Indexicals

First published Fri Sep 14, 2001; substantive revision Fri Jan 16, 2015

An indexical is, roughly speaking, a linguistic expression whose reference can shift from context to context. For example, the indexical ‘you’ may refer to one person in one context and to another person in another context. Other paradigmatic examples of indexicals are ‘I’, ‘here’, ‘today’, ‘yesterday’, ‘he’, ‘she’, and ‘that’. Two speakers who utter a single sentence that contains an indexical may say different things. For instance, when both John and Mary utter ‘I am hungry’, Mary says that she is hungry, whereas John says that he is hungry. Many philosophers hold that indexicals have two sorts of meaning. The first sort of meaning is often called ‘linguistic meaning’ or ‘character’ (the latter term is due to David Kaplan, 1989a). The second sort of meaning is often called ‘content’. Using this terminology, we can say that every indexical has a single unvarying character, but may vary in content from context to context.

Philosophers have several reasons for being interested in indexicals. First, some wish to describe their meanings and fit them into a general semantic theory. Second, some wish to understand the logic of arguments containing indexicals, such as Descartes’s Cogito argument. Third, some think that reflection on indexicals may give them some insight into the nature of belief, self-knowledge, first-person perspective, consciousness, and other important philosophical matters.


1. Preliminaries

1.1 Some Further Examples of Indexicals, Some Terminology, and a Contrast with Ambiguity

The indexicals that philosophers have studied most are the pronouns ‘I’, ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘it’, ‘this’, and ‘that’; the adverbs ‘here’, ‘now’, ‘today’, ‘yesterday’, ‘tomorrow’, and ‘actually’; and the adjectives ‘my’, ‘his’, ‘her’, ‘present’, ‘past’, and ‘actual’. The items on this list come mostly from David Kaplan’s influential work on indexicals, Demonstratives (Kaplan 1989a).

Indexicals are commonly called context-sensitive expressions (or context-dependent expressions) but the two terms tend to be used differently. The term ‘indexical’ tends to be restricted to simple expressions, such as ‘I’ and ‘today’. The term ‘context-sensitive’, however, is commonly applied both to simple indexicals and to complex expressions that contain simple indexicals, for example, the definite description ‘the dog she is looking at’, the verb phrase ‘sat next to me’, and the sentence ‘He is standing’.

The rough characterization of indexicals in the first sentence of this article might be rejected by some theorists, for it relies on the notion of a linguistic expression (such as ‘you’) varying in reference, and content, among contexts. But some theorists instead describe indexicality in terms of expressions varying in reference or content relative to utterances or other sorts of speech acts, such as assertions. Other theorists speak of utterances or tokens varying in reference or content, without any relativization to context or speech act. Some theorists speak several ways. The differences may be theoretically significant, and more will be said about them below. In addition, some philosophers would prefer to speak entirely about shifts in extension, rather than shifts in reference, from context to context. Some theorists, for instance, hold that ‘you’ is not a singular term that refers to an individual in a context. Rather, it is a quantifier phrase, and so its extension, in a context, is not an individual, but rather a certain sort of set. (See section 5.2 below for an analogous view of complex demonstratives.) Such a theorist may also wish to use the term ‘reference’ only for expressions whose extensions are individuals. This article, however, will use ‘reference’ and ‘extension’ more-or-less interchangeably. On this use of ‘reference’, the word ‘you’ varies in reference from context to context, even if it is a quantifier phrase whose extension, in a context, is not an individual, but a set.

Indexicality should be distinguished from ambiguity. Ambiguous simple expressions, such as ‘bank’ and ‘bat’, have a fixed, limited number of different meanings determined by linguistic convention. Indexicals, by contrast, seem to have a single linguistic meaning that is fixed by linguistic convention, but also another sort of meaning (content) that varies from occasion to occasion, or context to context. For instance, it seems that ‘you’ has a single meaning fixed by linguistic convention, and it is because of this fixed linguistic meaning that the sentence ‘You are hungry’ can have a virtually unlimited number of contents, in different contexts.

1.2 Indexical and Non-Indexical Uses of Pronouns

Some of the expressions in the earlier list of indexicals have both indexical and non-indexical uses. In particular, the pronouns ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘his’, and ‘hers’ appear to have three different types of use: indexical uses (sometimes called deictic or demonstrative uses), bound variable uses, and unbound anaphoric uses (Kaplan 1989a, pp. 489–90; Partee 1989).

The pronouns in (1)–(2) would typically be used as indexicals in utterances of (1)–(2) that are accompanied by pointing gestures.

  • (1) He was born in Detroit. [Pointing at John]
  • (2) Her paper was published. [Pointing at Mary]

When used demonstratively, the extensions and contents of ‘he’, ‘her’, and sentences (1) and (2) can vary from context to context, depending in some way on the speaker’s demonstrations or referential intentions or other contextual factors.

By contrast, the occurrence of ‘he’ and ‘her’ in (3) and (4), on the relevant ways of understanding them, function like occurrences of variables bound by quantifier phrases.

  • (3) Every young boy thinks that he will go to school.
  • (4) Every young girl rode her bike.

Consequently, we could reasonably symbolize (3) and (4) with (5) and (6) below.

  • (5) (Every \(x: x\) is a young boy) \(x\) thinks that \(x\) will go to school.
  • (6) (Every \(x: x\) is a young girl) \(x\) rode \(x\)’s bike.

The contents of (5) and (6) do not vary from context to context (or at least do not do so in virtue of the occurrences of the pronouns).

Finally, these same pronouns are also sometimes used as unbound anaphors. That is, some occurrences seem not to be used demonstratively, and not to be within the scope of prior explicit quantifier phrases or other binding linguistic expressions, and yet seem to depend for their interpretation on prior occurrences of linguistic expressions. (See the entries on anaphora and discourse representation theory.) For example, ‘he’ appears to be used as an unbound anaphor in discourse (7) and ‘she’ seems to be so used in (8).

  • (7) Johnny was riding a bike. He was having a good time.
  • (8) A woman came to my office today. She worked for Gigantic Academic Press. She tried to persuade me to adopt their logic book.

These three uses of pronouns seem quite different. Consequently, Kaplan (1989b, p. 572) sometimes says that ‘he’ is lexically ambiguous, and that the demonstrative ‘he’ and the anaphoric ‘he’ are homonymous expressions (Kaplan 1989b, p. 593). Most theorists, however, do not hold that these pronouns are ambiguous or that these uses involve distinct homonymous words. Many theorists who work on demonstratives and anaphora emphasize their similarities to variables. For demonstratives and variables, see Heim and Kratzer 1998, chapter 9; for anaphora and variables, see Kamp and Reyle 1993, Chierchia 1992, and Salmon 2006. For related discussion, see Partee (1989), Condoravdi and Gawron (1996), and Neale (2005).

For the rest of this article, we concentrate exclusively on demonstrative uses of the above pronouns.

1.3 Distinctions among Types of Indexicals

Various theorists classify indexicals into types, depending (roughly) on how their references and contents are determined in a context. Kaplan (1989a), for instance, distinguishes between pure indexicals and true demonstratives. The pure indexicals, he says, include ‘I’, ‘today’, ‘tomorrow’, ‘actual’, ‘present’, ‘here’, and ‘now’. The true demonstratives include ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘his’, ‘her’, and ‘that’. Kaplan claims that the reference and content of a true demonstrative, in a context, depends (roughly) on the speaker’s accompanying demonstrations or intentions. For example, Kaplan says that the reference and content of ‘that’ in a context is determined (in part) by the speaker’s pointing gestures or by the speaker’s intention to refer to a particular object. The reference and content of a pure indexical does not. For example, the reference of ‘I’ in a context is always the speaker, whether or not she points at herself, and the reference of ‘tomorrow’ is always the day after the day of the context, no matter which day the speaker intends to refer to.

John Perry (1997; 2001, pp. 58–62) makes a closely related distinction between automatic and discretionary indexicals. Automatic indexicals include ‘I’ and ‘tomorrow’; Perry says they are indexicals whose references are determined by their linguistic meanings and public contextual facts, such as the speaker and the day of utterance; intentions (other than the intention to use the indexical with its usual meaning) are irrelevant. Discretionary indexicals include ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘that’, and ‘this man’; they depend for reference on speakers’ intentions. Perry also makes an orthogonal distinction between narrow and wide indexicals. Narrow indexicals are those whose references are determined by narrow contexts, where narrow contexts include only a speaker, a time, and a location. Wide contexts include other facts, such as speakers’ intentions, assumptions made by conversational participants, and so on. The expressions that Kaplan calls ‘true demonstratives’ Perry would call ‘wide discretionary indexicals’.

Various complications arise in categorizing indexicals as pure indexicals and true demonstratives, or as automatic and discretionary. Kaplan (1989) classifies ‘here’ and ‘now’ as pure indexicals, though he thinks that the temporal and spatial extents of their extensions depend on speakers’ intentions (Kaplan 1989a, 419, n.12). Perry (1997, 2001) thinks that this sort of variation justifies classifying them as discretionary rather than automatic. Other indexicals may raise similar issues. For example, ‘today’ may initially appear to be an automatic indexical in Perry’s sense, but sometimes it is seemingly used to refer to temporal periods longer than a single day, as in ‘Today we ride in automobiles rather than in horse-drawn carriages’. For further discussion of these distinctions, and their viability, see Mount (2008).

1.4 Reference-Fixing, and Content-Fixing, for True Demonstratives

Many theorists accept a distinction between true demonstratives and pure indexicals, or some similar distinction, such as Perry’s distinction between automatic and discretionary indexicals. Thus many think that true demonstratives (from here on, simply demonstratives) require something more than pure indexicals to acquire a reference and content. The nature of this “extra something” is controversial, but two widely discussed candidates are demonstrations (or pointing gestures) and speakers’ intentions.

In his 1989a, Kaplan emphasizes the role of pointing gestures in fixing the reference (and content) of a demonstrative. More precisely, he says that the reference of a demonstrative in a context is fixed by a demonstration, which he describes as “typically, though not invariably, a (visual) presentation of a local object discriminated by a pointing.” (1989a, p. 490). Kaplan changes his mind in his 1989b. He there states that he had always thought that a demonstration is “typically directed by the speaker’s intention to point at a perceived individual on whom he has focused.” He then calls such intentions directing intentions and says that he has come to “regard the directing intention, at least in the case of perceptual demonstratives, as criterial, and to regard the demonstration as a mere externalization of this inner intention.” (1989b, p. 582)

Other theorists have proposed other accounts. Michael Devitt (1981) says that the referent of an utterance of ‘that’ is the item that stands in a certain causal relation to the utterance. Colin McGinn (1981) proposes that the referent of an utterance of ‘that \(F\)’ is the first \(F\) to intersect the line projected from the speaker’s pointing finger. Howard Wettstein (1984) says that the reference of ‘that’ is determined by the cues that a competent and attentive addressee would reasonably take the speaker to be exploiting. Marga Reimer (1991a, 199b) argues that demonstrative utterances can refer to objects that are not the targets of the speaker’s directing intentions, contrary to what she takes Kaplan (1989b) to be arguing. Kent Bach (1992a, 1992b) claims that the object to which a speaker refers with a demonstrative is fixed by certain of the speaker’s communicative intentions. Perry (2009, p. 60) argues that the referent of an utterance of a demonstrative is the object of a directing intention, and offers a rather elaborate theory of directing intentions that is inspired by some brief remarks from Kaplan. Jeffrey King (2012) argues that the semantic value of a demonstrative in a context is the object such that (a) the speaker intends it to be the demonstrative’s semantic value and (b) an attentive hearer would take it to be the speaker’s intended semantic value.

One prima facie problem for demonstration-theories is that demonstratives sometimes refer in contexts in which the speaker does not produce a pointing gesture. If ‘here’ and ‘now’ are true demonstratives, or discretionary indexicals, then they may present a particular difficulty for demonstration-theories, for pointing gestures often seem irrelevant to determining their referents and contents in contexts. One prima facie problem for intention-theorists is that speakers typically have many intentions when they use demonstratives, and these intentions may conflict (Bach 1992a, 1992b; Perry 1997, 2001 p. 60, 2009; King 2013). For example, a speaker who utters ‘he’ may intend to speak about Joe, about the man that she sees, about the man that others are referring to, and about the man at whom she is pointing. The speaker may think these are the same person when they are not.

2. Which Expressions are Indexicals?

Nearly all semantic theorists would agree that the list of simple indexicals given in section 1.1 is incomplete. Nearly all would agree that a more complete list includes the plural terms ‘we’, ‘us’, ‘ours’, ‘they’, ‘them’, ‘theirs’, ‘these’ and ‘those’, and most would be willing to add the adjective ‘current’ and the adverbs ‘then’, ‘presently’, ‘currently’, and ‘there’. Many theorists have proposed further additions to the list of simple indexicals, but these additions are controversial.

2.1 Some Expressions that Have Been Said to Be Indexicals

A semantic theory that says that an expression is context-sensitive, or is an indexical expression, is a contextualist theory of that expression. A theory that says that an expression is context-insensitive is an invariantist theory. Below is a list of types of expressions for which contextualist theories have been proposed, along with some discussion.

Tense Some theorists hold that sentences containing verbs in the present tense vary not only in truth-value from time to time, but also in content, from context to context. For example, some hold that the content of ‘Fred is hungry’ at a context whose associated time is \(t\) is (roughly) that Fred be hungry at \(t\). The variation in content is said to be due to the occurrence of ‘is’, which is context-sensitive. More generally, tense markers and tense morphology are claimed to be context-sensitive expressions. See Reichenbach 1947, Partee 1973, Enc 1987, Salmon 1989, Ogihara 1996, and King 2003.

Modals Paradigmatic modal terms include ‘necessary’ and ‘necessarily’, ‘possible’ and ‘possibly’, ‘contingent’ and ‘contingently’, ‘must’, ‘might’, ‘could’, ‘may’, ‘can’, and ‘able’. Some theorists would include many more expressions (Portner 2009). Speakers who utter a modal may mean different sorts of modality on different occasions. Examples: (a) Someone who utters ‘Sue can go to the party’ may mean (roughly) that her going to the party is consistent with her plans (practical or circumstantial possibility) or instead that her going is (merely) consistent with the laws of nature (nomological possibility). (b) If Jill utters ‘Joe might have been in London this morning’, she may mean that Joe’s being in London is consistent with her knowledge, whereas if Bill utters that same sentence, he may mean that Joe’s being in London is consistent with his (Bill’s) knowledge. In both cases, epistemic possibility is involved. (c) If Susan utters ‘Alice might have run three miles’, she might mean that Alice’s having run three miles is consistent with Alice’s metaphysical essence (metaphysical possibility) or that Alice’s having run is consistent with her (Susan’s) knowledge. (d) Someone who utters ‘Mary may go to school’ may mean that her going to school is morally permissible or instead that it is legally permissible. In both cases, a variety of deontic possibility is involved. Many theorists attribute the preceding sorts of variation to context-sensitivity in the relevant modals. Those who think that modals are semantically like quantifiers over possible worlds typically hold that the content of a modal, in a context, is the same as a restricted quantifier over possible worlds, where the relevant restriction varies from context to context. See Kratzer 1977, 2012; and Lewis 1979b.

Gradable Adjectives Paradigm examples of gradable adjectives are ‘tall’, ‘old’, ‘rich’, ‘fast’, ‘smart’, and ‘hot’. They are called ‘gradable’ because they can be felicitously modified with adverbs such as ‘fairly’ and ‘very’. Suppose that Susan is both a professional philosopher and a professional basketball player. A speaker who utters ‘Susan is tall’ might use ‘tall’ to mean (very roughly) tall for a philosopher. That same speaker, on another occasion, might utter ‘Susan is not tall’ and use ‘not tall’ to mean (roughly) not tall for a basketball player. Some theorists explain the variability by holding that gradable adjectives are context-sensitive. See Kennedy 2007.

Adjectives and Nouns that Optionally Take Complements Paradigm examples of adjectives of this sort are ‘ready’, ‘late’, ‘relevant’, ‘local’, and ‘eligible’, and paradigm examples of nouns of this sort are ‘neighbor’ and ‘enemy’. A speaker who utters ‘Tipper is ready’ typically means that Tipper is ready for \(X\), where \(X\) is some event or activity the speaker has in mind. In one context, a speaker might mean that Tipper is ready to work; in another context, he might mean that Tipper is ready for a certain party. Therefore, some theorists hold that ‘ready’ is context-sensitive. Somewhat similarly, a speaker who utters ‘Smith is a neighbor’ may mean that Smith is a neighbor of his (the speaker's) or that Smith is a neighbor of someone else (say, Jones). Again, it may be claimed that ‘neighbor’ is context-sensitive. See Partee 1989, Condoravdi and Gawron 1996, Bach 2005, Gauker 2012.

Know’ Speakers in some contexts may judge that the sentence ‘John knows that the bank will be open on Saturday’ is true. Speakers in other contexts who are aware of the same facts about John may, at the same time, judge that this same sentence is false. Consequently some philosophers hold that ‘know’ has different contents in different contexts, depending on the standards of justification that speakers of the context take for granted, or depending on the epistemic alternatives that are salient to the speakers of that context. See Cohen 1988, DeRose 1995, Lewis 1996, and the entry on epistemic contextualism.

Quantifier phrases Examples of quantifiers are ‘every’, ‘all’, ‘some’, ‘no’, ‘most’, ‘many’, and ‘few’. Quantifier phrases are (roughly) noun phrases or determiner phrases that include both a quantifier and a common noun or noun phrase, for example, ‘every student’, ‘some dog’, and ‘no black cats’. Two speakers who utter the same sentence containing a quantifier phrase may mean different things. If Smith is teaching a class of first-graders and utters ‘Every student has a pencil’, he means something like every student in Smith’s first-grade class has a pencil’. If Jones is proctoring a multiple-choice exam in a large college course, and utters that same sentence, then she means something like every student taking exam E has a pencil, where \(E\) is the relevant exam. This phenomenon is often called quantifier-domain restriction. Some theorists propose to explain this variation by hypothesizing that quantifier phrases are context-sensitive. See von Fintel 1994, Stanley and Szabo 2000.

Theorists have proposed contextualist theories for many other expressions, including: Conditionals (Lewis 1973, Kratzer 2012, and the entry on conditionals); deontic terms, such as ‘ought’ and ‘should’ (Lewis 1973, Kratzer 2012, Portner 2009); perspectival expressions, such as ‘come’, ‘go’, ‘left’, ‘right’, and ‘behind’ (Lewis 1979b); weather predicates, such as ‘rain’ and ‘hot’ (see Sennett 2008 for an overview); propositional attitude verbs, such as ‘believe’ (Richard 1990, and the entry on propositional attitude reports); common nouns, such as ‘student’ and ‘table’ (Stanley and Szabo 2000); and vague expressions, which include nearly all expressions in natural languages (Raffman 1996, Soames 1999, Fara 2000, and the entry on vagueness).

If the above expressions are indexicals, then their contents seem to depend (at least in part) on speakers’ intentions. They are not, however, appropriately called ‘true demonstratives’, for pointing gestures seem completely irrelevant to fixing their contents and references. Perry’s term ‘discretionary indexical’ would be more apt.

2.2 Strict Contextualism, Invariantism with Hidden Indexicals, and Invariantism with Unarticulated Constituents

Contextualist theories for an expression should be distinguished from invariantist theories that hypothesize hidden indexicals. On views of the latter sort, the expression itself is context-insensitive, but its occurrences are (often) accompanied by occurrences of an unpronounced expression that is context-sensitive. These context-sensitive expressions are sometimes said to be, or to resemble, indexicals, pronouns, or variables. For illustration, consider the gradable adjective ‘rich’. A strict contextualist theory would claim that this adjective is a unary predicate whose content in any context is a unary property. In some contexts, the content of ‘rich’ is (roughly) the property of being rich for a philosopher, while in others its content is the property of being rich for the CEO of a large company. By contrast, an invariantist theory with hidden indexicals for ‘rich’ would claim that the content of ‘rich’ does not vary from context to context: its content, in every context, is the same binary relation, roughly rich for, that can hold between a person and (roughly) a property. Sometimes the predicate ‘rich’ appears in sentences in which it has two (linguistic) arguments, as in ‘George is rich for a philosopher’. But in sentences in which there is no pronounced second argument, as in ‘George is rich’, the predicate ‘rich’ is accompanied by an unpronounced occurrence of a context-sensitive expression that resembles a pronoun. In some contexts, the content of the hidden indexical is the property of being a philosopher and in others it is the property of being a CEO of a large company. See Partee (1989), Condoravdi and Gawron (1996), Stanley and Szabo 2000.

A third type of theory for ‘rich’ is an invariantist theory with unarticulated constituents (Perry 2000, Chapter 10). On such views, ‘rich’ is a binary predicate whose content in all contexts is the previously mentioned binary relation rich for, but the word is never accompanied by a hidden indexical. Thus the content of the sentence ‘George is rich’, in all contexts, is less than fully propositional. However, according to some views of this sort, a speaker who utters that sentence typically asserts a full proposition, such as the proposition that George is rich for a philosopher. For discussion, see Bach 1994, 2005.

2.3 Strategies for Resisting Attributions of Context-Sensitivity

Some theorists , as we have seen, hold that indexicality extends far beyond Kaplan’s list, and pervades natural language. Others deny this. Many opponents of pervasive context-sensitivity rely heavily on pragmatics and speech act theory to explain away the phenomena that others take to be evidence for pervasive context-sensitivity. For example, Bach (2001) and Soames (2009) argue that quantifier phrases are context-insensitive. The content of ‘every student’, in all contexts, quantifies over absolutely all students. So, the content ‘Every student has a pencil’, in all contexts, is equivalent to the content of ‘Every student in the entire universe has a pencil’. But Bach and Soames say that speakers who utter that sentence almost always mean, convey, or assert a proposition other than the content of the sentence. When Smith utters ‘Every student has a pencil’ he asserts or means that every student in Smith’s first-grade class has a pencil (or some similar proposition), though this is not the content of the sentence in his context. Cappelen and Lepore (2005) similarly hold that ‘tall’ is context-insensitive. The content of ‘Mary is tall’, in every context, is simply the proposition that Mary is tall, with no relativization to a property (or scale or comparison class). However, a speaker who utters that sentence usually asserts or means a richer proposition, such as that Mary is tall for a philosopher. For discussions of related views, see Bach 1994, Carston 2002, Borg 2007, Recanati 2004, Gauker 2012, Braun 2012.

Other theorists resist pervasive context-sensitivity by appealing to shiftiness in extension without shiftiness in content. To obtain shiftiness in extension without shiftiness in content, these theorists relativize extensions of expressions to non-traditional parameters. Such views are often called relativist. For example, Egan, Hawthorne, and Weatherson (2005) and MacFarlane (2011) argue for relativist theories of epistemic uses of ‘might’. On their views, ‘Susan might be in Boston’, when used epistemically, has the same content in all contexts, but the truth-value of this content varies not only from one possible world to another, but also from one body of knowledge to another within a single possible world. Lasersohn (2005) similarly argues that predicates of personal taste, such as ‘tasty’ and ‘fun’, do not vary in content from context to context, but do vary in extension with respect to judges, or standards of taste, within a single world. See also Stephenson 2007, Richard 2008, Cappelen and Hawthorne 2009.

2.4 Proposed Tests for Indexicality

Given the disagreements about the context-sensitivity of various expressions, one might wonder whether there is a reliable test for context-sensitivity. In practice, many philosophers seem to employ the following tests.

Sentence \(S\) is context-sensitive iff it is possible for there to be two speakers who utter \(S\) (at the same time) and say different things.

Sentence \(S\) is context-sensitive iff it is possible for there to be a speaker who utters \(S\) and another speaker who utters the negation of \(S\) (at the same time), and yet the speakers do not contradict each other.

Sentences that contain paradigm indexicals pass these tests. But some opponents of pervasive context-sensitivity would reject them. For instance, Soames and Bach might admit that Smith and Jones say different things when they utter ‘Every student has a pencil’, but they would not attribute this variation to the alleged context-sensitivity of the sentence and its quantifier phrase. Rather, they would claim that Smith and Jones can use the sentence to say, or assert, propositions that are distinct from the sentence’s constant content.

Another test for context-sensitivity uses attitude ascriptions (Cappelen and Lepore 2005). Paradigmatic indexicals behave differently from non-indexicals in attitude ascriptions. Consider the following utterances.

  • (9) Smith: “Mary is a philosopher.”
    Jones: “Smith said that Mary is a philosopher.”
  • (10) Smith: “I am hungry.”
    Jones: “Smith said that I am hungry.”

Jones disquotes Smith in both of these cases: that is, Jones utters a says-that ascription whose embedded clause contains the very sentence that Smith utters. But Jones’s says-ascription in (9) is true (in Jones’s context), whereas Jones’s says-ascriptions in (10) is false (in Jones’s context). So, disquotation can fail when the subject of the ascription utters a context-sensitive sentence. Thus, Cappelen and Lepore propose roughly the following test for context-sensitivity.

\(S\) is context-sensitive iff: it is possible that [(i) \(A\) utters sentence \(S\) and yet (ii) “\(A\) said that \(S\)” is false in some context].

If this test is accepted, then it could be used to argue against the context-sensitivity of many simple expressions that do not appear on Kaplan’s list. Consider, for instance, the gradable adjective ‘rich’. At first glance the following seems impossible: Smith utters ‘George is rich’ and yet ‘Smith said that George is rich’ is false in some context. If so, then the above test entails that the sentence is not context-sensitive. The disquotation test, however, is controversial. For discussion of this test and others, see Cappelen and Lepore 2005, Cappelen and Hawthorne 2009, Leslie 2007.

3. Kaplan’s Theory of Indexicals

As mentioned above, Kaplan’s theory of indexicals is highly influential and serves as a starting point for much current theorizing about indexicals. This section presents some details of his theory.

3.1 An Example (Again) and Kaplan’s Distinctions

Let us consider again an example that can motivate Kaplan’s theory.

  • (11) Mary: “I am a philosopher.”
    John: “I am a philosopher.”

Mary and John utter the same unambiguous sentence, yet they say different things, for Mary says that she is a philosopher whereas John says that he is a philosopher. Moreover, we can imagine that Mary is a philosopher and John is not, so what Mary says is true whereas what John says is false. In view of these considerations, Kaplan (1989a) proposes a distinction between two kinds of meaning, character and content. The sentence ‘I am a philosopher’ has a single character, but has different contents with respect to different contexts. Kaplan usually identifies character with linguistic meaning, which is a kind of meaning fixed by linguistic convention.

3.2 Some Basics of Kaplan’s Theory

On Kaplan’s (1989a) theory, indexicals have contents in, or with respect to, contexts. Each context has associated with it at least an agent, time, location, and possible world. The content of ‘I’ with respect to a context \(c\) is the agent of \(c\). The content of ‘here’ is the location of \(c\). The content of ‘now’ is the time of \(c\). The content of ‘actually’ is (roughly) the property of being the case (being true) with respect to the world of \(c\).

Kaplan extends his theory of content to linguistic expressions in general, both simple and complex. On his view, the content of a predicate, with respect to a context, is a property or relation. The content of a sentence, with respect to a context, is a structured proposition, that is, a proposition with a constituent structure whose ultimate constituents are individual, properties, and relations. (See the entry on structured propositions.) The content of a sentence \(S\) with respect to a context \(c\) has, as its ultimate constituents, the contents of (roughly) the words in \(S\) with respect to \(c\).

To illustrate, consider the sentence ‘I am a philosopher’. Suppose that the agent of context \(c_1\) is Mary. Then the content of ‘I’ in \(c_1\) is Mary herself, while the content of ‘is a philosopher’ in \(c_1\) is the property of being a philosopher. The content of the whole sentence, in \(c_1\), is a proposition whose constituents are just those two items. We can represent this proposition with the ordered pair \(\langle \text{Mary},\) \(\text{being a philosopher} \rangle\). A structured proposition which, like the preceding one, has an individual as a constituent, is a singular proposition. The content of ‘I’ with respect to another context \(c_2\), in which John is the agent, is John, and the content of ‘I am a philosopher’ in \(c_2\) is the singular proposition \(\langle \text{John},\) \(\text{being a philosopher} \rangle\).

(Before continuing, we need a few interpretive qualifications. The description of contents in the two previous paragraphs, and in the rest of this subsection, follows the informal parts of Kaplan’s work (1989a, 1989b), in which he often identifies contents with individuals, properties, relations, and structured propositions. See especially the preface to Demonstratives. But when Kaplan turns to more technical matters, he represents contents with intensions: see the end of this section below and also section 3.7. Kaplan even goes so far as to assert that singular propositions are not a part of his theory (1989a, p. 496). He might mean by this that they are not a part of his formal logic of demonstratives; or he may wish to emphasize that one could accept the core of his theory of indexicals, including his distinction between character and content, while rejecting structured contents. In any case, for the rest of this section, we will continue to describe a version of Kaplan’s theory that uses structured propositions.)

Propositions, on Kaplan’s theory, have truth-values with respect to circumstances of evaluation, which Kaplan identifies with pairs of times and possible worlds, \(\langle t, w \rangle\). A single proposition may be true with respect to one circumstance of evaluation and false with respect another. For example, the proposition \(\langle \text{Mary}, \text{being a philosopher} \rangle\) may be true at \(\langle t_1, w_1 \rangle\) and yet false at \(\langle t_1, w_2 \rangle\) because, in \(w_1\), Mary is a philosopher at time \(t_1\), whereas in world \(w_2\) she is not a philosopher at time \(t_1\). Similarly, if time \(t_0\) is a time before Mary became a philosopher in \(w_1\), and \(t_1\) is a time after which she became a philosopher in \(w_1\), then \(\langle \text{Mary},\) \(\text{being a philosopher} \rangle\) is false at \(\langle t_0, w_1 \rangle\) but true at \(\langle t_1, w_1 \rangle\). In the remainder of this section, we will usually, for the sake of simplicity, pretend that Kaplan’s circumstances of evaluation are just possible worlds, and ignore variation in truth-value over time.

On Kaplan’s theory, we can speak not only of the truth-values of propositions at worlds, but also of the truth-values of sentences at pairs of worlds and contexts. The reason we can do this is that a context determines the content of a sentence, and the content of that sentence determines a truth-value at a world. For example, the content of the sentence ‘I am a philosopher’ in the context \(c_1\) described above is the singular proposition that Mary is a philosopher. This proposition is true with respect to world \(w_1\). So, the sentence ‘I am a philosopher’ is true with respect to \(c_1\) and \(w_1\). By contrast, the content of the sentence ‘I am a philosopher’ at the context \(c_2\) (in which John is the agent) is the singular proposition that John is a philosopher, and this proposition is false at \(w_1\) (let’s suppose). So, the sentence ‘I am a philosopher’ is false with respect to \(c_2\) and \(w_1\). So, the truth-value of the sentence ‘I am a philosopher’ is doubly relativized to both context and world. This sort of double-relativization is often called double-indexing. (See Vlach 1973 and Kamp 1973 for early examples of semantic theories that use double-indexing.)

Each context \(c\) is associated with a world, called ‘the world of \(c\)’. When a sentence is true with respect to context \(c\) and the world of \(c\), we say simply that the sentence is true at \(c\), without mentioning a world. But the notion of a sentence’s being true at context \(c\) and world \(w\) is more fundamental than the notion of a sentence’s being (simply) true at \(c\), for the latter notion is defined in terms of the previous notion. Now suppose that the two contexts mentioned above, \(c_1\) and \(c_2\), have the same associated world \(w_1\) (in which, recall, Mary is a philosopher but John is not). Then the sentence ‘I am a philosopher’ is true at context \(c_1\) and false at context \(c_2\).

The content of a sentence, at a context, can also be evaluated for truth at a world other than the world of the context. This is how the truth-values of sentences that contain modal operators, such as ‘possible’, are determined. For example, the content of ‘I am a philosopher’, with respect to \(c_1\), is the singular proposition that Mary is a philosopher. This proposition is true at \(w_1\), the world of context \(c_1\). But this proposition is false at world, \(w_2\), in which Mary goes into mathematics rather than philosophy. So, the sentence is true with respect to \(c_1\) and \(w_1\), but false with respect to \(c_1\) and \(w_2\). Therefore, the modal sentence ‘It is possible that I am not a philosopher’ is true with respect to our original context and its associated world, \(c_1\) and \(w_1\). Therefore, the modal sentence ‘It is possible that I am not a philosopher’ is simply true with respect to \(c_1\). (Notice that this last remark did not mention a world.)

We can similarly speak of the content of a singular term with respect to a context, and the extension or referent of that term, with respect to a context and a world. For example, the definite description ‘the person who invented bifocals’ has the same content with respect to all contexts. (Its content is some type of structured entity that has various properties and relations as constituents, such as the property of being a person, the relation of inventing, and so on.) This content determines different individuals at different worlds, because different people invent bifocals at different worlds. So, the referent of ‘the person who invented bifocals’, with respect to a context and a world, varies from world to world, because the person who invented bifocals varies from world to world. (We assume here, with Kaplan, that definite descriptions are singular terms rather than quantifier phrases.)

The situation is reversed for ‘I’. The content of ‘I’ varies from context to context: its content is Mary in \(c_1\), John in \(c_2\), someone else in \(c_3\), and so on. But given a single context \(c\), the referent of ‘I’ with respect to \(c\) and world \(w\) is the same for any world \(w\) whatsoever. For example, if Mary is the content of ‘I’ with respect to \(c_1\), then Mary is the referent of ‘I’ with respect to \(c_1\) and any world whatsoever. That is why, for any world \(w\), ‘I am a philosopher’ is true at \(c_1\) and \(w\) if and only if Mary is a philosopher in \(w\).

When a singular term refers to object \(o\) with respect to context \(c\) and the world of c, we can simply say that it refers to \(o\) in \(c\), without separately mentioning a world. So, ‘I’ refers to Mary in context \(c_1\) above. But once again, the notion of referring with respect to (or in) \(c\) is the less fundamental notion, and is defined in terms of the more fundamental relation of referring with respect to a context \(c\) and a world \(w\).

The content of a linguistic expression, at a context, determines a corresponding intension, which is a function from possible worlds (circumstances of evaluation, really) to extensions. For example, the content of ‘I’ with respect to the context \(c_1\) described above is Mary, and the extension of ‘I’ with respect to \(c_1\) and any world \(w\) whatsoever is Mary. The corresponding intension of ‘I’ with respect to \(c_1\) is the function whose value at any world \(w\) is the extension of ‘Mary’ with respect to \(c_1\) and \(w\), which is just Mary herself. The intension of ‘I’ varies from context to context, just as the content does; for instance, in context \(c_2\), the intension of ‘I’ is the function on worlds whose value at any world is John.

Two expressions may have different contents in \(c\) and yet have the same intension in that context. For instance, the contents of the sentences ‘I am a philosopher’ and ‘I am a philosopher and either I smoke or I do not smoke’ with respect to \(c_1\) are distinct structured propositions, for the content of the second sentence in \(c_1\) has the property of smoking as a constituent, whereas the content of the first one does not. Yet these propositions have the same truth-values at all worlds, and so they have the same intension in \(c_1\). Though contents and intensions are distinct, we can use intensions to represent contents, when we are willing to ignore fine-grained differences in content. This is what Kaplan does when he sets out his logic for indexicals (see section 3.7).

3.3 True Demonstratives in Kaplan’s Theory

Kaplan contemplates two ways of extending his theory to true demonstratives. In his1989a, he uses dthat-terms to do so. A dthat-term is a term of the form “dthat[\(t\)]”, where \(t\) is a singular term, such as a definite description or proper name. The content of ‘dthat[\(t\)]’ in a context \(c\) is the object to which the term \(t\) refers in \(c\). For example, the content of ‘dthat[the dog I see now]’, in a context \(c\), is Fido iff: there is exactly one dog in the world of \(c\) whom the agent of \(c\) sees at the time of \(c\) in the world of \(c\), and that dog is Fido. Kaplan (1989a) uses dthat-terms to represent the demonstrative ‘that’ together with a type of demonstration. Kaplan holds that a type of demonstration presents a demonstratum in a particular way, and a definite description (that may contain indexicals) can capture the way in which the demonstration presents the demonstratum. Thus, Kaplan (1989a) might use the dthat-term ‘dthat[the dog I see to my left]’ to represent Mary’s use of the word ‘that’ together with the type of demonstration that she uses to present a dog to her left. If Mary utters ‘That is larger than that’ while pointing first to a dog to her left and then to a dog to her right, then Kaplan might use the formal sentence (12) to represent Mary’s sentence-plus-demonstrations.

  • (12) Dthat[the dog I see to my left] is larger than dthat[the dog I see to my right].

If \(c\) is a context in which the agent of \(c\) sees Fido to her left and Rover to her right, then the content in \(c\) of the first dthat-term is Fido and the content of the second dthat-term in \(c\) is Rover. Kaplan anticipates treating other true demonstratives, such as ‘you’, in similar ways. (For critical discussion, see Salmon 2002.)

Kaplan presents a different treatment of true demonstratives in his 1989b. Kaplan adds to each context an addressee and a demonstratum, and stipulates that the content of ‘you’ in any context \(c\) is the addressee of \(c\) and the content of ‘that’ in any context \(c\) is the demonstratum of \(c\). Contexts may have sequences of multiple addressees and sequences of multiple demonstrata. Corresponding subscripts can be added to ‘you’ and ‘that’. If so, the content of ‘you1’ with respect to \(c\) is the first addressee of \(c\), the content of ‘you2’ in \(c\) is the second addressee of \(c\), and so on; similarly, the content of ‘that1’ is the first demonstratum of \(c\), the content of ‘that2’ is the second demonstratum, and so on. (See section 5.3 for more on multiple occurrences of demonstratives.)

3.4 Character

Kaplan (1989a, p. 505) says that he represents the character of an expression with a function on contexts whose value at any context is the expression’s content at that context. For example, the content of ‘I’ at any context \(c\) is the agent character of \(c\). So the character of ‘I’ is a function on contexts whose value at any context \(c\) is the agent of \(c\). The value of the character of ‘I’ at a context in which Mary is the agent is just Mary herself, and its value at a context in which John is the agent is just John himself. The character of a sentence is a function whose value at any context is the structured propositional content of that sentence at that context. For instance, the character of ‘I am a philosopher’ is a function whose value at any context \(c\) in which \(A\) is the agent of \(c\) is the proposition \(\langle A, \text{being a philosopher} \rangle\). If Mary is the agent of \(c\), then the value of this function at \(c\) is \(\langle \text{Mary}, \text{being a philosopher} \rangle\).

3.5 Direct Reference and Rigid Designation

Kaplan (1989a) claims that indexicals are devices of direct reference. By this he means that the content of an indexical, with respect to a context \(c\), is the object to which it refers in \(c\); its content is not a property or descriptive condition that determines the referent. For example, the content of ‘I’ in \(c\) is the agent of \(c\); its content in \(c\) is not the property or descriptive condition of being the agent of \(c\), or being the speaker of \(c\), or being the person uttering ‘I’, or any other sort of property or descriptive condition.

Kaplan (1989a) also says that indexicals are rigid designators. The notion of a rigid designator comes from Kripke (1980), who (roughly speaking) defines a rigid designator to be an expression that designates the same thing with respect to all possible worlds. When Kaplan claims that indexicals are rigid designators, he means that if object \(o\) is the referent of expression \(E\) with respect to context \(c\) and the world of \(c\), then \(o\) is also the referent of \(E\) with respect to \(c\) and any other world. For example, if Mary is the referent of ‘I’ with respect to \(c\) and the world of \(c\), then Mary is also the referent of ‘I’ with respect to \(c\) and any other world.

3.6 Utterances and Expressions in Kaplan’s Theory

Linguistic expressions should be distinguished from utterances. Linguistic expressions are abstract objects. Utterances are events in which an agent utters a linguistic expression. The word ‘the’ is a single linguistic expression, but two utterances of it occur in every utterance of the sentence ‘The philosopher saw the linguist’.

Kaplan’s theory does not ascribe characters or contents to utterances. Rather, it ascribes characters to linguistic expressions, and contents to expressions with respect to contexts. In fact, Kaplan’s theory ascribes contents to expressions with respect to contexts in which no one utters those expressions. For example, on Kaplan’s theory, the sentence ‘I exist’ has a content with respect to every context, and is true in every context, including contexts in which the agent does not utter that sentence, and including contexts in which no one in the world of the context speaks English. The sentence ‘I utter nothing’ is true in some contexts, on Kaplan’s theory, for there are contexts \(c\) in which the agent \(A\) of \(c\) utters nothing in the world of \(c\), and the content of the sentence in \(c\) is the proposition that \(A\) utters nothing, which is true in the world of \(c\). This is why Kaplan speaks of the agent of a context rather than the speaker of a context.

Nevertheless, Kaplan’s theory still has implications for utterances and speech acts. Suppose that Mary utters the sentence ‘I am a philosopher’ in world \(w\). Mary’s utterance has an agent in \(w\), namely Mary, and it occurs at a certain location and time in \(w\). So, her utterance in \(w\) determines a Kaplanian context. Call this context ‘Mary’s context’. On Kaplan’s theory, the sentence Mary utters has a content in Mary’s context, namely the singular proposition that Mary is a philosopher. If Mary utters the sentence assertively, then she (probably) asserts the content of that sentence in her context. So, Kaplan’s theory, together with other plausible assumptions, has important implications for what Mary asserts in her utterance.

For further discussion of utterances and expressions, see Reichenbach 1947, Garcia-Carpintero 1998, Kaplan 1999, Perry 2000, and section 5.3 below.

3.7 Kaplan’s Logic for Indexicals: A Few Formal Details

Kaplan (1989a) presents an elaborate logic of indexicals. We shall concentrate here on aspects of this logic that can be understood without going deeply into formal details.

The language of Kaplan’s logic is that of modal first-order predicate logic with tense operators and other additions. The additions include a distinguished predicate ‘Exists’, a distinguished binary predicate ‘Located’, a distinguished constant ‘I’, a distinguished constant ‘Here’, and a function-term ‘dthat’.

In standard first-order predicate logic, validity is defined as truth in all structures (sometimes called ‘models’) of a certain sort. In modal logic, validity is typically defined as truth at every world in every structure of a certain (different) sort. Kaplan similarly defines validity as truth at every context in every LD structure. (‘LD’ stands for ‘the Logic of Demonstratives’.) Each LD structure contains a set of contexts, a set of worlds, a set of individuals, a set of positions (common to all worlds), a set of times (common to all worlds), and a function that assigns to each predicate and individual constant an intension, which is a function from time-world pairs to extensions. (Thus Kaplan’s LD structures do not assign structured contents to expressions in contexts. LD structures use intensions to represent contents.) Each context has an associated agent, time, position, and world. Various stipulations about structures and contexts together ensure that, for every context \(c\) in every structure M: (i) the agent of \(c\) is a member of the extension of ‘Exist’ at the time and world of \(c\), and (ii) the ordered pair \(\langle \text{the agent of } c, \text{the position of } c \rangle\) is a member of the extension of ‘Located’ at the time and world of \(c\).

Kaplan uses standard methods to define truth for a formula, and denotation for a term, with respect to any given structure, context, time, world and assignment of values to variables. (Assignments will not be mentioned from here on.) Kaplan defines the notions of Content and Character for formulas and terms in terms of truth and denotation. The Content of a formula, with respect to a structure and context, is a function whose value at any time-world pair is the truth-value of the formula with respect to the preceding structure, context, time, and world. In short, the Content of an expression, with respect to a structure and context, is an intension. The Content of a singular term, with respect to a structure and context, is also an appropriate intension. Finally, the Character of a formula or term is the function from structures and contexts to Contents whose value, for any structure and context, is the Content of that expression with respect to that structure and context.

A formula is true at a context \(c\) in a structure \(M\) iff: the formula is true with respect to \(c\) and the time and world of \(c\) in \(M\). A formula is valid iff: for every structure \(M\), and every context \(c\) of \(M\), the formula is true at \(c\) in \(M\). Kaplan says that the notion of logical consequence can be defined in any of the usual ways.

3.8 More on Kaplan’s Logic for Indexicals: Contingent Validities, A Priority, and Valid Arguments

Sentences that are valid in standard (modal) first-order predicate logic are also valid in Kaplan’s logic of indexicals. But there are also valid sentences peculiar to Kaplan’s logic of indexicals. For instance, the formal analogs of ‘I exist’ and ‘I am here now’ are true in every context in every structure, and so are valid. This result is due to Kaplan’s stipulations that the agent of a context \(c\) exists at the time and world of \(c\), and that the agent of \(c\) is located at the position of \(c\) at the time and world of \(c\). In addition, every (formal) sentence of the form “\(S\) if and only if actually \(S\)” is valid. This is so because \(S\) is true at a context (in a structure) if and only if “Actually \(S\)” is.

A striking feature of Kaplan’s logic is that some valid sentences are contingently true, at some contexts in some LD structures. One example is ‘I exist’. We saw above that it is valid. Now consider an LD structure \(M\) in which Mary exists at some of the worlds in \(M\) but fails to exist at others. (More exactly, Mary is in the extension of ‘Exist’ at some pairs \(\langle t, w \rangle\) but is not in the extension of ‘Exist’ at some other pairs \(\langle t, w' \rangle\).) Next, consider a context \(c\) in which Mary is the agent. The formal analog of the sentence ‘I exist’ is true with respect to \(c\) and the time and world of \(c\) in \(M\), and so is true at \(c\) in \(M\). But that sentence is false with respect to \(c\), \(t\), and other worlds in \(M\). Therefore, ‘Necessarily, I exist’ (or its formal analog) is false at \(c\) in \(M\). Thus, ‘I exist’ is only contingently true at some contexts in some LD structures. Parallel points holds for ‘I am here now’: it is valid, but only contingently true at some contexts in some structures. Similarly, every sentence of the form “\(S\) if and only if actually \(S\)” is valid, but some sentences of this form are only contingently true at some contexts in some structures.

Kaplan holds that since ‘I exist’ is valid, one could know a priori the proposition that it expresses, in a context. For example, if Mary considers and understands the sentence ‘I exist’, then she can know a priori the proposition that it expresses in her context. Thus Kaplan concludes that she can know a priori the proposition that she exists. But this proposition is contingent, so Mary can have a priori knowledge of a contingent proposition. Thus Kaplan claims that his logic of indexicals provides examples of Kripke’s (1980) contingent a priori truths. (For discussion, see Salmon 1991, Forbes 1989)

Using a standard definition of validity for arguments, Kaplan’s formal analogs of arguments (13)–(15) are valid.

  • (13) I think. Therefore, I exist.
  • (14) Every human is mortal. I am human. Therefore, I am mortal.
  • (15) This is a hand. If this is a hand, then I am not a brain in a vat. Therefore, I am not a brain in a vat.

Thus, Kaplan’s logic of indexicals may aid in understanding the logic of some philosophically interesting arguments.

3.9 Some Criticisms of Kaplan’s Theory

Kaplan’s theory of indexicals is influential, and so has been subject to much critical scrutiny. A few criticisms will be described immediately below. Others criticisms will emerge later in this article.

Kaplan sometimes argues for his theory by appealing to intuitions about what is said. For instance, Kaplan claims that if John utters ‘I am hungry’ and Mary utters ‘I am hungry’ then what they say is different, whereas if John utters ‘I am hungry’ and Mary utters ‘You are hungry’ while addressing John, then what they say is the same. David Lewis (1980) says that Kaplan’s appeals to judgments about what is said are unpersuasive. Lewis also maintains that Kaplan fails to justify his claim that Kaplanian contents have a distinctive role to play in semantics. Lewis (1980) claims that the primary task of semantics is to describe how semantic values of sentences determine truth-values at contexts and circumstances of evaluation, the latter of which Lewis calls ‘indices’. Lewis holds that this can be done in (at least) two equally good ways. First, we can (like Kaplan) allow the semantic value of a sentence to vary from context to context, and design these varying semantic values so that they determine truth-values with respect to indices. Second, we can instead once-and-for-all assign to a sentence a single semantic value that determines a truth-value given both a context and an index. On views of this latter sort, semantic values are functions from pairs of contexts and indices to truth-values. Lewis claims that there is no theoretical reason to prefer one sort of theory over the other.

Kaplan’s semantics entails that that propositions can vary in truth-value from one time to another. He also assumes that propositions are the things that agents assert and believe. But he admits (1989a, 503, n. 28) that the objects of assertion and belief are traditionally thought to be eternal, that is, not to vary in truth-value from time to time. Salmon (1989) argues that Kaplan’s theory needs to be amended so as to make contents eternal. Salmon argues that once this amendment is made, it becomes evident that to deal adequately with tense, a semantic theory needs both (a) content-like meanings that vary in extension from time to time in the way that Kaplan’s contents do and (b) content-like meanings that are eternal. Jeffrey King (2003) also criticizes Kaplan for allowing contents (propositions) to be non-eternal. See Cappelen and Hawthorne (2009) for related discussion.

Bach (2005) says that the only indexicals that have contents with respect to contexts are the pure indexicals, such as ‘I’ and ‘today’. True demonstratives, such as ‘she’ and ‘that’, have no content in any context, and so the contents (in contexts) of sentences that contain them are propositional radicals (incomplete structured propositions). However, a speaker who utters such a sentence typically asserts a full proposition that completes the propositional radical that the sentence semantically expresses. (In this paragraph, and in most of the rest of section 4, we use ‘belief’ for events or states of believing propositions, rather than for propositions that are believed. We also use ‘desire’, ‘intention’, and ‘attitude’ similarly.)

Braun (1995) argues that the functions that Kaplan uses to represent characters in his formal logic (functions from structures and contexts to contents) misrepresent the more interesting notion of character described in the less formal parts of Kaplan’s theory (where Kaplan seemingly uses functions from contexts to contents in the intended structure to represent characters). Richard (2003) and Braun (1994) argue that structured characters, in addition to structured contents, are needed to distinguish between the linguistic meanings of certain pairs of expressions.

Kaplan maintains that ‘I am here now’ is logically valid, and yet he admits that the sentence ‘I am not here now’ is commonly used for answering-machine messages (1989a, 491, n. 12). For discussion of this “answering-machine puzzle,” see Predelli 1998a, 1998b; Corazza et al. 2002; Romdenh-Romluc 2002; and Cohen 2013.

For further criticisms of Kaplan’s theory (other than those that will emerge below), and for presentations of alternative theories, see Burge 1974, Weinstein 1974, Roberts 2002, and Elbourne 2008.

4. Indexical Belief and Indexical Semantics

Indexical beliefs are, roughly speaking, beliefs that agents are disposed to express by uttering sentences that contain indexicals. If Mary utters ‘I am a philosopher’, ‘You are a philosopher’, ‘She is a philosopher’ (while demonstrating someone), ‘The weather is good today’, or ‘John is here’, then she expresses an indexical belief. Indexical desires and indexical intentions are, roughly speaking, desires and intentions that agents can express by uttering sentences containing indexicals, such as ‘I want you to win the game’ and ‘I shall follow you’. Thus, we can speak more generally of indexical attitudes. (In this paragraph, and for most of the rest of section 4, we use ‘belief’ as a term for events or states of believing propositions, rather than for propositions that are believed. We use ‘desire’, ‘intention’, and ‘attitude’ similarly.)

Indexical beliefs are sometimes called self-locating beliefs (Perry 1977), because the beliefs that one has when one knows who one is, where one is, and when one is, are often expressed by uttering sentences containing ‘I’, ‘here’, ‘now’, and other indexicals. Indexical beliefs that can be expressed with ‘I’ are sometimes (following Lewis 1979) called ‘de se beliefs’. (‘De se’ is Latin for ‘of oneself’.) Those expressed with ‘now’ are sometimes called ‘de nunc beliefs’. (‘De nunc’ is Latin for ‘of now’.) Some philosophers hold that indexical beliefs are de re beliefs, which are beliefs of objects. (‘De re’ is Latin for of objects.) For example, some would say that the belief that Mary expresses by uttering ‘You are a philosopher’ to Bill is a de re belief concerning Bill.

Some philosophers hold that indexical attitudes, and so indexicals themselves, are important to understanding philosophically significant phenomena such as the following: Agency and explanation of action (Castañeda 1975; Perry 1979, 2000; McGinn 1983; and the entry on action); self-consciousness, subjectivity, and the first-person perspective (Nagel 1986, McDowell 1998); consciousness and qualia (Perry 1999; and the entries on consciousness and qualia); perceptual content (Egan 2006; and the entry on the contents of perception); immunity to error through misidentification (Shoemaker 1968); secondary qualities (McGinn 1983; Egan 2006); and various issues in moral philosophy (Velleman 1999; Hare 2007). For skepticism about the importance of indexicals to one or more of these topics, see Millikan 1990, Cappelen and Dever 2013, and Magidor forthcoming.

We shall concentrate here on the seeming implications that the theory of indexical semantics has for the theory of indexical belief, and vice versa. To grasp these seeming mutual implications, consider sentence (16) below.

  • (16) You are a philosopher.

Suppose that John understands sentence (16) and assertively utters (16) while addressing Mary and intending to refer to her. Then, plausibly, John asserts the proposition that (16) semantically expresses in his context. Moreover, if John is sincere, then he believes the proposition that (16) expresses in his context. Thus a semantic theory that describes the content of sentence (16) in John’s context also describes a proposition that he believes. Hence the theory of indexical semantics has implications for the theory of indexical belief. Theories of indexical belief can also have important implications for the semantics of indexicals. If, for instance, speakers do not believe the propositions that a semantic theory assigns to indexical sentences, relative to contexts, then that is prima facie reason to reject that semantic theory.

The remainder of this section will be dedicated to considering indexical belief and its implications for indexical semantics. (We shall, however, try to avoid discussing the semantics of belief ascriptions. See instead the entry on propositional attitude reports.)

4.1 Direct Reference Theories of Indexicals, Singular Propositions, and Indexical Belief

Direct reference theories of indexicals (such as Kaplan’s) say that the contents of ‘I’, ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘you’, ‘that’, and similar indexicals, in contexts, are the individuals to which those terms refer, in those contexts. Further, the contents (in contexts) of sentences containing such indexicals sentences are singular propositions (structured propositions that have individuals as constituents). Thus direct reference theories, together with the earlier assumptions about the connection of semantics with belief, imply that agents with indexical beliefs believe singular propositions. But various examples suggest that there is something wrong with, or at least something missing from, theories that say that agents with indexical beliefs believe singular propositions. Here is one famous example of this sort.

The messy shopper (Perry 1979)

John is in a grocery store, pushing a shopping cart. At the end of each row in the store there is a large mirror mounted near the ceiling. John notices a reflection of a shopper in one of these mirrors. He cannot see the shopper’s face, but he can see that the shopper’s cart contains a leaking bag of sugar. John utters ‘He is making a mess’ and sets off to find the messy shopper. But in fact, John saw a reflection of himself, and the leaking bag of sugar that he saw was in his own cart. After circling the store, John returns to the spot where he first spotted the messy shopper. He encounters the trail of sugar that he left behind. He then says ‘I am making a mess’, stops his cart, and adjusts the leaking bag of sugar in his cart.

Let \(t_0\) be the time at which John first saw the messy shopper and uttered ‘He is making a mess’. Let \(t_1\) be the later time at which John uttered ‘I am making a mess’ and stopped pushing his cart. It seems that John began to believe something at time \(t_1\) that he did not believe at \(t_0\). One proposition he seemingly began to believe for the first time at \(t_1\) is the proposition that the sentence ‘I am making a mess’ expressed in his context at \(t_1\). However, according to direct reference theories, that sentence expressed, in John’s context at \(t_1\), the singular proposition that John is making a mess. But John already believed the proposition that ‘He is making a mess’ expressed in his context at the earlier time \(t_0\), and he continued to believe that proposition through time \(t_1\). If direct reference theories are true, that proposition is also the singular proposition that John is making a mess. So, direct reference theories entail that John already believed, before time \(t_1\), the singular proposition that John is making a mess. So, if direct reference theories are correct, then it is not the case that John began to believe a proposition at \(t_1\) that he did not previously believe. But he did. Therefore, direct reference theories of indexicals are incorrect.

We can extract a simpler argument against direct reference theories from the messy shopper example by adding one more element to it. Consider the earlier time \(t_0\) when John first looked in the mirror and uttered ‘He is making a mess’, and now suppose he also uttered ‘I am not making a mess’ at that time. Then he believed the propositions expressed by both ‘He is making a mess’ and ‘I am not making a mess’ in his context at \(t_0\). But according to direct reference theories, ‘He is making a mess’ expresses, in John’s context at \(t_0\), the singular proposition that John is making a mess and the sentence ‘I am not making a mess’ expresses, in that same context, the singular proposition that John is not making a mess. So, if direct reference theories are true, then at \(t_0\), John believed both a proposition and its negation. But John is rational, and no rational person believes a proposition and its negation. Therefore, direct reference theories of indexicals are incorrect.

Both of the above objections to direct reference theories of indexicals can easily be modified to target theories that say that the contents of expressions containing indexicals, in contexts, are merely intensions, rather than structured contents.

Before considering replies from direct-reference theorists, let us consider an alternative semantics for indexicals, and an alternative theory of indexical belief, that may avoid the apparent problems with direct-reference theories.

4.2 A Descriptivist Theory of Indexicals and Indexical Belief

The above objections resemble Frege’s puzzles of cognitive significance for proper names. (See the entries on Gottlob Frege and propositional attitude reports.) One traditional response to problems of cognitive significance for proper names is to adopt a descriptivist theory of proper names. There are parallel descriptivist theories of indexicals.

On some traditional descriptivist theories of proper names, the content of a proper name can be expressed by a purely qualitative definite description, which is a definite description that does not contain any directly-referential terms (such as proper names and indexicals, if these are directly-referential). For example, on some views of this type, the content of the name ‘Benjamin Franklin’, in some speakers’ idiolects, is the same as that of the definite description ‘the person who invented bifocals’.

Similarly, according to some descriptivist theories of indexicals, every indexical, in every context, has a purely qualitative descriptive content. This content determines the indexical’s referent with respect to the world of the context (and any other world). A single indexical can have different descriptive contents in different contexts, and so can have different referents in different contexts. The descriptive content expressed by an indexical in a context is determined by the thoughts and intentions of the agent/speaker of the context. For example, when John utters ‘he’, he may mean the man who is \(F\), where the property of being a man and \(F\) is a purely qualitative property that suffices to determine a particular man independently of any context. The object determined by this descriptive content is the object to which ‘he’ refers, with respect to John’s context. If John utters ‘He is making a mess’, then the proposition that John believes and asserts is the proposition that the man who is \(F\) is making a mess.

An advocate of this purely qualitative descriptivist theory of indexicals could analyze the example of the messy shopper, in outline, as follows. When John first spots the messy shopper at \(t_0\), and utters ‘He is making a mess’, he begins to believe the descriptive proposition that the man who is \(F\) is making a mess, where \(F\) is a purely qualitative property. Later, at \(t_1\), when John utters ‘I am making a mess’, he begins to believe that the man who is \(G\) is making a mess, where \(G\) is a purely qualitative property different from \(F\). Therefore, John begins to believe a proposition that he did not previously believe, contrary to what direct-reference theories entail. Consider also the slightly modified case in which John utters both ‘He is making a mess’ and ‘I am not making a mess’ when he first looks in the mirror at \(t_0\). On a descriptivist analysis, John at that moment believes both the proposition that the man who is \(F\) is making a mess and the proposition that the man who is \(G\) is not making a mess. The second proposition is not the negation of the first, so John is perfectly rational to believe both. Thus the purely qualitative descriptivist theory seems to avoid the above problems for direct reference theories.

But Hector-Neri Castañeda (1966, 1967), John Perry (1977, 1979), and Kaplan (1989a) have presented a number of compelling objections to purely qualitative descriptivist theories. Versions of some of these objections appear below.

On the above descriptivist theory, John contemplates a purely qualitative descriptive content when he utters ‘He is making a mess’. Yet if John were asked to whom he was referring with ‘he’, it is unlikely that he would respond with a purely qualitative definite description. Rather, he would probably respond with a description like ‘the man I see in that mirror’, which is not purely qualitative unless John is contemplating purely qualitative properties when he utters ‘I’ and ‘that mirror’. Perhaps if John thought very hard, he could formulate a purely qualitative description that he thinks refers to the man he sees, such as the description ‘the man wearing a green shirt, red trousers, and white shoes who is pushing a shopping cart’. But if he has to think hard to find such a description, then he probably did not entertain the content of that description when he first uttered ‘He is making a mess’.

Waiving that objection, suppose that John does answer with a purely qualitative description, such as ‘the man wearing a green shirt, red trousers, and white shoes who is pushing a shopping cart’. Still, the description he uses may fail to refer to the person to whom John referred when he uttered ‘he’. Imagine that the mirror has distorted the color of the trousers that John sees: the trousers he sees (namely, his own trousers) appear red to him in the mirror, but they are in fact purple. So the preceding description does not pick out John. Now suppose further that there is a man who does fit the description perfectly, but he is in a grocery store far from John, and is not making a mess. Then the purely qualitative descriptivist theory entails that ‘He is making a mess’ is false in John’s context. But the sentence John utters is true in his context, contrary to the theory.

Kaplan (1989a) gives modal arguments against purely qualitative descriptivist theories of indexicals. Here is a modified version of one of his objections. Suppose, again, that the descriptive content of ‘he’ in John’s context is the content of ‘the man wearing a green shirt, red trousers, and white shoes who is pushing a shopping cart’. Then the following sentence expresses a necessary truth in John’s context: ‘He is wearing a green shirt, if he exists’. But that sentence expresses a contingent truth, not a necessary truth, in John’s context.

4.3 Direct-Reference Responses to Arguments against Their Views

We will soon consider other theories of indexical belief, and alternative semantic theories for indexicals, that are motivated by the above examples of indexical belief. But before doing so, let us consider how direct-reference theorists have responded to the earlier objections to their views.

Perry (1977, 1979) and Kaplan (1989a), claim that belief is a binary relation that agents can bear to propositions. But they say that this relation is mediated by a third entity. (Compare with assertion: assertion is a binary relation between agents and propositions, but it is mediated by sentences, or their characters.) Thus Perry and Kaplan claim that agents can believe a singular proposition in different ways. (Compare again with assertion: John can assert the singular proposition that he is shopping in at least two ways, by uttering either ‘John is shopping’ or ‘I am shopping’.) Moreover, a rational agent can rationally believe both a proposition and its negation, as long as he does so in suitably different ways.

Perry (1977) and Kaplan (1989a) take the relevant mediators of belief to be characters (Perry calls them ‘roles’). An agent can believe a proposition under one character, but fail to believe it under another character. This is John’s state when he first sees the messy shopper at \(t_0\), and he is willing to utter ‘He is making a mess’ but is not willing to utter ‘I am making a mess’. Perry and Kaplan also hold that a rational agent can believe a proposition under one character and also believe the negation of that proposition under a suitably different character. This is what happens when John utters ‘He is making a mess’ and ‘I am not making a mess’ in the slightly modified example: John believes the singular proposition that John is making mess under the character of ‘He is making a mess’ but believes the negation of that proposition under the character of ‘I am not making mess’. He is rational because the second character is not the negation of the first character (roughly speaking).

The claim that agents believe propositions under characters is reasonably clear when agents utter sentences to express their indexical beliefs. But agents believe many propositions that they do not express with sentences. Perhaps for this reason, Perry (1979) modifies the ways-of-believing theory by distinguishing between (i) the proposition that an agent believes and (ii) the belief state in virtue of which the agent believes that proposition. Perry holds that for any one proposition, there are many belief states that would enable an agent to believe that proposition. An agent can be in one of these belief states while failing to be in another. Belief states can be classified into types by the characters of the sentences that they dispose agents to utter. For instance, a belief state that would cause John to utter ‘He is making a mess’ can be classified with the character of that sentence, whereas a belief state that disposes John to utter ‘I am making mess’ can be classified with the character of that sentence. John can rationally be in a belief state of the first sort while failing to be in a belief state of the second sort. He can, in addition, be in a belief state of the first sort while also being in a belief state that disposes him to utter the negation of the second. For further discussion and criticisms, see Wettstein (1986), Taschek (1987), and Crimmins (1992, chapter 1).

Perry’s subsequent theories replace belief states with more elaborate systems of mental representation, and replace classification of belief states by characters with classifications of mental representations by cognitive roles and various types of semantic values. For details, see the papers that appear in Perry (1997, 2001).

4.4 Lewis and Chisholm on Indexical Belief

David Lewis (1979a) and Roderick Chisholm (1981) independently developed theories of indexical belief according to which the things that agents believe are properties rather than propositions. The primary differences between Lewis’s view and Chisholm’s view are ontological. Chisholm’s primitive ontology includes properties and relations. Lewis’s does not. It instead includes sets of possible objects, such as possible worlds and other individuals. Lewis reduces properties to sets of possible objects and relations to sets of \(n\)-tuples of possible objects. Lewis’s variant has been more influential, and so we concentrate on his theory below.

On Lewis’s view, believing is self-ascribing. Agents self-ascribe properties, so the things they believe are properties. If John sincerely utters ‘I am making a mess’, then he self-ascribes the property of making a mess, and therefore he believes that property. An agent who seemingly believes a purely general qualitative proposition \(P\) in fact believes the corresponding property of being such that \(P\). For example, if John sincerely utters ‘Some dogs are brown’, he believes (self-ascribes) the property of being such that some dogs are brown.

Some presentations of Lewis’s view replace properties with sets of centered worlds (Egan 2006, Ninan 2013). Centered worlds are ordered pairs \(\langle o, w \rangle\) where \(o\) is an object and \(w\) is a world. Suppose, as Lewis does, that properties are sets of possible objects; alternatively, suppose that a property \(F\) is an intension, namely a function whose value at any world \(w\) is the set of objects that have \(F\) at \(w\). Then, as Lewis (1979a) points out, believing a property \(F\) is, in a certain sense, equivalent to believing the set of centered worlds \(\langle o, w \rangle\) such that \(o\) has \(F\) in \(w\).

Agents cannot directly ascribe properties to individuals other than themselves, for all ascription of properties is self-ascription. But under the right conditions, agents can indirectly ascribe properties to objects other than themselves by self-ascribing properties that (roughly speaking) uniquely describe those other objects. For example, suppose that Mary sees Bill and only Bill. She may then self-ascribe the property of seeing exactly one man such that he is hungry. (More precisely, she may self-ascribe the property of being an \(x\) such that there is exactly one \(y\) such that \(y\) is a man and \(x\) sees \(y\) and \(y\) is hungry.) If she does so, then she indirectly ascribes the property of being hungry to Bill, under the relation of being a man uniquely seen. Lewis counts the relation of being a man uniquely seen as an acquaintance relation. According to Lewis, believing a property that uniquely determines an object under an acquaintance relation is sufficient for having a de re belief about that object. So, Lewis would say that Mary de re believes of Bill that he is hungry. But Lewis (1979a) also says “Beliefs de re are not really beliefs,” for he thinks that de re belief is too extrinsic a matter to count as genuine belief.

Lewis would analyze the messy shopper case as follows. When John looks into the mirror and utters ‘He is making a mess’, he begins to believe (to self-ascribe) the property of uniquely seeing a man in a mirror that is making a mess. However, John does not, at that point, believe (self-ascribe) the property of making a mess. John starts to believe that property only after he has searched for the messy shopper. So, when John utters ‘I am making a mess’, he begins to believe something (the property of making a mess) that he did not previously believe.

Lewis and Chisholm do not extend their views of indexical belief to the semantics of indexicals. That is, neither of them claims that the content of a sentence containing an indexical, in a context, is a property. Lewis (1980) mentions various semantic values that a semantic theory might assign to a sentence containing an indexical, but none of these semantic values are properties of the sort mentioned by his theory of indexical belief.

Turning now to criticisms, Lewis’s and Chisholm’s views say that agents believe properties. Properties are neither true nor false. But agents, one might object, often believe things that are true and false. Neither Lewis nor Chisholm addresses this objection directly. But Lewis sometimes says that an agent can be right to believe a property, or that an agent can believe a property truly, and he says this when the relevant agent believes a property that the agent has. This suggests that Lewis would analyze the notion of believing something that is true with some notion like that of believing something truly.

Both Lewis and Chisholm hold that whenever an agent has a belief about an object other than herself, she grasps a property that descriptively determines that object. The relevant property need not be purely qualitative, for it may relate the object to herself. Nevertheless, this is a strong form of descriptivism. David Austin (1990) presents detailed, putative counterexamples to their views that focus on this descriptivist aspect of their theories.

Stalnaker (1981, 2008) argues that Lewis’s view entails an implausible incommunicability of belief. Suppose that Mary believes that she is hungry and utters ‘I am hungry’. On Lewis’s view, she believes the property of being hungry. Suppose Bill hears her and agrees with her. He cannot agree with her by believing what she believes, for if he did, he would believe the property of being hungry, and so ascribe that property to himself, not to Mary. The best that Bill can do is self-ascribe a property that relates himself uniquely to her, such as the property of speaking uniquely to a person who is hungry.

For further discussion of Lewis’s view, and modifications of it, see Stalnaker 1981, 2008; Ninan 2013; Cappelen and Dever 2013; and Magidor forthcoming.

4.5 Other Views of Indexical Belief (and Indexical Semantics)

Many philosophers have presented alternative theories of indexical belief, sometimes along with alternative theories of indexical semantics.

Gottlob Frege (1997b) holds that each agent can think of himself or herself via a sense that no other agent can grasp. Other aspects of Frege’s views on indexicals are the subjects of interpretive controversy. For discussion, see Perry (1977, 1979), Evans (1985), Kripke (2011), and Burge (2012).

Schiffer (1978, 1981) holds that each agent can believe a singular proposition about herself, but cannot believe a singular proposition about any other object. All belief that is seemingly about other objects reduces to descriptive belief. Nevertheless, he holds that the correct semantics for indexicals is a direct-reference theory. Schiffer’s view of indexical belief is quite similar to Lewis’s and Chisholm’s, as Austin (1990) points out. Austin offers criticisms of Schiffer’s view that parallel his criticisms of Lewis’s and Chisholm’s views.

Evans (1985) holds (roughly) that agents with indexical beliefs believe singular propositions that have the characters of indexicals as constituents. For example, a person who utters ‘He is making a mess’, while pointing at John, believes a proposition that has as constituents John, the relation of demonstrating, and the property of making a mess. For discussion, see Perry 2000.

For other views on indexical belief, see Castañeda 1966, 1967; Stalnaker 1981, 2008; and Ninan 2013.

5. Other Topics Concerning Indexicals

5.1 Quasi-Indicators and Attitude Ascriptions that Seemingly Attribute First-Person Indexical Attitudes

Castañeda (1966, 1967) argues that ‘he himself’ and ‘she herself’ can be used to ascribe first-person indexical beliefs and cannot be used to ascribe beliefs that are not first-person indexical. Consider again the messy shopper, and let \(t_0\) be the time at which John first utters ‘He is making a mess’. Castañeda would hold that ascription (18) is true but ascription (19) is false.

  • (17) John [at \(t_0\)]: “He is making a mess.”
  • (18) John believed at \(t_0\) that he was making a mess.
  • (19) John believed at \(t_0\) that he himself was making a mess.

Castañeda uses the term quasi-indicator for expressions such as ‘he himself’ and ‘she herself’ that he claims can be used to ascribe (only) indexical beliefs that the subject would express with a first-person pronoun such as ‘I’. Castañeda uses ‘he*’ and ‘she*’ as abbreviations for ‘he himself’ and ‘she herself’.

Perry (2000, Chapter 5) argues that belief attributions containing ‘he himself’ in their ‘that’-clauses do not semantically require that the subject have a first-person belief. Instead, utterances of such belief attributions merely suggest that the subject has a first-person belief. Schlenker (2003), however, claims that some languages other than English contain lexical items that are quasi-indicators in Castañeda’s sense.

There are other attitude ascriptions that do not contain ‘he himself’ or ‘she herself’, but which also seem to require, or at least strongly suggest, that their subjects have first-person attitudes. Suppose that John is in a pizza parlor, and observes a customer in a mirror who appears to be too thin to be healthy. John points at him in the mirror and sincerely utters ‘I want him to eat a large slice of pizza’. John, however, is not feeling hungry, and so he says ‘I do not want to eat a large slice of pizza’. In fact, however, the person that John sees in the mirror is himself. Attribution (20) seems to be true in this situation, whereas attribution (21) seems to be false.

  • (20) John wants him to eat a large slice of pizza [pointing at John in the mirror].
  • (21) John wants to eat a slice of pizza.

Some theorists would claim that (21) is true only if John has a first-person desire, that is, a desire that he would naturally express with ‘I want to eat a large slice of pizza’. Some of these theorists would attribute the seemingly mandatory first-person reading of (21) to the presence of a silent, pronoun-like expression that serves as a subject for the embedded infinitival phrase ‘to eat a slice of pizza’. This sort of pronominal expression is often called ‘PRO’. For discussion, see Dowty 1985, Chierchia 1989, and Cappelen and Dever 2013.

5.2 Complex Demonstratives

Complex demonstratives are expressions of the form that \(N\) or this \(N\), where \(N\) is a common noun phrase. Examples include ‘this man’, ‘that red car’, and ‘that woman who is wearing a blue coat’. One major question about complex demonstratives is whether they are singular terms or quantifier phrases. Singular terms are expressions that refer, with respect to contexts, to individuals. Most semantic theories of the simple demonstratives ‘this’ and ‘that’ treat them as singular terms. Speakers seem to use complex demonstratives to refer to individuals in much the way that they use simple demonstratives. That is some reason to think that complex demonstratives are singular terms. However, complex demonstratives syntactically resemble paradigmatic quantifier phrases, such as ‘some woman’ and ‘every man’. That is some reason to think that complex demonstratives are quantifier phrases. But quantifier phrases are not singular terms; they do not refer, with respect to contexts, to individuals. Their references, or extensions, with respect to contexts, are usually taken to be sets of sets.

Singular-term theories of complex demonstratives must deal with two major issues. First, do the common noun phrases that appear in complex demonstratives play a role in determining their referents in contexts? Second, do the contents of those common noun phrases contribute to the contents of complex demonstratives, in contexts? (Does, for instance, the content of ‘philosopher’ appear as a constituent of the content of ‘that philosopher’, in a context?) Minimal theories assign minimal, or no, semantic role to common noun phrases in complex demonstratives. The common noun phrase merely gives an auditor a clue as to the speaker’s intended referent. Since the predicate ‘philosopher’ plays no role in determining the referent of ‘that philosopher’ in a context, its referent, in a context, need not be a philosopher. Furthermore, the content of ‘philosopher’ is not a constituent of the content of ‘that philosopher’ in a context; its content simply its referent, in that context. Larson and Segal (1995) endorse a minimal theory (but they do not accept the existence of Kaplan-style contents). Intermediate theories say that the common noun phrase helps determine the referent. So, an individual must be a philosopher to be the referent of ‘that philosopher’ in a context. But the common noun phrase does not contribute its content to the complex demonstrative’s content. Instead, the content of the complex demonstrative is simply its referent. Kaplan (1989a) hints that he accepts an intermediate theory. Braun (1994, 2008), Borg (2000), and Salmon (2002) explicitly argue for intermediate theories. Maximal theories say that the common noun phrase helps determine the referent, and its content appears as a constituent of the content, in a context. Richard (1993) endorses a maximal theory.

The arguments for and against these views are complicated. To take one example: intermediate theorists might claim that (22) is false in some contexts, and argue that this is incompatible with maximal theories.

  • (22) It is a necessary truth that if that philosopher exists, then something is a philosopher.

But maximal theorists, if they agree with this judgment about (22), can add rigidifying devices, such as ‘actually’, to obtain this result.

Taylor (1981), King (2001), and Neale (2004) endorse quantificational theories of complex demonstratives. For example, on King’s view, the content of (23), in some contexts in which the agent perceives Mary and believes Mary to be a philosopher, is necessarily equivalent to the content of (24) in that same context (assuming that definite descriptions are quantifier phrases, not singular terms).

  • (23) That philosopher was born in Boise.
  • (24) The individual that is actually a philosopher and is identical with Mary was born in Boise.

The arguments for and against singular-term theories and quantifier phrase theories are (again) complicated. For example, King argues that intermediate singular-term theories of complex demonstratives have difficulties dealing with cases of quantifying into complex demonstratives, as in examples like (25) below.

  • (25) Every university professor cherishes that first publication of hers.

Borg (2000), Lepore and Johnson (2002), Salmon (2002), and Braun (2008) respond to King’s argument, and criticize his view. King defends his argument, and his view, in King 2008a and 2008b.

See Lepore and Ludwig 2000, Dever 2001, Roberts 2002, and Elbourne 2008 for views of complex demonstratives that do not fit easily into the above classification scheme.

5.3 Multiple Occurrences of Demonstratives

Multiple occurrences of demonstratives present difficulties for some theories. Sentence (26) below contains multiple occurrences of the demonstrative ‘that’.

  • (26) That is not identical with that.

In the right circumstances, a speaker could use (26) to assert a true proposition. This strongly suggests that (26) is true in some contexts. But ‘that’ is unambiguous, and so has a single linguistic meaning. If linguistic meaning determines reference in a context (in the way that Kaplan’s characters do), then all occurrences of ‘that’ in (26) have the same reference with respect to any given context. So, (26) should be false in all contexts.

Kaplan’s theories of true demonstratives allow sentences that resemble (26) to be false in some contexts, but at the cost of attributing a type of ambiguity to ‘that’. For example, on his later indexical theory of demonstratives, some formal analogs of (26), such as (27), are true in contexts in which the first demonstratum of the context is distinct from the second.

  • (27) That1 is not identical with that2.

But on this theory each subscripted ‘that’ has a different character. So this theory does not identify a reasonable candidate for the single linguistic meaning of the unsubscripted English word ‘that’. This may be why Kaplan (1989b) speaks of the “exotic ambiguity” of demonstratives.

There are various options for responding to the problem of finding a single meaning for ‘that’. One could stipulate that each context has only one demonstratum, and say that the content of ‘that’ in a context is the demonstratum of the context, but then insist that the content of a sentence containing multiple occurrences of demonstratives is determined not by a single context but by a sequence of contexts. Then (26) is true with respect to certain sequences of contexts that have different demonstrata. Second, one could distinguish linguistic meaning and character. ‘That’ has a single linguistic meaning, but this meaning does not determine reference in a context; linguistic meaning instead determines the characters of occurrences, and these characters determine reference in a context. Third, one could move to a theory that assigns contents to utterances rather than expressions. This might help because every utterance of (26) contains two utterances of ‘that’. There are other possibilities. For discussion, see Kaplan 1989a, 1999; Wettstein 1986; Taschek 1987; Braun 1996; Garcia-Carpintero 1998; Salmon 2002; Richard 2003.

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