Margaret Fell

First published Thu Jan 26, 2012

On the strength of her 1666 pamphlet, Womens Speaking Justified, the Quaker writer Margaret Fell has been hailed as a feminist pioneer. In this short tract, Fell puts forward several arguments in favour of women's preaching. She asserts the spiritual equality of the sexes, she appeals to female exempla in the Bible, and she reinterprets key scriptural passages that appear to endorse women's subordination to men. Some scholars, however, have questioned Fell's status as a feminist thinker. They point to the fact that, according to Fell and her fellow Quakers, women are permitted to speak in church—but only in so far as they are vessels or mouthpieces for Christ. In every other respect, it is argued, the early Quakers continue to either ignore, denigrate, or efface the female sex. Other critics point out that the Quakers' gender egalitarian principles operate in a rather limited sphere of activity—that of religious worship alone—and do not extend to the socio-political domain. Notwithstanding such criticisms, Fell's defence of women's preaching was undoubtedly influential in her time and may have inspired women writers beyond her religious circle. Foxton (1994) claims that Quaker women's writings more generally set an important precedent for women's publishing activities in the seventeenth century, on both religious and non-religious topics.


1. Life and works

Fell's long life spanned the reigns of six English monarchs and some of the most dramatic political events in English history, including the Civil Wars of 1642–51 and the Glorious Revolution of 1688–89. Fell (née Askew) was born at Marsh Grange, Dalton-in-Furness, in Lancashire, England, in 1614, and she died in 1702. At the age of seventeen, she married the barrister Thomas Fell (c. 1598–1658) and together they had nine children. In 1652, upon his return home, Thomas Fell was greeted by neighbors who warned him that his wife had been bewitched by a travelling preacher. This preacher was George Fox (1624–91), a charismatic religious dissenter and first-generation leader of the Society of Friends (also known as Quakers). Upon hearing Fox speak at her local church, Margaret Fell testified that

It pleased the Lord so to open my understanding Imediately in the time of G Fs [George Fox's] declaration. That I saw perfectly Just then that wee were all wrong, & that we were but Theives, that had stollen the scriptures. which caused me to shed many tears. And I satt down in my pew & wept all the while … (Glines 2003, 430).

From that day forward, Margaret Fell was a convert to Quakerism. Despite his initial reservations, Thomas Fell was supportive of his wife's conversion, and the Fell family home of Swarthmoor Hall became a popular meeting place for Friends. In these early years, while Thomas Fell was chief magistrate of the area, the northern Quakers seem to have avoided persecution. Though Margaret Fell eventually suffered imprisonment for her beliefs, she remained a woman of considerable wealth and social status throughout her life.

Together with Fox and William Penn (1644–1718), Fell is now regarded as one of the founders of Quakerism. She helped to sustain the movement through her large correspondence with other Friends on a range of personal and religio-political topics. She travelled widely and spent extended periods in London petitioning the political authorities on behalf of persecuted Quakers (she personally addressed not only Oliver Cromwell but also Charles II and James II). And on at least three occasions, she spent periods in prison for holding Quaker meetings at her house and for refusing to take the Oath of Allegiance. Fell married George Fox in 1669, eleven years after her first husband's death, and she was subsequently known as Margaret Fox. Together they were active organizers of the separate Quaker women's meetings, first officially begun in 1671.

Not long after her conversion, Fell began to express her Quaker beliefs in print, starting with False Prophets, Antichrists, Deceivers in 1655. She was the author (or co-author) of at least 23 works in total, mostly in the form of short pamphlets. Some of her more substantial works—including A Call to the Universall Seed of God (1665), Womens Speaking Justified (1666; second edition, 1667), and A Touch-Stone: or, A Perfect Tryal by the Scriptures (1667)—were written during the period of her imprisonment in Lancaster Castle (1664–68). Following her death, several of her works were collected together and published as A Brief Collection of Remarkable Passages and Occurrences (1710). Despite its 535 pages, this collection is nevertheless incomplete and includes only a small sample of letters. Her works are now available in their original form in online databases such as Early English Books Online, or in selective modern anthologies such as Wallace (1992), Booy (2004), and Garman et al. (1996). Elsa F. Glines has published 164 of Fell's surviving letters in her collection The Letters of Margaret Fell (2003).

2. Quaker thought and practice

Fell's views about female spiritual authority are best understood in the context of her wider religious beliefs. Above all, Fell embraces the Quaker notion that every human being has the “Light of Christ” within them. According to the Quaker philosophy, all human beings are capable of attaining salvation provided that they turn their minds to the divine light. This universalism concerning salvation, and the Quaker view that everyone is capable of discerning fundamental religious truths for themselves, had notable implications for early Quaker practice. The Quakers believe that Christ is equally manifest in everyone and that God is “no respecter of persons” (Acts 10:34). From early on, the Quakers enacted this belief by taking a collaborative approach to prayer meetings. They did not appoint a single authoritarian preacher, “set up to teach them, it may be thirty or forty years together” (Fell 1667b, 86), but rather members would wait in silence till someone felt the light stir within. A guiding principle, Fell says, was that no-one should “strive for Mastery” but everyone should “esteem others better than themselves” (Fell 1710, 55). In their day-to-day interactions with social superiors, Quaker men would not remove their hats, and Quaker women would not curtsey. They refused to take oaths (such as the Oaths of Allegiance and Supremacy) and they did not use deferential titles. This lack of outward submission led some critics to accuse Quakers of “levelling all conditions” and ignoring social hierarchies between magistrates and people, husbands and wives, and masters and servants (Collier 1657, 12).

Despite her anti-authoritarian beliefs, however, Fell was no advocate of active resistance to political authority. She was, in fact, one of the first writers to articulate the Quaker philosophy of peace and non-resistance. In a letter to Charles II, dated 1660, she declares that the Quakers aspire

to live peaceably with all men, And not to Act any thing against the King nor the peace of the Nation, by any plotts, contrivances, insurrections, or carnall weapons to hurt or destroy either him or the Nation thereby, but to be obedient unto all just & lawfull Commands. (Glines 2003, 280)

Fell emphasizes that although Friends cannot in good conscience take an oath, “in Substance they perform that, which is true Allegiance to the King” (Fell 1710, 29–30). They express their allegiance by opposition to resistance and through denial of the Pope's authority (Fell 1710, 31). In none of her works does Fell call for the subject's right to rebel against tyrannical or irreligious political leaders.

In the early years of the movement, Quakers also dressed plainly and without ostentation. This practice was an outcome of focusing on the “Inner-Man” rather than outer appearances (Fell 1660f, 20). In one of her last “Epistle to Friends” (1698), Fell sternly warns against the dangers of leading young Friends into “the observation of outward things”. The outward form does not make a true Christian, but rather the inner person: “It's the Spirit,” she says, “that gives Life” (Fell 1710, 535).

2.1 Doctrine of the light

This emphasis on the inward rather than the outward person lies at the heart of Fell's egalitarian views about spiritual authority. According to Quaker philosophy, the spirit of Christ is “in the inward parts”, it is “the Law of God written in the heart” or the “Candle of the Lord in you” (Fell 1710, 35, 49). The light of Christ is divinely or supernaturally implanted; it is not a natural human capacity, such as reason or rational judgment (cf. Apetrei 2009, 134). By participating in this light, human beings partake in “a living, pure, eternal, immortal Principle” (Fell 1710, 92). Through the inner light, they come to learn God's will and law—the light “makes the will of God manifest” (Fell 1710, 50). They learn moral truths, such as “to doe to all men as ye would they should doe to you”, and that “thou shalt not steal” and “thou shalt not kill” (Fell 1656a, 2, 24). The light enables human beings to recognize sin and to make considered moral judgments in matters of justice and equity. And the light reproaches the individual for straying from the righteous path: it “will reprove, this teacheth in secret, and is alwayes present, when you are upon your Beds” (Fell 1656c, 7).

But while the light is undoubtedly divine or supernatural in nature, according to Fell, it is still up to the individual to direct her mind to the light in order to attain redemption. Above all, personal salvation depends upon the mind discerning the light within and then diligently keeping to it. The individual must engage in constant mental effort, she must “consider seriously” and “come to search and examine” her beliefs for herself (Fell 1656b, 1, 14).

Fell reiterates these points in several tracts addressed to the Jews of Europe, including For Manasseth Ben Israel (1656), A Loving Salutation (c. 1656–57) and A Call unto the Seed of Israel (1668). In the 1650s, Oliver Cromwell contemplated readmitting the Jews to England for the first time since their expulsion in the thirteenth century. In her writings, Fell welcomes the return of the Jews, but only on the condition that they convert to Christianity. As a millenarian thinker, she believes that the conversion of the Jews signals the fulfilment of biblical prophecies foretelling “the last days” and the second coming of Christ (cf. Gardiner 1994; Guibbory 2000). Fell thus appeals to the Jews to turn from their “outward worship” and to acknowledge the divine light within them. In Manasseth Ben Israel, Fell calls on them to “therefore cease from your abomination, and turne to the living God” (Fell 1656c, 4). “If ever you come to know the true and living God,” she says, “you must hearken to this Prophet which calls your minds to within, for by this doth the living God teach his People himselfe” (5). In A Loving Salutation, Fell likewise urges the Jews to “hearken diligently” (Fell 1656a, 3): “Incline your eare, and come unto me, hear, and your souls shall live” (3), and “thine eyes shall see thy teacher, and thy eares shall heare a voice behind thee” (6). With such exhortations, Fell emphasizes that living in the light requires certain activity on part of the moral agent, and not just the mere passive reception of the power and spirit of God. While everyone has the divine light within, they can only know the truths that the light reveals—and attain salvation—by actively hearkening to the light: “if ye desire this inheritance,” she says to the Jews, “turn your minds into the light” (8).

In these and other writings, Fell promotes a certain critical attitude toward customary ways of practising and thinking about religion. The path to God, she says, “leads out of the world, out of the worlds ways, fashions, and customs, and this makes a separation from the world” (Fell 1710, 65). The individual must learn to rely on her own independent faculty of moral judgement or her conscience. Both Jews and Gentiles are urged to “let that in your Consciences (which is of God) which respects no Person, Read and Examine those Scriptures” (Fell 1710, 65).

2.2 Anti-clericalism and anti-authoritarianism

Fell's anti-clericalism (her opposition to the professional clergy) is typical of Quaker texts of the period. In her view, the light is the only teacher or spiritual guide that anyone requires for salvation. The divine law is not written in paper and ink but rather with the spirit of the living God. Fell says that “Though ye may get all the words of the whole Scripture in your brains and comprehension, so long as ye deny the light, and turn your minds from the light, and seek to know these things without you, ye shall never know them” (Fell 1656b, 3). The light of Christ makes everyone capable of interpreting scripture for themselves, without the need for an education in Hebrew, Greek, or Latin. This claim is made most forcefully in A Touch-Stone: or, A Perfect Tryal by the Scriptures, in which Fell says that preachers of the light need not be “Learned Men, such as have been at Oxford or Cambridge” (Fell 1667b, 18). The apostles, after all, did not have degrees from prestigious universities, yet no one doubts that they taught the word of God.

On these grounds, Fell rails against those who have “set up Schooles of Learning, as they call them; and educated youth up in that darkness, and kept them studying and divining in their brains, till many have studied themselves out of their Wits” (Fell 1667b, 38–39). She encourages suspicion toward human religious authority and urges readers to question their ministers. “Try your Teachers,” she says, and do not “bow to mens wills and worships contrary to the command of Christ Jesus” (Fell 1655, 1; 1660b, 3). If ministers are not in the light, then they do not speak the word of God. Hence, no matter how well-educated or elevated in rank our ministers might be, we must not take their word on trust. “Fear ye not the reproaches of men,” she says, “neither be ye afraid of their revilings” (Fell 1668, 6). On the whole, it is always better for the individual to offend other human beings rather than God himself.

Fell maintains that most university-educated interpreters of scripture invariably lead others away from God to their own inventions and imaginations. She says that

The first thing that I except against in matter and form of their Worship: Viz. All sorts of Preachers and Teachers that are out of Christ and his Apostles Spirit, Doctrine and Rule, is the taking a part or portion of Scripture for a Text, and adding to thereto their own Inventions, which they study out of their own brain, and also bringing other Authors, who have done the like, many of them not Christians but Heathens. (Fell 1667b, 21)

This anti-learning bent distances Fell from later religious feminists, such as Mary Astell, who called for the higher education of women in her Serious Proposal to the Ladies (1694). For Astell, women can attain wisdom and virtue only if they are taught to improve their natural reasoning skills through the study of religion and philosophy. In her plea for a female academy, she cites the works of René Descartes, Antoine Arnauld, Pierre Nicole, and Henry More, as exemplary philosophical-theological texts. For Fell, however, religious worship is about the individual directing herself to the light and keeping to it; it does not consist in a dependence or reliance upon others' words and meanings. Such worship can be performed by anyone, anywhere, at any time.

2.3 Liberty of conscience

In some of her writings, Fell provides religio-political defences of liberty of conscience (freedom of religious belief and worship) for Quakers. In a direct appeal to Charles II, Fell calls upon the king

to a Consideration, according to Reason, Righteousness, and Equity, concerning us, as a People, to maintain our just Liberties and Rights, as he is engaged by Promise, to defend us from Wrongs, Injuries, and Violence, done to us by Military and Merciless Men. (Fell 1710, 28)

By “liberty” here Fell means freedom from coercion and persecution for one's religious beliefs and practices. She laments “That the State should pretend Love to the Truth, and yet suffer such things to be of Force, that all Bloody Persecutors may have their Wills, so far as the Lord gives them Power, upon those that live in the Truth” (Fell 1710, 43). Using gender-inclusive language, she calls on the authorities to respect the rights of “free-born English men and women” (Fell 1664, 1). Unlike her fellow Quaker William Penn (who anticipates the tolerationist views of John Locke), Fell does not offer detailed arguments for liberty of conscience based on pragmatic, political, or epistemological principles. She does point out, however, that “to use Violence and Cruelty, is absolutely contrary to the Doctrine and Command of Christ” (Fell 1667b, 45). She calls upon the political authorities to exemplify the Christian virtues in their treatment of religious dissenters.

3. Quaker feminism

As we have seen, Quaker preaching is not preaching in the traditional sense of exhortation on scripture: “For it was not Christ nor the Apostles Practice to take others Records & Writings that had been spoken from others,” Fell says, “but they spoke as the spirit gave them utterance” (Fell 1660f, 4). In Fell's view, women can justifiably preach because true preaching does not require the traditional book-learning of men, it requires only the light of Christ within. In their arguments, Fell and other Quaker authors repeatedly invoke biblical quotations in support of the spiritual authority of women, such as the claims that “there is neither male nor female: for ye are all one in Christ Jesus” (Galatians 3:28), and that “it shall come to pass in the last days, saith God, I will pour out of my Spirit upon all flesh: and your sons and your daughters shall prophesy” (Acts 2:17, quoting Joel 2:28). For many Quakers, the rise of the female preacher, like the conversion of the Jews, would be a realization of millennial expectations about Christ's second coming. In arguing thus, they were challenging widespread opposition to women's preaching at the time.

3.1 Arguments against women's preaching

Critics of women's preaching typically appealed to the natural inferiority of the female sex, the biblical tale of Eve's transgression, and Pauline injunctions against women speaking in church. In the anonymous A Spirit moving in the Women Preachers (1646), the author asserts that women preachers transgress not only the rules of nature but also of modesty, divinity, discretion, and civility. On these grounds, the author concludes that women preachers cannot possibly be moved by the spirit of God but must partake in the spirit of darkness, ignorance, and gross error. To support his point, the author notes that the Serpent approached Eve first, because he knew that women were “the silly and weaker Sex” and “naturally apt unto all mischiefe” (Anonymous 1646, 2). In his Antichrist in Man (1655), Joshuah Miller explicitly takes issue with the Quaker practice of permitting women to speak in church by citing two New Testament passages that seemingly forbid women's spiritual leadership: 1 Corinthians 14:34, “Let your women keep silence in the churches: for it is not permitted unto them to speak”, and 1 Timothy 2:11–12, “Let the woman learn in silence with all subjection. But I suffer not a woman to teach, nor to usurp authority over the man, but to be in silence”. He asks:

What monstrous Doctrine is this? to suffer Women to be Preachers by way of authority, condemned as against nature Isaiah 3.12. I Cor. 14. 34, 35. 1 Tim. 2. 12. 14. This opinion was first held by the Pepuzians, that women might Preach, because they wickedly affirmed Christ assumed the form of a woman, and not of a man. In France, they allow not a woman to bee a ruler over the affairs of mens goods: But with us some women will be rulers over, and directers of mens consciences; for so amongst the Quakers, women commonly teach as well as men. (Miller 1655, 27)

Miller's reference to the “monstrous Doctrine” of women preachers calls to mind the arguments of Protestant reformer John Knox (c. 1514–1572) a generation before. In his 1558 work, The First Blast of the Trumpet Against the Monstrous Regiment of Women, Knox urges his readers to rebel against female authority. He points out that it is repugnant to nature that the weak shall lead the strong, or that the foolish and mad shall govern the “sober of mind” (Knox 1558, 9). Nature informs us that women are physically frail, mentally feeble, and generally lacking in the necessary leadership virtues. Knox supports this view with reference to scriptural claims that it is a virtue for women to be submissive and subject to men. As part of the legacy of Eve's transgression, he points out, the Bible states that man shall be lord and governor over woman (Genesis 3:16). He also observes that the apostle Paul (again, in Timothy and Corinthians) deprives women of “all power and authoritie, to speake, to reason, to interprete, or to teache, but principallie to rule or to judge in the assemblie of men” (Knox 1558, 16).

3.2 Precursors to Womens Speaking Justified

There are several early Quaker texts that challenge these nature and scripture-based arguments against women's spiritual authority. In doing so, the authors continue a tradition that began in the fifteenth century with the querelle des femmes, an ongoing debate about the moral and intellectual status of women in continental Europe (cf. Kelly 1984, 68). In this debate, defenders of women protest against the contempt and defamation of women in the works of their male-biased peers. To support their cause, they repeatedly cite scriptural arguments for women's spiritual equality with men and put forward long lists of female worthies. The Quakers partake in this tradition by explicitly addressing the subject of women's natural or divinely-ordained subordination to men, as well as those problematic biblical passages about Eve's transgression and women “learning in silence”.

In one of the earliest defences, A Woman Forbidden to Speak (1654), Richard Farnworth sidesteps common criticisms of women's preaching by pointing out that natural women are not permitted to speak at prayer meetings, for “nothing must speak in the Church in God but the Holy Ghost” (Farnworth 1654, 3). If the spirit of God is manifest in a woman, however, then that woman ought to be permitted to speak—because she speaks with spiritual rather than carnal wisdom. As precedents, he cites the examples of Deborah in the book of Judges, the prophesying daughters of Philip, the woman named Phebe who was commended to be “a Servant or Minister to the Church” (7), and other women who labored with Christ in the Gospel. Far from being forbidden to speak, these women were received into the church and “saluted with an holy kiss in the Lord” (7).

In The Woman Learning in Silence (1656), George Fox likewise challenges those who would limit the spirit of God to “learned men, old books, and authors” (Fox 1656, 4). He goes further than Farnworth by arguing that those who prevent women from speaking in church stop Christ himself from speaking. To substantiate his point, he provides a list of exemplary females from the Bible, including the daughters of Philip, Hannah (or Anna) the Prophetess, Priscilla “an instructer”, Phebe, Mary Magdalene, and other “women-labourers in the Gospel”. These historical women provide proof that the light of Christ is the same in the male and the female—to suggest otherwise is to defy scripture and to place limits on the divine power. And “Who is it that dare limit the holy One of Israel?” and “who is it that dares stop Christs mouth? that now is come to reign in his sons & daughters” (5).

In To the Priests and People of England (1655), the Quaker women Priscilla Cotton and Mary Cole also argue in favor of the spiritual equality of men and women. In this work, written during a period of imprisonment in Exeter gaol, Cotton and Cole explicitly address the Pauline injunctions to “Let your women keep silence in the churches” and “Let the woman learn in silence with all subjection”. They reinterpret these texts to make them consistent with other passages that imply that it is permissible for women to speak or prophesy. Cotton and Cole say

thou tellest the people, Women must not speak in the Church, whereas it is not spoke onely of a Female, for we are all one both male and female in Christ Jesus, but it's weakness that is the woman by the Scriptures forbidden, for else thou puttest the Scriptures at a difference in themselves … for the Scriptures do say, that all the Church may prophesie one by one, and that women were in the Church, as well as men, do thou judge; and the Scripture saith, that a woman may not prophesie with her head uncovered, lest she dishonour her head (Cotton & Cole 1655,6–7).

Their point is that the Bible endorses a woman's capacity for equal spiritual authority and her entitlement to speak in church and to prophesy. In light of these endorsements, they say, a different interpretation must be given to those injunctions that suggest women must not speak. Instead we must interpret “woman” to mean “weakness”, and accept that womanliness can be a property of both males and females. As an example, they highlight 1 Corinthians 11:4–5, the warning that “Every man praying or prophesying, having his head covered, dishonoureth his head. But every woman that prayeth or prophesieth with her head uncovered, dishonoureth her head”. According to Cotton and Cole, this passage might be re-interpreted in a positive light. Both males and females may speak in church, but if they speak then they “must be covered with the covering of the Spirit”—they must be in the light, as it were. If they are not in the light, then they speak as “women” regardless of their actual gender: they speak, that is, with a lack of authority or with carnal weakness rather than spiritual strength.

Similar arguments can be found in Sarah Blackborow's Just and Equall Ballance Discovered (1660), Fox's Concerning Sons and Daughters (1661), Dorothy White's A Call from God out of Egypt (1662), Katherine Evans' A Brief Discovery of God's Eternal Truth (1663), and Fell's own work, A Call to the Universal Seed.

3.3 Arguments of Womens Speaking Justified

In light of these earlier defences, Fell's Womens Speaking Justified is rather unoriginal in terms of content. But Trevett claims that “it is special in the thoroughness of that appeal to Biblical precedent, in its sometimes cautious, but often spirited, case for women, in its criticism of Church and clergy, and in its optimism” (Trevett 1991, 54). In this work—first published in 1666, and then with a new postscript in 1667—Fell brings together many of the different argumentative strategies used in the aforementioned Quaker texts. She reinterprets key scriptural passages, she provides numerous examples of biblical women speakers, she draws out the egalitarian implications of the doctrine of the light, and she appeals to anti-clerical and anti-authoritarian Quaker principles. In short, she presents one of the “most comprehensively argued” Quaker defences of female preaching in her time (Trevett 1991, 54).

3.3.1 Spiritual equality

Fell's primary concern is to establish “how God himself hath manifested his Will and Mind concerning women, and unto women” (Fell 1667c, 3). Toward this end, she examines significant passages about women in both the Old and New Testaments. In the beginning (in Genesis 1:27), she notes, God joined male and female together in his own image and made no distinction between the sexes: he “put no such difference between Male and Female as men would make” (Fell 1667c, 3). Following the fall, this spiritual equality between the sexes was compromised. The Serpent approached Eve, discerning that she was “more inclinable” to listen to him; and then, together with Adam, she was “tempted into the transgression and disobedience” (3, 4). But when Eve tells God the truth about the temptation and confesses her sin, God passes sentence on the Serpent: “I will put enmity between thee and the Woman,” he says, “and between thy Seed and her Seed” (4). In Fell's view, these words (from Genesis 3:15) foretell the special role that women would play in the restoration of humankind. The “Seed of the Woman” refers to Christ himself, who is the Son of God “made of a woman”, the Virgin Mary (4). Those who prevent the Seed (or the inner light) of the Woman from speaking, Fell says, prevent the message of Christ:

Those that speak against the Power of the Lord, and the Spirit of the Lord speaking in a woman, simply, by reason of her Sex, or because she is a Woman, not regarding the Seed, and Spirit, and Power that speaks in her; such speak against Christ, and his Church, and are of the Seed of the Serpent, wherein lodgeth enmity. (5)

In Fell's view, the coming of Christ returns the spiritual standing of men and women to that of “the first Creation”. Once again, the sexes are on an equal footing because they each have the spirit or the light of Christ manifest within them: his “Spirit is poured upon all flesh, both Sons and Daughters” (12). Following the redemption, the “Lord hath manifested himself and his Power, without respect of Persons” (12), and “Christ in the Male and in the Female is one” (13).

Fell thus severely criticizes those men or “blind Priests” who “pervert the Apostles Words, and corrupt his intent” by “contemning and despising” women in order to prevent them from speaking in church (10, 14). To prevent a woman from speaking is to limit the power of Christ “whose Power and Spirit is infinite, that is pouring it upon all flesh” (12). She sees the priests' tendency as part of a larger tendency of “the spirit of Darkness” (i.e. the state-sanctioned church) to prevent both Quaker men and women from spreading the message of God. Fell foretells of a new age dawning “which brings freedom and liberty” (11), and in which all those who are in the spirit of the Lord (men as well as women) can speak freely, without prejudice and persecution. In this sense, her book is (implicitly, at least) a continuation of her fight for liberty of conscience and the rights of “free-born English men and women” in her other works (Fell 1664, 1).

3.3.2 Biblical exempla

To validate her claims, Fell appeals to biblical examples of good and wise women, such as the woman of Samaria, Martha and Mary (the sisters of Lazarus), and the woman who poured precious ointment on Christ's head, as well as Priscilla, Deborah, Huldah, Sarah, Anna the Prophetess, Miriam, Elizabeth, Mary, Ruth, Rachel, Leah, the Queen of Sheba, Esther (or Hester), Judith, the wise woman of Abel, and the daughters of Philip. These women provide historical proof that God gave his spirit to women as well as men. But Fell singles out Mary Magdalene, Joanna, and Mary (mother of James)—the women who first delivered the news of Christ's resurrection to the apostles—for special mention. If these women had not exhibited the virtues of love and loyalty to Christ, Fell says, then “what had become of the Redemption of the whole body of Mankind?” (Fell 1667c, 7). In essence, she offers a pragmatic argument for permitting women to speak in church. If the apostles had not listened to women, then the restitution of humanity would never have come about. Women clearly have a special providential role to play in spreading the word of the Lord. If ministers do not permit women to speak in church, then terrible consequences might follow.

3.3.3 Scriptural exegesis

In light of Fell's points about women's spiritual equality with men and their special role in redemptive history, she advises her readers to re-interpret or re-contextualize those common injunctions against women's speaking in the Bible. She begins with 1 Corinthians 14:34, “Let your women keep silence in the churches”. In a passage preceding this statement, Fell points out, “the Man is commanded to keep silence as well as the woman, when they are in confusion and out of order” (8). The apostle's words apply only to those women who are in “strife, confusion and malice in their speaking” (9)—those women who were “under the Law, and in that Transgression as Eve was” (8). But his words do not apply to those women who have the “Everlasting Gospel to preach, and upon whom the Promise of the Lord is fulfilled” (9)—they do not apply to those who have turned to the light.

In “A further Addition” to the main text, Fell extends her analysis to 1 Timothy 2:11, “Let Women learn in silence, with all subjection”. Her argument proceeds by way of simple modus tollens. If this injunction applied to all women, she says, then no woman would be permitted to speak. But the apostle does permit women to speak—he explicitly mentions the four virgin daughters of Philip (Acts 21:9), who were respected as prophets. “And was it not prophesied in Joel 2. that Hand maids should Propesie [sic]? And are not Hand-maids women?” (14). Therefore, some women must be permitted to speak. To explain the apostle's command to silence, Fell suggests that “here you ought to make a distinction what sort of Women are forbidden to speak” (13). The reader ought to distinguish between those women who are mere “busie-bodies, and tatlers” (13) and those women who have the spirit of the Lord. We might also consider the idea that a woman's “husband” in this passage is in fact Christ himself, and that if a woman learns from this Husband, then she ought to be permitted to speak (17).

In a “Postscript” to the 1667 edition, Fell once again addresses those “dark Priests” who are “so mad against Womens Speaking” (18). She refers to the example of Deborah (Judges 5), a woman leader who sung and praised God in “glorious triumphing expressions” (18). Fell points out the hypocrisy of those priests who forbid women to preach and yet include the words of Deborah in their sermons. She scorns those who “make a Trade of Womens words to get money by, and take Texts, and Preach Sermons upon Womens words; and still cry out, Women must not speak, Women must be Silent” (16). These priests are being blatantly contradictory: they allow that women can speak the word of God, and yet they deny that women can speak the word of God.

At this point, it might also be noted that Fell's works were often intended to be read aloud, and so we must be aware of a certain performative aspect to Womens Speaking. The author's argument achieves its greatest force when it is spoken or performed. This is because the very act of saying the words establishes the conclusion of Fell's argument—the idea that women are capable of speaking the word of the Lord. The onus then falls on her critics to point out where she speaks in ignorance. But given that she repeats the same scriptural passages that they themselves use (her arguments rely on premises they would accept), then there would appear to be little comeback.

4. Other Quaker defences of women's preaching

Fell's arguments are echoed in the works of later Quaker women. In 1683, Elizabeth Bathurst published The Sayings of Women (1683), the only other seventeenth-century tract after Fell's to be “exclusively devoted to the vindication of women's speaking” (Apetrei 2010, 174). Like Womens Speaking, this work is more than just a collection of quotations from the Bible: it is intended to show that, following Christ's restitution of humanity, women once again share a spiritual equality with men. In the “Postscript” to this work, Bathurst contrasts the state of women after the fall with the state of women following Christ's redemption. She points out that “As by Woman came in the Transgression and Degeneration; So by Woman also came the Reconciliation and Restoration, to wit, Christ, who came of the Woman's Seed” (Bathurst 1683, 24). Like Fell, Bathurst highlights the fact that women play a special role in redemptive history and, with the coming of Christ, “Male and Female are made all one” (24).

Other Quaker women who assert the spiritual equality of men and women include Anne Docwra in her Epistle of Love (1683), Dorcas Dole in Once more a Warning (1683), and an anonymous author in “A Seventeenth-Century Quaker Women's Declaration” (c. 1675–80), a piece that may have been the work of Fell's daughter, Sarah (Speizman & Kronick, 1975).

5. Criticisms of Quaker defences of women

Modern critics identify several problems with describing Quaker defences of women as “feminist”. They point to the fact that, despite their affirmations of spiritual equality, the Quakers still uphold a negative conception of sexual difference, they suggest that women preachers must typically transcend or efface their female sexuality, and they do not call for wider socio-political changes for women.

5.1 Denigration of natural women

In some Quaker texts, for example, “woman” or “womanliness” is redefined to mean weakness and carnal wisdom by contrast with strength and spiritual wisdom. In To The Priests and People, Cotton and Cole identify womanliness with weakness, vanity, shame, and dishonor. They insult the priests who visit them in prison by saying that “you your selves are the women, that are forbidden to speak in the Church” (Cotton & Cole 1655, 7–8). In response, Gill (2005) notes that

there is a problem with accusing enemies with possessing ‘feminine’ weakness. Such an argument retains categories of gender difference, thereby assigning them continued significance. Masculine characteristics remain preferable to those associated with women. (52; cf. also Trevett 1991, 50).

In short, these Quaker writers continue to perpetuate a male-biased tradition in Western religion according to which femaleness is symbolically coded as inferior, imperfect, and “less divine” than maleness (cf. Tuana 1993). They implicitly accept the prejudices of their misogynist critics, such as Joshuah Miller and John Knox, who maintain that women are physically weak and mentally feeble by nature.

Another, closely related, problem is that in some Quaker texts natural women themselves are not permitted to preach the word of the Lord. Smith (1982) points out that “Women functioned as the vessels for Christ's teaching, not as speakers for themselves” (70). Women are permitted to speak only insofar as they are instruments or bearers of the light. According to Gill, the Quaker women “seem to be attempting to divorce spirituality from physicality, claiming the message should be attended to rather than the person delivering it” (Gill 2005, 42). But this separation between the spiritual and the physical is problematic. Spiritually speaking, the body of the female preacher is simply irrelevant to the delivery of the message; while physically speaking, the female preacher still represents all that which is despicable and unworthy of God. In sum, it would appear that the early Quaker defenders of women's preaching either ignore or denigrate a woman's sexed body.

5.2 Limitations to egalitarianism

Other critics (Smith 1982; Broad & Green 2009) point out that the Quakers' egalitarian approach to female ministry is built upon a purely religious conception of what makes all human beings equal. The problem is that this spiritual equality does not automatically translate into political equality for women in a more general sense. Smith (1982) notes that Fell's defence of women's speaking did not “include a questioning of other aspects of sexual hierarchy” (96). In response to 1 Timothy 2:11–12 (“I suffer not a woman to teach, nor to usurp authority over the man”), Fell writes that

Here the Apostle speaks particularly to a Woman in Relation to her Husband, to be in subjection to him, and not to teach, nor usurp authority over him, and therefore he mentions Adam and Eve: But let it be strained to the utmost, as the opposers of Womens Speaking would have it, that is, That they should not preach nor speak in the Church, of which there is nothing here. (Fell 1667, 9)

Here Fell implicitly accepts the husband's authority over the wife's within marriage. Her stand on women's preaching is not meant to challenge hierarchical relations within the marital institution, it challenges only women's subordinate position in the church. Smith sees this as a pattern in sectarian women's texts of the seventeenth-century:

Most female religious writers simply ignored political or feminist topics. Even Margaret Fell Fox, one of the most forceful supporters of women's being able to speak in Quaker meetings, argued in Women's Speaking Justified … that they should never speak in a way that would usurp authority over men. For the large majority of women writing religious tracts during the seventeenth century, the question of women's rights simply never arose. (Smith 1982, 70)

Along the same lines, Broad and Green (2009, 172–79) point out that there is no necessary inference from the Quaker theory of spiritual equality to the view that women as well as men ought to have equal access to social goods, such as education. The Quakers' arguments do not logically lead to equal education for women, because women do not require an education in order to attain salvation or to be in the spirit of the Lord. Their arguments do not logically lead to equal employment opportunities or full political participation for women either, because it is only necessary that women be active and employed in religious matters. In short, the Quaker theory of sexual equality does not amount to a fully articulated feminist theory of political equality.

5.3 Response to criticisms

Nevertheless, the charge of denigrating the female sex cannot be levelled at Margaret Fell herself. Feroli (2006, 149–50) highlights the fact that Fell's arguments in favour of women's preaching do not efface the significance of the female body. In Womens Speaking Justified, Fell supports her case for female spiritual authority by appealing to the Virgin Mary's vital role in salvation history. By virtue of her maternal power, Fell emphasizes, Mary gave birth to the “Seed of the Woman”: “the holy Ghost came upon her, and the holy thing that was born of her, was called the Son of God”, and Christ was “made of a woman” (Fell 1667c, 12, 4). Here Fell upholds a positive conception of sexual difference, according to which the female body is integral (rather than irrelevant) to the bringing of Christ's message. In addition, Fell also valorizes the women who spread the message of Christ's resurrection. These women exhibit admirable character traits or virtues, such as love and loyalty to Christ: their hearts were “united and knit unto him in love”, and they “could not depart as the men did, but sat watching and waiting, and weeping about the Sepulchre” (7). The woman who pours ointment on Christ's head also demonstrates that she “knew more of the secret Power and Wisdom of God, then his Disciples did” (5). In such instances, women are not required to transcend or efface their natural womanhood in order to be admirable, and they are not mere vessels for the message of Christ—they have their virtues regardless, as natural women. Hence Feroli says that Fell's text “not only affirms the theological point that women may speak in the church but also attempts to change general perceptions of women's abilities” (Feroli 2006, 151). Her text challenges negative stereotypes of women as mentally and morally inferior to men.

More generally, it might be noted that when the Quakers defend a woman's right to speak with religious authority, they are also (implicitly, at least) defending a natural woman's ability to choose freely to live in the light. In her millenarian “calls to the Jews”, For Manasseth Ben Israel and A Loving Salutation, Fell emphasizes that while the spirit of the Lord might be divinely implanted, turning to the light requires a certain capacity for discernment, a firm resolution of will, and a natural bravery and courage on the part of the individual. First, “hearkening diligently” to the inner light requires the subject actively to discern what is necessary for her salvation. An individual must be capable of understanding or recognising what is her true good, such as “Eternall peace” (Fell 1656c, 5) or the divine “Inheritance” (Fell 1656a, 8). Second, hearkening requires that the subject show due attention to the voice of the Lord within, by an exercise of free will: the individual must will herself to “turn” her eyes or “incline” her ears (Fell 1656a, 3). And third, hearkening requires strength of moral character—not only because the light reproaches the individual with her own sin, but because turning to the light may require contradicting one's spiritual teachers.  The light “lets you see the thoughts of your hearts, that they are vaine, which light lets you see when you doe amisse, when you tell a lye, when you doe wrong to any man” (Fell 1656a, 2). This knowledge will “rip you up and lay you open … and make all the deceit of your heart appear” (Fell 1656c, 7). The individual must be brave and steadfast to face up to such sinfulness. She must also reflect critically on what she may have been taught to believe by family and friends, especially those conventions concerning outward worship and outward appearances. In short, by affirming that women preachers can be in the light, Fell implicitly affirms that natural women are capable of asserting their intellect and will in order to attain salvation, even if that means defying their fathers, husbands, or other male spiritual guides.

6. Conclusion: Fell's place in history of feminism

In this last respect, Fell and her fellow Quakers anticipate the ideas and arguments of later seventeenth-century feminists, such as Mary Astell and Damaris Masham. These later women build on the basic Protestant insight that a woman's salvation depends upon herself alone and her own independent capacity for reflection on her beliefs. They call on women to avoid blind obedience to human religious authority and they assert a woman's capacity to discern moral and religious truths for herself. But their arguments are also based on an egalitarian concept of reason—or the idea that men and women have the same natural capacity for rational judgment—and not the idea that women are spiritually equal to men by virtue of a supernatural light. It is reason, according to Astell and Masham, that is the “Candle of the Lord” in all human beings. They therefore emphasize that in order to attain everlasting happiness through virtue, women must be properly educated in order to improve their rational faculties. In later centuries, these part-secular, part-religious ideas about reason and education would evolve into calls for social and political equality for women.

Margaret Fell is not an advocate of an egalitarian concept of reason or a supporter of equal educational opportunities for women. Her arguments in favour of female preaching rest on a principle of spiritual equality, or the idea that both men and women have the supernatural light of Christ within them. But for Fell, the ability to hearken to that light implicitly requires that women possess a natural capacity to discern the truth for themselves, to exercise strength of will, and to exhibit moral virtue or excellence of character. In these respects, Fell's arguments for female preaching contain an implicit feminist challenge to negative perceptions about women's moral and intellectual abilities in her time. On these grounds, we might conclude that her writings constitute something of a bridge between the querelle des femmes of the late-medieval period and the later feminist arguments of figures such as Astell and Masham.

Bibliography

Primary literature

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  • Fell, M., 1655, False Prophets, Anticrists, Deceivers, Which are in the World, which John Prophesied of, which hath been long hid and Covered. But now is unmasked in these last dayes with the Eternal Light which is risen … By M. Fell, London: Giles Calvert.
  • Fell, M., 1656a, A Loving Salutation to The seed of Abraham among the Jewes: where ever they are scattered up and down upon the face of the earth, London: Thomas Simmons.
  • Fell, M., 1656b, A Testimonie of the Touchstone, for all Professions, and all Forms, and Gathered Churches (as they call them) of what sort soever to try their ground and foundation by. And a Tryal by the Scriptures, who the False Prophets are, which are in the world, which John said should be in the last times by Margret Fell. Also, some of the Ranters Principles Answered, London: Thomas Simmons.
  • Fell, M., 1656c, For Manasseth Ben Israel. The Call of the Jewes out of Babylon. Which is good tidings to the Meek, Liberty to the Captives, and for the opening of the Prison Doores, London: Giles Calvert.
  • Fell, M., 1659a, To the General Councel, and Officers of the English Army, And to every Member in particular, London: Thomas Simmons.
  • Fell, M., 1659b, To the General Council of Officers. The Representation of divers Citizens of London, and others Well-affected to the Peace and Tranquility of the Commonwealth, London: John Clowes.
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  • Fell, M., 1660c, An Evident Demonstration to Gods Elect, Which clearly manifesteth to them, I. How necessary and expedient it is for them to come to witnesse true faith. II. That after they have attained to the faith, it must be tried as gold is tried in the fire. III. It shews how many have departed from the faith and denied it. IV. That the standing of the Saints is by faith in the Son of God. V. How strong Abraham was in the faith, and how all that believe are to look unto him. By Margret Fell, London: Thomas Simmons.
  • Fell, M., 1660d, This is to the Clergy Who are the Men that goes about to settle Religion (As they say) according to the Church of England. Whether they be Bishops or Presbyters, or what Name soever they may go under, London: Robert Wilson.
  • Fell, M., 1660e, This was given to Major Generall Harrison and the rest. Read this in the Fear of the Lord, and in the moderation of Your spirits, without prejudice, London: Thomas Simmons.
  • Fell, M., 1660f, A True Testimony From the People of God: (Who by the world are called Quakers) of the Doctrines of the Prophets, Christ, and the Apostles; which is witnessed unto, by them who are now raised up by the same Power, and quickned by the same Spirit and Blood of the Everlasting Covenant, which brought again our Lord Jesus from the dead, London: Robert Wilson.
  • Fell, M., 1664, To the Magistrates and People of England where this may come, London: n.p.
  • Fell, M., 1665a, A Call to the Universall Seed of God, Throughout the whole World, to Come up to the Place of Publick Worship, which Christ Jesus the great Prophet hath set up, who took not upon Him the nature of Angels, but the seed of Abraham, whereby he comes to raise up Adams House and fallen State, into an Estate that shall never fall, London: n.p.
  • Fell, M., 1665b, “John Wigan, this in Answer to part of thy Appendix,” in Thomas Curwen, et al., This is An Answer to John Wiggans Book, Spread up and down in Lancashire, Cheshire, and Wales, who is a Baptist & a Monarchy-man, London: n.p., pp. 86-122.
  • Fell, M., 1666, A Letter Sent to the King From M. F. Here is also thereunto Annexed a Paper written unto the Magistrates in 1664, which was then Printed, and should have been dispersed, but was prevented by wicked hands, London: n.p.
  • Fell, M., 1667a, The Standard of the Lord Revealed. By which He hath led and guided and preserved his people since Adam to this day, as is manifested through the Scriptures, and is shewed forth in this following Abstract…. Given forth at Lancaster Castle 11 month 1665/6. By M.F. a Prisoner of the Lord, London?: n.p.
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  • Fell, M., 1667c, Womens Speaking Justified, Proved and Allowed of by the Scriptures. All such as speak by the Spirit and Power of the Lord Jesus. And how Women were the first that preached the Tidings of the Resurrection of Jesus, and were sent by Christ's Own Command, before He ascended to the Father, John 20.17, second edition, London: n.p.
  • Fell, M., 1668, A Call unto the Seed of Israel, That They may come out of Egypts Darkness, and House of Bondage, unto the Land of Rest. Also The Righteous Law of God Justified. With an Epistle to all those, whose desires are after the Truth as it is in Jesus where ever they are Scattered. Also Twenty five Queries to all the Worlds Priests and People that say, the Light of Christ is Natural, By M.F., London: Robert Wilson.
  • Fell, M., 1671, “A few Lines concerning Josiah Coale,” in The Books And Divers Epistles Of the Faithful Servant of the Lord Josiah Coale; Collected and Published, as it was desired by him the Day of his departure out of this Life, London: n.p., pp. 25–26.
  • Fell, M., 1677, The Daughter of Sion Awakened, And putting on Strength: She is Arising and shaking her self out of the Dust, and putting on her Beautiful Garments, M.F., London: n.p.
  • Fell, M., 1679, “Friend, Whosoever thou art,” in S. Crisp, An Epistle to Friends Concerning the Present and Succeeding Times, third edition, London: n.p., pp. 3–6.
  • Fell, M., 1690, “Margaret Fox's Testimony concerning dear William Carter,” in The Memory of That Faithful Servant of Christ William Carter, Late of Cumberland (Deceased,) Revived. In the Testimonies of Certain Faithful Friends given concerning him, his Faithful Ministry and Blessed End, London: Thomas Northcott, p. 7.
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Secondary literature

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  • Thickstun, M. O., 1995, “Writing the Spirit: Margaret Fell's Feminist Critique of Pauline Theology”, Journal of the American Academy of Religion, 63(2): 269–79.
  • –––, 1992, “ ‘This was a Woman that Taught’: Feminist Scriptural Exegesis in the Seventeenth Century”, Studies in Eighteenth-Century Culture, 21: 149-158.
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Astell, Mary | equality | feminism, approaches to | Locke, John | Masham, Lady Damaris | toleration

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