Medieval Theories of Future Contingents

First published Thu Jun 15, 2006; substantive revision Thu Oct 22, 2015

The philosophical debate concerning the truth-value of singular statements about future contingents derives from Chapter 9 of Aristotle's treatise De interpretatione (Peri hermeneias). In Chapters 7–8, Aristotle deals with the contradictory pairs of assertoric statements which divide truth and falsity so that one is true and the other is false. In Chapter 9 he raises the question of whether this holds for all assertoric statements or whether there might be an exception with respect to statements about singular future events or states of affairs which are neither necessary nor impossible and hence may take place, or may not. Aristotle's famous example is tomorrow's sea battle. Is the prediction ‘There will be a sea battle tomorrow’ necessarily true, if it is true, and does its truth entail that the sea battle is inevitable? After a discussion of deterministic arguments and the absurdity of fatalism (18a34–19a22), Aristotle gives his ambiguous reply in 19a23–39. Boethius's (c. 480–524) Latin translation of De interpretatione had a long commentary tradition through the Middle Ages, beginning from the eleventh century. Boethius's own two commentaries were very influential as well and provided information about other ancient commentaries (Magee 2010). Chapter 9 was also dealt with in theological commentaries on Peter Lombard's Sentences (I.38) and in separate treatises (Isaac 1953; Lohr 1967–1974; Craig 1988; Marenbon 1993; Braakhuis and Kneepkens 2003; Knuuttila 2010). Al-Farabi's (c. 870–950) commentary on De interpretatione was influential in medieval Arabic philosophy; Averroes (1126–1198) wrote another Arabic commentary. (For future contingents in medieval Arabic thought, see Marmura 1985; Adamson 2006.)

1. From Aristotle to Boethius

The debate about future contingents in modern philosophical logic was revived by J. Łukasiewicz's works on three-valued logic (1957, 1967). He thought that in order to avoid fatalistic consequences, one should admit that the principle of bivalence (for any proposition p, either p is true or p is false) does not hold good for future contingent propositions. Arguing that this was realized by Aristotle in Chapter 9 of De interpretatione, Łukasiewicz attempted to formalize Aristotle's position by introducing a third truth-value (neither true nor false) for future contingent propositions and giving three-valued truth-tables for truth-functional basic connectives. Many authors have followed Łukasiewicz in taking Aristotle to restrict the principle of bivalence, though they have not ascribed to Aristotle the details of Łukasiewicz's system, which is problematic in many respects. In arguing for the deterministic consequences of unrestricted bivalence, Łukasiewicz himself assumed, and took Aristotle to assume, that the truth of a proposition entails the necessity of its truth. Logical determinism, therefore, is to be avoided by qualifying the truth-values of future contingent propositions. The critics of this view do not see any entailment relation between truth and necessity, some of them maintaining that the illusion of logical determinism has its roots in a tacit oscillation between a temporal and atemporal predication of truth. The temporalized reading may be associated with diachronic determination, certainty, necessity and other time-dependent qualifications. Mixing these with non-deterministic atemporal predications yields the wrong idea of fatalism (von Wright 1984, 52–67). It is also argued that even the temporalized predication of truth carries no deterministic implications. (Sorabji 1980, 96–103; Sorabji's example is that ‘even if it has already been true that I am going to swim, I still retain the power to make it to have been false’.)

The majority of Aristotelian scholars believe that the argument in De interpretatione 9 aims at avoiding fatalism by restricting bivalence with respect to future contingent predictions (Frede 1970, 1985; Sorabji 1980; Craig 1988; Gaskin 1995; Crivelli 2004; Weidemann 2012). The second interpretation insists that Aristotle's point is not to deny the truth-value of these statements, but their being true in the same way as other statements are true. The difference is that while the truth of other statements is necessary, the truth of future contingent predictions is not yet similarly determined. This interpretation is associated with Aristotle's remark that not everything which is actual and therefore necessary is necessary without qualification (19a23). This is taken to mean that the necessity of an event at a certain time does not imply that it was inevitable. Aristotle speaks about singular future possibilities which may be realized or remain unrealized and which may or may not cease to be antecedent possibilities. (See De int. 19a13–17, EN III.5, 1114a17–19, Met. VI.3.) In the same way predictions may begin to be necessarily true or necessarily false. (For various versions of this approach, see Anscombe 1956; Rescher 1963; Hintikka 1973; Fine 1984; Judson 1988.)

The former interpretation, which restricts bivalence with respect to future contingent statements, is called the ‘traditional’ or ‘standard’ interpretation. Some Stoics read Aristotle in this way, as Boethius reports in his second commentary on Aristotle's De interpretatione:

Now some people – the Stoics among them – thought that Aristotle says that future contingents are neither true nor false. For they interpreted his saying that nothing [of that sort] is disposed more to being than to not being as meaning that it makes no difference whether they are thought false or true; for they considered them to be neither true nor false [in Aristotle's view], but falsely. (In Periherm. II, 208.1–4, trans. by N. Kretzmann.)

On the basis of a note in Simplicius's commentary on Aristotle's Categories (407.6–13), it is argued that some Aristotelians also qualified the principle of bivalence. (For this and other ancient deviations from the principle, see Sorabji 1980, 92–93.) On the other hand, future contingent propositions were treated as true or false in Stoic logic. The Stoics took the universally valid principle of bivalence to imply the predetermination of all future events. (See Cicero, De fato, 20–21; Bobzien 1998, 59–86.)  

Boethius regarded the Stoic interpretation of Aristotle's view as mistaken, his interpretation being based on the terms ‘definitely’ true or false and ‘indefinitely’ true or false. These same terms were also used in Ammonius's commentary (c. 435/445–517/526). Since this work was not known to Boethius, both authors seem to have known some earlier Greek discussions in which these qualifications were introduced. (Ammonius's Greek commentary on De interpretatione 9 is translated by D. Blank and Boethius's Latin commentaries by N. Kretzmann in the same volume, with interpretative essays by R. Sorabji, N. Kretzmann and M. Mignucci in 1998.) The contemporary reconstructions of what Ammonius and Boethius meant can be divided into two groups. According to one interpretation, Ammonius and Boethius ascribe to Aristotle the view that the predictions of future contingent events and their denials differ from other contradictory pairs, because truth and falsity are not definitely distributed between them and the propositions are consequently neither definitely true nor definitely false. In answering the Stoic criticism, Boethius might have thought that future contingent propositions have the disjunctive property of being true-or-false, which would mean something other than simply lacking a truth value. (For various interpretations of how Boethius restricted bivalence, see Frede 1985; Craig 1988; Gaskin 1995; Kretzmann 1998.) Another interpretation holds that Boethian future contingents are not definitely true or false, because their truth-makers are not yet determined, but are true or false in an indeterminate way. No qualification of the principle of bivalence is involved. True statements are either definitely true or simply (indefinitely) true or false (Mignucci 1988, 1998; Seel 2000; Beets 2003 for Boethius's first commentary). According to both interpretations, Ammonius and Boethius assumed that the definite truth of predictions directly implies determinism and that Aristotle denied the definite truth of all future contingent propositions; it is less clear how they understood the indefinite truth of these (Sorabji 1998). Boethius's formulations often suggest that future contingent propositions are true-or-false. One reason for avoiding to treat them as simply true or false is his view of the necessity of the present. In commenting on Aristotle's remark that ‘What is necessarily is when it is’ (De interpretatione 19a23), Boethius explains that even though present things are temporally or conditionally necessary, they may be generically or antecedently contingent (In Periherm. I, 121.20–122.4; II, 241.7–243.28). He apparently thinks that the truth of future contingent statements implies that things cannot be otherwise, for the assumed actuality of the relevant truth-makers means that alternative prospectives are rendered temporally impossible.

In his longer commentary on De interpretatione, Boethius says of God that ‘he knows future events as happening contingently and not necessarily so that he does not ignore the possibility that something else might take place’ (In Periherm. II, 226.9–12). Boethius also stresses that since the truth of future contingents is not accessible to humans, the predictions of the form ‘A sea battle will take place tomorrow’ are false in the sense that they assert the truth of something that cannot be known (In Periherm. II, 211.26–213.18). In his later treatise Consolatio philosophiae Boethius states that ‘I do not think that anybody would say that those things which are happening now were not going to happen before they happened’ (V. 4.19) In this treatise, Boethius argues that God has timeless knowledge of everything. God's knowledge is not foreknowledge, since it is not temporally located, but the predictions of future contingents are true or false from the point of view of God's eternal knowledge of the things referred to (V.6, 25–32; see also Augustine, City of God 11.21). (See Sharples 2009; Marenbon 2013.) According to Boethius, it is necessary that if God knows that p, then p. This ‘conditional necessity’ does not imply the ‘simple necessity’ of p (Consolatio philosophiae V, 6.27–30). Some medieval authors read this distinction in Boethius and Augustine as a modal placement solution to the problem of foreknowledge and free will (Matthews 2004). Thomas Aquinas, for example, refers to Boethius's distinction using the terms necessitas consequentiae and necessitas consequentis (Summa contra gentiles I.67; De veritate I.23, ad 13). 

2. Medieval Developments from Abelard to Aquinas

In discussing statements such as ‘What is known by God necessarily takes place’, Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109) distinguished between the antecedent and consequent necessity of things which are known. The latter is the necessity of a thing's actuality which is caused by the actuality of the thing itself. The former is the necessity by which a thing exists because of an external cause (Cur Deus homo 2.17, 125.6–126.2). Neither antecedent knowledge nor antecedent truth has a compelling effect on things. In explaining Mary's believing the truth of a prophetic statement concerning the death of Christ, Anselm writes:

Therefore, since her faith was true faith it was necessary that things would be as she believed. But if you are once again disturbed by my saying “It was necessary…”, then remember that the truth of the virgin's faith was not the cause of his dying freely but that her faith was true faith because this was going to happen. (Cur Deus homo 2.17, 124.27–125.3)

Anselm thought that future contingent statements based on divine revelation were true without deterministic implications. A similar view was held by most medieval theologians when they addressed divine omniscience and prophesy.

William of Champeaux (c. 1070–1122) dealt with an argument against the compatibility between contingency and divine omniscience which was discussed in Augustine's City of God (V.9). In response to Cicero's De fato and De divinatione, Augustine refuted the claim that if events can happen in any way other than God has foreseen, then God can be in error. William stated that the antecedent of the argument is true but the consequent is false and therefore the consequence is not valid (Lottin 1959, 195; Marenbon 1997, 226–227). Peter Abelard (1079–1142/4), in discussing the same example, applied the systematic division between modal statements de sensu or in the compound sense and modal statements de re or in the divided sense. (For Abelard's modal terminology, see Super Perihermenias 3–47. Later authors used the expression de dicto instead of de sensu.) Abelard's analysis of Cicero's argument was often repeated in medieval theology, since it was put forward in slightly modified form in Peter Lombard's Sententiae (c. 1157), which became the standard medieval introduction to theology. Abelard states that when the proposition ‘A thing can be otherwise than God knows it to be’ is read as a modal proposition de sensu, the antecedent is false and the possibility of God's error as a consequent would not follow even if the consequence were valid. When the antecedent is read de re, it is true, but the consequent is false, since if things were otherwise, then God would possess different knowledge of them. This shows that the consequence is not valid. Following Peter Abelard, Peter Lombard formulated the same view in stating that ‘Things cannot be other than as God foreknows them’ is true in the compound sense and false in the divided sense. The truth of the compound sense saves God's infallibility and the falsity of the divided sense expresses God's freedom and the metaphysical contingency of the future (Peter Lombard, Sententiae I.38.2; Peter Abelard, Logica ‘Ingredientibus’, 429.26–430.36; Dialectica, 217.27–219.24). It is assumed here that when a temporally definite statement is true, its denial may be possibly true.

Early medieval logicians could deal with singular future statements as statement types with truth-values changing in accordance with the time of assertion, as in Aristotle and Hellenistic philosophy. (For the prevalence of temporally indefinite sentences in ancient philosophy, see Hintikka 1973, Ch. 4; Bobzien 1998, 66–67, 100–101, 109–111.) In the theological context of timeless divine omniscience, it was more natural to regard these statements as atemporal and temporally definite. Abelard calls statements propositions (propositio) and what is asserted by a statement its dictum. He considered that a statement is true or false when its dictum is true or false. In dealing with prophesy, Abelard suggested that the dictum about a singular event is first expressed by a future tense proposition and then by present and past tense propositions. (For the nature of the dictum, contrasted with the ‘facts’ and ‘propositions’ of twentieth-century philosophical jargon, see Marenbon 1997, 202–209). The view of the atemporal propositional content was developed further by twelfth-century authors who were later called nominales. One of the theses of this group was ‘What is once true is always true.’ (See Iwakuma and Ebbesen 1992, 196, 199–201, 205–206 for the relevant texts. For the history of the principle, see also Marenbon 1992, 58–61 and Ebbesen 1992, 73–74.) This thesis was employed in the discussions of how the beliefs of Abraham and others who lived before the coming of Christ and believed various things about him were the same as the beliefs of those who live after His coming. The reason for asking this was that the previous beliefs were formulated in future tense statements and the latter in present or past tense statements. According to the nominales, one could regard as basic a temporally definite propositional content the meaning of which is expressed by various tensed expressions depending on when they are uttered. While tensed statements about temporally definite singular events have a changing truth-value, the corresponding non-tensed dicta are unchangingly true or false (Nuchelmans 1973, 177–189; for some later examples, see also Nuchelmans 1980; Lewis 1995; Goris 2001). Peter of Poitiers (c. 1130–1205), one of the authors taking this approach, argued that while the singular statements about contingent things are immutably true or false because of God's eternal choice, their unchanging truth-value could be otherwise. God does not know contingent things through tensed statements, since their truth-value is changeable. If God's knowledge is described by using tensed statements, analogously to the articles of faith before and after the coming of Christ, one should read them so that they signify the same (Peter of Poitiers, Sententiae I.7, 133–143; I.12.199–223; I.14.328–253). This became a well-known position, since it was also employed in Peter Lombard's Sententiae (I.39.1; I.41.3.)

The theological formulations by Peter Abelard, Peter Lombard and Peter of Poitiers discussed above exemplify twelfth-century deviations from the Aristotelian thesis ‘What is necessarily is when it is.’ This was traditionally understood as implying the principle of the necessity of the present, which was not questioned in ancient modal theories (Knuuttila 1993, Ch. 1). Since God's knowledge about contingent things was regarded as unchangeable, the contingency of this knowledge (in the sense that it could be different) also implied the denial of the Aristotelian equation of immutability with necessity, a denial regarded as an explicit doctrine of the nominales (Ebbesen and Iwakuma 1992, 194). The new modal paradigm, which is more or less consciously applied in these discussions of God's will, power, and knowledge, could be characterized as the model of simultaneous alternatives. There are three main examples of it in early medieval philosophy. 

Abelard assumes that at a given instant of time, what is actual is necessary as no longer be avoided, but he argues that unrealized alternatives are possible at the same time in the sense that they could have happened at that time. Some of the alternatives of a singular being are real counterfactual alternatives. These are unrealizable because of some previous change in the conditions of the subject, and some are merely imaginable alternatives, such as Socrates's being a bishop, which never had a real basis in things. While often employing traditional ideas about necessity and possibility, Abelard also developed ideas pertaining to simultaneous alternatives. (See Martin 2003; Knuuttila 2008, 537–538.)

Gilbert of Poitiers (1085/90–1154) stressed the idea that natural regularities which are called natural necessities are not absolute, since they are chosen by God and can be overridden by divine power. This had become a widespread theological view in Gilbert's time. Gilbert explained it in the light of the Augustinian view of God's acting by divine will, which chooses between alternative providential plans, and divine omnipotence as an executive power. There is an interesting formulation of Plato's ‘Platonitas’ in Gilbert. This is said to include all of what Plato was, is and will be as well as what he could be but never is. Even though Gilbert does not explain why there is a modal element in the individual concept, it was probably needed in order to speak about Plato in alternative possible histories or, as in Abelard, about Socrates as a bishop. Gilbert seems to have been the first to formulate an individual concept in this way (Marenbon 2007, 158–159).

A third context of the systematic interest in simultaneous alternatives was the new twelfth-century theory that declarative singular statements or their contents should be primarily treated as temporally definite and as having an unchanging truth-value. All propositional contents pertaining to contingent things have a truth-value on the basis of God's eternal choice. These truth-values would be otherwise if the providential design of the world were different in relevant respects. Robert Grosseteste (1168/75–1253) taught that the opposites of actualized contingent things are no longer realizable possibilities, though they are possible alternatives in the sense that they could have been included in God's eternal providential choice. Actual history is an explication of one of the divine alternatives with respect to which things are primarily called necessary, possible or impossible. Necessities and possibilities at this basic level are called modalities ‘from eternity and without beginning’. Mathematical truths exemplify these ‘simple’ necessities. In addition there are necessities and impossibilities which have a beginning and which are eternal contingencies in the sense that they depend on God's free choice (De libero arbitrio 168.26–170.33; 178.28–29). The contingency of the divine acts of knowledge and will is based on an atemporal causal priority between the powers of knowledge and the will and their acts (178.24–26). Grosseteste's views are compared with those of Duns Scotus in Lewis (1996).

This was an innovative theory for dealing with future contingent statements as omnitemporally true or omnitemporally false or, if these were tensed, as antecedently true or antecedently false. The truth-values of statements about contingent things, though temporally immutable from the beginning of the world and also immutably known by God, were metaphysically contingent. The consequence from knowledge or truth to necessity, whether causal or semantic, was denied. The contingency of the created order was taken to be based on God's eternal and free choice, which involved the acts of the created will as free. Anselm formulated this traditional view, following Augustine, as follows: ‘It is both necessary that God foreknows what will come to be and that God foreknows that something will freely come to be’ (De concordia praescientiae et praedestinationis et gratiae Dei cum libero arbitrio, 1.1; cf. Augustine, On Free Choice of the Will, 3.3.8). Anselm argued that that predictions are true or false and their truth can be understood as the correspondence to what will happen, although what will contingently happen is not known to human beings without supernatural help. This was the standard view of the possibility of prophesy. (See the above quotation from Anselm's Cur Deus homo; Peter Abelard, Logica ‘Ingredientibus’, 426–429; Anonymous, Summa Duacensis, 129–130.)

Early medieval authors were well acquainted with the conception of God's eternal and timeless knowledge in Augustine and Boethius. This aspect of the question of the divine knowledge and future contingents became a central issue in Thomas Aquinas. According to Aquinas, God grasps all combinations of things in particular times by one eternal vision. Temporal things are timelessly present to God, who has direct knowledge of them and their relative temporal order in their actuality, though none of them is past or future with respect to His cognition (Sent. I.38.1.4–5; Summa contra gentiles I.66; Summa theologiae I.14.9, 14). Things seen as actual are necessary by supposition (i. e., with respect to God's knowledge and providence), but many of them are contingent with respect to their proximate causes (Sent. I.38.1.5, Summa contra gentiles I.67, Summa theologiae I, 14.13, De veritate 2.12). The ultimate source of the actuality of the created order is the divine will (In Periherm. I.14, 197). The whole of world history is known by God's immutable vision, which includes the knowledge of things which are future contingents in the temporal order. Aquinas assumes, like Boethius and in contrast to Abelard, that the idea of natural truth or falsity of all temporally definite propositions implies that everything happens of necessity (In Periherm. I.13, 173). While prophetic predictions of future contingents are possible through a revelatory participation in divine knowledge, their truth remains a supernatural matter (Summa theologiae II-2, 171.3, 6). Speaking about divine prescience is a temporal projection of the divine mode of knowing. For various interpretations of Aquinas's view, see Wippel 1985: Craig 1988, 99–126; Goris 1996; Marenbon 2005.

Medieval critics found the allegedly Thomist idea of the presence of each instant of time to God's non-temporal eternal vision problematic. (See John Duns Scotus, Lectura I.39.1–5, 23, 27, 85, 87, and further references in Hoenen 1993, 169–70.) One could also ask how Aquinas's view of God's essential simplicity and immutability is compatible with the view that God's eternal choice could be otherwise and the voluntary acts of created beings could be other than what is known by God. (See Stump 2003, 100–127.)

3. Interpreting Aristotle

Mignucci's account of how Ammonius and Boethius understood the distinction between definite and indefinite truth is roughly speaking the same as the explanation of these terms in Peter Abelard's interpretation of De interpretatione 9. Abelard believed that Aristotle assumed that future contingent statements are true or false, though not determinately true or false before the actuality of the things to which they refer (Dialectica 213.17–20). Abelard uses the notions of ‘determinate/indeterminate’ instead of the Boethian ‘definite/indefinite’, as most medieval authors did. He retained the principle of bivalence for all assertoric statements, but rejected the universal application of the stronger principle that every assertoric statement is determinately true or determinately false. According to Abelard, the notions of ‘determinate’ or ‘indeterminate’ apply primarily to the truth-makers of assertions and secondarily to assertions themselves:

But as the obtaining of future contingent states of affairs is indeterminate, similarly the propositions which enunciate these are said to be indeterminately true or false, for those which are true are indeterminately true and those which are false are indeterminately false, in acccordance with the indeterminate obtaining of what is predicted. Dialectica 211.30–32)

Abelard was particularly interested in the question of whether the present truth of statements about future contingent events are themselves determinate; i. e., whether ‘The sentence ‘Socrates will eat tomorrow’ is true’, if true, is determinately true. Denying this, he restricted the principle that all past and present true propositions are determinately true. Abelard also distinguished between determinateness and certainty. Future contingent propositions may be certain if they are revealed by angels, for example, but they are not knowable of themselves and not determinately true. (See Logica ‘Ingredientibus’ 420.12–422.40; Dialectica 211.32–212.23; Lewis 1987.)

The ‘traditional’ view of truth and bivalence in Aristotle is put forward in an anonymous early twelfth-century commentary on De interpretatione, edited by M. Dal Pra, which is often, and probably mistakenly, attributed to Abelard. Applying Boethius's distinction between definitely and indefinitely true statements, the author argues that future contingent statements are merely disjunctively true or false (tantum sub disjunctione); 100.13–19; 112.8–113.3). They are true-or-false.

While Abelard thought that the universal validity of the principle of bivalence was an Aristotelian view, thirteenth-century commentators argued for the traditional interpretation. Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas took Aristotle to be arguing in De interpretatione 9 that if every contradictory pair divides truth and falsity in a determinate way and the members are consequently determinately true or false, all things must determinately be or not be. He then refutes the consequent by referring to various contingent things. It follows that the antecedent cannot be true and future contingent propositions are not determinately true or determinately false. They are true-or-false under disjunction (Albert the Great, Liber Perihermeneias, I.5.4–6, 418–422; Thomas Aquinas, In Aristotelis Peri hermeneias expositio, I.13, 170–172; I.15, 202–203). The same interpretation of Aristotle is found in Arabic commentators Abū Nasr al-Fārābī and Averroes. (See Al-Farabi's Commentary and Short Treatise on Aristotle's De interpretatione, trans. F. Zimmermann, lxviii, 75–76, 78–79, 91–92, 244–245, and Averroes's  Middle Commentary on Aristotle's De interpretatione, 82va.) Al-Fārābī's own view was that future contingents are either true or false (94–96; Marmura 1985, Adamson 2006). Among Latin authors the traditional interpretation of Aristotle's view was put forward by many later commentators such as John Duns Scotus, Quaestiones in libros Perihermenias Aristotelis, I.7–8 (179–181), trans. Buckner and Zupko; Walter Burley, Commentarius in librum Perihermeneias Aristotelis, 92, 95–96; William Ockham, Expositio in Librum Perihermenias Aristotelis I.6.15; Peter Auriol, Sent. I.38.3, 817–828; Gregory of Rimini, Sent. I.38.1.1 (238–243); Peter of Ailly, Quaestiones super Sent. I.11.1A). In his Supercommentary on Averroes's Commentary on Aristotle's De interpretatione, the Jewish philosopher Levi ben Gerson (Gersonides, 1288–1344) states that positing a truth value for future contingents leads to absurdity (83r; Rudavsky 1985, 166). John Buridan read Aristotle in the same way as Abelard. All assertoric statements are true or false though those about future contingents are not determinately true or false (Questiones longe super librum Perihermeneias I.10). Since theologians usually thought that divine omniscience and prophecy presupposed unrestricted bivalence, the discussion of future contingents was divided into historical constructions of Aristotle's view, mostly in accordance with the traditional interpretation, and the systematic discussions in theology which usually followed the Abelardian lines. Later examples of the traditional interpretation of Aristotle's view include George of Brussels, Logica magistri Georgii inserto textu Bricoti, 51rv; Iodocus Trutfetter, Summulae totius logicae  II.1 (LL3v–4v); Veteris artis…Perihermeneiasque expositio (g1r); see also Baudry (1950), 206. (For medieval interpretations, see Weidemann 1994; Gaskin 1995; Knuuttila 2010.)

4. Later Medieval Views

The most influential late medieval approach to future contingents was included in John Duns Scotus's theory of metaphysics as a transcendental science in which the meaning of the univocal notion of being (ens) was defined as ‘that to which to be is not repugnant’. Beings in this metaphysical sense are actual things as well as non-actual possible things, the imagined actuality of which does not include a contradiction. In the Augustinian tradition metaphysical possibilities were ultimately based on the divine essence and represented the ways in which it could be imitated by created things. According to Scotus, when God as an omniscient being knows all possibilities, he does not know them by turning first to his essence. Possibilities can be known in themselves; in fact, they would be what they are even if there were no God. Scotus calls the propositional formulations of pure possibilities logical possibilities (possibile logicum). These express things and states of affairs to which it is not repugnant to be. Possibilities as such have no kind of existence of their own, but are real in the sense that they form the precondition for everything that is or can be. (For Scotus's modal theory, see Vos et al. 1994; Knuuttila 1996; Normore 2003; Honnefelder 2005.) Scotus takes it as an obvious fact that there are contingent states of affairs which could have not been at that very moment of time at which they are (Ord. I.2.1.1–2, 86). This idea of simultaneous alternatives differed from the traditional view of the necessity of the present and played and important role in Scotus's metaphysics.

God's omniscience involves all possibilities and, as objects of God's knowledge, they necessarily receive intelligible or objective being. Some of these are included in God's providential plan of creation and will receive actual being. The description of a possible state of affairs at a certain moment consists of compossible possibilities. Since finite beings are contingently actual, alternative possibilities are possible with respect to the same time, though they are not compossible with what is actual. According to Scotus, impossibilities are incompossibilities between possible ingredients, such as Socrates's sitting at a certain time and Socrates's not sitting at that same time (Lect. I.39.1–5, 62–63; Ord. I.35, 32, 49–51; Ord. I.36, 60–1; Ord. I.43, 5–7, 14).

Scotus's modal metaphysics incorporates many ideas from the early medieval model which was developed by Abelard and the nominales, such as the denial of the necessity of the present, the distinction between immutability and necessity and the universal validity of bivalence. Giving up the Thomistic view of the atemporal presence of the flux of time to God, Scotus explains God's knowledge of the truth-value of future contingent propositions as a knowledge of which of the possible scenarios will be actual (Lect. I.39.1–5, 44). The definite truth-values of the propositions about possible events do not make them necessary, many of these being acts of the will which as a free cause chooses between alternatives without being determined. (See Schwamm 1934; Vos et al. 1994; Söder 1999; for some discussions of Scotus's view of the free acts of the will, see Dumont 2001; Normore 2003, 141–145; Langston 2010.)

William Ockham criticized Scotus's attempt to explain the contingency of God's eternal choice by distinguishing between the instants of nature in God which represent conceptual succession without separation or interval, for example, the instant of the will encountering opposite alternatives and the instant of choosing one of these. (See Sent. I.38.1 (578, 581); Adams 1987, 1130–1136.) Ockham followed Scotus in believing that God's choice could be other than it is, but he was dissatisfied with Scotus's explanation without having any of his own. Ockham also criticized the view that God knows future free acts through his own acts of the will as their ultimate cause, which he, like many of his contemporaries and later commentators, treated as Scotus's position (Sent. I.38.1 (582–583). This was Henry of Ghent's view to which Scotus first subscribed but then qualified his acceptance. (See Hoenen 1993, 177–179; Söder 1999, 177–183; Schabel 2000, 43–46.) He thought that there are many contingent propositions known by God differently such as those about creaturely sins and other acts of free will. (Frost 2010.)

Ockham believed, as Scotus did, that future contingent propositions are true or false, that created wills are non-determined free causes and that God knows contingent events without their being simultaneously present to God. (For Ockham's view and the relevant texts, see Adams and Kretzmann 1983.) While Scotus preferred to distinguish God's eternal knowledge and choice from the temporal order sharply (Lect. I.39.1–2, n. 28, 85; Ord. I.40, n. 8), Ockham thought that they can be treated as temporally past. This led him to ask how God's foreknowledge as something past and hence seemingly necessary is compatible with the contingency of the future things. Ockham's answer was that even though God's foreknowledge is past, its content is future, and the past truth of future contingent propositions does not fall under the necessity of the past (Sent. I.38.1 (587), Tractatus de praedestinatione 515–516). Many influential late thinkers embraced this idea. (See Robert Holkot, Sent. II.2 in Seeing the Future Clearly, 127, 145–146; Gregory of Rimini, Sent. I.38.2.3 (302–303); Pierre d'Ailly, Quaestiones super Sent. I.11.3S.) This is also the hallmark of what is called the Ockhamist view of divine foreknowledge in contemporary philosophical theology (Zagzebski 1991, 66–97).   For texts and studies on late medieval controversies related to foreknowledge and freedom, see Schabel 2000, 2003, 2004, 2007, 2011, 2011a; Schabel, Friedman and Balcoyiannopoulou 2001; Rossini and Schabel 2005; Martin 2004.

Many early fourteenth-century authors were interested in the distinctions between determinate and indeterminate truth and falsity. Ockham characterized all prospective truths, whether necessary or contingent, as immutable and therefore determinate, but there were other suggestions as well (Normore 1982, 1993; Genest 1992; Gelber 2004, 224–250). It was usually thought that while future contingent propositions were neither true nor false in Aristotle, this was not acceptable with respect to divine knowledge. A different view was defended by Peter Auriol who argued that since these propositions lack a truth value, even God is aware of the future in a way which does not imply that future contingent propositions are true or false (Schabel 2000, 67–123). Auriol's position inspired much discussion until early sixteenth century. It came to be regarded as heretical when a Papal commission made a decision about the theses of Peter de Rivo, who defended a view similar to that of Auriol. Some of de Rivo's statements were officially condemned in 1474 by Pope Sixtus IV (Baudry 1950; Schabel 1995, 1996, 2000, 315–336, 2004).

A central question for those who gave up the Thomist view was how God can eternally know the acts of the will which is a free cause? An influential answer was offerred in the theory of middle knowledge by Luis de Molina (1535–1600). In addition to the knowledge of all possibilities and the possibilities which will be actualized in the providentially chosen history, God has a third kind of knowledge (scientia media), which comprises the hypothetical truths about possible beings. In creating the world, God knows what possible creatures would do in any possible situation (Freddoso 1988). Molina's ‘middle knowledge’ theory about counterfactuals of freedom was actively debated in the sixteenth and seventeenth century and has remained a living issue in the philosophy of religion (Dekker 2000).


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