In the usual sense, prophecy involves disclosing some important information that could not have been known to the prophet in any ordinary way. Prophecy is interesting from a philosophical point of view because it introduces interesting questions about divine knowledge, time, and human freedom. Unlike historians or theologians, philosophers rarely argue about what kinds of things have actually been prophesied, or whether or not a given prophecy came true. Instead, they prefer to argue about ideal cases, where the theoretical issues become much more sharp. In this article, we will follow their lead by sidestepping completely the question of whether or not any apparent prophecies are actual ones. We will also avoid the question of the existence of God, which is addressed by a number of other entries in this encyclopedia (see the entries listed in the Related Entries section).
It is often assumed that the primary purpose of prophecy is to foretell the future, but this is not always the case. In the great monotheistic religious traditions (Judaism, Christianity, and Islam), for instance, a prophet is a person who makes God's will particularly clear, whether or not doing so involves making any predictions about the future. As William Hasker says, prophets are usually involved in “witnessing to the people concerning God's purposes and requirements and seeking to recall them to obedience” (Hasker 1989, 194). Questions about how a human person might come to know God's will through some kind of revelation are discussed elsewhere in this encyclopedia, for example in the entries on the epistemology of religion and philosophy and Christian theology.
When philosophers discuss prophecy, they are typically interested in prophecies concerning the contingent future, so that will be the focus in the remainder of this article. What special philosophical issues are raised by this kind of prophecy?
Let's say that a future event is contingent if and only if it is both possible that it happen and possible that it not happen. In other words, future contingent events are not determined to occur and not determined not to occur; they are “up in the air”, so to speak. (For more on the notion of determinism, see the entry on causal determinism.) Now imagine that based upon the revelation of an infallible God, a person prophecies that some future contingent event will occur. Since God cannot be wrong, does it follow that the future contingent event must occur? And if it must occur, how can it be a contingent event?
An especially vivid example of this kind of situation comes from the Christian scriptures. Jesus prophecies that Peter will deny him three times before the cock crows (see Matthew 26:34). Typically, we would think of Peter's denial as a free act, and hence as a contingent event. (For more on this connection, see the entries on compatibilism, free will, and causal determinism.) But since Jesus cannot be mistaken (according to Christian theology), how are Peter's later denials free? Once Jesus' words become part of the unalterable past, don't they guarantee a particular future, whether or not Peter is willing to cooperate?
This problem is an especially interesting instance of the more general problem of the compatibility of God's complete foreknowledge with the existence of future contingent events (for more on this general problem, see the entry on divine foreknowledge and human freedom). Whereas the more general question about God's foreknowledge typically involves just God's knowledge and the future contingent event, the problem of prophecy involves a third element, namely, the prophecy itself, which becomes a part of the past history of the world as soon as it is made. This additional element adds an interesting twist to the general problem, making it more difficult to solve.
Philosophers have responded to this problem in several different ways. One obvious way to respond is simply to claim that there are no future contingent events. Different people have taken this approach for different reasons. Some are attracted to the idea that every event has a prior sufficient cause (see the entry on causal determinism). Others believe that the idea of free choice does not require anything like real contingency or the possibility of doing or intending otherwise (see the entries on compatibilism and free will). Still others believe that God's providential control over the world is so thorough and detailed that nothing is left to chance, not even the apparently free choices of human beings (see the views defended by Calvin, Carson, and Feinberg, for instance, and the entry on divine providence). So one possible response to the difficulty here is simply to give up one half of the problem by denying that there are any future contingent events. To return to our example from the Christian tradition, when Jesus truly prophecies that Peter will deny him three times before the cock crows, there is no philosophical puzzle as long as we do not claim that Peter's denials are contingent events.
Many philosophers and theologians do not find this approach very promising, though, because they believe strongly in future contingent events, especially human free choices. How else might one respond to the problem posed by prophecies concerning future contingent events?
One way of approaching this topic is to deny that God has any knowledge of the contingent future. According to this approach, which has been called the “Open Future” view (see Hasker 1989 and 2004, Basinger and Basinger 1986, Basinger 1994, Pinnock 1986, Pinnock et al 1994, and Rice), there may be future contingent events, but God does not know about them. God does not know about them either because there are no true propositions now that report what future contingent events will occur, or because it is impossible for anyone, including God, to know such true propositions. (Open Future advocates also like to point out that foreknowledge alone would be providentially useless to God: see Hasker (1989, 58). For more on the motivation behind the Open Future view, see the authors mentioned above and Davison 1991 and 2003.) How can the Open Future view explain prophecies in the theistic tradition that appear to make reference to future contingent events?
William Hasker, perhaps the most prominent advocate of the Open Future view, addresses this problem explicitly, and suggests a three-fold response. First, he points out that the main function of prophecy is not to foretell the future, but to reveal God's will (Hasker 1989, 194). Many prophecies, in fact, have a conditional character, such as “If a nation does not do such and such, then it will be destroyed” (see Jeremiah 18:7–10, for example). Second, many prophetic predictions are based upon existing trends and tendencies, which provide God with enough evidence to foresee the future (Hasker 1989, 195). (Hasker places Jesus' prediction about Peter in this category, by the way.) Finally, some prophecies simply reveal what God has already decided to bring about in the future (Hasker 1989, 195). Since God's own actions in the future are up to Him, it is possible for God to know about them even though they are contingent, and hence it is possible for prophecies to reveal them.
In response to Hasker's attempt to solve the problem of prophecy from within the constraints imposed by the Open Future view, Thomas P. Flint has argued that Hasker's response is inadequate. Flint argues that if people are truly free in a sense that implies future contingency, then not even God could know very much about the future based upon present trends and tendencies alone. This is because the probability of any particular future contingent event is very low, so that God would not have much justification for believing that any particular future contingent event would occur. (He also points out that Hasker faces a dilemma here that other Open Future advocates share, namely, that if they insist that the probabilities of future contingent events are high enough to justify God in making predictions about the future, then God actually doesn't take much of a risk in creating the world. This is problematic for Open Future advocates, who often claim that their view has the virtue that God takes certain risks in creating the world.) As an example, Flint points to John 6:64, which implies that Jesus knew that Judas would betray him. How could this be, Flint wonders, when the probability that Judas would betray Jesus was so low?
We will not try to adjudicate the dispute between Flint and Hasker here, since that would take us beyond the scope of this article. Instead, let's consider the other alternative solutions to the problem of prophecy. In order to classify them, it will be helpful to describe briefly the different ways that philosophers and theologians have tried to explain God's knowledge of the contingent future.
William Ockham (c.1285–1347), a highly influential Christian philosopher and theologian from the medieval period, suggested an interesting way of accounting for God's knowledge of the contingent future and resolving the problem of prophecy. (For more detailed presentations of Ockham's views, see the introduction to Ockham (Predestination) by Adams and the introduction to Molina 1988 by Freddoso.) Ockham claims that what a prophet has truly revealed about the contingent future “could have been and can be false” (Ockham Predestination, 44), even though the existence of the prophecy in the past is “ever afterwards necessary” (Ockham Predestination, 44). As Calvin Normore puts it, “After God has revealed a future contingency it is necessary that the physical or mental things he used to reveal it have existed, but what is revealed is not necessary” (Normore 1982, 373). In terms of our example involving Jesus' prophecy concerning Peter's denial, Ockham's idea is that were Peter to choose freely not to deny Jesus instead, then Jesus would never have prophesied that Peter would deny him. (Some philosophers like to call this kind of proposition a “back-tracking counterfactual”, because it is a subjunctive conditional statement whose consequent refers to an earlier time than its antecedent.) In other words, if a person were about to choose freely to do something, then God would have known about it from eternity, and hence would have acted accordingly.
If this is right, then Ockham's idea implies that we probably have the ability to do something now such that if we were to do it, then the past would have been different (because God would known what we would do differently and hence would have acted differently in the past). Some philosophers refer to this kind of ability as “counterfactual power over the past.” Alvin Plantinga has this idea in mind in his defense of Ockham's account of God's foreknowledge of the contingent future when he says that “it is possible that there is an action such that it is within your power to perform it and such that if you were to perform it, then God would not have created Abraham” (Plantinga 1986, 257). Along the same lines, Edward Wierenga suggests that according to Ockham, Peter has the power to do something such that if he were to do it, then Jesus would not have intended what he said about Peter’s future denials as a prophecy (Wierenga 1991, 440). In other words, Jesus uttered words that actually did constitute a prophecy, but those same words would not have been a prophecy had Peter chosen otherwise (Wierenga 1991, 440).
But doesn't this attribute to Peter a rather odd power over the past? Once Jesus says certain words with a certain intention, is it coherent to say that Peter still has a choice about whether or not to betray Jesus? Some philosophers have expressed doubts along these lines about whether or not Ockham's approach is ultimately successful. Alfred J. Freddoso, for instance, claims that “Ockhamism commits one to having to choose between the Scylla of claiming that God can undo the causal history of the world and the Charybdis of claiming that divine prophecies might be deceptive or mistaken” (Freddoso 1988, 61). Whether or not this is so, one might wonder about the other alternative solutions.
A very different approach to explaining God's knowledge of the contingent future involves suggesting that God exists outside of time altogether. This would mean that God does not foreknow the future, strictly speaking (since foreknowledge is knowledge of an event that is possessed at a moment in time that occurs earlier than the moment in time at which the event foreknown occurs). Instead, the idea is that God knows all events from the perspective of timeless eternity. (For further elaboration and defense of this view, see Stump and Kretzmann 1987, Helm 1988, and Leftow 1991.) Many theists have adopted this view throughout the centuries, including the highly influential medieval theologian St. Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274). One of the earliest Christian theologians to defend this approach to answering the Knowledge Question was Boethius (480–524 C.E.), who wrote in The Consolation of Philosophy that “[Since] God has a condition of ever-present eternity, His knowledge, which passes over every change of time, embracing infinite lengths of past and future, views in its own direct comprehension everything as though it were taking place in the present” (Boethius Consolation, 117).
Some philosophers have objected to this way of explaining God's knowledge because it represents an unbiblical picture of God derived largely from Greek philosophical influences (see Wolterstorff 1982, for example). But it does suggest an interesting approach to the problem of prophecy. In terms of our example, the defender of God's atemporal eternity would say that God knows from the perspective of eternity that Peter will deny Jesus at a certain time, and on this basis, Jesus prophecies in time that the event in question will occur.
The problem with this approach is that once Jesus prophecies at a particular time that Peter will deny him, God's atemporally eternal knowledge is “introduced” into the past (as David Widerker says in Widerker 1991), and the advantages of the atemporal eternity view seem to disappear. For we are still left with trying to explain how Peter's denial could be contingent, given that the prophecy has already occurred. It seems that either Peter's denial is not free or the past can be changed somehow.
Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann, probably the most prominent advocates of the atemporal eternity view, have defended the atemporal eternity approach to prophecy against Widerker's objection (see Stump and Kretzmann 1991). They point out that most prophecies are conditional or vague, so that they leave “room” for different ways in which they might be fulfilled (400–401). If a prophecy were to be very specific, then it might actually render the action in question inevitable, they admit, but they also insist that rendering an action inevitable is not the same as making it unfree. This is because they distinguish freedom of action from freedom of will, and argue that “it is possible for an action to be inevitable and yet a free action” (403), as (for instance) when “the agent himself has a powerful desire to do the action, his will is not causally determined by anything external to him or by pathological factors within him, and the inaccessible alternatives to his inevitable action are alternatives the agent has no desire to do or even some desire not to do” (403). Trying to resolve the dispute between Widerker and Stump and Kretzmann would go beyond the scope of this article, so instead we will turn to the final alternative solution to the problem of prophecy.
This last approach to explaining how God knows the contingent future starts with an observation concerning foreknowledge and providence that the Open Future advocates have made very clearly and forcefully. Why would knowledge of the future be useful to God? Well, presumably knowledge of the future enables God to make decisions about how to exercise divine power in order to accomplish the purposes behind creation. But there is a problem here: knowledge of the future is just knowledge of what will happen (since the future is by definition whatever will happen), and once God knows that something definitely will happen, then it's too late to do anything about it. (This may sound like a limit on God's power, but it isn't; it's just a consequence of saying that something definitely is part of the future.) As William Hasker says, “In the logical order of dependence of events, one might say, by the ‘time’ God knows something will happen, it is ‘too late’ either to bring about its happening or to prevent it from happening” (Hasker 1989, 58). So what God needs, for the purposes of providence, is not just knowledge about what will happen, but also knowledge about what could happen and what would happen in certain circumstances.
Luis de Molina, an influential Spanish Jesuit theologian (1535–1600 C.E.), saw clearly the relationship between God's providence and the knowledge of what could happen and would happen in various circumstances. He drew a useful distinction between three kinds of knowledge which God possesses, a distinction that suggests a promising response to the problem of prophecy. (For more complete and detailed presentations of this view, see Freddoso's introduction to Molina 1988, Craig 1987, Flint 1988 or Flint 1998.)
According to Molina, the first kind of knowledge that God possesses is called natural knowledge. A true proposition is part of God's natural knowledge if and only if it is a necessary truth (a truth which could not be false under any circumstances whatever) which is beyond God's control. Examples of such true propositions would include “Two plus two equals four”, “Nothing is both red all over and green all over at once”, and “Every triangle has three sides”, since these truths are necessary (they could not be false, under any circumstances) and they are beyond God's control (nobody, including God, could make them false).
The second kind of knowledge that God possesses is called free knowledge because it is subject to God's free decision. According to Molina, a true proposition is part of God's free knowledge if and only if it is a contingent truth (an actual truth which could have been false under different circumstances) which is within God's control. Examples of such true propositions would include “Michelangelo painted the ceiling of the Sistine Chapel”, “There are iguanas in America” and “There is a rock on my desk”, since God could have brought it about that these true propositions were false instead.
The third kind of knowledge that God possesses, according to Molina, is called middle knowledge (because it is “in between” God's natural knowledge and free knowledge). A true proposition is part of God's middle knowledge if and only if it is a contingent truth (like items of God's free knowledge) which is beyond God's control (like items of God's natural knowledge). The most frequently discussed items of middle knowledge are often called “counterfactuals of freedom” by philosophers, since they describe what people would freely do if placed in various possible situations.
Molina claims that God's providential control over the world involves middle knowledge in a crucial way. Very briefly, here is how it is supposed to work: through natural knowledge, God knows what is necessary and what is possible. Through middle knowledge, God knows what every possible person would do freely in every possible situation. So God decides which kind of world to create, including those situations in which free human persons should be placed, knowing how they would respond, and this results in God's free knowledge (contingent truths which are up to God, which includes foreknowledge of the actual future, including all human actions).
In the case of Jesus' prophecy that Peter would deny him, those who follow Molina's account of God's knowledge (Molinists) would say that God knew (through middle knowledge) that if Peter were placed in certain circumstances, then he would deny Jesus. And for reasons not known to us, God decided to create those circumstances, place Peter in them, and also to prophecy through Jesus what Peter would do. (For a much more detailed explanation, see Flint 1998, chapter 9.) In this way, Molina's theory of middle knowledge generates a powerful theory of providence which hopes to combine a strong, traditional notion of God's control with a robust account of the contingency involved in human freedom. (It also appears to have some biblical support, because there are verses which seem to attribute middle knowledge to God: see I Samuel 23:6–13 and Matthew 11:20–24.)
But philosophers have some serious doubts about whether or not it is possible for God to possess middle knowledge, doubts that parallel those expressed above in connection with the possibility of God's foreknowledge of the contingent future. (For more detailed discussions of these objections, see Freddoso's introduction to Molina 1988, Craig 1987, Flint 1988 and Flint 1998, and Hasker 1989; for a very clever attempt to explain prophecy without middle knowledge, see Pruss 2007). For one thing, they wonder about counterfactuals of freedom: can we really assume that these are either true or false? How can they be true if (for example) the person in question is never in the situation and never actually makes a choice? What “grounds” them or makes them true? (This worry is explored in Adams 1977 and Davison 2004.) A second worry about Molina's picture has to do with the nature of knowledge. Even if a given counterfactual of freedom is true, knowing a proposition requires that a person be able to distinguish what is true from what is false. The worry here is that perhaps not even God could distinguish true counterfactuals of freedom from false ones. (See Davison 1991 for a discussion of this kind of argument.)
There are several ways to try to resolve the problem of prophecy, which arises in cases where a future contingent event is predicted. The approaches surveyed here have their own distinctive strengths and weaknesses. The question of prophecy has been receiving increased attention as the debate over the extent of God's knowledge has become more widely discussed in recent work in the philosophy of religion. One could reasonably predict that philosophical arguments concerning these matters will continue indefinitely into the future.
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- Nicholas Wolterstorff, 1982, “God Everlasting,” in Cahn 1982, pp. 77–98.
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- The History of Prophecy in Christianity and Judaism, in The Catholic Encyclopedia
- Prophecy in Christianity, in The Catholic Encyclopedia
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