Deontic Logic

First published Tue Feb 7, 2006; substantive revision Wed Apr 21, 2010

Deontic logic[1] is that branch of symbolic logic that has been the most concerned with the contribution that the following notions make to what follows from what:

permissible (permitted)       must
impermissible (forbidden, prohibited)       supererogatory (beyond the call of duty)
obligatory (duty, required)       indifferent / significant
omissible (non-obligatory)       the least one can do
optional       better than / best / good / bad
ought       claim / liberty / power / immunity

To be sure, some of these notions have received more attention in deontic logic than others. However, virtually everyone working in this area would see systems designed to model the logical contributions of these notions as part of deontic logic proper.

As a branch of symbolic logic, deontic logic is of theoretical interest for some of the same reasons that modal logic is of theoretical interest. However, despite the fact that we need to be cautious about making too easy a link between deontic logic and practicality, many of the notions listed are typically employed in attempting to regulate and coordinate our lives together (but also to evaluate states of affairs). For these reasons, deontic logics often directly involve topics of considerable practical significance such as morality, law, social and business organizations (their norms, as well as their normative constitution), and security systems. To that extent, studying the logic of notions with such practical significance adds some practical significance to deontic logic itself.

Further remarks on this topic may be found in Challenges in Defining Deontic Logic

(To keep this entry a readable length, supplementary documents such as the one linked in above are used liberally to explore many secondary issues or to explore primary issues in more detail. Footnotes are for more minor asides, notational explanations, short proofs, but also for paragraph-length entries on the literature associated with a topic.)

1. Informal Preliminaries and Background

Deontic logic has been strongly influenced by ideas in modal logic. Analogies with alethic modal notions and deontic notions were noticed as far back as the fourteenth century, where we might say that the rudiments of modern deontic logic began (Knuuttila 1981). Although informal interest in what can be arguably called aspects of deontic logic continued, the trend toward studying logic using the symbolic and exact techniques of mathematics became dominant in the twentieth century, and logic became largely, symbolic logic. Work in twentieth century symbolic modal logic provided the explicit impetus for von Wright (von Wright 1951), the central early figure in the emergence of deontic logic as a full-fledged branch of symbolic logic in the twentieth century. So we will begin by gently noting a few folk-logical features of alethic modal notions, and give an impressionistic sense of how natural it was for early developments of deontic logic to mimic those of modal logic. We will then turn to a more direct exploration of deontic logic as a branch of symbolic logic. However, the emphasis will be on conceptual and foundational issues, not technical ones.

However, before turning to von Wright, and the launching of deontic logic as an on-going active academic area of study, we need to note that there was a significant earlier episode, Mally 1926, that did not have quite the influence on symbolic deontic logic that it might have, due at least in part, to serious technical problems. Despite these problems with the system he found (notably the collapse of what ought to be into what is the case), Mally was an impressive pioneer of deontic logic. He was apparently uninfluenced by, and thus did not benefit from, early developments of alethic modal logic. This is quite opposed to the later trend in the 1950s when deontic logic reemerged, this time as a full-fledged discipline, deeply influenced by earlier developments in alethic modal logic. Mally was the first to found deontic logic on the syntax of propositional calculus explicitly, a strategy that others quickly returned to after a deviation from this strategy in the very first work of von Wright. Mally was the first to employ deontic constants in deontic logic (reminiscent of Kanger and Anderson's later use of deontic constants, but without their “reduction”; more below). He was also the first to attempt to provide an integrated account of non-conditional and conditional ought statements, one that provided an analysis of conditional ‘ought’s via a monadic deontic operator coupled with a material conditional (reminiscent of similar failed attempts in von Wright 1951 to analyze the dyadic notion of commitment), and allowed for a form of factual detachment (more below). All in all, this seems to be a remarkable achievement in retrospect. For more information on Mally's system, including a diagnosis of the source of his main technical problem, and a sketch of one way he might have avoided it, see the entry on Mally's deontic logic.

1.1 Some Informal Rudiments of Alethic Modal Logic

Alethic modal logic is roughly the logic of necessary truth and related notions. Consider five basic alethic modal statuses, expressed as sentential operators—constructions that, when applied to a sentence, yield a sentence (as does “it is not the case that”):

it is necessary (necessarily true) that (□)
it is possible that (◊)
it is impossible that
it is non-necessary that
it is contingent that[2]

Although all of the above operators are generally deemed definable in terms of any one of the first four, the necessity operator is typically taken as basic and the rest defined accordingly:

It is possible that p (◊p) =df ~□~p
It is impossible that p =df □~p
It is non-necessary that p =df ~□p
It is contingent that p =df ~□p & ~□~p

It is routinely assumed that the following threefold partition of propositions holds:

threefold partition

The three rectangular cells are jointly exhaustive and mutually exclusive: every proposition is either necessary, contingent, or impossible, but no proposition is more than one of these. The possible propositions are those that are either necessary or contingent, and the non-necessary propositions are those that are either impossible or contingent.

Another piece of folk logic for these notions is the following modal square of opposition:[3]

modal square

Furthermore it is generally assumed that the following hold:

If □p then p (if it is necessary that p, then p is true).

If p then ◊p (if p is true, then p is possible).

These reflect the idea that we are interested here in alethic (and thus truth-implicating) necessity and its siblings.

We now turn to some of the analogies involved in what is a corresponding bit of deontic folk logic: “The Traditional Scheme” (McNamara 1996a). This is a minor elaboration of what can be found in von Wright 1953 and in both editions of Prior 1962 [1955].

1.2 The Traditional Scheme and the Modal Analogies

The five normative statuses of the Traditional Scheme are:[4]

it is obligatory that (OB)
it is permissible that (PE)
it is impermissible that (IM)
it is omissible that (OM)
it is optional that (OP)

The first three are familiar, but the fourth is widely ignored, and the fifth has regularly been conflated with “it is a matter of indifference that p” (by being defined in terms of one of the first three), which is not really part of the traditional scheme (more below). Typically, one of the first two is taken as basic, and the others defined in terms of it, but any of the first four can play the same sort of purported defining role. The most prevalent approach is to take the first as basic, and define the rest as follows:

PEp ↔ ~OB~p
OMp ↔ ~OBp
OPp ↔ (~OBp & ~OB~p).[5]

These assert that something is permissible iff (if and only if) its negation is not obligatory, impermissible iff its negation is obligatory, omissible iff it is not obligatory, and optional iff neither it nor its negation is obligatory. Call this “The Traditional Definitional Scheme (TDS)”. If one began with OB alone and considered the formulas on the right of the equivalences above, one could easily be led to consider them as at least candidate defining conditions for those on the left. Although not uncontestable, they are natural, and this scheme is still widely employed. Now if the reader looks back at our use of the necessity operator in defining the remaining four alethic modal operators, it will be clear that that definitional scheme is perfectly analogous to the deontic one above. From the formal standpoint, the one is merely a syntactic variant of the other: just replace OB with □, PE with ◊, etc.

In addition to the TDS, it was traditionally assumed that the following, call it “The Traditional Threefold Classification (TTC)” holds:


Here too, all propositions are divided into three jointly exhaustive and mutually exclusive classes: every proposition is obligatory, optional, or impermissible, but no proposition falls into more than one of these three categories. Furthermore, the permissible propositions are those that are either obligatory or optional, and the omissible propositions are those that are impermissible or optional. The reader can easily confirm that this natural scheme is also perfectly analogous to the threefold classification we gave above for the alethic modal notions.

Furthermore, “The Deontic Square” (DS)” is part of the Traditional Scheme:


The logical operators at the corners are to be interpreted as in the modal square of opposition. The two squares are plainly perfectly analogous as well. If we weave in nodes for optionality, we get a deontic hexagon:[6]


Given these correspondences, it is unsurprising that our basic operator, read here as “it is obligatory that”, is often referred to as “deontic necessity”. However, there are also obvious dis-analogies. Before, we saw that these two principles are part of the traditional conception of alethic modality:

If □p then p (if it is necessary that p, then p is true).
If p then ◊p (if p is true, then it is possible).

Their deontic analogs are:

If OBp then p (if it is obligatory that p, then p is true).
If p then PEp (if p is true, then it is permissible).

The latter two are transparently false, for obligations can be violated, and impermissible things do hold.[7] However, as researchers turned to generalizations of alethic modal logic, they began considering wider classes of modal logics, including ones where the necessity operator was not truth-implicating. This too encouraged seeing deontic necessity, and thus deontic logic, as falling within modal logic so-generalized, and in fact recognizing possibilities like this helped to fuel the generalizations of what began with a focus on alethic modal logic (Lemmon 1957, Lemmon and Scott 1977).

1.3 Toward Deontic Logic Proper

It will be convenient at this point to introduce a bit more regimentation. Let's assume that we have a simple propositional language with the usual suspects, an infinite set of propositional variables (say, P1,…,Pn,…) and a complete (per their standard interpretation) set of truth-functional operators (say, ~ and →), as well as the one-place deontic operator, OB.

A more formal definition can be found in the supplemental document Deontic Wffs

Unless otherwise stated, we will only be interested in deontic logics that contain classical propositional calculus (PC). So let's assume we add that as the first ingredient in specifying any deontic logic, so that, for example, OBp → ~~OBp, can be derived in any system to be considered here.

Above, in identifying the Traditional Definitional Scheme, we noted that we could have taken any of the first four of the five primary normative statuses listed as basic and defined the rest in terms of that one. So we want to be able to generate the corresponding equivalences derivatively from the scheme we did settle on, where OB is basic. But thus far we cannot. For example, it is obviously desirable to have OBp → ~PE~p as a theorem from the traditional standpoint. After all, this wff merely expresses one half of the equivalence between what would have been definiens and definiendum had we chosen the alternate scheme of definition in which “PE” was taken as basic instead of “OB”. However, OBp → ~PE~p is not thus far derivable. For OBp → ~PE~p is definitionally equivalent to OBp → ~~OB~~p, which reduces by PC to OBpOB~~p, but the latter formula is not tautological, so we cannot complete the proof. So far we have deontic wffs and propositional logic, but no deontic logic. For that we need some distinctive principles governing our deontic operator, and in particular, to generate the alternative equivalences that reflect the alternative definitional schemes alluded to above, we need what is perhaps the most fundamental and least controversial rule of inference in deontic logic, and the one characteristic of “classical modal logics” (Chellas 1980):

OB-RE: If pq is a theorem, then so is OBpOBq.

This rule tells us (roughly) that if two formulas are provably equivalent, then so are the results of prefacing them with our basic operator, OB. With its aid (and the Traditional Definitional Scheme's), it is now easy to prove the equivalences corresponding to the alternative definitional schemes. For example, since ⊢ p ↔ ~~p, by OB-RE, we get ⊢ OBpOB~~p, i.e., ⊢ OBp ↔ ~~OB~~p, which generates ⊢ OBp ↔ ~PE~p, given our definitional scheme. To the extent that the alternative definitional equivalences are supposed to be derivable, we can see RE as presupposed in the Traditional Scheme.

All systems we consider here will contain RE (whether as basic or derived). They will also contain (unless stated otherwise) one other principle, a thesis asserting that a logical contradiction (conventionally denoted by “⊥”) is always omissible:


So, for example, OD implies that it is a logical truth that it is not obligatory that my taxes are paid and not paid. Although OD is not completely uncontestable[8] it is plausible, and like RE, has been pervasively presupposed in work on deontic logic. In this essay, we will focus on systems that endorse both RE and OD.

Before turning to our first full-fledged system of deontic logic, let us note one very important principle that is not contained in all deontic logics, and about which a great deal of controversy in deontic logic and in ethical theory has transpired.

1.4 The Fundamental Presupposition of the Traditional Scheme

Returning to the Traditional Scheme for a moment, its Threefold Classification, and Deontic Square of Opposition can be expressed formally as follows:

DS: (OBp ↔ ~OMp) & (IMp ↔ ~PEp) & ~(OBp & IMp) & ~(~PEp & ~OMp) & (OBpPEp) & (IMpOMp).

TTC: (OBpOPpIMp) & [~(OBp & IMp) & ~(OBp & OPp) & ~(OPp & IMp)].

Given the Traditional Definitional Scheme, it turns out that DS and TTC are each tautologically equivalent to the principle that obligations cannot conflict (and thus to one another):

NC: ~(OBp & OB~p).[9]

So the Traditional Scheme rests squarely on the soundness of NC (and the traditional definitions of the operators). Indeed, the Traditional Scheme is nothing other than a disguised version of NC, given the definitional component of that scheme.

NC is not to be confused in content with the previously mentioned principle, OD (~OB⊥). OD asserts that no single logical contradiction can be obligatory, whereas NC asserts that there can never be two things that are each separately obligatory, where the one obligatory thing is the negation of the other. The presence or absence of NC arguably represents one of the most fundamental divisions among deontic schemes. As until recently in modern normative ethics (see Gowans 1987), early deontic logics presupposed this thesis. Before turning to challenges to NC, we will consider a number of systems that endorse it, beginning with what has come to be routinely called “Standard Deontic Logic”, the benchmark system of deontic logic.

2. Standard Deontic Logic

2.1 Standard Syntax

Standard Deontic Logic (SDL) is the most cited and studied system of deontic logic, and one of the first deontic logics axiomatically specified. It builds upon propositional logic, and is in fact essentially just a distinguished member of the most studied class of modal logics, “normal modal logics”. It is a monadic deontic logic, since its basic deontic operator is a one-place operator (like ~, and unlike →): syntactically, it applies to a single sentence to yield a compound sentence.[10]

Assume again that we have a language of classical propositional logic with an infinite set of propositional variables, the operators ~ and →, and the operator, OB. SDL is then often axiomatized as follows:

SDL: A1. All tautologous wffs of the language (TAUT)
A2. OB(pq) → (OBpOBq) (OB-K)
A3. OBp → ~OB~p (OB-D)
R1. If ⊢ p and ⊢ pq then ⊢ q (MP)
R2. If ⊢ p then ⊢ OBp (OB-NEC)[11]

SDL is just the normal modal logic “D” or “KD”, with a suggestive notation expressing the intended interpretation.[12] TAUT is standard for normal modal systems. OB-K, which is the K axiom present in all normal modal logics, tells us that if a material conditional is obligatory, and its antecedent is obligatory, then so is its consequent.[13] OB-D tells us that p is obligatory only if its negation isn't. It is just “No Conflicts” again, but it is also called “D” (for “Deontic”) in normal modal logics. MP is just Modus Ponens, telling us that if a material conditional and its antecedent are theorems, then so is the consequent. TAUT combined with MP gives us the full inferential power of the Propositional Calculus (often referred to, including here, as “PC”). As noted earlier, PC has no distinctive deontic import. OB-NEC tells us that if anything is a theorem, then the claim that that thing is obligatory is also a theorem. Note that this guarantees that something is always obligatory (even if only logical truths).[14] Each of the distinctively deontic principles, OB-K, OB-D, and OB-NEC are contestable, and we will consider criticisms of them shortly. However, to avoid immediate confusion for those new to deontic logic, it is perhaps worth noting that OB-NEC is generally deemed a convenience that, among other things, assures that SDL is in fact one of the well-studied normal modal logics with a deontic interpretation. Few have spilled blood to defend its cogency substantively, and these practical compromises can be strategic, especially in early stages of research.

A quick comparison of SDL with the seminal system in von Wright 1951 can be found in the supplemental document von Wright's 1951 System and SDL

Regarding SDL's expressive powers, advocates typically endorse the Traditional Definitional Scheme noted earlier.

Below we list some theorems and two important derived rules of SDL.[15]

~OB[16] (OB-OD)
OB(p & q) → (OBp & OBq) (OB-M)
(OBp & OBq) → OB(p & q) (OB-C / Aggregation)
OBpOPpIMp (OB-Exhaustion)
OBp → ~OB~p (OB-NC or OB-D)

If ⊢ pq then ⊢ OBpOBq (OB-RM)
If ⊢ pq then ⊢ OBpOBq (OB-RE)

We will be discussing a number of these subsequently. For now, let’s briefly show that RM is a derived rule of SDL. We note some simple corollaries as well.

Show: If ⊢ pq, then ⊢ OBpOBq. (OB-RM)
Proof: Suppose ⊢ pq. Then by OB-NEC, ⊢ OB (pq), and then by K, ⊢ OBpOBq.
Corollary 1: ⊢ OBpOB(pq) (Weakening)
Corollary 2: If ⊢ pq then ⊢ OBpOBq (OB-RE)[17]

An alternative formulation of SDL can be found in the supplemental document Alternative Axiomatization of SDL.

SDL can be strengthened in various ways, in particular, we might consider adding axioms where deontic operators are embedded within one another. For example, suppose we added the following formula as an axiom to SDL. Call the result “SDL+” for easy reference here:

A4. OB(OBpp)

This says (roughly) that it is required that obligations are fulfilled.[18] This is not a theorem of SDL (as we will see in the next section), so SDL+ is a genuine strengthening of SDL. Furthermore, it makes a logically contingent proposition (i.e., that OBpp) obligatory as a matter of deontic logic. SDL does not have this substantive feature. With this addition to SDL, it is easy to prove OBOBpOBp, a formula involving an iterated occurrence of our main operator.[19] This formula asserts that if it is obligatory that p be obligatory, then p is obligatory. (Cf. “the only things that are required to be obligatory are those that actually are”).[20] It should be noted that these are often given an impersonal ought reading, so that A4 would then be read as “It ought to be the case that (if it ought to be the case that p, then it is).”[21]

2.2 Standard Semantics

The reader familiar with elementary textbook logic will have perhaps noticed that the deontic square and the modal square both have even better-known analogs for the quantifiers as interpreted in classical predicate logic (“all x: p” is read as all objects x satisfy condition p; similarly for “no x: p” and “some x: p”):

modal square

Though less widely noted in textbooks, there is also a threefold classification for classical quantifiers:

threefold quantifiers

Here all conditions are divided into three jointly exhaustive and mutually exclusive classes: those that hold for all objects, those that hold for none, and those that hold for some and not for others, where no condition falls into more than one of these three categories. These deep quantificational analogies reflect much of the inspiration behind what is most often called “possible worlds semantics” for such logics, to which we now turn.[22] Once the analogies are noticed, this sort of semantics seems all but inevitable.

We now give a standard “Kripke-style” possible world semantics for SDL. Informally, we assume that we have a set of possible worlds, W, and a relation, A, relating worlds to worlds, with the intention that Aij iff j is a world where everything obligatory in i holds (i.e., no violations of the obligations holding in i occur in j). For brevity, we will call all such worlds so related to i, “i-Acceptable” worlds and denote them by Ai.[23] We then add that the acceptability relation is “serial”: for every world, i, there is at least one i-acceptable world. Finally, propositions are either true or false at a world, never both, and when a proposition, p, is true at a world, we will often indicate this by referring to that world as a “p-world”. The truth-functional operators have their usual behavior at each world. Our focus will be on the contribution deontic operators are taken to make.

The fundamental idea here is that the normative status of a proposition from the standpoint of a world i can be assessed by looking at how that proposition fairs at the i-acceptable worlds. Let’s see how. For any given world, i, we can easily picture the i-acceptable worlds as all corralled together in logical space as follows (where seriality is reflected by a small dot representing the presence of at least one world):

logical space

The intended truth-conditions, relative to i, for our five deontic operators can now be pictured as follows:

four deontic operators

Thus, p is obligatory iff it holds in all the i-acceptable worlds, permissible iff it holds in some such world, impermissible iff it holds in no such world, omissible iff its negation holds in some such world, and optional iff p holds in some such world, and so does ~p. When a formula must be true at any world in any such model of serially-related worlds, then the formula is valid.

A more formal characterization of this semantic framework can be found in the supplemental document Kripke-Style Semantics for SDL

To illustrate the workings of this framework, consider NC (OB-D), OBp → ~OB~p. This is valid in this framework. For suppose that OBp holds at any world i in any model. Then each i-accessible world is one where p holds, and by the seriality of accessibility, there must be at least one such world. Call it j. Now we can see that ~OB~p must hold at i as well, for otherwise, OB~p would hold at i, in which case, ~p would have to hold at all the i-accessible worlds, including j. But then p as well as ~p would hold at j itself, which is impossible (by the semantics for “~”). The other axioms and rules of SDL can be similarly shown to be valid, as can all the principles listed above as derivable in SDL

However, A4, the axiom we added to SDL to get SDL+, is not valid in the standard serial models. In order to validate A4, OB(OBpp), we need the further requirement of “secondary reflexivity”: that any i-acceptable world, j, must be in turn acceptable to itself. We can illustrate such an i and j as follows:

i and j

Here we imagine that the arrow connectors indicate relative acceptability, thus here, j (and only j) is acceptable to i, and j (and only j) is acceptable to j. If in all eligible models, all worlds that are acceptable to any given world have this property of self-acceptability, then our axiom is valid. For suppose this property holds throughout our models, and that for some arbitrary world i, OB(OBpp) is false at i. Then not all i-acceptable worlds are worlds where OBpp is true. So, there must be an i-acceptable world, say j, where OBp is true, but p is false. Since OBp is true at j, then p must be true at all j-acceptable worlds. But by stipulation, j is acceptable to itself, so p must be true at j, but this contradicts our assumption that p was false at j. Thus OB(OBpp) must be true at all worlds, after all.

Two counter-models showing that A4 is not derivable in SDL, and that SDL + OBOBpOBp does not imply A4 can be found in the supplemental document Two Counter-Models Regarding Additions to SDL

We should also note that one alternative semantic picture for SDL is where we have a set of world-relative ordering relations, one for each world i in W, where ji k iff j is as good as k (and perhaps better) relative to i. We then assume that from the standpoint of any world i, a) each world is as good as itself, b) if one is as good as a second, and the second is as good as a third, then the first is as good as the third, c) and for any two worlds, either the first is as good as the second or vice versa (i.e., respectively, each such ≥i is reflexive, transitive, and connected in W). It is widely recognized that this approach will also determine SDL, but proofs of this are not widely available.[24] If we then add “The Limit Assumption”, that for each world i, there is always at least one world as good as all worlds (i.e., one i-best world), we can easily generate our earlier semantics for SDL derivatively. We need only add the natural analogue to our prior truth-conditions for OB: OBp is true at a world i iff p is true at all the i-best worlds.

ordering semantics

Essentially, the ordering relation coupled with the Limit Assumption just gives us a way to generate the set of i-acceptable worlds instead of taking them as primitive in the semantics: j is i-acceptable iff j is i-best. Once generated, we look only at what is going on in the i-acceptable worlds to interpret the truth-conditions for the various deontic operators, just as with our simpler Kripke-Style semantics. The analogue to the seriality of our earlier i-acceptability relation is also assured by the Limit Assumption, since it entails that for each world i, there is always some i-acceptable (now i-best) world. Although this ordering semantics approach appears to be a bit of overkill here, it became quite important later on in the endeavor to develop expressively richer deontic logics (ones going beyond the linguistic resources of SDL). We will return to this later.

For now, we turn to the second-most well known approach to monadic deontic logic, one in which SDL will emerge derivatively.

3. The Andersonian-Kangerian Reduction

The Andersonian-Kangerian reduction is dually-named in acknowledgement of Kanger's and Anderson's independent formulation of it around the same time.[25] As Hilpinen 2001a points out, the approach is adumbrated much earlier in Leibniz. We follow Kanger's development here, noting Anderson's toward the end.

3.1 Standard Syntax

Assume that we have a language of classical modal propositional logic, with a distinguished (deontic) propositional constant:

d” for “all (relevant) normative demands are met”.

Now consider the following axiom system, “Kd”:

Kd: A1: All Tautologies (TAUT)
A2: □(pq) → (□p → □q) (K)
A3: ◊d (◊d)
R1: If ⊢ p and ⊢ pq then ⊢ q (MP)
R2: If ⊢ p then ⊢ □p (NEC)

Kd is just the normal modal logic K with A3 added.[26] A3 is interpreted as telling us that it is possible that all normative demands are met. In import when added to system K, it is similar to (though stronger than) the “No Conflicts” axiom, A3, of SDL. All of the Traditional Scheme's deontic operators are defined operators in Kd:

OBp =df □(dp)
PEp =df ◊(d & p)
IMp =df □(p → ~d)
OMp =df ◊(d & ~p)
OPp =df ◊(d & p) & ◊(d & ~p)

So in Kd, p is obligatory iff p is necessitated by all normative demands being met, permissible iff p is compatible with all normative demands being met, impermissible iff p is incompatible with all normative demands, omissible iff p's negation is compatible with all normative demands, and optional iff p is compatible with all normative demands, and so is ~p. Since none of the operators of the Traditional Scheme are taken as primitive, and the basic logic is a modal logic with necessity and possibility as the basic modal operators, this is referred to as “a reduction” (of deontic logic to modal logic)

Proofs of SDL-ish wffs are then just K-proofs of the corresponding modal formulae involving “d”. Two such simple proofs can be found in the supplemental document Two Simple Proofs in Kd.

A proof that SDL is indeed contained in Kd can be found in the supplemental document SDL Containment Proof

In addition to containing all theorems of SDL, we note a few theorems specific to Kd because of the non-overlapping syntactic ingredients, d, □, and ◊:

⊢ □(pq) → (OBpOBq) (RM′)
⊢ □pOBp (NEC′)
OBp → ◊p (“Kant's Law”)[27]
⊢ ~◊(OBp & OB~p) (NC′)

These are easily proven.[28]

Although our underlying modal system is just K, adding further non-deontic axiom schema (i.e., those neither abbreviate-able via SDL wffs, nor involving d specifically) can nonetheless have a deontic impact. To illustrate, suppose we added a fourth axiom, one to the effect that necessity is here truth-implicating, called axiom T:

T: □pp

Call the system that results from adding this formula to our current system KTd. Axiom T is certainly plausible enough here, since, as mentioned above, this approach to deontic logic is more sensible if necessity is interpreted as truth-implicating, since it takes obligations to be things necessitated by all normative demands being met, but in what sense, if not a truth-implicating sense of necessity?

Now with T added to Kd, we have gone beyond SDL, since we can now prove things expressible in SDL's language that we have already shown are not theorems of SDL. The addition of T makes derivable our previously mentioned axiom A4 of SDL+, which we have shown is not derivable in SDL itself:


So, reflecting on the fact that SDL+ is derivable in KTd, we see that the Andersonian-Kangerian reduction must either rely on a non-truth-implicating conception of necessity in order for its pure deontic fragment to match SDL, or SDL itself is not susceptible to the Andersonian-Kangerian reduction. Put another way, the most plausible version of the Andersonian-Kangerian reduction can't help but view “Standard Deontic Logic” as too weak.

A brief exploration of determinisms catastrophic implications for deontic matters in the context of KTd can be found in the supplemental document Determinism and Deontic Collapse in the Classic A-K Framework.

Anderson's approach is practically equivalent to Kanger's. First, consider the fact that we can easily define another constant in Kd, as follows:

s =df ~d,

where this new constant would now be derivatively read as follows:

“some (relevant) normative demands has been violated”.

Clearly our current axiom, ◊d, could be replaced with ~□s, asserting that it is not necessary that some normative demand is violated. We could then define OB as:

OBp =df □(~ps),

and similarly for the other four operators.

Essentially, Anderson took this equivalent course with “s” being his primitive (initially standing for something like “the sanction has been invoked” or “there is a liability to sanction”), and ~□s the axiom added to some modal system (at least as strong as modal system K⊤).

We should also note that Anderson was famous as a founding figure in relevance logic, and instead of using strict implication, □(pq), he explored the use of a relevant (and thus neither material nor strict) conditional, ⇒, to express the reduction as: OBp =df ~ps. (A bit more on this can be found within the entry Mally's deontic logic. See references there, but also see Mares 1992.) This alternative reflects the fact that there is an issue in both Kanger's and Anderson's strict necessitation approaches of just what notion of “necessity” can we say is involved in claiming that meetings all normative demands (or avoiding the sanction) necessitates p?

As a substantive matter, how should we think of these “reductions”? For example, should we view them as giving us an analysis of what it is for something to be obligatory? Well, taking Kanger's course first, it would seem that d must be read as a distinctive deontic ingredient, if we are to get the derivative deontic reading for the “reduced” deontic operators. Also, as our reading suggests, it is not clear that d does not, at least by intention, express a complex quantificational notion involving the very concept of obligation (demand) as a proper part, namely that all obligations have been fulfilled, so that the “reduction”, presented as an analysis, would appear to be circular. If we read d instead as “ideal circumstances obtain”, the claim of a substantive reduction or analysis appears more promising, until we ask, “Are the circumstances ideal only with respect to meeting normative demands or obligations, or are they ideal in other (for example supererogatory) ways that go beyond merely satisfying normative demands? Anderson's “liability to sanction” approach may appear more promising, since the idea that something is obligatory if (and only if) and because non-compliance necessitates (in some sense) liability to (or perhaps desert of) punishment does not appear to be circular, (unless the notion of “liability” itself ultimately involves the idea of permissibility of punishment), but is it still controversial (e.g. imperfect obligations are often thought to include obligations where no one has a right to sanction you for violations)? Alternatively, perhaps a norm that is merely an ideal cannot be violated, in which case perhaps norms that have been violated can be distinguished (as a subset) from norms that have not been complied with, and then the notion of an obligation as something that must obtain unless some norm is violated will not be obviously circular. The point here is that there is a substantive philosophical question lingering here that the language of a “reduction” brings naturally to the surface. The formal utility of the reduction does not hinge of this, but its philosophical significance does.

3.2 Standard Semantics

The semantic elements here are in large part analogous to those for SDL. We have a binary relation again, but this time instead of a relation interpreted as relating worlds acceptable to a given world, here we will have a relation, R, relating worlds “accessible” to a given world (i.e., possible relative to the given world). The only novelties are two: (1) we add a simple semantic element to match our syntactic constant “d”, and (2) we add a slightly more complex analog to seriality, one that links the accessibility relation to the semantic element added in order to model d. We introduce the elements in stages.

Once again, assume that we have a set of possible worlds, W, and assume that we have a relation, R, relating worlds to worlds, with the intention that Rij iff j is accessible to i (e.g., j is a world where everything true in j is possible relative to i)[30]. For brevity, we will call all worlds possible relative to i, “i-accessible worlds” and denote them by Ri. For the moment, no restrictions are placed on the relation R. We can illustrate these truth-conditions for our modal operators with a set of diagrams analogous to those used for giving the truth-conditions for SDL’s deontic operators. We use obvious abbreviations for necessity, possibility, impossibility, non-necessity, and contingency:

Alethic operator semantics

Here we imagine that for any given world, i, we have corralled all the i-accessible worlds together. We then simply look at the quantificational status of p (and/or ~p) in these i-accessible worlds to determine p's modal status back at i: at a given world i, p is necessary iff p holds throughout Ri, possible iff p holds somewhere in Ri, impossible iff p holds nowhere in Ri, non-necessary iff ~p holds somewhere in Ri, and contingent iff p holds somewhere in Ri, and so does ~p.

The only deontic element in the syntax of Kd is our distinguished constant, d, intended to express the fact that all normative demands are met. To model that feature, we simply assume that the worlds are divided into those where all normative demands are met and those that are not. We denote the former subset of worlds by “DEM” in a model. Then d is true at a world j iff j belongs to DEM. Here is a picture where d is true at an arbitrary world, j:

t-conditions for d

Since j is contained in DEM, that means all normative demands are met at j.[31]

Corresponding to simple seriality for SDL (that there is always an i-acceptable world), we assume what I will call “strong seriality” for Kd: for every world i, there is an i-accessible world that is among those where all normative demands are met. In other words, for every world i, the intersection of the i-accessible worlds with those where all normative demands are met is non-empty. Given the truth conditions for d, strong seriality validates ◊d, ensuring that for any world i, there is always some i-accessible world where d is true:

t-conditions for POSd

Given these semantic elements, if you apply them to the definitions of the five deontic operators of Kd, you will see that in each case, the normative status of p at i depends on p's relationship to this intersection of the i-accessible worlds and the worlds where all normative demands are met:

i-accessible intersection

If that inter-section is permeated by p-worlds, p is obligatory; if it contains some p-world, p is permissible, if it contains no p-world, p is impermissible, if it contains some ~p-world, p is omissible, and if it contains some p-world as well as some ~p-world, then p is optional.[32]

A more formal characterization of this semantic picture can be found in the supplemental document Kripke-Style Semantics for Kd.

If we wish to validate ⊤, □pp (and derivatively, A4, OB(OBpp)), we need only stipulate that the accessibility relation, R, is reflexive: that each world i is i-accessible (possible relative to itself):

reflexive accessibility

For then □pp must be true at any world i, for if □p is true at i, then p is true at each i-accessible world, which includes i, which is self-accessible. This will indirectly yield the result that OB(OBpp) is true in all such models as well.

We turn now to a large variety of problems attributed to the preceding closely related systems.

4. Challenges to Standard Deontic Logics

Here we consider some of the “paradoxes” attributed to “Standard Deontic Logics” like those above (SDLs). Although the use of “paradox” is widespread within deontic logic and it does conform to a technical use in philosophical logic, namely the distinction between “paradox” and “antinomy” stemming from Quine’s seminal “The Ways of Paradox” (Quine 1976 [1962]), I will also use “puzzle”, “problem” and “dilemma” below.

To paraphrase von Wright, the number of outstanding problems in deontic logic is large, and most of these can be framed as problems or limitations attributed to SDLs. In this section we will list and briefly describe most of them, trying to group them where feasible under crucial principles of SDL or more general themes.

4.1 A Puzzle Centering around the Very Idea of a Deontic Logic

Jorgensen’s Dilemma (Jorgensen 1937):

A view still held by many researchers within deontic logic and metaethics, and particularly popular in the first few decades following the emergence of positivism, was that evaluative sentences are not the sort of sentences that can be either true or false. But then how can there be a logic of normative sentences, since logic is the study of what follows from what, and one thing can follow from another only if the things in question are the sort that can be either true or false? So there can be no deontic logic. On the other hand, some normative sentences do seem to follow from others, so deontic logic must be possible. What to do? That's Joergesson's dilemma.[33]

A widespread distinction is that between a norm and a normative proposition[34]. The idea is that a normative sentence such as “You may park here for one hour” may be used by an authority to provide permission on the spot or it may be used by a passerby to report on an already existing norm (e.g., a standing municipal regulation). The activity of using a normative sentence as in the first example is sometimes referred to as “norming”—it creates a norm by granting permission by the very use. The second use is often said to be descriptive, since the sentence is then not used to grant permission, but to report that permission to do so is a standing state. It is often maintained that the two uses are mutually exclusive, and only the latter use allows for truth or falsity. Some have challenged the exclusiveness of the division, by blending semantics and speech-act theory (especially regarding performatives), thereby suggesting that it may be that one who is in authority to grant a permission not only grants it in performing a speech act by uttering the relevant sentence (as in the first example), but also thereby makes what it said true (that the person is permitted to park).[35]

4.2 A Problem Centering Around NEC

This problem can be found in the supplemental document The Logical Necessity of Obligations Problem

4.3 Puzzles Centering Around RM

Free Choice Permission Paradox (Ross 1941):


(1) You may either sleep on the sofa-bed or sleep on the guest room bed.[36]

(2) You may sleep on the sofa-bed and you may sleep on the guest room bed.

The most straightforward symbolization of these in SDL appears to be:

(1′) PE(sg)
(2′) PEs & PEg

Now it is also natural to see (2) as following from (1): if you permit me to sleep in either bed, it would seem that I am permitted to sleep in the first, and I am permitted to sleep in the second (though perhaps not to sleep in both, straddling the two, as it were). But (2′) does not follow from (1′) and the following is not a theorem of SDL:

* PE(pq) → (PEp & PEq)

Furthermore, suppose * were added to a system that contained SDL. Disaster would result. For it follows from OB-RM that PEpPE(pq).[37] So with * it would follow that PEp → (PEp & PEq), for any q, so we would get

** PEpPEq,

that if anything is permissible, then everything is, and thus it would also be a theorem that nothing is obligatory, ⊢ ~OBp.[38]

Some have argued for two senses of “permissibility”[39]

Another puzzle centering around RM can be found in the supplemental document The Violability Puzzle.

Ross's Paradox (Ross 1941):


(1) It is obligatory that the letter is mailed.
(2) It is obligatory that the letter is mailed or the letter is burned.

In SDLs, these seem naturally expressible as:

(1′) OBm
(2′) OB(mb)

But ⊢ OBpOB(pq) follows by RM from ⊢ p → (pq). So (2′) follows from (1′), but it seems rather odd to say that an obligation to mail the letter entails an obligation that can be fulfilled by burning the letter (something presumably forbidden), and one that would appear to be violated by not burning it if I don't mail the letter.

The Good Samaritan Paradox (Prior 1958):[40]


(1) It ought to be the case that Jones helps Smith who has been robbed.
(2) It ought to be the case that Smith has been robbed.

Now it seems that the following must be true:

Jones helps Smith who has been robbed if and only if Jones helps Smith and Smith has been robbed.

But then it would appear that a correct way to symbolize (1) and (2) in SDLs is:

(1′) OB(h & r)
(2′) OBr

But it is a thesis of PC that (h & r) → r, so by RM, it follows that OB(h & r) → OBr, and then we can derive 2′) from 1′) by MP. But it hardly seems that if helping the robbed man is obligatory it follows that his being robbed is likewise obligatory.[41]

A much-discussed variant of this paradox can be found in the supplemental document The Paradox of Epistemic Obligation.

There have been various responses to these RM-related paradoxes.[42]

4.4 Puzzles Centering Around NC, OD and Analogues

Sartre's Dilemma (Lemmon 1962b)[43]:

A conflict of obligations is a situation where there are two obligations and it is not possible for both to be fulfilled.

Consider the following conflict:

  1. It is obligatory that I now meet Jones (say, as promised to Jones, my friend).
  2. It is obligatory that I now do not meet Jones (say, as promised to Smith, another friend).[44]

Here it would seem that I have a conflict of obligations, in fact a quite direct and explicit one, since what I promised one person would happen, I promised another would not happen. People do (e.g., under pressure or distraction) make such conflicting promises, and it appears that they incur conflicting obligations as a result.[45] But consider the natural representation of these in SDLs:

(1′) OBj
(2′) OB~j

But since NC, OBp → ~OB~p, is a theorem of all SDLs, we can quickly derive a contradiction from (1) and (2), which means that (1′) conjoined with (2′) represents a logically inconsistent situation. Yet, the original hardly seems logically incoherent.[46]

A puzzle regarding OBp → ◊p can be found in the supplemental document A Puzzle Surrounding Kant's Law

Another puzzle associated with NC and OD can be found in the supplemental document Collapse of Conflicts and Impossible Obligations

Let me note that a long-ignored and challenging further puzzle for conflicting obligations, called “van Fraassen's Puzzle” (van Fraassen 1973) has deservedly received increasing attention of late: Horty 1994, Horty 2003, van der Torre and Tan 2000, McNamara 2004a, Hansen 2004, and Goble 2005.

Plato's Dilemma (Lemmon 1962b):[47]

  1. I'm obligated to meet you for a light lunch at noon.
  2. I'm obligated to rush my choking child to the hospital at noon.

Here we seem to have an indirect, non-explicit conflict of obligations, if we assume that satisfying both obligations is practically impossible. Yet here, unlike in our prior example, where the two promises might naturally have been on a par, we would all agree that the obligation to help my child overrides my obligation to meet you for lunch, and that the first obligation is defeated by the second obligation, which takes precedence. Ordinarily, we would also assume that no other obligation overrides my obligation to rush my son to the hospital, so that this obligation is an all things considered non-overridden obligation, but not so for the obligation to meet you for lunch. Furthermore, we are also prone to say that the situation is one where the general obligation we have to keep our appointments (or to keep our promises, still more generally) has an exception—the circumstances are extenuating. If we define an “obligations dilemma” as a conflict of obligations where neither of the conflicting obligations is overridden (cf. Sinnott-Armstrong 1988), then the case above involves a conflict of obligations but not an obligations dilemma. Once we acknowledge conflicts of obligation, there is the further issue of representing the logic of reasoning about conflicting obligations where some do (some don't) override others, some are (some are not) defeated, some are (some are not) all things considered non-overridden obligations, where some are perhaps parts of obligation dilemmas, where some hold generally, but not unexceptionally, some are perhaps absolute, etc. So a central issue here is that of conflicting obligations of different weight and the defeasability of obligations. Clearly, there is no mechanism in SDL for this, since SDL does not allow for conflicts to begin with, yet this is an issue that goes well beyond that of merely having a logic that allows for conflicts. There have been a variety of approaches to this dilemma, and to defeasibility among conflicting obligations.[48]

4.5 Puzzles Centering Around Deontic Conditionals

A forerunner of the next paradox may be found in the supplemental document The Paradox of Derived Obligation/Commitment:

Contrary-to-Duty (or Chisholm's) Paradox (Chisholm 1963a):

Consider the following:

(1) It ought to be that Jones goes (to the assistance of his neighbors).

(2) It ought to be that if Jones goes, then he tells them he is coming.

(3) If Jones doesn't go, then he ought not tell them he is coming.

(4) Jones doesn't go.

This certainly appears to describe a possible situation. It is widely thought that (1)–(4) constitute a mutually consistent and logically independent set of sentences. We treat these two conditions as desiderata.

Note that (1) is a primary obligation, saying what Jones ought to do unconditionally.[49] (2) is a compatible-with-duty obligation, appearing to say (in the context of 1)) what else Jones ought to do on the condition that Jones fulfills his primary obligation. In contrast, (3) is a contrary-to-duty obligation or “imperative” (a “CTD”) appearing to say (in the context of 1)) what Jones ought to do conditional on his violating his primary obligation. (4) is a factual claim, which conjoined with (1), implies that Jones violates his primary obligation. Thus this puzzle also places not only deontic conditional constructions, but the violability of obligations, at center stage. It raises the challenging question: what constitutes proper reasoning about what to do in the face of violations of obligations?

How might we represent the above quartet in SDL? The most straightforward symbolization is;

(1′) OBg.
(2′) OB(gt).
(3′) ~gOB~t.
(4′) ~g.

But Chisholm points out that from (2′) by principle OB-K we get OBg → OBt, and then from (1′) by MP, we get OBt; but by MP alone we get OB~t from (3′) and (4′). From these two conclusions, by PC, we get ~(OBt → ~OB~t), contradicting OB-NC of SDL. Thus (1′) - (4′) leads to inconsistency per SDL. But (1)–(4) do not seem inconsistent at all, so the representation cannot be a faithful one.

Various less plausible representations in SDL are similarly unfaithful. For example, we might try reading the second and third premises uniformly, either on the model of (2′) or on the model of (3′). Suppose that instead of (3′) above, we use (3″) OB(~g → ~t). The trouble with this is (3″) is derivable from (1′) in SDL, but there is no reason to think (3) in fact follows from 1), so we have an unfaithful representation again. Alternatively, suppose that instead of (2′) above, we use (2″) gOBt. This is derivable from (4′) in PC (and thus in SDL). But there is no reason to think (2) follows from (4). So again, we have an unfaithful representation.

The following displays in tabular form the difficulties in trying to interpret the quartet in SDL:[50]

First Try : Second Try: Third Try:
(1′) OBg (1′) OBg (1′) OBg
(2′) OB(gt) (2′) OB(gt) (2″) gOBt
(3′) ~gOB~t (3″) OB(~g → ~t) (3′) ~gOB~t
(4′) ~g (4′) ~g (4′) ~g
From (1′), (2′), OBt. (3″) follows from (1′). (2″) follows from (4′).
From (3′), (4′), OB~t. So independence is lost. So independence is lost.
By NC, OBt → ~OB~t.
So ⊥; consistency is lost.

Each reading of the original quartet violates one of our desiderata: mutual consistency or joint independence.

If von Wright launched deontic logic as an academic specialization, Chisholm's Paradox was the booster rocket that provided the escape velocity deontic logic needed from subsumption under normal modal logics, thus solidifying deontic logic's status as a distinct specialization. It is now virtually universally acknowledged that Chisholm was right: the sort of conditional deontic claim expressed in (3) can't be faithfully represented in SDL, nor more generally by a composite of some sort of unary deontic operator and a material conditional. This is one of the few areas where there is nearly universal agreement in deontic logic. Whether or not this is because some special primitive dyadic deontic conditional is operating or because it is just that some non-material conditional is essential to understanding important deontic reasoning is still a hotly contested open question.[51]

Further discussion of this important puzzle can be found in the supplemental document A Bit More of Chisholm's Paradox

The Paradox of the Gentle Murderer (Forrester 1984)[52]


(1) It is obligatory that John Doe does not kill his mother.

(2) If Doe does kill his mother, then it is obligatory that Doe kills her gently.

(3) Doe does kill his mother (say for an inheritance).

Then it would appear that a correct way to symbolize (1) through (3) in SDLs is:

(1′) OB~k
(2′) kOBg
(3′) k

First, from (2′) and (3′), it follows that OBg by MP. But now add the following unexceptionable claim:

Doe kills his mother gently only if Doe kills his mother.

Assuming this, symbolized as gk, is a logical truth in an expanded system, by OB-RM it follows that OBgOBk, and so by MP again we get OBk. This seems bad enough, for it hardly seems that from the fact that if I kill my mother then I must kill her gently and that I will kill her (scoundrel that I am), we can conclude that I am actually obligated to kill my mother simplicter. Add to this that from OBk in turn, we get ~OB~k by NC of SDL, and thus we have a contradiction as well. So we must either construe (2) so that is does not satisfy modus ponens or we must reject OB-RM.[53]

4.6 Problems Surrounding (Normative) Expressive Inadequacies of SDL

Here we look at some monadic normative notions that appear to be inexpressible in SDL.

The Normative Gaps Puzzle (von Wright 1968)[54]:

In some normative systems, permissions, prohibitions and obligations are explicitly given. So it would seem to be possible for there to be normative systems with gaps: systems where something is neither explicitly obligatory, impermissible, nor permissible because, say, it is neither explicitly commanded, prohibited or permitted by the relevant authority. Yet OBp ∨ (PEp & PE~p) ∨ IMp is a thesis (“exhaustion”) of SDL (given the Traditional Definitional Scheme), which seems to make any such gaps impossible.

Urmson's Puzzle—Indifference versus Optionality (Urmson 1958):


1) It is optional that you attend the meeting, but not a matter of indifference that you do so.

This seems to describe something quite familiar: optional matters that are nonetheless not matters of indifference. But when deontic logicians and ethicists gave an operator label for the condition (~OBp & ~OB~p), it was almost invariably “It is indifferent that p”, “INp”. But then it would seem to follow from the theorem OBp ∨ (~OBp & ~OB~p) ∨ IMp, that (~OBp & ~IMp) → INp, that is, everything that is neither obligatory nor prohibited is a matter of indifference. But many actions, including some heroic actions, are neither obligatory nor prohibited, yet they are hardly matters of indifference. We might put this by saying that SDL can represent optionality, but not indifference, despite the fact that the latter concept has been a purported target for representation since nearly its beginning.

The Supererogation Problem (Urmson 1958):

Some things are beyond the call of duty or supererogatory (e.g., volunteering for a costly or risky good endeavor where others are equally qualified and no one person is obligated). SDL has no capacity to represent this concept, which calls for a substantial increase in expressive and logical resources. (See also Chisholm 1963b)

The Must versus Ought Dilemma (McNamara 1996b)


(1) Although you can skip the meeting, you ought to attend.

This seems perfectly possible, even in a situation where no conflicting obligations are present, as we will suppose here. (1) appears to imply that it is optional that you attend—that you can attend and that you can fail to attend. It seems clear that the latter two uses of “can” express permissibility. Yet “ought” is routinely the reading given for deontic necessity in deontic logic (and in ethical theory), and then “permissibility” is routinely presented as its dual. But then if we symbolize 1) above accordingly, we get,

(1′) PE~p & OBp

which is just ~OBp & OBp in disguise (given OB-RE and the Traditional Definitional Scheme). So (1′), given OB-NC, yields a contradiction. Another way to put this is that the “can” of permissibility is much more plausibly construed as the dual of “must” than as the dual of “ought”. This yields a dilemma for standard deontic logic (really for most work in deontic logic):

Either deontic necessity represents “ought”, in which case, its dual does not represent permissibility (and neither does any other construction in SDL), or permissibility is represented in SDL, but “ought” is inexpressible in it despite the ubiquitous assumption otherwise.

That “ought” is the dual of permissibility is really a largely overlooked pervasive mistaken bipartisan presupposition partially characterizing twentieth century ethical theory and deontic logic.[55]

The Least You Can Do Problem (McNamara 1996b):

(1) You should have come home on time; the least you could have done was called, and you didn’t do even that.

The expression in the second clause has been completely ignored in the literature of deontic logic and ethical theory. (1) appears to express the idea that there is some minimal but acceptable alternative (and the criticism suggested in the emphatic third clause is that not even that minimal acceptable option was taken, much less the preferable option identified in the first clause using “ought”). This notion of what is minimally acceptable among the permissible options is not expressible in SDL.

Regarding the last four problems, McNamara 1996a, 1996b provide a semantical and logical framework for distinguishing “must” from “ought”, indifference from optionality, as well as distinctly representing “the least you can do” idiom and analyzing one central sense of “supererogation” via that otherwise unstudied idiom. A quick glance at the resulting scheme, which presupposes a no-conflicts atmosphere for simplicity, can be found in the supplemental document A Framework for Common Sense Morality in Non-Conflict Contexts.

4.7 Agency in Deontic Contexts

We routinely talk about both what ought to be and what people ought to do. These hardly look like the same things (for example, the latter notion calls for an agent, the former does not). This issue, and the general issue of representing agency in deontic logic has been much discussed, and continues to be an area of active concern.

The Jurisdictional Problem and the Need for Agency[56]

Consider the following:

(1) Jane Doe is obligated to not bring it about that your child is disciplined.
(2) Jane Doe is obligated to not bring it about that your child is not disciplined.

Suppose you have a child. For almost any Jane Doe, (1) is then true: she is obligated to not bring it about that your child is disciplined, since that is none of her business. Similarly, for (2): she also is obligated to not bring it about that your child is not disciplined, since bringing that about is also none of her business. How might we represent these in SDL? Suppose we try to read the OB of SDL as “Jane Doe is obligated to bring it about that   [57]; then how do we express (1) and (2)? The closest we appear to be able to come is:

(1′) ~OBp.
(2′) ~OB~p.

But these won't do. Collectively, (1′) and (2′) amount to saying that two obligations are absent, that it is neither obligatory that Jane Doe brings it about that your child is disciplined nor obligatory that she brings it about that your child is not disciplined. But this is compatible with its being the case that both (1) and (2) above are false. After all, suppose now that you are Jane Doe, the single parent of your child. Then in a given situation, it may be that you, the child's sole parent and guardian, are both permitted to bring it about that the child is disciplined and permitted to bring it about that the child is not disciplined, in which case both (1) and (2) are false. These permissions in fact appear to be equivalent to the negations of (1) and (2).) But the falsity of (1) (and the first permission) implies the truth of (2′) on the current reading, and the falsity of (2) (and the second permission) implies the truth of (1′) on the current reading. So clearly (1) and (1′) are not equivalent, nor are (2) and (2′).

Alternatively, on the proposed reading of OB, shifting the outer negation signs to the right of the operators in (1′) and (2′) will just get us this conflicting pair:

(1″) OB~p
(2″) OB~~p

which are hopeless candidates for symbolizing (1) and (2), which do not conflict with one another.

Also, consider this traditional equivalence:


If we are going to read “OB” as having agency built into it, presumably we want to do the same for the other operators, and so IMp above will be read as “it is impermissible for Jane Doe to bring it about that p”. However, this renders the left to right implication in the equivalence above unsound, for it may be true that it is impermissible for me to discipline your child, but false that it is obligatory for me to see to it that your child is positively not disciplined. The matter must be left up to you.

On the face of it, the “not”s in (1) and (2) are not external to the deontic operators, as it were, nor are they directly operating on p; rather they pertain to Jane Doe's agency with respect to p. They come “between” a deontic element and an agential element, so reading OB as an amalgamation of a deontic and agential operator does not allow for the “insertion” of any such negation. So, unsurprisingly, it looks like we simply must have some explicit representation of agency if we are to represent agential obligations like those in (1) and (2) above.

A Simple Kangerian Agency Framework

So let us introduce a standard operator for this missing element,

BA: Jane Doe brings it about that    .[58]

Then clearly the following relations expressing an agent's simple position with respect to a proposition, p, are to be distinguished:

BAp: Jane Doe brings it about that p
BA~p: Jane Doe brings it about that ~p
~BAp: Jane Doe does not bring it about that p
~BA~p: Jane Doe does not bring it about that ~p

Plainly, if neither of the first two hold, then the conjunction of the last two holds. In such a case we might say that Jane Doe is passive with respect to p, or more adequately, passive with respect to herself bringing about p or its negation.[59] Let's introduce such an operator:

PVp =df ~BAp & ~BA~p

Clearly we have here another potential set of modal operators, and we can introduce rough analogues to our traditional definitional schemes for alethic modal operators and deontic operators as follows:

ROp =df BA~p
NRp =df ~BA~p
NBp =df ~BAp
PVp =df ~BAp & ~BA~p

The first says that it is ruled out by what our agent does that p if and only if our agent brings it about that ~p. Note that this notion does not apply to all things that are ruled out per se, but only to those that are specifically ruled out by our agent's exercise of her agency. So contradictions, the negations of laws of nature and of past events are not ruled out by what our agent now does. The second says it is not ruled out by anything our agent does that p if and only if our agent does not bring it about that ~p. Laws of logic (which are necessarily ruled in) as well as contradictions (which are necessarily ruled out) are not things that are ruled out by our agent. The third says our agent does not bring it about that p (p is not ruled in by anything our agent does) if and only if it is false that our agent brings it about that p. This is of course compatible with p's holding for some other reason, such as that it is a law of logic or nature, or because it holds due to another person’s exercise of her own agency. The fourth says our agent is passive regarding p (does nothing herself that determines the status of p) if and only if our agent neither brings about p nor rules p out by what she does do (if anything). Again, it does not follow from the fact that our agent leaves something open that it is open per se. PVp is consistent with its being fixed that p and consistent with its being fixed that ~p, as long as it is not fixed by anything our agent has done. These notions are all intended to have a strong agential reading.

It is quite plausible to think that the first five agential operators satisfy the conditions of the traditional square and the traditional threefold classification scheme:

agential square
agential 30fold partition

For example, in the latter case, for every agent Jane Doe, and any proposition, p, either Doe brings about p, or Doe brings about ~p, or Doe brings about neither, and furthermore, no more than one of these three can hold (i.e., the three are mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive). We will come back to this in a moment.

Virtually all accounts of this operator take it to satisfy the rule,

If pq is a theorem, so is BAp ↔ BAq (BA-RE),

as well as the scheme,

BApp (BA-T)

(if an agent brings about p, then p holds—“success” clause), and the schema,

(BAp & BAq) → BA(p & q) (BA-C)[60]

It is also the majority opinion that this operator satisfies this scheme:

~BA⊤. (BA-NO)

Consider again:

(1) BAp 1′) ~BAp
(2) BA~p, (2′) ~BA~p,

and consider pairing these with one another. Pruning because of the commutativity of conjunction, we get six combinations:

a) BAp & BA~p. (Contradiction given BA-T axiom)
b) BAp & ~BAp. (PC contradiction)
c) BAp & ~BA~p. (The second clause is implied by the first)
d) BA~p & ~BAp. (The second clause is implied by the first)
e) BA~p & ~BA~p. (PC contradiction)
f) ~BAp & ~BA~p. (i.e., PVp)

Recall that because of the BA-T axiom, (1) above implies (2′), and (2) implies (1′). So the following three pruned down statuses for a proposition, p, and an agent, s, are the only pairs that remain of the six above (redundancies are also eliminated):




For the reasons alluded to already, it is easy to prove using the above principles that these three statuses (regarding an agent) and a proposition, p, are indeed mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive, as anticipated.

Another operator of considerable pre-theoretic interest is briefly discussed in the supplemental document Inaction versus Refraining/Forebearing

It is beyond the scope of this essay to delve non-superficially into the logic of agency,[61] and here we only barely touch on the more complex interaction of such logics with deontic logics by keeping the agency component exceedingly simple.

The Meinong-Chisholm Reduction: A Simple Recipe for Agential Obligations (Chisholm 1964)[62]:

Let us set aside the jurisdictional problem as having established the need to go beyond SDL in order to represent agential obligations. Returning to deontic matters, the question arises: how do we represent not just agency, but agential obligation? With an agency operator in hand, we might now invoke the famous “Meinong-Chisholm Reduction”: the idea that Jane Doe’s obligation to do some thing is equivalent to what it is obligatory that Jane do (cf. what Jane ought to do is what it ought to be that Jane does). If we regiment this a bit using our operator for agency, we get the following version of the “reduction”:

Meinong-Chisholm Reduction: Jane Doe is obligated to bring it about that p iff it is obligatory that Jane Doe brings it about that p.

This is sometimes taken to be a reduction of personal obligation to impersonal obligation and agency (or it is sometimes rephrased as a reduction of the personal “ought to do” to the impersonal “ought to be” and agency).[63] Although not uncontested (e.g., see Horty 2001), by relying on this analysis we appear to have a way to represent the troublesome sentences, (1) and (2) of the jurisdictional problem:

1″) OB~BAp,
2″) OB~BA~p.

These might be taken to assert that Jane Doe is positively obligated to not bring it about that p and that she is also positively obligated to not bring it about that ~p. Here we can properly express the fact that she is positively obligated to be non-agential with respect to the status of both p and ~p. These are easily distinguished from the claims that Jane Doe is not obligated to bring about p (i.e., ~OBBAp) and that she is not obligated to bring about ~p (i.e., ~OBBA~p). Similar remarks hold for our earlier equivalence IMpOB~p.

Generally, if we substitute “BAp” for p in the traditional definitional scheme's equivalences, we get:

OPBAp ↔ ~OBBAp & ~OB~BAp

If we now read each deontic operator as “it is ____ for Jane Doe that”, so that it is impersonal but not agential, the earlier problem with IMpOB~p, coupled with trying to read the agency into the deontic operators, disappears. For the deontic-agential compound above gets things right: it is impermissible that Jane Doe brings it about that your child is disciplined iff it is obligatory for Jane Doe that she does not bring it about that your child is disciplined. We can now clearly and distinctly express the idea that something is simply out of Jane Doe's jurisdiction.

This general approach to obligations to do things has been very widely employed in deontic logic.[64]

Krogh and Herrestad 1996 reinterpret the analysis so that the deontic operator is personal, yet not agential. This is arguably a more plausible way to preserve a componential analysis of agential obligation. McNamara 2004a also makes the case that a person's being obligated to be such that a certain condition holds (e.g., being obligated to be at home at noon, as promised) is the more basic idiom, and being obligated to bring about something is just being obligated to be such that you do bring it about.

A Glimpse at the Theory of Normative Positions (Kanger 1971 [1957]):

One way in which the Meinong-Chisholm analysis has been fruitfully employed is in the study of what are called “normative positions”. A set of normative positions is intended to describe the set of all possible mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive positions that a person or set of persons may be in regarding a proposition and with respect to a set of selected primitive normative statuses and a set of agency operators. For a given proposition, p, recall the partition regarding how Jane Doe may be positioned agentially with respect to p:

(BAp ∨ ROp ∨ PVp) & ~(BAp & ROp) & ~(BAp & PVp) & ~(ROp & PVp)

Now also recall our partition with respect to obligations:

(OBpIMpOPp) & ~(OBp & IMp) & ~(OBp & OPp) & ~(IMp & OPp)

We might consider “merging” these two partitions, as it were, and try to get a representation of the possible ways Jane Doe may be positioned normatively with respect to her agency regarding p. Given certain choices of logic for BA and for OB, we might get a set of mutually exclusive and exhaustive “normative positions” for Jane Doe regarding p, the basic normative status, OB, and the basic agency operator, BA, such as that pictured below:

seven normative positions

As usual, the partition above is intended to assert that the following seven classes are mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive:

PEBAp & PEROp & PEPVp (~OB~BAp & ~OB~BA~p & ~OB~PVp)
PEBAp & PEROp & OB~PVp (~OB~BAp & ~OB~BA~p & OB~PVp)
PEBAp & OB~ROp & PEPVp (~OB~BAp & OB~BA~p & ~OB~PVp)
OBNBp & PEROp & PEPVp (OB~BAp & ~OB~BA~p & ~OB~PVp)
OBPVp (OBNBp & OBNRp, given axioms OB-C & OB-M)

This too has been a dynamic area of research that we have barely touched on here.[65]

A further issue regarding the Meinong-Chisholm Reduction can be found in the supplemental document Deontic Complements

An Obligation Fulfillment Dilemma (McNamara 2004a)[66]

Obligations can be fulfilled and violated. These are among the most characteristic features of obligations. It is often thought that fulfillment and violation conditions for what is obligatory are easily represented in SDL as follows:

OBp & p (fulfillment)
OBp & ~p (violation).

Call this the “Standard Analysis”. Now consider cases where p is itself some agential sentence, say BAq, where we continue to read this as saying that Jane Doe brings it about that q. The Standard Analysis then implies:

OBBAq & BAq (fulfillment?)
OBBAq & ~BAq (violation?).

These suggest that Doe's obligation to bring it about that q is fulfilled iff she brings it about that q and is violated iff she doesn't. But if this is the proper analysis of obligation fulfillment, then it is hard to see how someone else could ever fulfill our obligations when we don't fulfill ours, for then our obligation would be unfulfilled and violated according to the Standard Analysis. Yet surely people can fulfill other people's obligations, and when they do so, it certainly seems to follow that our obligation is fulfilled. So the question then becomes, just what is obligatory? It would seem that it can't be that what is obligatory is that Jane Doe brings it about that p, for it is incoherent to say that someone else does that unless we mean that someone else gets Jane Doe to bring it about that p; but that is hardly the usual way in which we fulfill other's obligations. I might bring your book back to the library for you, thereby fulfilling one of your obligations without getting you to return the book yourself, at gunpoint say. So we face a dilemma:

Since others can sometimes discharge our obligations, either our obligations are not always obligations for us to do things, and thus personal obligations need not be agential or obligation fulfillment is more complex than has been previously realized, and perhaps both.

A related problem can be found in the supplemental document The Leakage Problem.

4.8 Challenges regarding Obligation, Change and Time

Although we have seen that obligations can be obligations to be (i.e., to satisfy a condition) as well as obligations to do, and that the former may be a special case of the latter, nonetheless, it is plausible to think that one is obligated to do something only if that thing is in the future. Thus even if attempts to solve Chisholm's contrary to duty paradox by invoking time do not look very plausible, this does not mean that there is no interesting work needed to forge relationships between time and obligations. For example, consider the system Kd. If we read d atemporally as all obligations past, present, and future are met, then the only relevant worlds are those so ideal that in them there has never been a single violation of a mandatory norm. But as a parent, I may be obligated to lock the front door at night even though this would not be a norm unless there had been past violations of other norms (e.g., against theft and murder). People also acquire obligations over time, create them for themselves and for others by their actions, discharge them, etc.[67]

5. Conclusion

Plainly, there are a number of outstanding problems for deontic logic. Some see this as a serious defect; others see it merely as a serious challenge, even an attractive one. There is some antecedent reason to expect that the challenges will be great in this area. Normativity is challenging generally, not just in deontic logic. Normative notions appear to have strong semantic and pragmatic features. Normative notions must combine with notions for agency and with temporal notions to be of maximal interest—which introduces considerable logical complexity. There is also reason to think that there are hidden complexities in the interaction of normative notions and conditionals. Finally, there appears to be a wide array of normative notions with interesting interactions, some easily conflated with others (by ethicists as much as deontic logicians). Clearly, there is a lot of work to be done.


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logic: action | logic: modal | logic: relevance | Mally, Ernst | Mally, Ernst: deontic logic | moral dilemmas | reasoning: moral | square of opposition


This entry is an original contribution to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. It has been adapted for inclusion in the Handbook of the History of Logic. See McNamara 2006. I'd like to thank the editors of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for their cooperation in working out these arrangements.

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Paul McNamara <>

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