Immutability

First published Mon Jul 1, 2002; substantive revision Thu Apr 7, 2011

The doctrine of divine immutability (DDI) asserts that God cannot undergo real or intrinsic change in any respect. To understand the doctrine, then, we must first understand these kinds of change. Both “intrinsic” and “real” (in the relevant sense) are hard notions to elucidate. I cannot here attempt anything like a full account of them. I instead provide very rough characterizations, which would be acceptable on a wide variety of competing accounts of these notions.


1. Kinds of Change

A change is real if and only if it makes on its own a real difference to the world. Real change is (roughly) change involved in causing something, change an item is caused to undergo or change not “logically parasitic” on change in other things. (These “or”s are inclusive, not exclusive — one change can satisfy more than one clause of this account.) Smith's kicking me involves changes in Smith. Kicking me makes on its own a real difference in Smith. When Smith kicks me, I undergo various changes which count as real, intuitively — being kicked makes many real differences in me. On the other hand, when I become shorter than Smith because Smith grows, Smith changes really but I do not. Gaining height makes a real difference in Smith, but Smith's gaining height doesn't make a real difference in me. Rather, my becoming shorter than Smith in this way is logically parasitic on Smith's growing. It is simply a logical consequence of a real change in something else, not a real change itself.

Coming at the notion another way, a change is real if and only if it is an event which logically could be either the only event that occurs in an entire universe or else the sum of all events in a universe, while a change is a “logical parasite” if and only if this is not true of it. Consider Smith's kicking me. This looks like it could be the only occurrence in a universe. It is logically possible that the universe simply sits there wholly static, then Smith kicks me, then the universe winks out of existence before anything else happens. But actually, when we look more carefully, we see that in this case, the kick is not the only change. For it has parts which are shorter or spatially smaller changes. In the kick, for instance, Smith's leg first moves an inch, then another inch, etc., and each movement consists spatially of discrete movements by various muscles. The kick is not the only change, but in the odd universe I described, it is the sum of all changes in a universe. No change with parts can be the only change in a universe, strictly speaking. On the other hand, it is not logically possible that my becoming shorter than Smith in the way described occur alone or be a sum of all changes occurring in a universe. For it to occur, Smith's growth must also occur. And Smith's growth is not a part of it. So changes are real if and only if they are logically independent events in the world's history. If God cannot change really, then, nothing can so act on him as to change him, his actions do not change him, and no change in God could be the only event in a universe. If God cannot change really, then if had there been nothing other than God, there would have been no change at all, of any sort.

Intrinsic changes are changes like learning or expanding, which (roughly) occur entirely within the changing item — which could occur if the universe ended at the item's “skin.” Putting this more carefully, a change is intrinsic to the changing thing if and only if its occurring does not imply the existence of anything “outside” the boundaries of the changing thing. Changes which are not intrinsic are extrinsic. All changes in relations to other things are extrinsic. For instance, if a dog moves to my left, I become a man with a dog on his left. This does not take place wholly within me. It also involves the dog, who exists outside me; it implies the existence of the dog.

Changes can be intrinsic or extrinsic in spatial or temporal terms. The dog's coming to be on my left is a spatially extrinsic change in me. If Smith's guardian angel gets angry at Smith's kicking me an hour earlier, this change has no spatial aspect — angels have no spatial location or boundaries. But it is a temporally extrinsic change in the angel, for it implies the occurrence of an event, the kicking, which occurred outside the temporal boundaries of the becoming-angry. Extrinsic changes aren't “real” in the sense above. I change extrinsically when a dog comes to be on my left. The dog does not so act on me at to make me have it on my left: the dog does nothing to me at all. And my becoming a man with a dog on his left could not be the only event in a universe. For it to happen, a dog must also move. But to say that extrinsic changes aren't “real” in the above sense is not to say that they don't occur. It is merely to classify them.

DDI lets God change extrinsically. On DDI, God can, e.g., come to have new relational properties involving other things which are not due to those things' acting on him. Suppose that at t, Quine worships God. Then at t, God comes to have a new relational property, being-worshipped-by-Quine. This is clearly an extrinsic change, since its occurring in God implies the existence of someone “outside” God, namely Quine. God does not (let's say) do anything to cause this. It's a matter of Quine's free will. Quine doesn't do anything to God by worshipping him. And this change in God is a logical parasite of the real changes in Quine which constitute his worshipping God. It's not possible that becoming worshipped by Quine be the only change in a universe. Quine's worshipping must occur too if this one does. DDI thus lets God become Quine-worshipped. It rules out only real and intrinsic changes.

All of this raises a question: why do only real, intrinsic changes matter? It would be silly to ascribe to friends of DDI some sort of pre-given general antipathy against real, intrinsic change. Disliking change makes as little sense as disliking qualities or relations. DDI's friends simply followed various specific arguments, discussed below, where they seemed to lead. And they seemed to lead to a denial that God can change really and intrinsically, but not to a denial of all divine change tout court. The arguments which led philosophers to exempt God from real, intrinsic change all had to do with ways involvement in change might (they thought) make God less perfect. It isn't plausible that merely extrinsic change could make something more or less perfect. I am exactly as impressive a man with a dog on my left as I am without a dog on my left.

2. Immutability vs. Impassibility

DDI is sometimes conflated with the doctrine of divine impassibility, which asserts that nothing external can affect God — that nothing external can cause God to be in any state, and in particular can cause him to feel negative emotions like grief. Actually, DDI neither implies nor is implied by divine impassibility. Something could be impassible but mutable if it could change itself, but nothing else could change or affect it. God could be immutable but passible. For he could be changelessly aware of events outside himself -- perhaps even caused to be aware of them by the events themselves -- and due to them changelessly feel such responsive emotions as grief. But he would feel them without change, and so always feel them. If temporal, such a God would grieve for us before, while and after we suffer what he grieves for. There is nothing counter-intuitive in this. It's standard theism to hold that God has full foreknowledge of what is to befall us: he sees our pain before we feel it, not just while we feel it, and so grieves it beforehand if He ever grieves it at all. There would be no difference in the quality of God's grief before and while the pain occurs. For were there anything about it He did not know beforehand, the foreknowledge would not be full, and full knowledge beforehand should elicit the same reaction as full knowledge during. Likewise, it's standard theism to hold that God is cognitively perfect. If he is so and exists in time, He has a past to recall and so has perfect memory. If God perfectly remembers your pain, it is as fresh for him years later as it was while it occurred, and if he perfectly loves you, perhaps he never gets over it. So we can make sense of unchanging grief; if God does grieve, we might well expect it from a God with full foreknowledge, cognitive perfection and a perfect affective nature. If He is timeless, an immutable but passible God would just timelessly suffer for us — responsively, i.e., because of our pain. The case would be just as if God were temporal, save that His knowledge would not be temporally located and so would not literally involve either foreknowledge or memory. So whether God is temporal or timeless, DDI implies nothing odd here. And it need not “depersonalize” God as some feel impassibility would.

Still, it is surprising that Western theists have held DDI. For Western Scriptures seem to conflict with the full DDI. Some Scriptural texts depict human sin as making God sadder than he was (e.g., Gen. 6:6), then bringing God to new decisions, e.g., to flood the world. According to John, “the Word became flesh” (1:14), i.e., God took on a human nature he did not always have. So Western theism's Scriptural roots seem to deny DDI. Yet by the first century C.E., DDI was central to the main theory of God's nature, “classical theism.” In such “classical theist” writers as Augustine and Aquinas, being immutable makes God eternal, and eternality is God's distinctive mode of being. So DDI is at the roots of such writers' understandings of God's nature. And “classical theism” ruled the theological roost till the 19th century. So one wonders: what made DDI so attractive for so long?

3. The Case for Immutability

For one thing, the Scriptural witness is not really so thoroughly on the side of divine real intrinsic change. Much that Scripture says of God is clearly metaphor. And it is not hard to show that Old Testament texts which ascribe change to God could be speaking metaphorically. As I note later, one can parse even the Incarnation in ways which avoid divine real or intrinsic change. Standard Western theism clearly excludes many sorts of change in God. Western theists deny that God can begin or cease to be. If God cannot, He is immutable with respect to existence. Nothing can change its essential nature: a thing's essence is by definition a property (or set of them) it cannot fail to have. For Western theists, God is by nature a spirit, without body. If he is, God cannot change physically — he is physically immutable. So it is not clear that the Western God could undergo other than mental changes -- changes in knowledge, will, or affect. Further, Scripture amply supports the claim that God is in all respects perfect. In conjunction with certain other Scriptural claims, God's perfection seems to rule out many sorts of mental change.

This is a broader topic than can be tackled here; instead, a few examples involving God's knowledge will be examined. If perfect, God is all-knowing. If God learns something new, then before that he was not all-knowing, unless the new item could not have been foreknown. Only free beings' future actions and what depends on these are even prima facie beyond God's foreknowledge. But Scripture is full of claims that God foreknows our free actions. So if Scripture calls God's knowledge perfect and asserts that it includes foreknowledge, there is a sort of fact about which God is omniscient and his knowledge does not change. Suppose that today God knows that I will finish this article tomorrow and tomorrow God knows that I am finishing the article. There is a fact God knows both days, that on this particular day, referred to one day as “tomorrow” and another as “today,” I finish the article. Such facts involve no real tense: they are ‘tenseless’ facts. If God has foreknowledge even of free creaturely actions, he always knows all tenseless facts. His knowledge of these does not change, and if He necessarily foreknows, then his knowledge of these is immutable. Our own knowledge of these constantly changes. I do not know till tomorrow that I tenselessly-finish the article tomorrow, for I do not know this until I know that I am finishing it, a truth which is present-tensed rather than tenseless. Similarly, if God always knows all truths of mathematics and logic, his knowledge of these never changes, and here too it is plausible to suppose that His knowledge of these cannot change. For these truths are necessary. Truths of mathematics and logic cannot be or become false. So God could change with respect to his belief in these only if he could at some time hold a false belief. If God is necessarily omniscient, he cannot.

Unlike us, then, God has a constant, unchangeable store of tenseless knowledge about all of history, mathematical knowledge, logical knowledge and indeed knowledge of any other sort of necessary truth — and this on Scriptural grounds. It is a small step indeed from divine perfection to necessary divine perfection. For it is surely more perfect to be unable not to be perfect than to be perfect but able not to be. Again, it is a small step from foreknowledge to necessary foreknowledge: wouldn't the latter be more perfect? So God's necessary and tenseless historical knowledge — tenseless knowledge of contingent truths — looks to be unchangeable, given only a small step beyond Scripture. We can take this a step further. The only sort of knowledge we've left out so far is knowledge of tensed contingent truths — such truths as that tomorrow I will finish the article or yesterday I did finish the article. If God always knows the tenseless correlates of these truths — e.g., that on March 27, 2002, it is the case that I tenselessly-finish the article on March 28, 2002 -- then his contingent knowledge changes only in ways for which the passage of time accounts. For which tensed truth God knows — that I will finish, am finishing or did finish — depends simply on what time it is. So to speak, he never has to learn about whether I finish on March 28; he merely has to learn where in time he is in relation to March 28, and this tells him what tensed propositions are true about my finishing. Thus one can make a case on what are basically Scriptural grounds that God's knowledge changes at most due to the bare passage of time.

So Scriptural considerations suggest a God at least much less changeable than we in some respects. But the roots of the full DDI are also philosophical. In thinking out their views of God's nature, Western philosophers have largely filled out the concept of God by ascribing to him the properties they thought he must have to count as absolutely perfect. God's perfection seems to rule out many sorts of change, as we've just seen. More general arguments from perfection convinced classical theists that God cannot change in any way.

Plato argued for the full DDI. He asserted that a god is “the… best possible” in virtue and beauty. Virtue is a perfection of mind. Beauty is a non-mental perfection. So Plato's examples are probably meant to do duty for all mental and non-mental perfections, i.e. all perfections simpliciter. If a god is already the best possible in these respects, Plato reasoned, a god cannot change for the better. But being perfect includes being immune to change for the worse — too powerful to have it imposed without permission and too good to permit it. Thus a god cannot improve or deteriorate. Plato's argument had great historical influence. But it overlooked the possibility of changes which neither better nor worsen. If one first knows that it is 11:59:59 and then knows that it is midnight, is one the better or the worse for it? If the best possible state of mind includes omniscience, then perhaps it includes constant change in respects which neither better nor worsen God, e.g., in what precise time God knows it is. Perhaps changes to ‘keep up with’ time are required by a constant perfection, his omniscience. At 11:59:59 it is surely better to know that it is now 11:59:59, and then at midnight it is better to know that it is now midnight. Plato's argument does not rule out such changes.

Aristotle also contributed to acceptance of the full DDI. For many medieval theists accepted Aristotle's case for God's existence. Aristotle's Physics reasoned that if change occurs, it has a final source, an eternally unchanged changer. Aristotle's De Caelo added that something is eternally unchanged only if unchangeable. Later theists thought the role of first cause of change too lofty not to be God's. Writers who took Aristotle's argument or its descendants to prove God's existence found themselves committed to DDI.

Boethius also played a role in DDI's popularity. He held that being in time involves, necessarily, at least two things which are defects. For being temporal, as Boethius saw it, entailed having past and future parts of one's life. Temporal beings no longer live the past parts of their lives. They do not yet live the future parts of their lives. Both things are defects, according to Boethius. So if God is free of all defects, Boethius reasoned, then God has no past or future. What has no past or future does not change. For what changes goes from what it was to what it then was going to be, and so has a past and a future. Hence, to Boethius, perfection required changelessness. If it does, necessary perfection — which is better than contingent perfection, and so by perfect-being reasoning is God's -- requires being immutable. Now Boethius' reasoning requires at least some cleaning up. For some things are temporal but have neither past nor future parts, e.g. instantaneous changes. And if one's past or future is a bad time, it is not obviously a bad thing not to be living them. But at least some current philosophers thing that Boethius' argument has a kernel of truth. For it would not be a perfection of an individual to have a life lasting only a single temporal instant. Surely longer would be better, at least if there was a good chance that the longer existence would be overall a good thing. And God's life, at least, cannot contain parts which it is overall bad to live if God truly is perfect.

Boethius actually followed his reasoning about divine perfection to the conclusion that God exists outside time by his very nature — that God can't be temporal. For whatever has neither past nor future is not located in time. But change requires existence in time. Suppose that a turnip, aging, goes from fresh to spoiled. It also then goes from fresh to not-fresh. So first “the turnip is fresh” is true, then “it is not the case that the turnip is fresh” is true. The two cannot be true at once. So things change only if they exist at at least two distinct times. Hence, if God is necessarily atemporal — via necessary divine perfection — God is necessarily changeless, i.e. immutable.

Aquinas (like Augustine) derived DDI from the deeper classical-theist doctrine of divine simplicity. If God is simple, God has no parts of any sort. Now when the turnip aged, it became partly different — its smell and texture altered. Were this not so, no change would have occurred. But if the turnip had changed in every respect, it would not have been a case of change either. For it would have changed with respect to such properties as being a turnip and being identical with this turnip. And if first we have something identical with this turnip and then we have something not identical with this turnip, the turnip has not changed, but disappeared and been replaced by something else. So whatever changes must stay partly the same (else there was not change in one selfsame surviving thing). So only things with parts can change. If so, a simple God cannot change. DDI's connection with divine simplicity and the classical theist theory of God's perfection which centers on divine simplicity is one of the deepest reasons for DDI's broad historical appeal; one cannot fully explain what moved thinkers to accept DDI without also treating the motivation for the doctrine of divine simplicity. That, however, is too large a topic to broach here.

DDI, then, has a variety of religious and philosophical roots.

4. Arguments Against Immutability

There are many arguments against DDI. One that some find particularly forceful begins from the fact that God is omniscient. If God is omniscient, they say, God knows what time it is now. What he knows, then, is constantly changing, since what time it is now is constantly changing. But knowledge of what time it is is intrinsic to God. And change with respect to something intrinsic is intrinsic change. So it seems that God cannot be intrinsically immutable.

One reply is that knowing the correct time is not an intrinsic state of God's. Intrinsic states are those settled entirely within one's own skin. But then unless P is a truth entirely about matters within one's own skin, knowing that P is not an intrinsic state. For that one knows that P rather than believes falsely that P only if P is true, and if P is not a truth entirely about matters within one's own skin, whether P is true is at least partly settled by matters outside one's own skin. But when it is now is not a matter settled within God's own skin. What time it is now is not a fact about God alone. It is a fact about time, which is not God, and also about the entire temporal universe. Further, it arguably is not the case even that what is within God's skin settles what time it is in the sense that were nothing else than God to exist, facts about God would suffice to determine what time it is. For this would be at best a contentious claim, as it implies that God would be in time if he existed alone, without a universe. Many would say that time is an aspect of the physical universe — no universe, no time either. Moreover, even if God existed alone and were then in time, knowing what time it is would not be a temporally intrinsic matter. God knows that it is now t just at t. So knowing the correct time at t is temporally intrinsic only if it does not entail the existence or occurrence of anything that exists at other times. But for any time after the first instant (if there was one), knowing what time it is involves knowing the temporal distance between the present time and some other time: knowing that it is noon, April 16, 2002, implies knowing a relation between that time and date and the date traditionally assigned to the birth of Christ. Thus knowing what time it is entails knowing that there was some time other than the present — a time outside the period in which God knows that it is now this time. Knowing what time it is at any time after the first instant thus is not a temporally intrinsic state. And if this is so, it is hard to see why even knowledge that it is time's first instant would be. Thus the objection has a false premise. If God's cognitive state with respect to what time it is changed, it would not follow from this that he is not intrinsically immutable. This result may seem a bit hard to swallow. One wants to know how a change in knowledge could fail to be an intrinsic change. One answer might appeal to externalist theories of mental content. On these, my knowledge that P is a complex consisting of my inner mental state plus certain items in the world. Perhaps God's knowledge that it is now t is something like a complex consisting of God's inner cognitive state and an external component, t. If it is, perhaps the only change involved when God first knows that it is now t and then knows that it is now t* (> t) is the change from t to t*.

Other arguments against DDI appeal to Scripture's depiction of God as changing, e.g., in the Flood story. Facing such texts, DDI's friends defuse the appearance of divine change by appeal to doctrines less speculative and theoretical than DDI. Thus Philo argues from God's foreknowledge of the future and constancy of character that God cannot repent or feel regret, as the Flood story suggests. The Incarnation is an especially knotty problem for DDI's Christian friends. In general, these argue that all change it involved occurred in the human nature God the Son assumed rather than in God; God was eternally ready to be incarnate, and eternally had those experiences of the earthly Christ which the Incarnation makes part of his life. Through changes in Mary and the infant she bore, what was eternally in God eventually took place on earth.

Another argument against DDI appeals to God's power. Before Creation, God could assure that no universe ever existed. God has this power now only if he can alter the past. Few think he can. So events seem to change God's power. DDI's defenders reply that any change here is purely extrinsic. God has the power he always has. He has lost a chance to use it, and so we no longer want to call his power a power to prevent a universe. But God is intrinsically as able as ever to do so.

A final objection goes thus: God does change extrinsically. Even full DDI grants this. But whatever changes extrinsically is in time. For different things are true of it at different times, even if the ‘real’ changes due to which this is so are in other things. And whatever is in time changes intrinsically — it grows older. So DDI is false. Some would reply by denying that growing older is an intrinsic change. A more controversial response might be to deny even extrinsic change to God. This can be done by holding that God is atemporal. For if God exists at t and at a later t*, and, at t, P is true of him and, at t*, P is false of him, he does change extrinsically. He bears different relations to proposition P, at least. If God is atemporal, he exists neither at t nor at t* — his existence is not temporally located. If this is so, there are never two times such that different things are true of him at different times. Rather, all that is ever true of him is true of him timelessly. But a thing changes, even extrinsically, only if different things are true of it at different times. Perhaps, then, defending DDI requires commitment to divine timelessness.

Bibliography

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Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotle | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | change: and inconsistency | intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties

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