-day relevance theorists: Robyn Carston (2002), Anne Bezuidenhout (2002), and Sperber and Wilson themselves in work from the mid-90s on.
Confronted with puzzles like Travis’s about what it takes to be literally “at home,” the literalist needs to maintain that the proposition I succeed in communicating by uttering a sentence often differs from the one my sentence expresses relative to prevailing values for relevant situating parameters, even when I speak with every surface sign of candor and directness. She concludes from this that there are disparities between what we strictly speaking say, the propositions we verbally express, and what we successfully mean that are subtler than those exhibited in classical Gricean implicatures. She hopes the discriminatory and explanatory strategies Grice brought to bear on relatively gross disparities between the said and the meant can eventually be brought to bear on these subtler ones as well.
The contextualist is free to think of at least some figurative uses as turning on a contrast between the literal content accruing to an expression directly and from below (in virtue of its meaning and relevant features of its occasion of use) and a distinct, derived, figurative content the expression passes on up the tree of grammar as its contribution to the content of any larger syntactic wholes in which it may be embedded. In other words, he is free to regard at least some figures of speech as involving pragmatically inspired processes of content reassignment.
For the literalist, however, all possible contents for a given expression issue from some appropriate underlying literal meaning for it in fundamentally the same way and with fundamentally the same directness: we simply apply one and the same content-determining rule, one and the same character, to different contexts. Literalism therefore has no place for figurative contents (so understood) in its accounts of figurative language use.
Recent contextualist accounts of metaphor have tended to be exercises in “truth conditional pragmatics”: metaphor involves some combination of enrichment and loosening in the applicability conditions of pertinent general terms, where the resulting content shift is just drastic enough to bring what the speaker is thereby taken to be saying and what she is thereby taken to mean or implicate into accord with pertinent conversational norms. The conceptual raw materials for the shifted content derive in part from what is taken for granted at a given point in a given conversation, in part from commonplaces belonging to “encyclopedia entries” permanently associated with particular terms for all competent users of those terms. In relevance theoretic accounts—Carston (2002), Bezuidenhout (2001), Sperber and Wilson (2008)—the adjustment is part of the same reflectively accessible process of conversational inference we use to work out classical Gricean implicatures. In Recanati’s competing account (2004), it is managed by “associative” processes to which the listener lacks routine reflective access. Sperber and Wilson maintain that metaphor is just an especially dramatic instance of processes of content modulation at work throughout the interpretation of language, involving no distinctive principles of its own.
Recent literalist accounts of metaphor have come in two styles.
On the one hand, there are efforts to portray the context sensitivity of metaphor in terms of Kaplanian characters: rules that render the semantic content of a suitable specific metaphorical constituent a suitable function of the current value of some specific situating parameter of special relevance to metaphor in particular.
When employed within the scope of modal and counterfactual constructions, a metaphorical focal expression brings the properties it actually picks out here and now to the characterization of circumstances in which it would have picked out other properties, had it been employed in them. This encourages Josef Stern (2000) to posit a term-taking, term-making operator, “metaphorically speaking” or “mthat,” ordinarily left unpronounced, whose behavior is modeled on that of Kaplan’s rigidifying operator “dthat.” Stern supposes that at any given point in any given conversation, there is a set of things mutually taken for granted for various figure-interpreting purposes; he calls them I-presuppositions. (Think back to Skulsky’s talk-postulates.) Like ordinary presuppositions, I-presuppositions change from utterance to utterance under the impact of accommodation pressures, and they equip terms with “implications” in something like Skulsky’s sense: a property P is “implied by” or m-associated with a general term Φ in context c just in case it is I-presupposed in that context that things to which Φ applies have property P. The full Kaplanian account of “mthat” runs more or less as follows:
If Φ is a general term, then for a given context c, “mthat [Φ]” has as its content the conjunction of all the properties that are m-associated with Φ in context c; for that context c, it picks out this conjunction of properties in any circumstance s. (115)
This makes the content of “mthat [Φ]” a function of a special purpose situating parameter, the set of active I-presuppositions, even in cases where Φ itself has the same content in every context.
On the other hand, there are efforts to rehabilitate the classical Gricean implicature account of metaphor by challenging the specific diagnostics for what is said insisted upon by contemporary contextualists. Neo-Gricean literalists undertake to argue that what is meant can differ from what is said even when speakers speak with every outward show of candor and directness, and that this is precisely what happens when speakers resort to metaphor. The arguments they employ against their contextualist opponents bear a striking resemblance to those Kripke employed against Donnellan’s content-based treatment of the distinction between referential and attributive uses of definite descriptions. See Donnellan (1966), Kripke (1977), and the entry on descriptions.
An especially detailed effort along these lines comes from Elisabeth Camp (2006); only one of her arguments can be reviewed here. Some time back the linguist Larry Horn drew attention to “the phenomenon of metalinguistic negation—a device for objecting to a previous utterance on any grounds whatever, including the conventional or conversational implicata it potentially induces, its morphology, its style or register, or its phonetic realization” (Horn, 1988, 381). Consider “It wasn’t warm, it was sweltering,” where of course, if it was sweltering, it follows that it was warm as well. In many circumstances, a form of words the contextualist regards as reserved for denying what is said can in fact be pressed into service to deny one or another associated, unexpressed proposition. Camp contends that this renders direct denial diagnostics for what is said systematically unreliable. If she’s right about this, direct affirmation diagnostics and direct questioning diagnostics will be in trouble for the same sort of reason.
5.3 Metaphor and Make-Believe
The American aesthetician Kendall Walton has pioneered an approach to imaginative play in children and its analogues in adult human culture built around the notion of a game of make-believe. Such a game is governed by complex, tacit, mutually understood rules or norms, principles of generation,that render what’s fictional in the game, what players of it are supposed to imagine in playing it, a fixed function of the actual states and behaviors of various things and people they perceive, manipulate, and otherwise interact with as they play it. Walton calls such generators of fictional content props.
Iconic and verbal representations of various familiar traditional kinds—dolls, hobby horses, statues, paintings, novels—are inanimate props, artifacts whose whole raison d’être is to help generate fictional content in make-believe games of various familiar recurrent kinds. What such representations represent is a matter of how they stand ready to function as props, how they stand ready to shape fictional content by helping to generate it when games of these familiar recurrent kinds actually get played. Actors, on the other hand, are animate props, props of a peculiarly active and self-conscious kind. They help to author and direct (in their capacity as autonomous agents) the fictional content they help to generate (in their capacity as props) and go on to consume (in their capacity as obedient imaginers). Actors behave so as to deliberately shape what comes out fictional in the games they play with one another and with salient inanimate bits of the world around them, thereby deliberately orchestrating their own imaginings and those of their fellow players.
The most conspicuous games of make-believe, those involving premeditated acting, prefabricated representations, or both, are games whose players vividly and eagerly imagine what they are supposed to imagine under the rules because doing so is intrinsically satisfying in some way. Props in such games are means to imaginative ends, deriving their instrumental value or interest from the intrinsic value or interest of the fictional content they help generate. Such games are content oriented. Examples include playing cops and robbers, putting on Hamlet, reading a novel for the sake of its story. (Walton, 1990) analyzed various important modes of representation in and outside the arts—depiction, narration, dramatic enactment, etc.—in terms of the special sorts of prop and special sorts of principle of generation characteristic of such anthropologically conspicuous, intrinsically satisfying, content oriented games.
But not all games of make-believe are like this. Sometimes the games we play and the fictions we generate in the course of playing them owe much of their value and interest to the manner in which they enable us to perceive, conceive, and manipulate their own props. Sometimes our thought and speech about objects that already really exist and are already of vital interest to us can be helpfully structured or restructured by pressing these objects into service as props in a suitable game of make-believe, turning them for the time being into improvised representations of something almost entirely different. Pretend for a moment that Italy is a boot, turn Italy for the time being into an improvised representation of a boot, and you have a readymade scheme for locating particular Italian cities in relation to each other, deriving from familiar established ways of thinking and talking about boots and their component parts. Games of this second sort are prop oriented (Walton 1993). Since little turns on how vividly we imagine the things such games call on us to imagine, we may be only dimly aware of playing them even as we do so. Yet we are are remarkably skilled at playing such games with one another on a pickup basis, never formulating, let alone stipulating, the principles of generation that govern our imaginative collaborations for as long as they last.
Hearing “Juliet is the sun” in its concrete conversational setting, we come to suspect that Romeo is imagining his new love to just plain be exactly that, the sun. We come to suspect that Romeo is enabled to imagine this and in his personal opinion called on to image it by the rules of a game of make-believe he spontaneously finds himself playing, a game we attempt to join him in playing as we struggle to make appropriate sense of his words. Romeo imagines Juliet to be the sun because he feels called on to do so, and he feels called on to do so because of the rules he takes himself to be playing by (on the one hand) and what he seriously believes about Juliet herself (on the other).
Perhaps Romeo’s game is such that in going through the motions of asserting that Juliet is the sun, he renders it fictional that he does assert this and does so sincerely and truthfully. (Many games of make-believe do work this way, after all.) If so, his utterance is an act of verbal participation in the game on which it comments, a fiction-generating move in the game under the rules: going through the motions of asserting that Juliet is the sun will fictionally count as sincerely and truthfully asserting this very thing. Or perhaps not: perhaps Romeo isn’t pretending to say or assert anything at all in speaking as he does. Perhaps he isn’t speaking in his capacity as make-believe actor at all; perhaps he speaks merely in his other capacities as make-believe author and director and audience. In either case, his words serve to signal an understanding on his part that it is fictional in the game he’s playing that Juliet is the sun: an understanding on his part that under the rules of the game that he and any suitably attuned listeners are playing together, he and they are to imagine Juliet to be the sun—imagine her to just plain be exactly that.
As we have already seen, this understanding on Romeo’s part is in turn a joint product and joint expression of his working understanding of the rules he’s playing by (on the one hand) and his working understanding of what Juliet herself is actually like (on the other). So: what would Romeo’s signal do for a listener who is already suitably attuned with him, a listener already reliably disposed to play by the same rules he plays by? It would ascribe to Juliet the properties that in Romeo’s opinion render it fictional that she is the sun, the properties that in Romeo’s opinion make the role of the sun fall to her, under those rules. And these are the very properties that turn up in a successful paraphrase of Romeo’s utterance when it gets taken as a metaphor. We listeners undertake to discover what properties these are by responding to Romeo’s utterance as a make-believe signal, doing our best to enter into the spirit of a game already in progress, and reflecting on the rules we find ourselves playing by if and when we succeed in doing so.
At any rate, this is how things go in the basic case. Sometimes the rules by which the maker of a metaphor is playing are so familiar and stereotyped that we can recover them without any prior effort to join in and play along, in which case we may not bother to do so. For that matter, sometimes the initiator of the game may merely go through the motions of playing it himself, failing to imagine the things he is nominally called on to imagine by make-believe signals he himself emits, in which case he merely alludes to a game that even he doesn’t bother to play.
All of which suggests the broad outlines of a novel account of how we go about interpreting many metaphors:
The metaphorical statement (in its context) implies or suggests or introduces or calls to mind a (possible) game of make-believe. The utterance may be an act of verbal participation in the implied game, or it may merely be the utterance of a sentence that could be used in participating in the game. In saying what she does, the speaker describes things that are or would be props in the implied game. It may be possible in favorable cases to paraphrase what she says about them with reasonable fidelity. Typically, the paraphrase will specify features of the props by virtue of which it would be fictional in the implied game that the speaker speaks truly, if her utterance is an act of verbal participation in it. (Walton 1993, 46)
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