Change and Inconsistency

First published Wed Dec 18, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jul 29, 2015

Change is so pervasive in our lives that it almost defeats description and analysis. One can think of it in a very general way as alteration. But alteration in a thing raises subtle problems. One of the most perplexing is the problem of the consistency of change: how can one thing have incompatible properties and yet remain the same thing? Some have held that change is a consistent process, and rendered so by the existence of time. Others have held that the only way to make sense of change is as an inconsistency. This entry surveys the history of this problem and cognate issues, and concludes that the case for change as inconsistency cannot be dismissed so easily.

1. Introduction

The most general conception of change is simply difference or nonidentity in the features of things. Thus we speak of the change of temperature from place-to-place along a body, or the change in atmospheric pressures from place-to-place as recorded by isobars, or the change of height of the surface of the earth as recorded by a contour map. Contour lines record sameness in quantities (such as 100 metres) from the same quantity-kind (such as height), and the differences recorded by different contour lines are quantity-differences (100 metres as opposed to 200 metres). The philosophical question here is how to construe such statements of identity and nonidentity, and it seems that the problem of universals is the main issue.

A narrower usage of “change” is exemplified by change in the properties of a body over time, that is temporal change. This essay will focus on temporal change. We begin by separating the concept of change from several cognate concepts, specifically cause, time and motion. Then we briefly survey attempts by such thinkers as Parmenides and McTaggart to deny change. There follows an account of the problem of the instant of change, where it is concluded that the problem is too general to admit a single solution, but requires specification of further metaphysical principles envisaged as constraints on a type of solution. The final three sections, the bulk of the essay, consider the question of the consistency or inconsistency of change, which in one way or another looms over all our discussions. It emerges that the case for change as an inconsistent process is stronger than might be expected.

2. Change, Cause, Time, Motion

Our interest in this essay will be on the special case of temporal change. So construed, the notion of change is obviously bound up with notions of cause, time and motion. Now a distinction between change and cause can certainly be drawn. It is clear that uncaused change is conceptually possible, and arguably actual in such things as radioactive decay. Conversely, the operation of a sustaining cause results in no change in a thing, if the thing would otherwise be undergoing a change which the sustaining cause prevents. Hence, the operation of a cause on a thing is neither necessary nor sufficient for change in that thing. Accordingly, we put the topic of cause in the background when discussing change.

Time cannot be so backgrounded. The thesis that time could pass without change in anything at all has proved controversial, and we have adopted the usage that change in a thing implies the passage of time. Aristotle nonetheless argued that change is distinct from time because change occurs at different rates, whereas time does not (Physics IV,10). This essay focusses on the topic of change, while not denying that the topic of time is inseparable from it. Motion, as change in place, will figure prominently in our discussion.

One well-known idea is that of Cambridge change. This can be arrived at by following the well-tried analytical technique of re-casting philosophically important discussions and concepts in the meta-language. Thus a Cambridge change in a thing is a change in the descriptions (truly) borne by the thing. The phrase “Cambridge change” seems to be due to Geach (1969, 71–2), who so named it to mark its employment by great Cambridge philosophers such as Russell and McTaggart. It is apparent that Cambridge change includes all cases ordinarily thought of as change, such as change of colour, from “red” to “non-red.” But it also includes changes in the relational predicates of a thing, such as when I change from having “non-brother” true of me to having “brother” true of me, just when my mother gives birth to a second son. It might seem faintly paradoxical that there need be no (other) changes in me (height, weight, colouring, memories, character, thoughts) in this circumstance, but it is simply a consequence of the above piece of metalinguistic ascent. It does point up, though, that in attempting to capture the object-language concept, one should take note of the distinction between the monadic or internal or intrinsic properties of a thing, and its relations or external or extrinsic features. Thus the natural view of change is that real, metaphysical change in a thing would be change in the monadic or internal or intrinsic properties of the thing. We will return to this point in Section 5.

3. Denying Change

It is on the face of it extremely implausible to deny change, but extreme implausibility has not always deterred philosophers. The Eleatics (C5th BCE), particularly Parmenides, appear to have been the first to do so. Parmenides maintained that whatever one speaks about or thinks about must in some sense exist; if it did not exist then it is nothing, so one would be speaking or thinking about nothing, which would be empty. From this thesis, it is deduced that the existing thing cannot have come into existence, because to say that it could would be to speak of a time when it did not exist. By similar reasoning, existing things are eternal because they cannot go out of existence. It is now a small step to conclude that change is an illusion, on the grounds that a change in a thing implies that there was a time when the thing-as-changed did not exist. However, this argument is not persuasive: the premiss that the non-existent cannot be thought or spoken about is dubious.

Parmenides’ disciples Melissus and Zeno developed this theme. Melissus argued that motion implies empty space to move into, but empty space is a nothing and so cannot exist, so that motion is impossible since it implies a contradiction. This argument requires the dubious premisses (1) that empty space is a nothing (which is denied by realists from Newton to Nerlich), and (2) that motion would have to be change relative to space. Even those who have held that empty space is a nothing (relationists from Leibniz to Mach and onward) have not generally denied motion, proposing instead that motion of a thing is change in the spatial relations between that thing and other things.

Zeno’s brilliant paradoxes are generally accounted as attempts to defend Parmenides. We will not look at these in detail, but his paradox of the arrow is relevant to what follows. This is the argument that an arrow in flight could not really be moving because at any given instant it would be at a place identical with itself (and not another place); something at just one (self-identical) place could not be described as moving, and an arrow which is motionless at every instant in a temporal interval must be motionless throughout the interval. Discussion of this subtle argument is deferred until discussion in a later section of Graham Priest’s position, which turns on similar premisses.

McTaggart’s well-known argument (1908) that time is unreal applies equally to the unreality of (temporal) change it seems. McTaggart distinguished between two ways of attributing temporal characteristics to events. The \(A\)-series of events is given by the descriptions “past,” “present” and “future,” while the \(B\)-series is strictly in terms of the relational concepts “earlier,” “simultaneous” and “later.” Now the \(B\)-series is insufficient to define change, because \(B\)-series relations apply unchangingly if they apply at all; whatever is earlier than something is always earlier than it. Moreover, the \(B\)-series presupposes the \(A\)-series since if \(X\) precedes \(Y\) then there must be a time when \(X\) is past and \(Y\) present. This step in the argument is not at all absurd: the discovery of spacetime, the relativistic realisation of the \(B\)-series, has impelled many from Minkowski on to describe it as a “static” conception of time. A genuinely dynamic conception of change would thus need to have things coming into and going out of existence with the passage of time, whereas spacetime invites quantification over it all “at once” as it were.

Thus according to McTaggart the source of time and change must be found in the \(A\)-series. But the \(A\)-series implies a vicious regress. Any event must have all three properties, pastness, presentness and futurity, but this is a contradiction. The only way out of the contradiction is to say that the event is past, present and future at different times; but the same question arises about the temporal instants themselves, which would force us to appeal to a further time series to avoid the contradiction.

Whatever we make of this argument, and much has been written about it, it highlights the baffling nature of the apparent passage of time. In particular, if temporal flux is denied then at the least an explanation of its intuitive naturalness is mandatory. For a close analysis, see the entry Savitt (2006) in this Encyclopedia.

However, one thing can be said about all the above denials of change: they all argue against change on the ground that it implies a contradiction. But the assumption of the consistency of change has been denied by a number of influential figures, as we will see.

4. The Instant of Change

Consider a car moving off from rest at exactly noon. What is its state of motion at the instant of change? If it is in motion, when did it start? And if it is motionless, when could it ever begin? This problem was explored by Medlin (1963), Hamblin (1969), and others. Put this way, a solution for at least some special cases is readily available. Locate the time origin \(t = 0\) at noon. If the car’s position function \(f\) is given by, say, \(f(t) = t^{2}\), then its speed is \(2t\). If motion is defined as having non-zero speed, then the car is motionless at \(t=0\). On the other hand, at all \(t \gt 0\) it is in motion, so there is surely no puzzle about when it could ever begin: there is no first instant of motion.

However, there are more troublesome special cases. Suppose that the car’s position function is given by: \(f(t)=0\) for all \(t \lt 0\), else \(f(t)=t\). Then speed is zero for all \(t \lt 0\), and speed is 1 for all \(t \gt 0\). But what of \(t = 0\)? One should avoid “arbitrary” solutions, which attribute one speed rather than another, but do not give a reason for so privileging. There is of course at least one simple solution that is non-arbitrary, namely that it is neither in motion nor motionless, since its speed is indeterminate at \(t = 0\). This solution derives from the fact that according to classical calculus there is no derivative of such a function at \(t = 0\).

But can we do no better? The present author (1985) proposed to set aside the problem until more is said about various possible constraints on the solution. Unless we had some reason to think that such functions really did describe the world, we might well feel that a solution was less than imperative and less than unique. For example, the world might be described wholly with \(C^{\infty}\) functions \((n\)-th derivatives exist for all \(n\), e.g., cos, sin, log, exponential functions). The above function is not among these, since its derivative is discontinuous. But then it isn’t clear what we might say of it if the example is counterfactual. There might be different things to say depending on what further principles describe the possible world. Hence we would need to supplement the original statement of the problem with an argument to the effect that we might expect such functions to describe the real world, or alternatively supply additional metaphysical principles to be regarded as constraints on the solution.

A related problem is the fracture problem, described by Medlin. Imagine fracturing a material body such as a piece of wood, regarded as a plenum (full of matter). What is the state of the two new surfaces after the fracture? Unless matter is to be created or destroyed, we seem to have to say that the break is half-open, with one new matter-surface being topologically closed and the other being topologically open. But which surface is which? There seems to be no principle to determine which. In response, it can be asked how seriously we have to take the postulation of a plenum. If for example matter is as Boscovich suggested, punctate and surrounded by fields, then there are no plena, and the problem is no more than hypothetical. Or again, there might be plena but other principles might apply. For example, mass-density functions might drop smoothly to zero at the boundaries between matter and empty space, which would mean that all surfaces were open. On the other hand, it might be instead that as a matter of fact all surfaces are topologically closed. This would need an inconsistent solution (see below, sections 5–7).

5. Consistent and Inconsistent Change

If a changing thing has different and incompatible properties then a contradiction is threatened. The obvious move to make when confronted with the fact that things change, is to say with Kant (1781) that they change in relation to time, which avoids the inconsistency. But then another problem emerges. In what sense can one thing persist through change? Identity across time and space is the mark of universals, but we also account particulars such as billiard balls and persons as having self-identity across time.

Aristotle’s views on the persistence of things are worth noting here. At the risk of gross oversimplification of what is treated thoroughly elsewhere (see the entry on Aristotle’s metaphysics, it can be said that early on he took the view that what persists over time and through change, the substrate, can be identified with matter, and that it is the form of matter which is acquired or lost (Physics I, 5–7). When he wrote the Categories, it is substance which is said to be susceptible of contrary attributions; and as such substance itself has no opposites. (Categories 4a10). In the Metaphysics \(Z\), a more complex doctrine of substance, that which \(is\), is worked out. Substance is not the substrate, matter, since that lacks particularity. Its substance, what it is to be that thing, that without which it does not exist, is its essence. Aristotle then links essence with his theory of causes, being identified variously with its final cause and with its formal cause.

Although Aristotle’s views about change — in particular, his distinction between essence and accident — have sometimes been thought to contain a solution to the problem of persistent identity through change, it seems to this author that they do not really get a grip on the problem in its most fundamental form. This is perhaps clearest in the Categories, where the ability of substance to admit incompatible accidental features is more-or-less definitional.

The problem can be made sharper by reflection upon the law of the indiscernibility of identicals. If a thing-at-\(t_{1}\) were identical with a thing-at-\(t_{2}\), then they should share all their properties. What sort of identity is it, if not that? But if the properties at different times are incompatible, then a contradiction follows. Because they emphatically took the view that contradictions are never true, the great Buddhist logicians Dharmakirti (C7th CE) and his commentator Dharmottara (C8–9th CE), who had certainly read their Aristotle, deduced that identity over time does not exist (see Scherbatsky (1930) vol 2). This is the Buddhist doctrine of moments, essentially an ontology of instantaneous temporal slices. The doctrine of the momentariness of existence is felicitously in accord with the core Buddhist doctrine of the impermanence of all things. The doctrine of moments might seem to be an unnecessarily strong application of impermanence, certainly unnecessary for soteriological purposes, were it not for the evident strength of the argument in its favour, not to mention its accord with the spacetime ontology of modern physics. On the other hand, it is of course psychologically very difficult to believe that one’s own self, as something genuinely self-identical, has not endured from moment-to-moment in the past. Even so, the thesis of the momentariness of human existence has had a recent defender in Derek Parfit (1984), who asks what sort of principle could unify the temporal stages sufficiently closely to be worth calling identity. He argues that none could, and proposes that internalising the momentariness of our lives has a beneficial effect on how we should face our deaths.

This theme is echoed in a recent debate on the topic of ‘temporary intrinsics’, which also connects with the earlier-mentioned concept of Cambridge change. Cambridge change in a thing is still change in something or other, but it is not always change in the thing itself. Thus we might seek to isolate change in the thing itself by change in its intrinsic properties. But then we have the problem of in what sense it continues to be just one thing through a change in its intrinsic properties. Now obviously this raises the question of how to define the concept of intrinsicality. We do not address that here, since it is discussed elsewhere in this Encyclopedia, see Weatherson (2002). So assuming a prima facie distinction between the intrinsic and extrinsic properties of a thing, how does a thing persist through changes in its intrinsic properties? David Lewis and others debated this question, e.g., Lewis (1986), (1988). Several options for a solution were canvassed, three of which were as follows.

(1) The basic existents are things indexed by times, that is time-slices. What primarily exist are things-at-a-time: “\(a\) is red at \(t\)” is rendered “\(a\)-at-\(t\) is red”. Things that persist over time are then wholes made up of such parts, and one says that persisting things perdure rather than endure. This is the solution favoured by Lewis, by the present author, and by space-time theory.

(2) A second option is to say that, instead of indexing things, one indexes properties: “\(a\) is red at \(t\)” is rendered as “\(a\) is red-at-\(t\)”. This option does not seem to have had any defenders, perhaps because those properties which are universals are supposed to be wholly in each of their instances, which the indexing apparently denies.

(3) A third option takes as its basic minimal idea that the index modifies the whole event: \((a\)’s being red) holds at \(t\). A variant is to take the index as modifying the exemplification ‘relation’: \(a\) exemplifies-at-\(t\) redness. Versions of this position were urged by several contributors: Johnston (1987), Lowe (1987), (1988), Haslanger (1989). However, the problem for adverbial-style analyses anywhere is to provide enough semantics, enough logical structure for the event, to account for the logical implications of the sentences under analysis, as Davidson (1967) pointed out. So for example one has things like: \((((Fa)\) at \(t) \amp a=b)\) implies \(((Fb)\) at \(t)\); or \((((Fa)\) at \(t_{1}) \amp((Ga)\) at \(t_{2}) \amp(F\) is incompatible with \(G))\) implies not \(t_{1}=t_{2}\); or \((((Fa)\) at \(t) \amp((Gb)\) at \(t) \amp(F\) is incompatible with \(G))\) implies not \(a=b\). One thus cannot rest with a minimalist position. At least Lewis’ has the merit of providing a viable semantics, a direct parallel with counterpart theory in modal semantics. Of course, the basic ontology of Lewis’ favoured position was Dharmakirti’s though Lewis did not note that fact. More to the point, Dharmakirti’s strategy did not depend on the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction. The problem of contradictory attributions occurs even if the attributions are extrinsic, and Dharmakirti’s argument is a straightforward application of Leibniz’ law to things-at-a-time. If time-slices are admitted at all, and it is hard not to do so if they are sanctioned by relativity theory, then Dharmakirti’s argument goes through.

Others have taken a different course on the issue of the consistency of change. Herakleitos (C6th BCE) wrote in a suggestive fashion, with his doctrine of the unity of opposites. However, his few surviving sentences are too obscure and fragmentary to give much confidence in interpretation. He spoke of the same river having different waters at different times, but there is no development of the observation. Similarly he spoke of the sea as being at one time both life-preserving (to fish) and death-dealing (to humans), and “the path up and the path down are one and the same.” These examples hardly force one to believe in true contradictions, however.

There is also in Herakleitos the idea that everything is in a state of flux, always changing, and that it is the struggle between opposites (opposed tendencies) which drives change. This can be seen as an early version of the Marxist dynamic of dialectical materialism. But without a separate argument for the inconsistency of change, there is no reason to think that it remains anything but a formally consistent theory.

Hegel was more explicit. In The Science of Logic he said that only insofar as something has contradiction in itself does it move, have impulse or activity. Indeed, movement is existing contradiction itself. “Something moves not because at one moment of time it is here and at another there, but because at one and the same moment it is here and not here.” (Hegel (1812) p. 440).

There is something appealing in this argument. As Priest and Routley put it, “in change… there is at each stage a moment when the changing item is both in a given state, because it has just reached that state, but also not in that state, because it is not stationary but moving through and beyond that state” (Priest, Routley and Norman, 1989, p. 7). Think of a body coming to rest at a given time, and compare it with the same body proceeding on to further motion. There must be something about the body at that instant which distinguishes the two scenarios, or there could be nothing at the time to count as continuing change. Cause cannot do it, for a body can continue in its state of motion without being impressed by an external force, as Newton taught us. Nor can mere velocity do it, since velocity is a relation to surrounding points. Indeed, there is no difference in velocity between a body momentarily at rest, and a body at rest for a period around the instant; yet one is changing and the other not.

We will look more closely at this argument in the next section. However, here we can remind ourselves of Hegel’s idealism. Just about everyone agrees that contradictions within ideas are easier to swallow than contradictions in the external world. In the special case of the phenomenology of motion, it is not such an absurd speculation that what distinguishes the direct perception of motion from the mere static memory of difference in position, is that nearby small variations in the stimulus are read into a kind of buffer where they are not compared as static memory does so much as overlapped or superimposed in the way that contradictions are. After all, we are not at all good at discriminating small intervals of time, as the success of 25 frames per second makes apparent. Thus, the mind constructs a kind of contradictory theory which undergoes constant update. Indeed, this may well be the source of the troublesome intuition we noted earlier, that it is one and the same thing which endures through change, even though it is acknowledged that it has different properties at different (nearby) times. If this is right, then if one thinks with Hegel that the world is a kind of idea, then the contradictoriness of ideas such as motion is apt to spill over to the contradictoriness of their realisations in the world. Indeed, even without the assumption of full-blown idealism, there is always the caution that if a theory (consistent or not) can be made out which describes an epistemic state, i.e., a cognitive state, then how can we be entirely confident that the world simply could not be that way?

Taking a far less ambitious view than Hegel, Von Wright (1968) nonetheless proposed an interesting account of conditions in which change would have to be regarded as inconsistent. The account requires two conditions. The first condition is that time is regarded as structured as nested intervals rather than an assemblage of atomic point-instants. This is an attractive proposal, if only because no-one has ever seen a temporal or spatial point. Of course, standard relativity theory proposes that spacetime is punctate, as does the usual mathematics of the continuum. But a successful non-punctate mathematics using intervals instead can be worked out, albeit with considerably extra complexity. (see e.g., Weyl 1960). Now in the ontology of intervals, since there are no atomic points to attach a unique proposition to, the most one can say is that a proposition holds somewhere in the interval, with the limiting case that it holds throughout the interval.

Von Wright’s second condition was then to suppose that an interval might be so structured that a given proposition \(p\) and its negation \(\neg p\) are dense in each other throughout the interval. This means that no subinterval, no matter how small, can be found in which just \(p\) holds throughout that subinterval, and no subinterval can be found in which just \(\neg p\) holds throughout the subinterval: every subinterval in which one holds, the other holds as well. From an external point of view admitting instants, we can see that this is a genuine consistent possibility, if for example we think of \(p\) as the proposition that a rational number of seconds has passed, and \(\neg p\) as the proposition that an irrational number of seconds has passed. These are dense in each other on the classical real line regarded as time. Thus, there is no subinterval which is purely \(p\) throughout and no subinterval which is purely \(\neg p\) throughout.

This was von Wright’s proposed account of a continuous change in an ontology of intervals. The state \(\neg p\) changes continuously to \(p\) if there is a preceding interval which is \(\neg p\) throughout, then an interval with \(\neg p\) and \(p\) dense in each other, then a succeeding interval with p holding throughout. Von Wright described this as a kind of inconsistency. Unfortunately it is not clear from his written words whether he had in mind that the situation was inconsistent or only possibly inconsistent. His argument seems to be this. In an ontology of intervals we begin with descriptions like “It rained here yesterday” which means that it rained sometime here yesterday. The basic description is thus “\(p\) holds (somewhere) in the interval \(I\).” The special case where \(p\) holds throughout \(I\) is noted, where to hold throughout is for there to be no subinterval in which \(\neg p\) holds. Now \(p\)’s holding in \(I\) is of course compatible with \(\neg p\)’s holding in \(I\). But there is no contradiction here, as long as there is a partition of \(I\) into subintervals such that \(p\) holds throughout the subinterval or \(\neg p\) holds throughout the subinterval. Thus if we take in that a disjunction holds in an interval just in case there is a partition in which each of the disjuncts holds throughout its subintervals, we can say that if there is such a partition for \(p\), then the law of excluded middle \(p \vee \neg p\) holds throughout the interval. Von Wright introduced the modal operator \(Np\) for “Necessarily \(p\).” If we define “\(Np\) holds in \(I\)” to mean that \(p\) holds throughout \(I\), we can say that if there is no continuous change in the above sense, then Excluded Middle LEM holds necessarily, \(N(p \vee \neg p)\). However, defining the modal “Possibly” in the usual way as \(M =df \neg N\neg\) and assuming de Morgan’s Laws, Double Negation and Commutativity, we get the result that in an interval in which there is continuous change, \(M(p \amp \neg p)\) holds, i.e.. a contradiction is possible. Presumably it further follows that in a subinterval which has continuous change throughout, \(N(p \amp \neg p)\) holds. Needless to say this implies that a contradiction is true in that subinterval. We might note that the result that continuous change is a true contradiction follows without the detour through modal logic, since if LEM is false then \(\neg(p \vee \neg p)\) holds for some \(p\), and so by de Morgan and Double Negation, \(p \amp \neg p\) holds (throughout).

This ingenious construction has its problems. It is certainly dangerous to assume De Morgan’s Laws and Double Negation when the logic of intervals is the case in point. They both fail for open set logic, which is to say intuitionism, just as they both fail for its topological dual, closed set logic. On the other hand, what is one to say if the world is structured as intervals, non-punctate, and if there are subintervals in which propositions and their negations are dense in each other, interspersed with intervals where one of the propositions holds throughout? The latter are clearly periods of non-change, and the former are reasonably described as intervals of change. And yet it would seem that the best one can do is to say that \(p \amp \neg p\) holds in the transition periods: there appears to be no consistent way of describing what is happening in the situation which adheres to intervals and eschews points.

6. Inconsistent Motion

Many of the above themes come together in Graham Priest’s inconsistent account of motion in In Contradiction (1987). Priest sets up the opposing consistent account of change as what he calls the cinematic view of change. This is the view that an object in motion does no more than simply occupy different points of space at different times, like a succession of stills in a film only continuously connected. He attributes the view to Russell and Hume. It is an extrinsic view of change, in the sense that change is seen as a matter of a relation to states at nearby instants of time. The best-worked-out version of this view is the usual mathematical description of change of position by a suitable function of time; and then motion as velocity, that is rate of change of position, is given by the first derivative, which is a relation to nearby intervals.

Priest wishes instead to have an intrinsic account of change, in which it is a matter of the features of the object solely at the instant whether it is changing at the instant. He offers three arguments against the extrinsic account. First there is the “abutment” argument (p. 203). Taking the usual view of time as a continuously distributed collection of point-instants, in any change there must be an interval throughout which \(p\) holds abutting an interval throughout which \(\neg p\) holds. It makes no difference whether there is a last instant for \(p\) and no first instant for \(\neg p\), or no last instant for \(p\) and a first instant for \(\neg p\); either way there is no room for a time at which the system is changing. For example, if we said that the change was at the boundary point, then there would be nothing about that point to distinguish it from the situation where there was no change at all because the abutting intervals had the same proposition holding throughout each. Hence says Priest there is no change at all in the cinematic view: for change there would have to be a time when change was occurring, and that is absent in this case.

Priest’s second argument (p. 217) appeals to causation. It is at least imaginable that the universe is “Laplacean,” by which he means that the state at any time is determined by the states at prior times. But if change is cinematic, then there is no sense to saying that the instantaneous state of the world at the prior time determines its state at subsequent times: for example, not even velocity is determined by the intrinsic instantaneous state of a body. Now a Laplacean universe is possible, but the cinematic view makes Laplacean change a priori false. Hence Priest concludes by rejecting the Laplacean view.

Priest’s third argument (p. 218) is his version of Zeno’s arrow argument mentioned earlier. In the cinematic view of change, there is nothing about the arrow at any instant to contribute to its motion: it is indistinguishable from an arrow at rest. But then there is nothing to constitute its motion: an infinite number of zero motions does not add up to anything but zero motion. In response to the reply that according to measure theory a (nondenumerably) infinite number of points of measure zero can have a non-zero measure, Priest argues that this is just mathematics: “…it does not ease the discomfort … when one tries to understand how the arrow actually achieves its motion. At any point in its motion it advances not at all. Yet in some apparently magical way, in a collection of these it advances. Now a sum of nothings, even infinitely many nothings, is nothing. So how does it do it?” (pp. 218–9)

Setting aside questions about the strength of these arguments for the present, how then are we to give an acceptable intrinsic account of motion? According to Priest, the only acceptable answer is Hegel’s: that motion is inconsistent. Support comes from Leibniz’ Continuity Condition (LCC). This is essentially the thesis, suitably qualified, that whatever holds up to a limit, holds at the limit. Priest’s argument for the LCC appeals to causality. He describes change violating the LCC as “capricious” (p. 210). Humeans might be able to accept it, but for them there are no connections, nothing to constitute past states’ determination of future states. He also argues if the LCC fails, change would occur, but “at no time” (p. 210): for a proposition switching values discontinuously at a boundary there would be no instant identifiable by its intrinsic properties alone as the one at which the change occurred.

Priest’s qualification to the LCC is that it applies only to atomic sentences and their negations: otherwise we would have to admit the case where a disjunction \(p \vee q\) held right up to a limit in virtue of \(p\) holding at the rational points and \(q\) holding at the irrational points: this would be capricious behaviour in which we can make no sense of the past determining the future. We would also admit problems if we allowed the LCC to apply to tense operators: Future-\(p\) can obviously hold up to a limit without holding at the limit.

But now we observe that the LCC so qualified implies that continuous change is contradictory. For consider any particle with equation of motion \(x = f(t)\). Then at \(t = a\) its position \(x = f(a)\). However if it is in motion then in the neighbourhood we have \(\neg(x = f(a))\), so by the LCC at the limit also \(\neg(x = f(a))\), along with of course \(x = f(a)\) as well. Priest amplifies this account by proposing that no moving body can be consistently localised. Rather, in moving at time \(t\) it inconsistently occupies a small finite (Planck length) lozenge of space, which is made up of the positions it takes in the corresponding lozenge of time surrounding \(t\). This gives a natural intrinsic account of motionlessness at \(t\), namely that there is no contradiction in its position at \(t\). One can propose an account of velocity, as varying with the length of the lozenge or spread of position in the direction of motion. There are applications in Quantum Theory, too. The Heisenberg uncertainty of position may simply be the size of the spread or smeared position. Moreover, there is a possibility for backward causation implicit in the advanced wave front of inconsistency affecting earlier states in the inconsistently identified smear of spatial positions; and backward causation may be the way to go with quantum nonlocality, as Huw Price (1996) has argued.

One quick objection does not succeed. One might argue that since motion and rest are not relativistically invariant, neither could the contradictoriness in motion be part of the absolute character of reality. This may be so, but it does not prevent the concept being of use in the analysis of phenomena by means of frames: frame-relative inconsistencies would still be a (relational) part of the world. More importantly, the concept may find its natural home in QM rather than GR. It is well-known that there are deep incompatibilities between them as they now stand, but the jury is still out on how to resolve them, and it may well be that absolute motion is a part of the solution.

In asking how strong are the arguments in favour of this well-crafted position, we return to Priest’s three arguments against the rival, consistent, extrinsic, cinematic view. We recall the first argument was the “abutment” argument: consistent change cannot allow that there is a (single) time at which the change takes place. This will not sway the opposition, who will reply that it is the nature of change, even change at a point, that it is relational in that it requires comparison with nearby points; hence the demand for an intrinsic conception of change is a mistake.

The second argument was that the cinematic view is incompatible with the Laplacean view that the past determines the present. The way Priest puts it is not so plausible: he says that Laplaceanism is possible, whereas the cinematic view rules it out “a priori” (p. 217). But this is a modal fallacy: the cinematic view is only ruled out when one adopts the Laplacean view, and so that is only relatively apriori.

The third argument, Zeno’s arrow, has greater force though. How can any number, even an infinite number, of zeros add up to a nonzero? The mathematics of measure theory may say that intervals have a non-zero measure whereas individual points are zero, but so what? What is needed is a story which makes its application intelligible and non-arbitrary. If this is not forthcoming, there is the strong counter-intuition that zero marks the absence of existence; and no number of absent or non-existent things or quantities makes a present, existent thing or quantity.

So Zeno’s argument after all seems to be the most resilient. But the Laplacean universe also has appeal. Many philosophers have felt uneasy about Hume’s views on causation: if the past does not determine the future then the universe is indeed capricious.

Now one might endeavour to support Russell’s contrary view by arguing that non-zero speed is both necessary and sufficient for motion. But both sides of this equivalence might be disputed. On the necessity of non-zero speed for motion, a challenge might be mounted that zero speed but non-zero acceleration is motion. On the question of the sufficiency of non-zero speed for motion, Priest in the second edition of In Contradiction (2006) says that he does not deny this. But this opens him up a possible objection, namely that if non-zero (speed or acceleration) is necessary and sufficient for motion, then the extra element of inconsistency would seem to be explanatorily otiose, since there is no need to add the extra element of inconsistency in order to constitute motion. Such an objection does not refute his view, but it would seem to make it unsimple. Moreover, one might still adopt an inconsistent view coupled with the denial of sufficiency, which avoids this objection.

In (2006), Priest extends his account to time itself. Hitherto, quantities other than times were regarded as changing to the extent that they were inconsistently smeared out in a small lozenge or spread of time. In 2006, even the identity conditions for times are smeared out: if \(t_1\) and \(t_2\) are in the same spread then both \(t_1 = t_2\) and not-\((t_1 = t_2)\) hold, and in particular not-\((t=t)\) holds for each \(t\). Priest proposes that this gives explanations of several perennially puzzling features of time, specifically its flow, how it differs from space, and its direction. Focussing just on flow, it is the fact that not-\((t=t)\) is constant for all t which supplies the intrinsic feature of time necessary in Hegelian terms for its changingness or flow. The view faces some interesting objections, one of which is a sorites-like problem that if times in the same spread are (inconsistently) identical with each other, then since any time will be identical with others in the same spread, and those others identical with further times in other spreads, identity will be spread everywhere. Of course, many replies have been made to the sorites, but one might also observe that none are particularly appealing. At least, the arguments need to be worked through for the particular case.

7. Discontinuous Change and the Leibniz Continuity Condition

If the LCC is to have a chance of being applicable, then it needs further restriction, beyond atomic sentences and their negations. This is because it has implausible consequences when applied to certain atomic sentences. Consider any increasing function \(f(t)\). Then sentences of the form \(f(t) \lt f(a)\) will hold for \(t \lt a\). By the LCC then, \(f(a) \lt f(a)\). This is surely a gratuitous conclusion even before the contradicting sentence \(-f(a) \lt f(a)\) is taken into account. The present author (1997) therefore proposed to restrict the application to the atomic sentences of equational theories, that is to sentences of the form \(f(t) = 0\). This is not so unreasonable on independent grounds, since the basic laws of nature are expressed in equational form.

So restricted, we can note that far from being unreasonable, it turns out that the LCC is satisfied in a large class of reasonable models, specifically the C-infinity worlds mentioned earlier, in which every function is continuous. These include all those of GR. Now a C-infinity world gives us a kind of half-way house for cause. It might be that all correlations are coincidences, but at least if functions are continuous then causation is a distinctive correlation in that it is transmitted locally. This can be applied beneficially to produce not a general account of inconsistent change, but a particular account of certain inconsistent changes, as follows.

Quantum measurement has long been problematic, for more than one reason. One reason has been that it represents an irreducibly different kind of process from Schrödinger evolution. Another is that it is change which is discontinuous and yet causal: one can make things to happen with measurement, even though one cannot determine the exact outcome. A third reason is nonlocality itself: the nonlocal is ipso facto the discontinuous, and yet the nonlocal is governed by a kind of statistical causality. But now, to settle at least some of these issues, it has been proposed to utilise the theory of inconsistent continuous functions. These arise when a function is classically discontinuous, but we inconsistently identify the limit of the function (assuming it has a limit) with its value at the limit. Such functions, by virtue of being continuous, can be shown to satisfy the LCC. But granted that the formal details exist, what reason is there to apply them? It is precisely that we want to preserve a degree of causality, that is LCC-causality, while yet retaining the essential discontinuity and unpredictability of the process. Thus the slogan “nonlocality is inconsistent locality,” which is intended not to apply to change in general but to discontinuous change which we nonetheless have reason to think of as causal.

8. Cognition of Motion

As we saw earlier, the basic case for the inconsistency of change turns on the following premisses: (i) \(Fa\), (ii) \(Gb\), (iii) \(Fx \rightarrow {\sim}Gx\), (iv) \(a=b\). Up to the last premiss all is consistent, but the identification of the entities a and b from different times gives one and the same thing incompatible properties. It was suggested in Section 5, taking a lead from Hegel, that even if we say that change is a consistent process, the perception of change might well involve inconsistent representations. It is time to take a closer look at what cognitive science can tell us about this. It turns out that the argument is inconclusive, but suggestive. It is useful to concentrate on the example of the perception of motion. A thorough survey can be found in Palmer (1999), Chapter 10.

A basic mechanism for perceived motion is the Reichardt detector. It seems not to be entirely settled whether there are such mechanisms in the CNS. On the other hand, as we see, it is so simple that it is hard to imagine that we don’t have Reichardt detectors in our brains.

The original Reichardt detector involved two spatially-separated retinal transducers responding to intensities \(I_{1}\), \(I_{2}\) of incident light respectively at times \(t_{1}\), \(t_{2}\). Essentially, I measures the number of incident photons on a single retinal cell at a time. (For convenience we can regard the input into a given retinal cell as the same as its output, though the output is electrochemical, as befits a transducer.) One of the two inputs, say \(I_{1}\), undergoes a delay, and so is compared at a later time \(t_{2}\) with the other input \(I_{2}\) undelayed. There are different ways to make the comparison: Reichardt suggested both addition and multiplication, but it is more reasonable to consider subtraction of one from the other (a fixed operation for a given Reichardt detector). The difference between \(I_{1}\) and \(I_{2}\) is then propagated further into the CNS. Thus we have a change detector, there is no change in intensity from \(I_{1}\) at \(t_{1}\) to \(I_{2}\) at \(t_{2}\) iff \(I_{2} - I_{1}=0\).

To see better what this means, we notice that the above detector can be pulled apart into two even simpler mechanisms.

The first of these is a spatial change or spatial difference detector. This consists of two transducers whose outputs without a delay are compared by subtraction. If the two input cells have positions \(x_{1}\), \(x_{2}\), then the quotient \((I_{2} - I_{1}) / (x_{2} - x_{1})\) measures the difference in simultaneous values of I over the spatial distance \(x_{2}-x_{1}\). This can be written as the derivative \(dI / dx\). It, and its numerator, are zero iff there is no difference in \(I\) measured by the two input cells at the same time. The temporal variable \(t\) is fixed here. In passing, we can also see a mechanism here for the perception of spatial relations as emphasised by Gestalt psychologists.

The second of these simpler mechanisms is a temporal change detector. It consists of a single input cell, whose output \(I_{1}\) at \(t_{1}\) is split into two, one of which passes through a delay, then compared with the undelayed signal \(I_{2}\) from the next moment \(t_{2}\). The quotient \((I_{2}-I_{1}) / (t_{2}-t_{1})\) measures change in I at a single input over the time period. This can be written \(dI / dt\). This, and its numerator, are zero iff there is no change in the intensities presented to the same cell at different times. The spatial variable \(x\) is fixed here.

These two mechanisms give ways to register and measure spatial and temporal change. Now it is clear that these two mechanisms, when coupled together, are exactly the original Reichardt detector. But now we can see exactly what that measures. Calculus allows us to write \(dx/dt =(dI/dt)/(dI/dx)\). But \(dx/dt\) is the rate change of position over time, which is speed. Importantly, it is the intensity variable \(I\) which is fixed here. Thus what this measures is how a single intensity, such as that of a moving dot, an edge, or a shadow, is varying its spatial position over time. This is motion. For a given pair of input cells, the direction of the motion is fixed (different detectors for different directions), so we have a register for velocity.

In passing, acceleration detection is also straightforward to explain: split the output from a motion-detector, delay one signal, and compare.

We can see that the sense in which information about different times is compared, is by delaying information from one time. A delay is a kind of buffer. Then the information is “superimposed” on the information from the next time, by presenting the two informations together at the one comparator. A “composite picture” is obtained by subtracting one from the other. This is conjunction of sorts, since it puts two pieces of information together. But it does not obviously make for a state with contradictory content. Indeed, it does not make for a picture of a thing enduring over time, since the same intensity \(I\) at different place-times might be due to quite unrelated events. But there is more to be said about perceived motion

We can learn more by considering a family of phenomena known collectively as phi, which is in turn more generally classified under the heading of apparent motion. The simplest example is of two intermittently illuminated lights, flashing back-and-forth. We naturally represent it as a single, moving light. This is not mere sameness of intensity, but representation as an enduring thing. Moreover, it is not surprising that we should evolve to have this response, if we are to successfully track game, or danger, through intermittent presentations. Or think of a row of lights, as in a neon sign, with either a single bulb illuminated but its position varying, or a single bulb unilluminated, again with systematically varying position. Or think of a clock dial, with one bulb out, moving around the circle. The content of our experience is as an enduring single thing, having different positions at different times. This is the phi phenomenon. Speed things up (sometimes called magni-phi), and it ceases to look discrete, instead presenting as a continuously moving thing, which enhances the effect.

Think of the example of a black dot moving across our visual field. Recalling our general rubric for change at the beginning of this section, we can affirm the first three premisses as statements about the content of our experience: (i) \(a\) is at \(x_{1}\) at \(t_{1}\), (ii) \(b\) is at \(x_{2}\) at \(t_{2}\), (iii) if anything is at place \(x_{1}\) at a time \(t_{1}\), then it is not at place \(x_{2}\) at \(t_{2}\). Now add in the content of the phi-experience: (iv) \(a=b\), and we deduce that \(a\) is also not at \(x_{1}\) at \(t_{1}\).

The premiss to be challenged is, one might think, premiss (iii). As we saw, Dharmakirti challenged (iv) as an account of motion-in-the-world, and Lewis thought likewise with his perdurance account (and his counterpart theory). In favour of (iii), it might be said that if the moving black dot is slowed down sufficiently, and particularly if its positions are discrete, or it jumps about, then (iii) finds intuitive assent: a and b just are the sorts of things (events) that occupy distinct places at distinct times. I am inclined to think that this is what happens. Our cognitive system responds to stimuli both as events, where (iii) holds; and as enduring objects, where (iv) holds. If nothing moves, then there is no contradiction, but when we see motion, the object-recognition mechanism identifies distinct things at different times and so a contradictory content is born. That, I suspect, is the phenomenological content of motion.

This model has a number of features, which are only briefly summarised here. A now box is postulated, distinguished by its distinctive multi-modal inputs and outputs. Information enters the now box and is retained for a brief time, the “specious present”. Dismissal from the now box cannot be instantaneous, but takes some time to “fade” or reduce in intensity. Thus the now contains new contents and fading, older contents; and a natural direction of time. The delay and comparisons of Reichardt detectors are enlisted in this process. The endurance or persistence of contents suggests an account of apparent motion, phi or beta, in which identical states close in time and space but not identical, are counted as identical. The important thing for our purposes is that the identity of different and changing temporal stages of a perceptual process (the perceived moving dot), gives the necessary premiss for inconsistency, as discussed earlier.

In passing, this model gives natural accounts of akinetopsia, and of the “moving now”. Akinetopsia, that is motion blindness, has a “stop-start” phenomenology where a thing is perceived as distant, then suddenly up close, without any awareness of the in-between. This suggests that something has gone wrong with the fade mechanism, and the contents of the now do not fade, but persist full strength for a time, crowding out new updates. Eventually it collapses, and then no in-between has been registered. As for the moving now, it is noted that the contents of the now change over time, but it seems to the experiencer as if the now is a single thing persisting or enduring over time, and moving from event to event. These matters are expanded on in Mortensen (2013).

An independent account of the flow of time, with striking similarities is to be found in Gruber, Bach and Block (2015). The flow of time has two levels of explanation, and is described as an “illusion” insofar as experience is in conflict with measurement (compare Muller-Lyer). It would appear that the levels, upper and lower, correspond to \(A\) and \(B\) concepts respectively, so that the upper level, the passage of time, is an illusion. The authors postulate two mechanisms, perceptual completion and object persistence, to account for the flow of time. Perceptual completion involves adding to an experience to complete it some way, for example apparent motion, that is phi or beta. Object persistence requires that an object be perceived as the same (thing) now as it was then. It is essentially the same mechanism that identifies an object at a time, with itself at a later time. This is conceptually necessary for an order of past/present/future, the \(A\) series. This account also has a specious present or now, which is similar to our now box.

We cannot hope to do justice to this complex paper here. However, focussing on the theme of inconsistency, one question that could be asked is how much these mechanisms, perceptual completion and object persistence, are really different, as against being species of the same genus. It would seem that the illusion is pervasive because of the mechanism of identification of earlier/later stages. But this is what we saw was sufficient for contradiction. If these models of motion perception are right, it follows that contradiction is pervasive in our experience as the phenomenology of change, which is to say, everywhere.

9. Conclusion

There remain many loose ends from our discussion. Still, it emerges that the connection between change and inconsistency is deep, and that the case for inconsistencies in motion and other change is surprisingly robust.


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