Interpretivist Theories of Law

First published Tue Oct 14, 2003

Interpretivism about the nature of law is the view that legal rights and duties are determined by the scheme of principle that provides the best justification of certain political practices of a community: a scheme identifiable through an interpretation of the practices that is sensitive both to the facts of the practices and to the values or principles that the practices serve.

Interpretivism has been developed by Ronald Dworkin in a number of publications over the last 30 years or so (see the works of Dworkin cited in the Bibliography). Interpretivism as developed by Dworkin includes the claim that interpretation is sensitive to values in the way just explained, and that it is fundamental to the nature of law. Many theorists accept that, given the law, interpretation that is sensitive to values is necessarily employed in its application (e.g. Brink 2001). In this entry, we shall be concerned exclusively with interpretivism as a theory about the nature of law, and so we shall not consider such views (except as possible misunderstandings of interpretivism). We shall focus on the explanation of the position defended by Dworkin (though not necessarily on his way of defending it), and briefly consider some alternatives in respect of the normative character of legal interpretation.

The arrival of interpretivism in the scene, previously dominated by positivist and natural law theories about the nature of law, has stimulated a great deal of debate (the following are some examples from the vast secondary literature: Mitchell, 1983; Cohen 1984; Hart 1994 (Postscript); Raz 1986; Finnis 1992; Coleman 2001).

1. Propositions and Grounds

Interpretivism is a thesis about what determines legal rights and duties, i.e. what makes it the case that the law requires what it does. As such, it is a thesis about the nature of law. These questions can be formulated in terms of the grounds of propositions of law.

Propositions of law are expressed by sentences that describe legal requirements. For example, such a proposition may be that

Gratuitous promises not relied upon are not enforceable in law.

Such propositions can be at all levels of generality. They may involve relatively abstract legal requirements, such as the above example, or concrete requirements such as the proposition that Smith is entitled to $100 from Jones. They can be expressed in terms of legal rights or duties: e.g. ‘in law, no duty to do as promised applies to those who promise gratuitously, as long as their promise is not relied upon’, or ‘Jones has a legal duty to pay Smith $100’.

What makes a proposition of law true, when it is true? We want to investigate the grounds of law, so it would not help to cite facts that trivially make legal propositions true — we already know that, for any x, the fact that x is capable of making the proposition that x true — and it would not help to cite any legal facts either — doing so would merely postpone, not answer our question. What are the likely candidates?

It seems uncontroversial that biographical and other contingencies in the lives of ordinary citizens, such as the fact that Jones was drunk when he met Smith to discuss a deal, are among the facts that make true concrete propositions of law that involve such citizens' rights and duties. More interestingly, it is uncontroversial that the truth of all legal propositions is, at least in part, dependent upon certain political facts. By 'political facts' I mean political decisions and practices, including legislative enactments, custom, or settled judicial practice, understood in non-legal terms, i.e. without reference to what the law requires; and further understood in non-evaluative terms, i.e. without reference to facts about what is right or good.

It is uncontroversial that the question whether gratuitous promises bind in law is partly dependent upon political decisions and practices. It is further widely accepted that such decisions and practices crucially include what officials said and did in the past, conceived simply in terms of the texts and utterances they issued and their settled practice of behaving in a certain way, all of which at least in part make propositions of law true. For example, it is widely accepted that the text of a statute that reads 'gratuitous promises shall not be enforced', or the fact that judges, as a matter of settled practice, are disposed not to enforce gratuitous promises, would go a long way towards explaining why such promises are not enforceable.

Political facts properly conceived may include more than these simple facts. Official utterances and texts are meaningful entities, not mere sounds or ink stains (which could not as such make any legal proposition true) so any proper conception of political facts must rely on some doctrine about what makes texts and utterances mean what they do. But a conception of political facts may be much richer still: for example, it may include counterfactual dispositions of officials, or psychological states of officials such as their intentions, desires, hopes, and expectations not specified in terms of dispositions. Did members of Congress intend or expect that the text of the statute should be construed in a certain way? Would they have formulated the text differently if they had contemplated a contingency they did not in fact contemplate? An appropriate conception of political facts may further include other, more complex facts such as the fact that certain courts possess the power to quash other courts' decisions. It is more controversial whether such complex facts are ultimately reducible to simple facts of linguistic and other behavior of officials or citizens, including their collective dispositions, or whether they are indeed relevant at all. It is however uncontroversial that political facts, conceived in non-evaluative terms, play a critical role in the grounding of legal propositions. For convenience, I shall call political facts so conceived political practice.

Interpretivism accepts and provides an explanation for these widely accepted claims, but also defends a view usually attributed to the natural law tradition: that, in spite of their obvious dependence upon political practice, legal requirements further depend, in some complex way, upon certain non-contingent evaluative facts. This part of interpretivism is highly controversial, so we need to clarify and defend it.

Interpretivism is the view that, if true, a proposition of law is true in virtue of an interpretive fact: in a nutshell, in virtue of the fact that the proposition follows from the best justification of a community's political practice. Interpretivism says that it is not political practice alone — such as the fact that Congress voted for a statute that says that gratuitous promises are not enforceable, that its power to enforce its decisions is recognized, or that it is treated as supreme law-maker by lawyers, or the fact that as a matter of settled practice courts do not enforce such promises — that makes legal propositions true, nor is it moral or other evaluative facts alone — e.g. that it is good that gratuitous promises should not be enforceable — that make them true either. Rather, legal propositions are made true by the best justification of political practice, i.e. the scheme of principle that underlies and governs political practice, including e.g. the fact that it is right that Congress should wield the power that it does or that courts' settled practice should have a large impact on our duties. Interpretivism therefore claims that legal requirements are sensitive to both the facts of the practice and the values served by it, but not fully determined by either.

2. Propositions and the Nature of Law

The question of the grounds of legal propositions is not a question about the legal requirements in any jurisdiction. It is not the question of what is the content of the law, here or elsewhere. Rather, it is the question of what makes the content of the law what it is. If the law, for example, includes a requirement to pay capital gains tax at a certain rate, what makes it the case that it includes that requirement?

Consider by way of analogy the proposition that a certain course of action, A, is immoral. If this proposition is true, what makes it true? We learn something important about the nature of morality if we learn whether, e.g., this proposition is true in virtue of the fact that A is disapproved by the Gods, or that A is considered immoral by most people. Similarly, in the legal domain we may hope to learn about the nature of law by learning whether legal propositions are made true by contingent political facts — and if so, which ones — or by political values, economic forces, or divine will, or have any other colorable ground.

The core at least of any doctrine about the nature of law including all the familiar ones may be formulated as a thesis about legal propositions and their grounds. Put in those terms, some of these doctrines may imply that legal propositions divide into distinct classes, on the basis of the kind of grounds each has. For example, a theory may hold that certain propositions are either made true by a special class of facts of political practice, law-creating facts, alone, or are entailed by propositions that are made true by such facts alone. These propositions constitute a basic class, the law. By contrast, propositions that follow from the basic class with the addition of further contingent or evaluative premises constitute the law's applications (compare Raz 1980, 70-92; 216-24). Moreover, each theory provides or entails an account not merely of the grounds and the propositions they make true, but also of the nature of the relation between grounds and propositions. For example, a theory may hold that the links between true legal propositions and political practice are conceptual, in the special sense of the shared implicit understanding of the concept of law or other key concepts such as the concept of authority. That is, the theory may say that it is such a conceptual truth that certain aspects of the practices determine the propositions that they do (see the link to Greenberg 2002 in the Other Internet Resources section, for systematic discussion of possible determination relations).

Interpretivism may be consistent with a classification of legal propositions by kind of grounds but, since it would not accept that any legal proposition is made true by political practice (in the narrow technical sense identified above) alone, it need not place any emphasis on such a division. Interpretivism would further say that the relation that holds between the grounds and the propositions is interpretive, in a sense to be explained further.

The question of the grounds of legal propositions should not be confused with another question often discussed by legal philosophers: not what makes legal propositions true but rather what makes norms (or legal rules or laws) valid. Some theorists hold that the conditions of validity of norms are exclusively source-based, consisting only in facts about the norms' pedigree. Other theorists hold that norms' validity may further depend on certain moral conditions, if such conditions are laid down by more fundamental source-based norms, or by settled judicial practice, or by some other feature of political history. For example, such a view may be that in case the Constitution entrenches some values, the conditions of validity of ordinary legislation include those values. Or it may be that, in case officials happen to use moral tests, e.g. they treat as law whatever Congress says yet only insofar as it is consistent with liberty and equality, these values set partial tests of validity. In both cases the values play the crucial role only because legislators themselves said so or because officials treat them as such — in virtue of political practice.

Interpretivism is often taken to represent another possibility along that spectrum: it is recast as the thesis that legal norms' validity is partly dependent upon the best justification of political practice, in the specific sense that valid norms are those which, in addition to having the right source — their having been promulgated by the right people or institutions — are further consistent with the principles that justify the relevant political practice (even if the principles are not explicitly laid down by any authority). On that reading, interpretation consists in the derivation of valid legal norms through the application of an evaluative filter to a set of given norms. As the metaphor of a filter makes plain, the reading in question presupposes a set of norms (or rules or laws), whose identity does not depend on interpretation, to which the filter is applied at an analytically later stage. The interpretivist, however, need not accept that any legal norms or rules are individuated non-interpretively.

On another version, interpretivism does not take any norms as (non-interpretively) given. It rather claims that valid legal norms are identifiable through an interpretation of the legal materials such as authoritative texts — the texts of the constitution, statutes and cases, which canonically formulate the legal decisions — in the light of certain political values. But even on that version, the materials' legality is given. A broadly positivistic explanation of law in terms of authoritative sources is once again assumed, with interpretation understood as some kind of evaluative processing of the sources.

The confusion may be encouraged by the assumption that the interpretivist must rely on or presuppose a division of legal propositions into a special class of propositions grounded on law-creating facts alone, which constitute the law and in respect of which interpretation plays no role, and those that follow from the special class with the addition of further premises, which constitute the application of law. On this assumption, the interpretivist is merely claiming that law must be interpreted to be applied. As we saw however, interpretivism is not restricted in this way.

3. Interpretive Practices

The interpretivist claims that legal practice is, in its nature, interpretive. What makes a practice interpretive? Dworkin explains this in terms of a special attitude, which has two components, holding among practitioners. He uses an imaginary example of a practice of courtesy, which includes many rules cited by practitioners and taken by them to set out what courtesy requires. He describes the components of the attitude (Dworkin 1986, 47) as follows:

The first is the assumption that the practice of courtesy does not merely exist but has value, that it serves some interest or purpose or enforces some principle — in short, that it has some point — that can be stated independently of just describing the rules that make up the practice. The second is the further assumption that the requirements of courtesy — the behavior it calls for or the judgments it warrants — are not necessarily or exclusively what they have always been taken to be but are instead sensitive to its point, so that the strict rules must be understood or applied or modified or qualified or limited by that point.

Dworkin's two components capture two independent conditions, both of which must be satisfied. It is not enough that the practice be thought to serve some value (which would satisfy the first condition); further, the value must be taken to be constitutive of the practice, which is what the second condition amounts to. Together, the conditions have important consequences in respect of the practice's character.

It should be emphasized that the value or principle in question is assumed to be genuine and not trivially satisfied by the practice. The assumption is that the practice is in fact valuable, not that it can be rationalized. Baby-torturers may think that their practice serves some value, and even that its requirements are sensitive to it, but they are wrong: the value in question cannot be the value of torturing babies, a value their practice would trivially satisfy if it existed. Nor can it be the value of inflicting suffering, which would not be trivial but likewise does not exist. In this case, we can confidently assume that no real value or principle is served by what they do. This case is however only a dramatic extreme: the fact that practitioners assume that their practice serves a value does not suffice to make it so, so it could turn out for any practice whatever — including legal practice — that the assumption is false.

Practitioners hold themselves responsible to a standard that is set by the value, if any, which in fact justifies the practice, not their individual or collective understanding of the value. This aspect of the attitude introduces a critical dimension to interpretive practices. It implies that the standard that governs such a practice is taken to be in a crucial sense external to it. Participants accept that they are fallible, even collectively, in respect of the standard and thus in respect of the behavior or judgment that the standard entails. Any particular aspect of the practice, however well-settled, may turn out to be a mistake, and the practice could have determinate requirements even where it is unsettled. Consider by way of contrast a conventional practice, as commonly understood: in that case, the standard that governs a practice is defined — exclusively set — by settled practice (compare Hart 1982, 153-61). It follows that, in that case, no part of settled practice could turn out to be a mistake, a failure by practitioners to discharge the duty imposed by the practice. For the interpretivist, however, there is no such guarantee. The question can always be raised in respect of any aspect of the practice: does it really serve the value the practice is meant to serve?

But while the standard is in that sense partly external, it is not in another. Participants are open-minded in respect of what makes their practice as it stands now require what it does. When they are inclined to correct their actual practice to conform to a new, better interpretation, they take it that that the new interpretation better articulates the standard to which they were antecedently committed, not that they are persuaded to substitute a new, more attractive standard for the old one (compare Burge 1986).

Room for error in the practice entails that disagreement of a special kind is possible. Participants can sensibly disagree about what constitutes courtesy — what the standard of courtesy is, not merely whether some behavior satisfies a given standard — and take it that the right answer to that constitutive question would be right in virtue of capturing the rationale of the practice, whatever it is, not their understanding of the rationale (whether explicit or implicit, individual or collective). This is not to say that it follows from the mere fact that participants appear to disagree in that fundamental way that they do. Rather, the point is that, if participants do hold themselves responsible to the value, whatever it is, that justifies their practice, it is possible for such disagreement to obtain. Whether any actual disagreement has the character in question depends on whether it is in fact best explained in those terms.

4. Interpretation

The interpreter's task in respect of an interpretive practice is to formulate a hypothesis, i.e. to postulate a value that could in fact justify the practice's requiring what it is held to require. The interpreter's hypothesis amounts to the attribution of a rationale or point to the relevant practice, an articulation of the values that are served by behaving in the way participants do behave when they are trying to conform to the requirements of the practice in question. It is worth repeating that the practice's interpretive character merely entails that the interpreter must look for such a rationale, not that there is some guarantee that one exists.

For example, the rationale of giving up one's seat to a senior in the name of courtesy (i.e. as a duty entailed by a standard that requires many other things too, such as excusing oneself from certain parties) may be to show respect (assuming that this constitutes a virtue or has some other value); if so, the display of respect would constitute the point of the practice, so that, if faced with the question what the practice requires that one do in a different context, the right answer would be sensitive to that point. For another example, which greatly simplifies a far more complicated practice, the rationale of awarding compensation for injuries caused by defective products may be that manufacturers should bear the cost of the risk associated with the use of the relevant products. Such a rationale would justify awarding damages when such injuries occur, whether or not the manufacturer is at fault — i.e. would justify no-fault liability. Finally, consider the practice of treating statutes as capable of overriding many long-standing arrangements of rights and duties, as having the power instantly to invent new or to extinguish old such arrangements. It would be a major undertaking fully or even adequately to specify the values served by treating the legislature as possessing such sweeping powers; plausibly, they are abstract political values that involve procedural justice. These values, once articulated, would partly determine the impact of a statute that purports to override some fundamental right, with which the legislature had never interfered before.

These examples are meant merely to convey the flavor of the interpreter's task. Given the complexity of legal practice, the legal interpreter's complete task would be to construct an equally complex hypothesis that can explain and justify, so far as possible, all the ‘data’, the facts of a large number of specific practices, many of which may seem to pull in different directions. The interpretivist then may introduce a superhuman character, the ideal interpreter, who should be able to find a complex hypothesis that achieves equilibrium among all the relevant practices (Dworkin famously calls him ‘Hercules’). Although sometimes presented as a flaw in the theory, the superhuman character merely helps illustrate an aspect of legal practice which does not seem controversial: that any candidate interpretation of the law, however narrowly focused, is open to the challenge that it does not cohere with another part of the law, where both the interpreter and the challenger agree what that part requires. The possibility of this form of challenge implies the formal aspect of interpretation discussed here: that any local interpretation must aspire to be a genuine component of the global, all-encompassing and perfectly calibrated interpretation of the totality of legal practice. The fact that no lawyer or judge can put together such an interpretation is no more disturbing than the fact that no scientist can put together a total explanation of the natural world. Like the total scientific theory, the global interpretation provides the measure of correctness and thus the standard of criticism of ordinary science and ordinary interpretation.

5. Facts and Impact

The interpretivist's central claim is that legal practice is indeed interpretive, in the sense explained above. He claims that it is possible for lawyers to disagree in the special way (and is likely further to claim that they often do disagree in that way): e.g. about what constitutes negligence or legislative intent, each assuming that his or her explanation of the law on the disputed point is the best in virtue of being the only explanation that properly justifies the rest of the practice (the part not in dispute). Most lawyers would agree of course on some very weak proposition about the grounds of law. They would agree that certain aspects of practice — e.g. statutory texts — have large impact on the law, but they only agree because they each rely on a far more elaborate understanding of the precise impact that any aspect of the practice does have. Their thin agreement is only an overlap of very different complete accounts. That is not to say that each lawyer has a well-articulated Herculean account in mind when he engages in a local dispute, only that he assumes that his partial account is good in virtue of being a part of the Herculean account, and hence assumes a responsibility to articulate as best he can the implications or presuppositions of the part he defends, in any direction.

Even if lawyers may occasionally have to dirty their hands in the detail, perhaps philosophers could leave the matter at the area of overlap, and be content with the proposition that some role or other must be assigned to political facts. But which facts, more precisely, are we talking about? And what makes those facts so central to legal propositions? We can dramatize this question: what makes facts about what members of Congress said and did, though not facts about what each member's best friend said and did, pertinent to law? And which facts about members of Congress are crucial? Is it exclusively facts about members voting for bills, or perhaps facts about Congressional debates as well? And how about facts about committee activities? And do we only care for the explicit utterances and formal deeds of members of Congress, or are we also interested in any psychological facts about these people (Dworkin 1985b; 1986 Ch. 9)? We can ask such questions in respect of any sub-class of political facts: we can reformulate our questions to focus on the Framers and their friends, the Framers' speeches and their correspondence, and the political pamphlets some of them wrote; and so on for judges and other political agents.

Interpretivism claims that values justify the precise kind of authority that different agents and institutions have and hence the precise way in which their decisions and other acts determine legal duties (including any specific cases in which it may turn out that that the values may dictate that the facts about authoritative decision-making alone determine our duties). Although the interpretivist accepts that propositions of law are founded on political decisions, i.e. that the content of the law is sensitive to what a political community historically decides; and he also accepts that, more abstractly, law is dependent upon certain political practices of a community, including legislation and adjudication; he further says that what makes these decisions and practices the grounds of propositions of law is the normative fact that it is good that they should be such grounds. The interpretivist says that it is in virtue of the fact that our rights and duties ought to flow from past political decisions that they flow from them; or that, more abstractly, legal duties ought to be determined by social practices that they do. And he thinks that they ought to be determined by such decisions and practices because doing so serves certain political virtues such as fairness and procedural justice. The interpretivist says that a fuller articulation of these virtues and of their connections with other political values would yield a more detailed account of the precise way in which the practices determine legal duties.

The full account would include the answer to the more specific kind of question that was illustrated above, and so would tell us whether our duties depend on the explicit decisions, only, of Congress and other bodies, or further on the psychological states of the decision-makers, the decision-makers' own understanding of the decisions, or any other element of political history and structure. For the interpretivist, the legality of the aspects of political practice that do in fact serve as the grounds of law is settled by reference to what is right or good.

It would be a mistake however to think that the only question is which facts count as legal. We do not merely need to work out questions such as why someone ought to make law and who gets to make it (and possibly also what is the broad or rough way in which the words and deeds or other behavior of the relevant persons determine the law's requirements). The principles of political morality that figure in the best interpretation of political practices do not only dictate that certain facts about the promulgation of statutes and the resolution of cases, or some other aspect of a community's political practices, are the distinctively legal facts on which rights and duties depend, without helping precisely to determine what impact the facts have on our rights and duties.

The question to which the values provide an answer can be expressed more simply (see the link to Greenberg 2002 in the Other Internet Resources section). It is this: in respect of all the facts that could conceivably play a role in determining legal rights and duties, what is the role that each has? This is not simply a question of relevance or even rough weight. Rather, the question invites an answer in terms of the precise impact that a fact has on our rights and duties, i.e. an answer which includes a specification of the impact of the relevant fact, in case different relevant facts pull in different directions. The interpretivist then says that values determine the precise impact that all candidate facts have on legal rights and duties. Legality and impact are not distinct.

6. Justifying the Facts

We have just seen that the interpretivist claims that it is in virtue of certain values that the law has the determinants that it does — i.e. that its content depends on a community's political practices. He claims that values do not merely make the political facts relevant but also select the way in which the facts determine legal rights and duties.

Simplifying the thesis in that way helps us better to understand Dworkin's famous claim that interpreting the practices consists in assigning to them the content that best fits and justifies them (Dworkin 1986). While Dworkin's distinction between fit and justification, as tests of interpretive success, is explicitly a mere heuristic device (Dworkin 1982, 1986 at 229-63), it has received intense critical scrutiny (Raz 1986; Finnis 1992; Hart 1994, Postscript). The distinction seems to suggest that the interpreter has two separate tasks, first to formulate alternative hypotheses that are consistent with the facts of the practice, and second show which one among them provides the most attractive justification of the facts of the practice. The dimension of fit may then be understood as an independent, non-normative constraint, in the sense either that this is how the interpretivist understands it, or that this how he cannot but understand it.

In fact the distinction in question is no more than a rough distinction between ineligible and eligible interpretations, which is made within particular interpretations, not prior to any interpretation. It is merely a device for organizing complex interpretations and so for facilitating the representation of alternative interpretations involved in notional or actual disputes. An interpretation will be typically organized in terms of the examples from the practice that it undertakes to justify, and the justification that it offers. But no interpretation need accept that any particular example's standing as such is immune from interpretive assessment. The interpretation must itself (normatively) explain what makes a putative example a genuine example, if it is indeed such. That implies that no example is immune from discount as a mistake, as a piece of fool's gold lurking among the genuine samples.

The interpretivist does not accept, nor does the fit-justification distinction properly understood entail, a distinction between the data and their reading that is prior to and independent of interpretation. As we have already noticed, common ground among interpretations is mere overlap. No aspect of the practice can be taken as a non-interpretive given. Rather, they are both parts of the interpretive, thoroughly normative account.

There is yet another misunderstanding that we must guard against. We concluded that interpretivism claims that neither question — what are the data and what justifies them — can be answered in a non-normative manner. But even if it is conceded that interpretation has no non-normative part, it may still seem that there are two distinct normative questions to be asked, namely what is the justification for taking certain data to be generally decisive in determining our duties, and what is the justification for taking the data to determine them in a particular way, i.e. in a way such that certain duties and not others are identified as legally imposed. And if we think that there are two distinct questions — even if it is granted that they are both normative — it may seem that there could be tensions between them, so that a further question remains which concerns how to balance the two components of the normative account when they conflict. We may dissolve this further misunderstanding by recalling our formulation of the interpretivist point in terms of a single question. Interpretivism says that values select, from among all the facts that could conceivably be determinants of legal duty, the ones that are such determinants, by providing an account that justifies the impact that each precise determinant has on our rights and duties.

7. Why Political Morality?

The fact that the interpretivist seeks to identify the foundation of duties that, on their face, seem political — duties owed to political decisions and practice — suggests why that foundation, if it exists, is likely to come from political morality, the domain of duties owed to each other or to institutions or to the community as a whole in virtue of some feature of political life that is capable of providing such a foundation. But the interpretivist commitment is weaker than that. It is rather that, whatever, if anything, is capable of justifying doing as the law requires because it requires it, is an eligible candidate.

The interpretivist does not deny that the quest for such a foundation may fail. If so, no value that can play the role of foundation may be attributable to the practice. What the interpretivist must deny is that the attribution of a value or point that is too weak to justify genuine duties should always be preferred, even if the attribution of a point that is not weak in that way is available and compelling. For the claim then becomes non-interpretivist, since it assumes that a test other than (and prior to) interpretive success is fundamental.


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