Mental Imagery

First published Tue Nov 18, 1997; substantive revision Fri Apr 2, 2010

Mental imagery (varieties of which are sometimes colloquially refered to as “visualizing,” “seeing in the mind's eye,” “hearing in the head,” “imagining the feel of,” etc.) is quasi-perceptual experience; it resembles perceptual experience, but occurs in the absence of the appropriate external stimuli. It is also generally understood to bear intentionality (i.e., mental images are always images of something or other), and thereby to function as a form of mental representation. Traditionally, visual mental imagery, the most discussed variety, was thought to be caused by the presence of picture-like representations (mental images) in the mind, soul, or brain, but this is no longer universally accepted.

Very often, imagery experiences are understood by their subjects as echoes, copies, or reconstructions of actual perceptual experiences from their past; at other times they may seem to anticipate possible, often desired or feared, future experiences. Thus imagery has often been believed to play a very large, even pivotal, role in both memory (Yates, 1966; Paivio, 1986) and motivation (McMahon, 1973). It is also commonly believed to be centrally involved in visuo-spatial reasoning and inventive or creative thought. Indeed, according to a long dominant philosophical tradition, it plays a crucial role in all thought processes, and provides the semantic grounding for language. However, in the 20th century vigorous objections were raised against this tradition, and it was widely repudiated. More recently, it has once again begun to find a few defenders.


1. Meanings and Connotations of ‘Mental Imagery’

Mental imagery is a familiar aspect of most people's everyday experience (Galton, 1880; Betts, 1909; Doob, 1972; Marks, 1972, 1999). A few people may insist that they rarely, or even never, consciously experience imagery (Galton, 1880, 1883; Faw, 1997, 2009; but see Brewer & Schommer-Aikins, 2006), but for the vast majority of us, it is a familiar and commonplace feature of our mental lives. The English language supplies quite a range of idiomatic ways of referring to visual mental imagery: ‘visualizing,’ ‘seeing in the mind's eye,’ ‘having a picture in one's head,’ ‘picturing,’ ‘having/seeing a mental image/picture,’ and so on. There seem to be fewer ways to talk about imagery in other sensory modes, but there is little doubt that it occurs, and the experiencing of imagery in any sensory mode is often referred to as ‘imagining’ (the appearance, feel, smell, sound, or flavor of something). Alternatively, the quasi-perceptual nature of an experience may be indicated merely by putting the relevant sensory verb (‘see,’ ‘hear,’ ‘taste,’ etc.) in actual or implied “scare quotes.”

Despite the familiarity of the experience, the precise meaning of the expression ‘mental imagery’ is remarkably hard to pin down, and differing understandings of it have often added considerably to the confusion of the already complex and fractious debates, amongst philosophers, psychologists, and cognitive scientists, concerning imagery's nature, its psychological functions (if any), and even its very existence. In the philosophical and scientific literature (and a fortiori in everyday discourse), the expression ‘mental imagery’ (or ‘mental images’) may be used in any or all of at least three different senses, which are only occasionally explicitly distinguished, and all too often conflated:

{1} quasi-perceptual conscious experience per se;
{2} hypothetical picture-like representations in the mind and/or brain that give rise to {1};
{3} hypothetical inner representations of any sort (picture-like or otherwise) that directly give rise to {1}.

Far too many discussions of visual mental imagery fail to draw a clear distinction between the contention that people have quasi-visual experiences and the contention that such experiences are to be explained by the presence of representations, in the mind or brain, that are in some sense picture-like. This picture theory (or pictorial theory) of imagery experience is deeply entrenched in our language and our folk psychology. The very word ‘image,’ after all, suggests a picture. However, although the majority of both laymen and experts probably continue to accept some form of picture theory, many 20th century philosophers and psychologists, from a variety of theoretical traditions, have argued strongly against it, and, in several cases they have developed quite detailed alternative, non-pictorial accounts of the nature and causes of imagery experiences (e.g., Dunlap, 1914; Washburn, 1916; Sartre, 1940; Ryle, 1949; Shorter, 1952; Skinner, 1953, 1974; Dennett, 1969; Sarbin & Juhasz, 1970; Sarbin, 1972; Pylyshyn, 1973, 1978, 1981, 2002a, 2003a, 2005; Neisser, 1976; Hinton, 1979; Slezak, 1991, 1995; Thomas, 1999b, 2009). Others, it should be said, have developed and defended picture theory in sophisticated ways in the attempt to meet these critiques (e.g., Hannay, 1971; Kosslyn, 1980, 1983,1994; von Eckardt, 1988, 1993; Tye, 1988, 1991; Cohen, 1996). However, despite these developments, much philosophical and scientific discussion about imagery and the cognitive functions it may or may not serve contines to be based on the often unspoken (and even unexamined) assumption that, if there is mental imagery at all, it must consist in inner pictures.

Consider, for example, the title of the book The Case for Mental Imagery, by Kosslyn, Thompson & Ganis (2006). In fact the book is an extended and quite polemical defense of the much disputed view that visual mental imagery consists in representational brain states that are, in some significant and important ways, genuinely picture-like (see supplement: The Quasi-Pictorial Theory of Imagery, and its Problems). That is to say, the contents suggest that the title should be understood as intending "imagery" in sense {2}. However, it would also be very natural (and, very possibly, in accord with the authors' intentions – compare Kosslyn, Ganis & Thompson, 2003) to understand the title as implying that the book's deeper purpose is to refute the view that imagery, even in sense {1}, does not really exist (or, at least, that the concept of imagery will find no place in a properly scientific ontology). Although this denialist view of imagery has few, if any, supporters today, it is well known that not so very long ago, in the era of Behaviorist psychology, it had great influence. The book's title thus (intentionally or otherwise) invites us to conflate the (now) very controversial view that mental images are picture-like entities, with what is, today, the virtual truism that people really do have quasi-perceptual experiences, and that our science of the mind owes us some account of them.

Another way in which the expression ‘mental imagery’ (together with many of its colloquial near-equivalents) may be misleading, is that it tends to suggest only quasi-visual phenomena. Despite the fact that most scholarly discussions of imagery, in the past and today, do indeed focus mainly or exclusively upon the visual mode, in fact, quasi-perceptual experience in other sensory modes is just as real, and, very likely, just as common and just as psychologically important (Newton, 1982). Contemporary cognitive scientists generally recognize this, and interesting studies of auditory imagery, kinaesthetic (or motor) imagery, olfactory imagery, haptic (touch) imagery, and so forth, can be found in the recent scientific literature (e.g., Segal & Fusella, 1971; Reisberg, 1992; Klatzky, Lederman, & Matula, 1991; Jeannerod, 1994; Bensafi et al., 2003). Although such studies are still vastly outnumbered by studies of visual imagery, ‘imagery’ has become the generally accepted term amongst cognitive scientists for quasi-perceptual experience in any sense mode (or any combination of sense modes).

1.1 Experience or Representation?

In the introduction to this entry, in order to avoid making a premature commitment to the picture theory, and in accordance with definitions given by psychologists such as McKellar (1957), Richardson (1969), and Finke (1989), mental imagery was characterized as a form of experience (i.e., as {1}). However, this itself is far from unproblematic. Evidence for the occurrence of any experience is necessarily subjective and introspective, and, because of this, those who have doubts about the validity of introspection as a scientific method, may well be led to question whether there is any place for a concept such as imagery within a truly scientific world view. J.B. Watson, the influential instigator of the Behaviorist movement that dominated scientific psychology (especially in the United States) for much of the 20th century, questioned the very existence of imagery for just these sorts of reasons (Watson, 1913a, 1913b, 1928 – see supplement; see also: Thomas, 1989, Berman & Lyons, 2007). Although few later Behaviorist psychologists (or their philosophical allies) expressed themselves on the matter in quite the strong and explicit terms sometimes used by Watson, the era of Behaviorist psychology is characterized by a marked skepticism about imagery (if not its existence, at least its psychological importance) amongst both psychologists and philosophers. Imagery did not become widely discussed again among scientific psychologists (or philosophers of psychology) until around the end of the 1960s, when Behaviorism began to be displaced by Cognitivism as the dominant psychological paradigm. Most informed contemporary discussions of imagery, amongst both philosophers and psychologists, are still very much shaped by this recent history of skepticism about imagery (or iconophobia, as it is sometimes called), and the subsequent reaction against it.

By contrast with their Behaviorist predecessors, most cognitive psychologists today hold that imagery has an essential role to play in our mental economy. Many may share some of the reservations of their Behaviorist predecessors about the place of introspection and subjectivity in science, but they take the view that imagery must be real (and scientifically interesting) because it is explanatorily necessary: The results of many experiments on cognitive functioning, they hold, cannot be satisfactorily explained without making appeal to the storage and processing of imaginal mental representations. The belief that such mental representations are real is justified in the same sort of way that belief in the reality of electrons, or natural selection, or gravitational fields (or other scientifically sanctioned “unobservables”) is justified: Imagery is known to exist inasmuch as the explanations that rely upon imaginal representations are known to be true. From this perspective, some theorists recommend that the term ‘imagery’ should not be understood to refer to a form of subjective experience, but, rather, to a certain type of “underlying representation” (Dennett, 1978; Block, 1981a, Introduction; Block, 1983a; Kosslyn, 1983; Wraga & Kosslyn, 2003; Kosslyn, Thompson & Ganis, 2006). Such representations are “mental” in the sense now commonplace in cognitive science: i.e., they are conceived of as being embodied as brain states, but as individuated by their functional (and computational) role in cognition. As Block (1981a, 1983a) points out, an advantage of defining mental imagery in this way (i.e., as an unspecified form of representation, as {3} rather than {2}) is that it does not beg the controversial question of whether the relevant representations are, in any interesting sense, picture-like.

However, if it is not because they are picture-like, what is it that makes these mental representations mental images? Presumably the idea is that a mental representation deserves to be called an image if it is of such a type that its presence to mind (i.e., its playing a role in some currently occurring cognitive process) can give rise to a quasi-perceptual experience of whatever is represented. But this move relies upon our already having a grasp of the experiential conception of imagery, which must, therefore, be more fundamental than the representational conception just outlined. Furthermore, to define imagery in the way that Block, Kosslyn etc. suggest, as first and foremost a form of representation (as explanans rather than explanandum), is to beg more basic and equally controversial questions about the nature of the mind and the causes of quasi-perceptual experiences. A number of scientists and philosophers, coming from a diverse range of disciplinary and theoretical perspectives, do not accept that imagery experiences are caused by the presence to mind of representational tokens (e.g., Sartre, 1940; Ryle, 1949; Skinner, 1953, 1974; Sarbin, 1972; Thomas, 1999b, 2009; O'Regan & Noë, 2001; Bartolomeo, 2002; Bennett & Hacker, 2003; Blain, 2006).

It should be admitted, however, that focusing too narrowly on the experiential conception of imagery has its own potential dangers. In particular, it may obscure the very real possibility, foregrounded by the representational conception, that importantly similar underlying representations or mechanisms may sometimes be operative both when we consciously experience imagery and sometimes when we do not. Some evidence, such as Paivio's (1971, 1983a, 1991) work on the differential memorability of words with different “imagery values” (see section 4.2, below), suggests that this is indeed the case.

In practice, both the experiential and the representational conceptions of imagery are frequently encountered in the literature of the subject. Unfortunately, it is often hard to tell which is intended in any particular case. Even where they are not actually conflated, confusion can arise when one conception is favored over the other without this ever being made sufficiently clear or explicit. Although it would be pedantic and potentially confusing to insist on explicitly drawing the distinction everywhere, where it seems important or helpful to do so this entry will refer to imagery experiences (or quasi-perceptual experiences) on the one hand, and imagery representations (or imagery processes) on the other.

1.2 The Relation to Perception

There are further potential problems, however, with the brief characterization of imagery given in our introduction. Not only does what is said there duck the difficult (and rarely considered) task of specifying what dimensions and degrees of similarity to perception are necessary for an experience to count as imagery; it also elides the controversial question of whether, despite the surface resemblance, imagery is a sui generis phenomenon, conceptually quite distinct from true perceptual experience, or whether imagery and perception differ only in degree rather than in kind.

Some, such as Hume (1740), hold that percepts (impressions in his terminology) and images (ideas) do not differ in kind, but only in their causal history and their degree of “vivacity”or vividness. This view has frequently been criticized, however, most recently by McGinn (2004; cf. Reid, 1764 II.5, VI.24; Savage, 1975; Warnock, 1976). An alternative view, explicitly defended by some (e.g., Jastrow, 1899; Savage, 1975; Thomas, 1997a), and implicit in much of the other relevant literature, is that imagery lies at one end of a spectrum stretching from veridical, highly stimulus-driven and stimulus-constrained perception at one end, to “pure” imagery (where the content of the experience is generated entirely by the subject, and is quite independent of any current stimulus input) at the other. Several varieties of imaginative preceptual experience may be taken to fill in the continuum between these extremes: mistaken or illusive perceptions (imagining, for instance, that the bush seen indistinctly in the darkness is a bear), and various types of non-deceptive seeing as or seeing in (such as imagining a cloud to have the shape of a camel, weasel, or whale; seeing a Laughing Cavalier in paint on canvas; seeing someone's sadness in their eyes; or seeing the notorious duck-rabbit figure as a duck [or rabbit]).

The Duck-Rabbit
Figure 1.2_1
The Duck-Rabbit

Others, however, notably Reid (1764 II.5), Sartre (1936), Wittgenstein (1967 §621 ff.), and McGinn (2004), argue that there is a sharp conceptual and phenomenological distinction to be drawn between imagery and perception proper. After all, it is argued, our imagination, unlike our perception, is under the control of our will (and experienced as such). Provided I know what an elephant looks like, I can choose to imagine one wherever and whenever I want to, but I cannot choose to see an elephant unless one actually happens to be present. By contrast, if an elephant is present before my open eyes, I cannot help but see it, whether I will or no.[1] Furthermore, it is claimed that (in sharp contrast to perception) we can derive no new information about the world from our imagery: No image can contain anything except what the imager put there, which must already have been in his or her mind (Sartre, 1940; Wittgenstein, 1967 §§627, 632). However, this negative view of the epistemological value of imagery is rejected by Kosslyn (1980, 1983), and the arguments of Sartre and Wittgenstein on this point have been rebutted in some detail by Taylor (1981).[2] McGinn (2004 p. 19ff) argues that although Sartre and Wittgenstein overstate their point, there is a genuine and important insight underlying what they say: The information we can derive from our imagery is of a different sort, and is derived in a different way, from that which we get from perception.

1.3 The Intentionality of Imagery

On a more consensual note, with only rare exceptions (e.g. Wright, 1983; Martin, 2008 p. 160) nearly all serious discussions of imagery take it for granted that it bears intentionality in the sense of being of, about, or directed at something (Harman, 1998): A mental image is always an image of something or other (whether real or unreal), in the same sense that perception (whether veridical or not) is always perception of something (see Anscombe, 1965). It is in virtue of this intentionality that mental imagery may be (and usually is) regarded as a species of mental representation that can, and often does, play an important role in our thought processes.

It is also generally accepted that imagery is, for the most part, subject to voluntary control. Although it is true that images often come into the mind unbidden, and sometimes it is hard to shake off unwanted imagery (for instance, a memory of some horrible sight that one cannot get out of one's mind), most of us, most of the time can quite freely and voluntarily conjure-up and manipulate imagery of whatever we may please (provided, of course, that we know what it looks like).

There are quasi-perceptual experiences, such as afterimages, that are not subject to this sort of direct voluntary control, and indeed, that do not seem to bear intentionality, but these are usually (at least implicitly) understood to be phenomena of a distinctly different type from mental imagery proper (see supplement).

Further discussion of phenomena akin to, or sometimes confused with, mental imagery:

Supplement: Other Quasi-Perceptual Phenomena

2. Pre-Scientific Views of Imagery

It seems likely that mental imagery has been discussed for as long as humans have been trying to understand their own cognitive processes. It receives attention in the oldest extended writings about cognition that have come down to us – the works of Plato and Aristotle – and there is reason to believe it was discussed by yet earlier Greek thinkers. Plato's and particularly Aristotle's writings have undoubtedly had an enormous and continuing influence on how cognition in general and imagery in particular are conceptualized within both the Western and the Muslim cultural traditions. However, there is reason to think that the phenomenon of imagery, if not this tradition of theorizing about it, is not culture bound. Children as young as three have been found to be aware their imagery, and of its subjective nature (Estes, 1994), and researchers have been able to gather introspective reports and descriptions of mental imagery from members of non-Western cultures ranging from pre-literate tribal Africa (Doob, 1972) to modern Japan (where, indeed, the empirical psychological study of imagery seems to have been taken up with some enthusiasm – Oyama & Ichikawa, 1990). Imagery is also said to play a significant role in traditional Hindu and Buddhist spiritual practices (Samuels & Samuels, 1972), and apparent references to the phenomenon of imagery can be found in the works of the classical Chinese thinkers such as Confucius (e.g. Analects 9:10 & 15:5).[3] There might well be important insights to be gleaned from the study of these various cultures' conceptions of imagery, but the available literature on this is very sparse. Thus, of necessity, what follows will focus on the Western philosophical and scientific tradition. In any case, the seeds of the controversies about imagery that erupted in the 20th century were sown not in Africa or the Orient, but in Greece.

2.1 Early Greek Ideas of Imagery

The following supplements discuss Greek conceptions of imagery prior to the work of Aristotle:

Supplement: Ancient Imagery Mnemonics

Supplement: Plato and his Predecessors

2.2 Aristotle and Imagery

Where Plato regarded images as irremediably deceptive, Aristotle, although he certainly recognized their potential for leading us astray (De Anima 428a-b), saw them as playing an essential and central role in human cognition, one closely akin to that played by the more generic notion of mental representation in contemporary cognitive science. Indeed, he developed what amounts to the first comprehensive cognitive theory, a theory that has been enormously influential over the subsequent ages, and continues (mostly indirectly) to shape much scientific and philosophical thought about the mind even today. He was clearly aware of, and very possibly influenced by, the mnemonic imagery techniques in use in Greece (see supplement), to which he alludes in at least four passages in his extant writings (Topica 163b28, De Anima 427b18, De Memoria 452a12–16, De Insomniis 458b20–22).

Aristotle's Greek word, that is commonly and traditionally translated as "[mental] image" is “phantasma” (plural: phantasmata), a term used by Plato to refer to reflections in mirrors or pools (or the liver), amongst other things, but which Aristotle seems to reserve to appearances in the psyche. Aristotle describes phantasmata as being analogous to paintings or wax impressions (De Memoria 450a-b), and as “a residue of the actual [sense] impression” (De Insomniis 461b; cf. Rhetorica 137a 28) or “a movement resulting from an actual exercise of a power of sense” (De Anima 429a 1–3). Some modern scholars, it should be noted, have questioned the translation of "phantasma" as "image," in part because Aristotle does not always seem to think of phantasmata as inner pictures, and also because he seems to think of them as playing a role in perception itself (Nussbaum, 1978; Schofield, 1978; Birondo, 2001). As Hume distinguished impressions from ideas, contemporary colloquial English distinguishes between percepts and the mental images that we experience when we fantasize, daydream, or recall some experience from memory. Aristotle's concept of phantasma seems to collapse this distinction. It has thus been suggested that "phantasma" would be better translated as "appearance" (Lycos, 1964) or "presentation" (Beare, 1906) rather than as "image". However, contemporary scientific theories of imagery (see sections 4.4 and 4.5) also, for the most part, do not make a sharp distinction in kind between mental images and percepts, and are virtually unanimous in holding (as, indeed, did Hume) that both are varieties of a single species.

In any case, it is abundantly clear that, in many even if not all cases, Aristotle uses "phantasma" to refer to what we now call a mental image. Phantasmata have several functions paralleling those ascribed to imagery by modern folk psychology (and some scientific psychology). In particular, they are central to Aristotle's theory of memory (De Memoria et Reminiscentia; see Sorabji, 1972) and to his theory of thought. Not only does remembering essentially involve the recall of imagery of past experiences, but, he tells us, "It is impossible to think without an image [phantasma]," (De Memoria 450a 1; cf. De Anima 431a 15–20 & 432a 8–12). Phantasmata also play a key role in his account of desire and motivation (e.g. De Anima 431a — see Nussbaum, 1978): When some desirable object is not actually present to our senses, exerting its pull on us directly, our motivation to strive to obtain it is driven by our awareness of its (memory or fantasy) image. (This idea is still found in modern, scientific theories of desire (McMahon 1973; Kavanagh et al., 2005; Andrade et al., 2009).) Aristotle also apparently held that linguistic meaning derives from imagery, spoken words being but the symbols of the inner images (De Interpretatione 16a 5–9; De Anima 420b 29–32; see Modrak, 2001). Today, few theorists of language take this notion seriously (but see Paivio, 1986, 2007; Prinz, 2002), but it was almost universally accepted until relatively recent times (Wollock, 1997; and see section 3.3 below).

Very arguably, Aristotle's views about imagery (phantasmata) cannot be fully understood in isolation from his views about imagination (phantasia), which he defined as “(apart from any metaphorical sense of the word) the process by which we say that an image [phantasma] is presented to us” (De Anima 428a 1–4). Aristotle has been accredited with the very invention of the concept of imagination (Schofield, 1978), and certainly it seems fair to say that the roots of most subsequent discussions of the concept can be traced back to his work (even though, for him, it did not have the strong association with creativity and aesthetic insight that it has since acquired, mostly through the influence of the Romantic movement) (Watson, 1988; White, 1990; Thomas, 1999a). Unfortunately, however, Aristotle's remarks about phantasia, suggestive and influential though they are, are scattered widely amongst the surviving texts, and the only extended discussion of the concept (in De Anima III.3) is particularly difficult to interpret, not only because the text that has come down to us seems to be more than usually corrupt (Nussbaum, 1992), but also because of the richness and density of its arguments and its peculiarly oblique approach to the ostensible subject matter. After over two millennia of discussion, scholars still do not agree about crucial aspects of Aristotle's conception of phantasia, and thus about his view of the fundamental nature of imagery.[4]

Further discussion of the aftermath and influence of Aristotle's work on imagery:

Supplement: From the Hellenistic to the Early Modern Era

2.3 Images as Ideas in Modern Philosophy

It can hardly be denied that the concept of the idea was central to much of modern philosophy. Ideas were mental representations, and very frequently, though not necessarily always, they were (explicitly or implicitly) conceived of as mental images. Even if some authors did not themselves take ideas to be images, it is likely that many of their readers would have taken them to be doing so. Thus, claims about the nature of ideas, and the cognitive and epistemological roles they could or could not play, were often conditioned by whether or not a philosopher did conceive of ideas as images, and by what imagery was taken to be.

2.3.1 Descartes

The Oxford English Dictionary records a clear example of the word 'idea' being used in the sense of mental image as far back as 1589, but philosophical confusion over whether or not ideas are images goes back at least to the “father of Modern Philosophy,” Descartes. Certainly the “clear and distinct ideas” that play such a prominent role in the Meditations (1641), and in Descartes' epistemology more generally, are not conceived to be mental images. We are told that we can attain clear and distinct ideas of such things as God and the human mind (Meditation 4, 53). Neither of these are things of which we have perceptual, let alone quasi-perceptual, experience. But Descartes insists that even our ideas of perceptible things are, inasmuch as they are clear and distinct, not perceptual or imaginative. His perceptual and imaginative grasp of the nature of a piece of wax, he tells us, can never match the clarity and distinctness of the idea of the wax that can potentially be attained by purely mental scrutiny (Meditation 2, 31).

However, we also find in Descartes' work another conception of idea as something that is quasi-perceptual (and, indeed, pictorial) and is formed in the imagination. These ideas may not be capable of providing the sure epistemological foundation that Descartes thinks the clear and distinct ideas of the intellect can give us, but they are real nonetheless, and probably play a larger role in ordinary, non-philosophic thinking. Although they are alluded to in many of Descartes works, these imagistic ideas are explained most fully in the Treatise of Man, where he propounds his speculative physiological theory of visual perception in some detail.[5] The nervous system is described as working by a form of hydraulics, with the nerve fibres (including those that make up the brain) functioning as hollow pipes carrying a fluid called animal spirit.[6] In the center of the brain is the pine-cone-shaped pineal gland, slight movements of which, Descartes believed, were somehow able directly to affect, and be affected by, the thoughts of the immaterial soul. Figure 2.3.1_1, taken from the Treatise, shows his model of visual perception: As a result of the formation of optical images on the retinae of the eyes, the nerves produce another image, isomorphic to the retinal image[7] (but re-inverted, so as to be upright), that is picked out on the surface of the gland by the flow of animal spirits through its pores.[8] Thus points a, b, and c on the surface of the gland correspond to points A, B, and C of the arrow which is being observed. The tracing of the image on the surface of the gland causes it to move in a subtle and complex fashion that (in some unexplained way) causes a conscious visual experience of the arrow in the soul (Descartes 1664 – see particularly pp. 83ff. in Hall's translation).

Retinal and Pineal Images in Descartes Treatise of Man

Figure 2.3.1_1
Diagram from Descartes' Treatise of Man (1664), showing the formation of inverted retinal images in the eyes, and the transmission of these images, via the nerves so as to form a single, re-inverted image (an idea) on the surface of the pineal gland.

At the same time that the flow of animal spirits is causing visual experiences by moving the pineal, elsewhere in the brain it is causing visual memories to be laid down by its action upon the nerve fibres themselves. These changes to hydraulic structure of the brain allow for mental images of memory and imagination to arise by the recreation of formerly experienced flow patterns of spirits at the pineal surface. Descartes explicitly tells us that the surface of the pineal gland is the “seat of imagination [l'imagination]”[9] and that the images traced there are “ideas” [idées] (Descartes 1664 – p. 86 in Hall's translation; see also Descartes 1648 – p. 27 in Cottingham's translation).

At least one of Descartes' followers, de la Forge, suggested that the term “idée [idea]” should be applied only to concepts in the intellect, and coined the expression “espèces corporelles [corporeal species]” to refer to the pictorial images of the imagination (Clarke, 1989). However, this was clearly not Descartes' own practice. Indeed, in the Third Meditation we are told that, strictly speaking, the word 'idea' should only be applied to thoughts that “are as it were the images of things” (Meditation 3, 37). On the other hand, in his letter to Mersenne of July 1641 he seems to say just the opposite: ideas are in our minds (presumably our immaterial souls), and in so far as images are “in the corporeal imagination” they should not properly be called ideas at all (Cottingham et al., 1991 pp. 185; see also Meditation 3, 40). The thought here seems to be that all ideas as such are in our minds, although some of them are caused or occasioned by the presence of an image on the pineal surface. It is beyond the scope of this entry to determine what was truly Descartes' considered view. What is clear, however, is that Descartes' readers would have readily been able to find a concept of the idea as a picture-like image in his writings.

In his Optics (1637, discourses 4 & 6), Descartes likens the images of his theory to engravings, flat, perspective projections of visual scenes. It is notable, however, that this comparison is made in the course of an argument to the effect that the representations in the brain that cause our perceptual and imaginative experiences need not actually resemble their objects: the resemblance between an engraving and what it depicts is, after all, very partial and imperfect. What matters, for Descartes, is that the conscious soul is appropriately affected by the movements that the process of image formation causes in the pineal gland. Thus it is the functional role of the image, not its actual physical nature, that is important. In this regard, Descartes' view is very close (at least in terms of functional architecture) to the contemporary quasi-pictorial theory of Kosslyn (1980, 1994, 2005; Kosslyn, Thompson, & Ganis, 2006 – see section 4.4.2 and supplement: Quasi-Pictorial Theory ). In both cases, it is claimed that although the material image in the brain is, in fact, picture-like, what actually makes it a mental image (or an idea) is not its two-dimensional neural instantiation, but its functional role in conveying visuo-spatial information to “higher” cognitive powers.

2.3.2 Hobbes

As a materialist, Hobbes, unlike Descartes, does not distinguish between images formed in the brain and ideas in the mind. In fact, although Hobbes sometimes uses the word 'idea' as a synonym for 'image,' it occurs rather infrequently in his writings, and he prefers to use 'image' (or 'imagination') or other synonyms such as 'phantasm' or 'appearance.'

Images, however, are undoubtedly central to his cognitive theory. Thought or “Mentall Discourse,” according to Hobbes, is nothing but a “trayne of imaginations,” an associatively connected succession of images passing through the mind, whether it be undirected (as in daydreaming or idle woolgathering) or more focused and purposive because it is “regulated by some desire, and designe,” by some overarching “Passionate Thought” (Leviathan I.3 (Hobbes, 1651)).[10]

However, it is not necessarily the case that Hobbes thought of his images, even those of visual appearances, as being picture-like. Imagination, we are told, “is nothing but decaying sense” (Leviathan I.2).[11] Because Hobbes regarded sensation as a sort of motion or pressure arising in the brain (or heart) in response to an inward pressure arising for external objects, the sort of decaying he has in mind seems unlikely to be that of a picture (or other representational object) crumbling to dust. Rather, it is that of a movement gradually running out of impetus, a pendulum swing gradually decreasing in amplitude, or a gas under pressure gradually leaking away. Furthermore, Hobbes, unlike Descartes, did not think of memory as being the result of structural changes in the brain, but rather as arising from the persistence, the very slow dying away, of the internal motions that were originally set going by sense experience (Leviathan I.2).[12] Hobbesian, images therefore, are processes rather than entities. Although they are undoubtedly quasi-perceptual experiences (presumably, in the absence of an immaterial soul, we are to suppose that they are experienced just in virtue of occurring there within the brain) they may not be mental pictures in any very robust sense.

2.3.3 Empiricism and its Critics

Unlike his predecessors, Locke did not concern himself with the nature or underlying mechanisms of mental imagery. Henceforth, at least until the rise of cognitive science in the late 20th century, that would be seen as the concern of scientists rather than philosophers[13] (and as it turned out, the scientists did not have much to say about the matter either, until, once again, the era of cognitive science). Furthermore, Locke's Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690) uses the words 'image' and 'imagination' only rarely (White, 1990; Ayers, 1991 p. 45).[14] However, he has a great deal to say about ideas, which are the vehicles of thought of his cognitive theory. Although what may be the canonical definition of idea as “whatever it is which the mind can be employed about in thinking” (Essay I.i.8), seems to be deliberately noncommital about their nature, there are several passages in Locke's Essay that suggest that he thought of them, at least when they were of visual origin, as being picture-like. Indeed, he explicitly refers to ideas as “the pictures drawn in our minds” (Essay II.x.5; see also II.x.7, II.ix.8, II.xxv.6, II.xxxi.6, IV.xi.1), and draws an analogy between the way that ideas enter the mind and the formation of optical images within a camera obscura (a “dark room”) (Essay II.xi.17).

It is thus hardly surprising that, according to Lowe (2005 p. 38), it remains “orthodox” to interpret Locke as holding that ideas are pictorial mental images. This orthodoxy is defended by Ayers (1986, 1991) and White (1990) amongst others, but other recent Locke scholars, notably Yolton (1956, 1970, 1984, 1985, 1996), Chappell (1994), and, more tentatively, Lowe (1995, 2005) challenge it, arguing that the explicit comparisons of ideas with pictures are all limited merely to bringing out some or other specific aspect of the nature of ideas, and should not be read as identifying them with pictures. According to Yolton, there is no evidence that Locke thought of ideas as entities of any sort (Yolton 1970 p. 134), rather, “To say that we know objects by means of ideas is to say no more than that objects become known through sensory awareness” (Yolton, 1985 p. 151). Lowe expresses what may be much the same underlying thought by suggesting that Locke may perhaps be interpreted as holding an “adverbial” theory of ideas, whereby they are construed as ways (or modes) of experiencing rather than as mental entities (Lowe, 1995 pp. 42– 47, 2005 pp. 47–48).

It is worth noting, however, that some recent philosophers have argued for just such an “adverbial” account of mental imagery itself, construing images as modes of experiencing, rather than the presence to mind of inner entities (Rabb, 1975; Heil, 1982; Tye, 1984; Thomas, 1999b, 2009; Meijsing, 2006). Enactive theories of imagery (see section 4.5.1) can be viewed as fleshed out versions of this position (Thomas, 1999b). Thus, even if Yolton and others are right to argue that Locke did not think of ideas (even visual ones) as pictures (imagery in sense {2}), or even as inner entities of any sort (sense {3}), he might still have consistently viewed them as images in sense {1}, as quasi-perceptual experiences. He certainly held that they arise from perception,[15] and that we are conscious of them when we employ them in our thinking (Essay II.i.2–3, I.i.8, II.xxvii.9).

Whatever Locke's true intentions may have been, many of his leading successors and critics, such as Berkeley and Reid, seem to have understood him as believing that ideas are inner representational entities, and, when visual, are like inner pictures.

Few seem to doubt that Berkeley thought of ideas as being images (but see Pitcher, 1977; Kasem, 1989). Indeed, his famous and influential attack (in The Principles of Human Knowledge (1734)) on the possibility of abstract or general ideas clearly derives most of its persuasiveness from the assumption that ideas are like pictures:

For my self I find indeed I have a Faculty of imagining, or representing to myself the Ideas of those particular things I have perceived and of variously compounding and dividing them. I can imagine a Man with Two Heads or the upper parts of a Man joined to the Body of a Horse. I can consider the Hand, the Eye, the Nose, each by itself abstracted or separated from the rest of the Body. But then whatever Hand or Eye I imagine, it must have some particular Shape and Colour. Likewise the Idea of Man that I frame to my self, must be either of a White, or a Black, or a Tawny, a Straight, or a Crooked, a Tall, or a Low, or a Middle-sized Man. I cannot by any effort of Thought conceive the abstract Idea above described. And it is equally impossible for me to form the abstract Idea of Motion distinct from the Body moving, and which is neither Swift nor Slow, Curvilinear nor Rectilinear; and the like may be said of all other abstract general Ideas whatsoever. (Principles, Introduction X).

Or again, a general idea of a triangle

must be neither Oblique nor Rectangle, neither Equilateral, Equicrural, nor Scalenon, but all and none of these at once? In effect, it is something imperfect that cannot exist (Principles, Introduction XIII).

In effect, Berkeley is arguing that we can form ideas of things that we have never actually seen just inasmuch as we can form new mental pictures by the sort of cutting and pasting operations we could perform with pictures on paper – sticking the picture of a man's head onto a picture of the body of a horse, for example – but that, just as there is no way of drawing or creating a picture that inherently depicts the general man or the general triangle, we can form no such general ideas in our minds.[16] If ideas are images (and if mental images are pictures), Berkeley's argument (which continues to influence today's discussions of imagery and mental representation (e.g., Fodor, 1975)) may very well be sound. If they are not images at all, it makes little sense (and if mental images are not much like pictures, it is probably invalid).

As with Locke, Yolton (1996) argues that Hume did not understand the ideas of his cognitive theory to be mental images. However, there is a great deal in Hume's writings (much more than in Locke's) to suggest otherwise. Indeed, A Treatise of Human Nature (Hume, 1740) opens by explicitly identifying ideas with images: ideas are defined as “the faint images of [sensory impressions] in thinking and reasoning” (Treatise I.i.1). It is conceivable that 'image' might mean nothing more than 'copy' here, but many other passages in both the Treatise and the Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (1748) suggest that Hume intended it in a much stronger sense. For example, he refers to the memory one might have of some site in the Holy Land, after having actually been there, as both a “lively image” and a “lively idea” of the place (Treatise I.iii.9), clearly treating the two expressions as equivalent. Furthermore, ideas are constantly being described as having their existence in, or being present to, the imagination or the fancy,[17] and we are told that we need only the “slightest philosophy” to convince us “that nothing can ever be present to the mind but an image or perception, and that the senses are only the inlets, through which these images are conveyed” (Enquiry XII.1).[18]

The passages just cited (and others like them) perhaps imply no more than that Hume thought of ideas as quasi-perceptual experiences (a conclusion that Yolton might be able to accept), but the fact that Hume approvingly repeats Berkeley's argument against general ideas (Treatise I.iii.1; Enquiry XII.1) suggest that he also thought of them as picture-like. This is also suggested by his choice of the word 'impression' to designate the percepts of which ideas are the images or copies. Clearly the word alludes to the wax impression model of perception and memory that we find in Plato and Aristotle, and although Hume, no doubt, does not intend it to be understood too literally, the fact that he thinks it an appropriate and innocuous metaphor remains telling.

Certainly when Thomas Reid came to develop his influential critique of “the way of ideas,” in effect a comprehensive rejection of the idea as the vehicle of thought, he based many of his arguments upon the assumption that the philosophers he was criticizing understood ideas to be picture-like images (Reid, 1764, 1785).[19] Such images, Reid thinks, are simply not capable of playing the cognitive and epistemological roles that his predecessors had assigned to them, and the assumption that they do so leads to many absurdities. Reid is not saying that we do not have quasi-perceptual experiences, but he wants to deny that these are caused by representational mental entities that we experience in lieu of some actually present physical object or scene.

When we come to Kant (1781/1787), we find that ideas have been displaced, as the vehicles of thought, by concepts. However, images still have a significant role to play in his account of how our concepts connect to empirical reality. The imagination (einbildungskraft) must synthesize the inchoate deliverances of the senses, the sensory manifold, into a coherent, meaningful image, a true representation that the understanding can grasp and bring under some concept. Unfortunately, Kant was unable to give a satisfactory account of how the imagination, even in concert with the understanding, can achieve this. We are told that it involves what he calls a schema, a “representation of a universal procedure of imagination in providing an image for a concept” (1781/1787 B180). We are told that it is only “through” and “in accordance with” a schema that images become possible (1781/1787 A 142). Unfortunately, however,

This schematism of our understanding, in its application to appearances and their mere form, is an art concealed in the depths of the human soul, whose real modes of activity nature is hardly likely ever to allow us to discover, and to have open to our gaze. (1781/1787 B181).

Thus Kant, in attempting to grapple with problems about the nature of mental representation that the Empiricists had failed to solve, left the process of image formation, and the nature of the image itself, deeply mysterious.

3. Imagery in the Age of Scientific Psychology

When psychology first began to emerge as an experimental science, in the philosophy departments of the German universities in the late 19th century, and soon after in the United States, the central role of imagery in mental life was not in question. For these pioneering experimentalists, such as Wilhelm Wundt in Germany and William James in America, mental images (often, following the established usage of the Empiricist philosophical tradition, referred to as ideas) held just the same central place in the explanation of cognition that they had held for philosophical psychologists of earlier times. Edward B. Titchener, a student of Wundt who established himself as a leading figure in American psychology, was particularly interested in imagery, and an experiment performed by one of his students, C.W. Perky, has become particularly well known. It is often assumed that it shows that there is no qualitative experiential difference between mental images and percepts, but further experimental investigations have raised some doubts about this conclusion (see Supplement: The Perky Experiment).

However, developments within psychology at the beginning of the 20th century began to cast doubt on this long established consensus. A group of psychologists working in Würzburg, Germany, lead by another former student of Wundt's, Oswald Külpe, claimed to have found empirical evidence that certain conscious thought contents are neither imaginal nor perceptual in character. Their results were challenged on several grounds by Wundt, Titchener and others, and were certainly never definitively established. Nevertheless, the bitter dispute that ensued, the so called imageless thought controversy, had a profound effect on the development of scientific psychology (and, very arguably, philosophy too). Most psychologists became, in effect, profoundly disillusioned with the whole notion of mental imagery, and either avoided seriously considering the topic, treated it dismissively, or, in some extreme cases, denied the existence of the phenomenon outright. These attitudes noticeably influenced other disciplines, including philosophy. Although the psychological study of imagery revived with the rise of cognitivism in the 1960s and 70s, when new experimental techniques were developed that enabled a truly experimental study of the phenomenon, current views about, and attitudes towards, mental imagery cannot be properly understood without an awareness of this history, versions of which, of varying degrees of accuracy, have passed into the folklore of psychology.

3.1 Early Experimental Psychology

The following supplements discuss ideas and research about imagery in early (late 19th and early 20th century) scientific psychology:

Supplement: Founders of Experimental Psychology: Wilhelm Wundt and William James

Supplement: Edward B. Titchener: The Complete Iconophile

Supplement: The Perky Experiment

3.2 The Imageless Thought Controversy

Perhaps Wundt's most important German student was Oswald Külpe, who had for several years served as Wundt's assistant professor, but eventually left to set up his own laboratory in the philosophy department of Würzburg University. He and his students there developed a direct challenge to the prevalent imagery theory of thought. Under the influence of both Machian positivism and, later, the act psychology of Brentano and the phenomenology of Husserl, Külpe, like Titchener (whom he had helped train), rejected what he saw as Wundt's unnecessarily strict methodological restrictions on the scope of empirical science, and encouraged his students to extend the scope of the introspective method to the study of the “higher” processes of thought and reasoning (Danziger, 1979, 1980; Ash, 1998). In 1901, two of these students, Mayer and Orth, performed a word association experiment in which subjects were asked to report everything that had passed through their mind between hearing the stimulus word and giving the response. Note that it was normal practice, in this era of psychology, for experimental subjects, or observers as they were more often called, to be drawn from among fellow researchers within the same laboratory, often including the supervising professor. Present day psychologists would, with good reason, suspect such subjects of being liable to produce results strongly biased by theoretical preconceptions (Orne, 1962; Intons-Peterson, 1983). Great pains are usually taken, today, to ensure that subjects in psychological experiments have no idea what hypothesis the experiment is supposed to be testing. In 1901 however, it was thought that experienced and knowledgeable observers were more likely to produce consistent and meaningful results than the psychologically untrained. In the case of the Meyer and Orth experiment, two amongst the four subjects were Meyer and Orth themselves. Nevertheless, they professed to be surprised by some of their findings. In particular:

The subjects frequently reported that they experienced certain events of consciousness which they could quite clearly designate neither as definite images nor yet as volitions. For example, the subject Meyer made the observation that, in reference to the stimulus word “metre” a peculiar event of consciousness intervened which could not be characterized more exactly, and which was succeeded by the spoken response “trochee”. (Meyer & Orth, as quoted and translated by Humphrey, 1951)

The jargon term bewusstseinslagen (“states of consciousness” — Humphrey, 1951) was coined to designate these indescribable non-sensorial states, and they soon began to turn up in more and more profusion in the introspective reports generated in the Würzburg laboratory, taking on an increasing theoretical significance as time went by. In 1905 another Würzburg researcher, Ach, also introduced the largely overlapping, but more explicitly intentionalistic concept of bewusstheit or “awareness”, an unanalysable “impalpably given ‘knowing’” (Ach, quoted and translated by Humphrey, 1951), and by 1907, Karl Bühler, perhaps the most radical of Külpe's students, was simply referring to gedanken (“thoughts”). Bühler's experiments might, for example, involve giving a subject (often professor Külpe himself) a somewhat gnomic sentence to interpret (e.g., “Thinking is so extraordinarily difficult that many prefer to judge”) and then collecting introspective reports of the conscious, but allegedly non-imaginal, gedanken that had occurred between the hearing of the sentence and the giving of the interpretation. Although the Würzburg school never denied that imagery does occur, by this time the greater part of the conscious contents of minds examined in Würzburg seemed to be non-imaginal.

Unsurprisingly, Wundt, and others, refused to accept these new methods and conclusions, and a heated debate, the so called imageless thought controversy, ensued. Though Wundt was surely skeptical of the existence of imageless thoughts, his primary criticisms were methodological. He was very much concerned with the fact that the experiments were necessarily constructed so that the introspective reports were given after the completion of the experimental task (word association, sentence interpretation, or whatever). The Würzburg research thus involved discursive recollection (or was it reconstruction?) of conscious contents that were no longer present to the mind. Such experiments, Wundt argued, were open invitations to suggestion, and, indeed, were

not experiments at all in the sense of scientific methodology: they are counterfeit experiments that seem methodical simply because they are ordinarily performed in a psychological laboratory and involve the coöperation of two persons, who purport to be experimenter and observer. In reality, they are as unmethodical as possible; they possess none of the special features by which we distinguish the introspections of experimental psychology from the casual introspections of everyday life. (Wundt, quoted and translated by Titchener, 1909. Original German, 1907.)

Titchener (see supplement) also strongly objected to the alleged demonstrations of imageless thought, but for different reasons. He did not object to the aims or the introspective methodology of the Würzburg school, but to their purported results, and, for him, the experiments were not so much misconceived as incompetently executed: In particular, he felt, the observers (experimental subjects) in Würzburg had been inadequately trained in the art of introspection. According to Titchener, the main pitfall of introspection was what he called the “stimulus error,” the strong tendency to confound the conscious experience itself with whatever it might represent. Thus, to report, when looking at a rectangular table top, that one experiences a rectangle, would be to commit the stimulus error: The “real” conscious content would (on Titchener's view) have the trapezoidal shape that the table top projects upon the retina. For Titchener, the intentionality generally ascribed to imageless thoughts was clear evidence that the Würzburg introspectors were committing the stimulus error systematically: They were not reporting the intrinsic nature of their conscious contents, but what those contents signified. Titchener suggested that the purported bewusstseinslagen etc. were, in fact, faint and fleeting kinaesthetic sensations, feelings of muscular tension and the like (Tweney, 1987). In Titchener's own laboratory, experiments quite similar to those done in Würzburg, but carried out using introspective observers well trained in avoiding the stimulus error (Titchener himself, or his own graduate students), produced no reports of imageless thoughts. Instead, they found the fleeting imagery or the subtle bodily sensations that Professor Titchener's theory predicted (Titchener, 1909; Humphrey, 1951).

This work of Titchener's (like other responses to the imageless thought controversy from America, Britain, and elsewhere) had relatively little impact in Germany, which, with some justification at that time, still regarded itself as very much preeminent in psychological science. Nevertheless, on both sides of the Atlantic the controversy was recognized as touching on deep foundational issues in the science of mind. Although largely forgotten today, it seems to have had a lasting impact on the development not only of psychology, but philosophy as well. The Würzburg school's claims, despite their shaky basis, undoubtedly contributed to a sense that imagery could not be so psychologically important as had traditionally been assumed, and that an alternative way of thinking about cognitive content was needed. Many psychologists and philosophers of this era came, partly for this reason, to feel that thought should be understood in terms of language per se, and that it was a serious mistake ever to have believed that the representational power of language derives from some more fundamental form of representation, such as mental imagery.[20]

But the imageless thought controversy was never satisfactorily resolved, at least in the terms in which it was originally posed. Indeed, philosophers are still arguing over the issues involved (e.g., Lormand, 1996; Mangan, 2001; Pitt, 2004; Robinson, 2005). Although the Würzburg school has been lauded for drawing psychology's attention to the intentionality of mental contents, and for the introduction of once important concepts such as “mental set” into the science, it would certainly be grossly misleading to suggest that their work provides evidence for the existence of non-sensorial conscious mental contents (i.e. imageless thoughts) that comes anywhere close to meeting present day scientific standards. Indeed, the fact that Külpe's and Titchener's laboratories each produced results that fitted their directors' contrasting preconceptions did not go unnoticed by their contemporaries. The irresolvable dispute contributed significantly to a growing sense of intellectual crisis within psychology, leading to a deep loss of confidence (persisting to the present – see Schwitzgebel (2002a,b, 2008)) in the scientific value of introspection. It also led to a precipitous decline in scientific interest in imagery, especially in the United States after the Behaviorist movement took hold. On the one hand its importance in the cognitive economy (or even its very existence) was now subject to doubt; on the other hand it had come to seem that it was very difficult, if not impossible, to study it experimentally and objectively.

Further discussion of the consequences of the imageless thought controversy:

Supplement: European Responses: Jaensch, Freud, and Gestalt Psychology

Supplement: The American Response: Behaviorist Iconophobia and Motor Theories of Imagery

3.3 Imagery in Twentieth Century Philosophy

By the early 20th century, particularly in the United States, where it most flourished, psychology had progressively established a disciplinary identity distinct from the parent discipline of philosophy. However, interest in and attitudes towards imagery amongst philosophers followed a very similar trajectory to that seen in psychology. Early in the century, philosophers as otherwise diverse as Russell (1919, 1921) and Bergson (1907) still gave imagery a key role in their theories of meaning and cognition (although it may be significant that Bergson seems to regard what he called the “cinematic” imagery-based thought of “ordinary” and “intellectual” cognition as distinctly inferior to the non-imaginal philosophical intuition that also played a large role in his epistemology). However, before long, and especially in the wake of the imageless thought controversy, doubts were beginning to emerge, in the work of philosophers such as Schlick (1918), Sartre (1936, 1940), Ryle (1949), and especially the later Wittgenstein, both about imagery's importance in cognition, and about whether the whole notion of “pictures in the mind” really made sense.

Indeed, even in the late 19th century Frege (1884 §§59–60) had already argued against the traditional view that the meaningfulness of language derives from the mental images that we associate with words. Images, he pointed out, are subjective and idiosyncratic, whereas word meanings are objective and universal. However, the almost unanimous scorn with which the imagery theory of meaning was regarded by late 20th century analytic philosophers seems mainly to be due to the influence and arguments of the later Wittgenstein (Candlish, 2001; Nyíri, 2001). Today, it is largely thanks to Wittgenstein's efforts that,

an imagistic account of thinking such as is outlined in Russell's Analysis of Mind (Lecture X) [Russell, 1921] or elaborated in H.H. Price's Thinking and Experience [Price, 1953] is usually no more felt to deserve critical attention than is, say, a geocentric account of the universe. (Candlish, 2001 §2).

In fact, Wittgenstein implicitly rejected the imagery theory of meaning even in his early work – the so called “picture theory of meaning” of the Tractatus (Wittgenstein, 1922) is not a version of the imagery theory – but an explicit critique appears only in his posthumously published later writings (although the arguments were already influential during his lifetime, long before they saw print). Perhaps the most sustained critique of the imagery theory of meaning occurs in the opening pages of The Blue and Brown Books (Wittgenstein,1958), although the pithier remarks in the Philosophical Investigations (1953 – especially §139f) may have been more influential. Many other remarks and arguments scattered through Wittgenstein's other posthumously published writings, particularly in Zettel (1967), the Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology (1980a, 1980b), and the Last Writings on the Philosophy of Psychology (1990), demonstrate that he was fascinated by imagery, but deeply skeptical not only about the large cognitive role traditionally assigned to it, but also about the traditional understanding of the image as a sort of inner picture (see, e.g. 1953 I §301, II pp. 196e & 213e).

No-one could seriously doubt that Wittgenstein himself recognized the experiential reality and philosophical importance of imagery: he expends so much effort wrestling with the concept. Nevertheless, as Nyíri (2001) remarks, “Wittgenstein's untiring endeavor [is] to relegate mental images to a merely secondary place.” He determinedly rejected the traditional empiricist view that thinking is primarily a play of images, that language is semantically grounded in imagery, and that the principal role of language is to communicate the results of our inner, imaginal thought processes to others. Instead, Wittgenstein regarded language itself as the preeminent vehicle of thought, and he held that the meanings of linguistic expressions arise from the various uses to which they are put. He thus saw no need (and no room) for language to be semantically grounded in any other form of representation. In support of this position, he strove to show that imagery (the only real candidate for the job) could not possibly be the semantic ground of language, and he is very widely believed to have succeeded.

The two themes of the cognitive unimportance of imagery and its non-pictorial nature were taken up, and argued more fully, by numerous post-Wittgensteinian philosophers in the latter half of the twentieth century. Although there may be some tension between the themes (most arguments against the imagery theory of thought and meaning seem to turn upon mental images being, in some sense, picture-like) in practice they have rarely, if ever, come into conflict; rather, both have played their part in setting the iconophobic tone of the era.

Even in the wake of the revival of scientific interest in the cognitive roles of imagery in the 1960s and 70s, the handful of post-Wittgensteinian philosophers who have attempted to defend imagery-based theories of thought and meaning (Price, 1953; Lowe, 1995, 1996; Ellis, 1995; Nyíri, 2001) still find themselves swimming very much against the tide. Philosophers such as Harrison (1962–3), Goodman (1968), and Fodor (1975) have reinforced, restated and extended Wittgenstein's arguments for the irrelevance of imagery to semantics, and have made a powerful and influential case. One point that is often made is that there seems to be no natural way of representing certain linguistically expressible concepts in an image. Logical relations are often mentioned in this context. It is hard to see, for example, how it might be possible to form a mental image of not (is any image in which John does not appear an image of John is not here?), or or (how would an image of A or B differ from one of A and B?), or if…then.

The image theory of linguistic meaning might seem to be on its strongest ground when it is applied to nouns (or, at least, concrete nouns). On the face of things, it is plausible to think that one understands the meaning of the word 'dog' if and only if as the word is able to arouse an image of a dog in one's mind. Berkeley's argument against general ideas had long brought this simple picture into question, however (see section 2.3.3). Can my mental picture of a dog represent any dog, or dogs in general, or is it, at best, just a representation of Rover?

Twentieth century philosophers, however, would soon point to an even deeper problem. They assumed, probably often correctly, that the traditional image theory of meaning was based upon the assumption that images themselves get their meaning through resembling their objects: an image of a dog represents a dog because it resembles or looks like a dog, in the same way that a painting of Queen Elizabeth represents Queen Elizabeth because it looks like her. This resemblance theory of representation is not always explicitly stated by image theorists of thought and language (perhaps it is thought to be too obvious to be worth saying, or perhaps not all of them are really committed to it), but Russell (1919,1921), for one, explicitly takes the view that words represent because they are associated with mental images, and that the images themselves represent because they resemble their objects.

This resemblance theory became the main focus of attack. Consider a photograph of Leo the lion. It would certainly be reasonable to say both that it resembles and that it represents him. But now suppose we have two such photographs. Each photo resembles the other more than either resemble Leo (both photos are small, rectangular pieces of card, with a white border around a gray or vari-colored rectangle, and neither is carnivorous or furry), yet we would normally want to say that they each represent Leo, and not that they represent each other. Of course, a photograph of Leo does resemble him, when the right aspects of resemblance are considered, but in this regard Leo equally resembles the photograph. We are unlikely, however, to want to say that he represents the photo. Resemblance is a symmetrical relationship, and representation is not. None of this necessarily means that resemblance never plays any role in representation, but in order for it to do so, the relevant aspects of resemblance have to be recognized, and the resembling object has to be used (or, at least, taken) as a representation. But surely, before a cognitive system can recognize or use the relevant aspects of resemblance between a photograph (or an inner quasi-picture) and an object (or a percept), it must already be able to represent the picture and its object, and their various features, to itself. The mind's power to recognize resemblance seemingly depends on its power to represent things, rather than vice-versa. On grounds such as this, Goodman (1968) argued that even physical pictures – paintings drawings, photographs, etc. – do not represent their subjects because they resemble them. Indeed, he held that what a picture represents is just as much a matter of interpretation and convention as is what a word or sentence represents, the implication being that pictorial representation is no more “natural” or fundamental, no more a “ground” for meaning, than linguistic representation itself. Clearly the argument applies to mental pictures quite as much as to physical ones.

Fodor (1975), borrowing liberally from the Wittgenstein of the Philosophical Investigations (1953 §139 f.), made a compelling case that mental pictures cannot be the foundational bearers of intentionality because what they resemble is too indeterminate (cf. Goodman, 1970). A mental image of John, who is a tall fat man, might mean John, it might mean fat man (or John is a fat man), or tall man, or just man, human being, or even physical object. On the other hand it might mean John in just the particular pose and situation in which he is imagined. After all, it resembles all those things (and indefinitely many more). What an image means, according to Fodor, what it is an image of, will necessarily remain radically indeterminate unless it is pinned down by an associated linguistic description. Fodor himself holds that what our mental images represent is determined by an associated description couched in mentalese, an innate, unconscious, computational “language of thought” (Fodor, 1975) (see: language of thought hypothesis); others, such as Kaufmann (1980), apparently think that the necessary descriptions may be couched in the natural language that the imager speaks. On either view, though, the traditional semantic dependency is inverted. Instead of the meaningfulness of language being grounded in imagery, the meaningfulness of imagery seems to need grounding in some sort of language.

Arguments against the pictorial nature of imagery, which are scarcely more than hinted at in Wittgenstein's published works, were developed much more explicitly by Ryle (1949). As part of a broader (and very influential) attack on what he called “Descartes' myth” (i.e., Cartesian dualism), Ryle argued that the notion of private, non-physical, mental pictures is an absurdity, and proposed instead that “imagining”, “seeing in the mind's eye”, and so forth, is better understood as akin to pretending (to ourselves) to experience ordinary, external things. Other philosophers influenced by both Wittgenstein and Ryle soon carried forward this critique of the inner picture: Shorter (1952) and Dennett (1969) (in some respects anticipating the work of Pylyshyn (1973) – see section 4.4.1 below, and especially note 31) suggested that imagery might be more akin to describing or depicting something to oneself, rather than to pretending to see it; and, from a detailed exegesis of Ryle's arguments, Ishiguro (1966, 1967) developed a theory of mental images as intentional objects (in the sense of Anscombe (1965)) having a merely “grammatical” existence: Although the grammar of our language may sometimes make it very awkward to refer to our imagery experiences without seeming to imply that they are caused by certain entities (mental images), it does not follow that such entities actually exist.

Although expressed in very different terms, Ishiguro's position on imagery is not altogether unlike the view developed earlier in the century by Sartre (1940). (See Ryle (1971) for an interesting comparison of his own views about the mental, including mental imagery, to views in the phenomenological tradition, to which Sartre belonged.) Under the influence of Husserl rather than Wittgenstein, Sartre also stressed the intentionality of imagery and denied that mental images (conceived as entities) exist:

The fact of the matter is that the expression ‘mental image’ is confusing. … But since the word image is of long standing we cannot reject it completely. However, in order to avoid all ambiguity, we must repeat at this point that an image is nothing else than a relationship. The imaginative consciousness I have of Peter is not a consciousness of an image of Peter: Peter is directly reached, my attention is not directed on an image but on an object (Sartre, 1940 p. 8).

It is important to be clear that just because Sartre (and Ryle, Shorter, Ishiguro, and others) hold that mental images are not inner pictures, nor even, indeed, any sort of entity, they are not thereby denying that people have quasi-perceptual experiences, or even that these may sometimes be very vivid. Unfortunately, perhaps because the notion that such experiences are caused by inner pictures is so entrenched in our folk psychology, this point does not always seem to have been clear to critics of such views, and it has even been occasionally suggested that they could not possibly be held by anyone personally familiar with the experience of imagery.[21] However, a careful reading of these apparently iconophobic authors soon reveals that they in no way intend to deny the experiential reality of imagery, and most of them make their personal familiarity with it quite clear.[22] They deny only that such experience, however vivid it might be, is caused by (or embodied as) inner pictures.

By contrast, in his Mental Images – A Defence, Hannay (1971) vigorously championed the reality of inner pictures (see also Hannay, 1973, and for a counterargument see Candlish, 1975). But, despite the fact that he had no thought of reinstating imagery to its traditional importance in cognitive and semantic theory, Hannay clearly saw himself (in 1971) as a lonely dissenter, a voice crying in the wilderness against philosophy's virtually monolithic iconophobic consensus. In the subsequent decades that consensus has been fractured, but by no means shattered, by developments in cognitive psychology and cognitive science (discussed below). In particular, in the wake of Kosslyn's (1980, 1994) seminal work on the cognitive psychology of imagery, a growing number of philosophers are now ready to defend the reality of mental pictures, and show no sign whatsoever of feeling embattled (e.g., von Eckardt, 1988, 1993; Tye, 1988, 1991; Mortensen, 1989; Brann, 1991; Cohen, 1996; Rollins, 2001). Many other philosophers, even if not entirely convinced about pictures, now take a serious interest in the cognitive science of imagery.

Nonetheless, the post-Wittgensteinian consensus that imagery cannot be as important as it once seemed to be, that it cannot be the ground of linguistic meaning or the prime vehicle of thought, remains strong. Furthermore, Bennett & Hacker (2003) have recently made a powerful restatement of the Wittgensteinian case against mental entities in general and mental pictures in particular. Despite all that has happened in cognitive science, imagery has by no means regained its former prominence in philosophy.

4. Imagery in Cognitive Science

A revival of interest in imagery was an important component of the so called cognitive revolution in psychology during the 1960s and early 1970s, a period when the Behaviorist intellectual hegemony over the field was broken and the concept of mental representation was established as central and vital to psychological theorizing (Baars, 1986; Gardner, 1987; but see also Leahey, 1992). The first (and formative) textbook of the emerging cognitive approach to psychology (Neisser, 1967) devoted substantial space to mental imagery, and the end of the 1960s brought the publication of a spate of books reviewing and reporting new findings on the psychology of imagery: Richardson (1969), Horowitz (1970), Paivio (1971), Piaget & Inhelder (1971), Segal (1971a), Sheehan (1972).

Although the emergence of computational models of mental processes probably played the leading role in the rise of cognitive psychology and cognitive science, the new interest in imagery was independently motivated, and contributed significantly to the growing feeling, amongst psychologists, that both the ontology and methodology of Behaviorism were excessively restrictive, and that inner mental processes and representations could, after all, be useful, or even indispensible, scientific concepts. Quite apart from the broader talk of revolution in psychology in this era (e.g., Hebb, 1960), there seems to have been a real sense, at the time, that the revival of interest in imagery was, in itself, an insurgent movement liberating psychologists from entrenched but outworn Behaviorist dogmas. The imagery revival was depicted in dramatic terms as “the return of the ostracized” (Holt, 1964; cf. Haber, 1970), as “a dimension of mind rediscovered” (Kessell, 1972), and as marking “a paradigm shift in psychology” (Neisser, 1972b).

4.1 The Imagery Revival

Holt (1964) indicates a number of developments that led some psychologists, in the 1950s, to begin to pay significant attention to imagery again. These include research on hallucinogenic drugs, developments in electroencephalography, the discovery of REM sleep and its correlation with dreaming, and Penfield's (1958) finding that direct electrical stimulation of certain brain areas can give rise to vivid memory (or pseudo-memory) imagery. More significant, however, (according to Holt) was a line of psychological research that was originally inspired by practical, rather than theoretical, concerns: by the perceptual problems experienced by people such as radar operators, long-distance truck drivers, and jet pilots, whose work requires them to remain perceptually alert whilst watching monotonous, impoverished, and barely changing visual stimuli over extended periods of time. In the laboratory, subjects experiencing such sensory deprivation often spontaneously reported vivid, intrusive, and sometimes bizarre mental imagery, “like having a dream while awake” (Bexton, Heron, & Scott, 1954; but see Suedfeld & Coren, 1989). Despite the introspective nature of the evidence, the practical implications of these findings (for such things as road and air safety) made them hard to dismiss.

Beginning in the 1960s, and perhaps stimulated by some of the research mentioned by Holt, there was also a growing interest in the application of imagery based techniques in psychotherapy and psychosomatic medicine (see, e.g., Assagioli, 1965; Horowitz, 1970, 1983; Korn & Johnson, 1983; Sheikh, 2002). By the 1970s, something of a self conscious imagery movement had taken hold, in which discoveries and theoretical developments coming out of experimental psychology and cognitive science helped to fuel and legitimate an enthusiasm for the application of imagery to psychotherapy, and even to “personal growth,” “consciousness expansion,” and the like. More recently, imagery based techniques, including, but not limited to, so called “mental practice” (Richardson, 1967; Ryan & Simons, 1982; Nordin et al., 2006), have come to be extensively applied in sports psychology, where they are widely believed to have the potential to boost athletic performance to a significant degree (Paivio, 1985; Sheikh & Korn, 1994; Driskell et al., 1994; Morris et al., 2005; Short et al., 2006; Weinberg, 2008). A journal dedicated to the subject, the Journal of Imagery Research in Sport and Physical Activity commenced online publication in 2006 (see Other Internet Resources). Great claims are also made, by some, for the healing powers of guided imagery, whereby clients (or patients) are encouraged to visualize particular scenes or scenarios thought to have therapeutic value (e.g., Rossman, 2000). Guided imagery techniques have been claimed to be effective for purposes ranging from chronic pain relief and the preparation of patients for surgery (Fontaine, 2000; Tusek et al., 1997), to breast enlargement and global spiritual renewal (Willard, 1977; Ekstein, 2001)!

It is sometimes claimed or implied that these sorts of techniques are based upon ancient oriental, and particularly Indian, spiritual practices (e.g., Samuels & Samuels, 1975; Gawain, 1982), and it thus may not be coincidental that a prominent figure in the psychotherapeutic imagery movement is a Pakistani born psychologist, Akhter Ahsen, known not only for his clinical and theoretical work (e.g., Ahsen, 1965, 1977, 1984, 1985, 1993, 1999), but also because he was instrumental, in the later 1970s, in the foundation of the International Imagery Association, and the peer reviewed Journal of Mental Imagery (which began publication in 1977). The Association's mission, stated on their web site, is “to further the understanding of mental imagery and advance its potential in the development of human consciousness” (see Other Internet Resources). The journal publishes articles on imagery from a wide range of psychological perspectives, including the cognitive. An American Association for the Study of Mental Imagery was also founded in 1978, with a mission to promote “the study of mental imagery as a part of human science and the application of scientific knowledge about mental imagery in the relief of human suffering and the enhancement of personal development”. Its journal, Imagination, Cognition and Personality, commenced publication in the early 1980s. (The Association may now be defunct — its web site has disappeared — but the journal continues to be published.)

4.2 Mnemonic Effects of Imagery

Despite the developments outlined above, interest in imagery amongst experimental psychologists remained at a fairly low level until the mid to late 1960s. It was the recognition, in that period, of the powerful mnemonic effects of imagery that changed the situation, leading to a thriving tradition of experimental research, and securing imagery a firm place in cognitive theory. These mnemonic effects, it turned out, could be clearly demonstrated in readily repeatable experiments that did not rely in any way upon introspective reports.

According to Bugelski (1977, 1984), an important stimulus to the flowering of experimental research on imagery and memory[23] was the 1966 publication of Frances Yates' celebrated and widely read historical study, The Art of Memory. Yates details how imagery based mnemonic techniques, particularly versions of the so-called method of loci, were in widespread use amongst European intellectuals, educators, and orators from classical Greek through to early modern times, and she argues that the knowledge and use of these techniques may have had quite significant effects on the development of Western philosophical, theological, and early scientific thought. (see Supplement: Ancient Imagery Mnemonics).

Around the same time, Soviet psychologist Alexander Luria's (1960, 1968) extensive case study of the “mnemonist” Shereshevskii first became available in English, and well known amongst English-speaking psychologists. Shereshevskii's truly prodigious feats of memory were apparently made possible by an abnormally vivid visual imagination, often harnessed to his own version of the method of loci. Experiment soon confirmed that the imagery method of loci, as described by Yates and Luria, was extremely effective in enhancing memory performance in ordinary people (Ross & Lawrence, 1968).

In fact, Canadian psychologist Allan Paivio was already quietly working on the mnemonic effects of imagery in the early 1960s, before either Yates or Luria had published their books (Paivio, 1963, 1965). (His interest in the subject was apparently sparked by a demonstration of imagery mnemonics he witnessed at a public speaking course (Marks, 1997).) However, the considerable attention that Paivio's theoretical speculations and painstaking quantitative experiments were attracting by the end of the decade surely owed much to the interest aroused by the more eye-catching historical and anecdotal studies of Yates and Luria. By the later 1960s, and in the 1970s, many other psychologists would take up research in this area, but Paivio was well established as the field's leading figure, and discussion centered largely upon the implications and merits, or otherwise, of the Dual Coding (imagery code and verbal code) theory of mental representation that Paivio proposed to explain his results (Paivio, 1971, 1986, 1991, 1995, 2007). Although they inevitably became entangled, this contoversy between the Dual Coding and the rival Common Coding theories of memory (see Supplement: Dual Coding and Common Coding Theories of Memory) should not be confused with the better known debate between analog (pictorial) and propositional (descriptive) theories of imagery (see section 4.4). The former debate is about the function of imagery in cognition, the latter is about the nature and mechanism of imagery itself.

The findings of this extensive experimental research program on the mnemonic effects of imagery, can be crudely summarized as the discovery of two principal effects. First of all, it was demonstrated quite incontrovertibly that subjects who follow explicit instructions to use simple imagery based mnemonic techniques to memorize verbal material (typically lists of apparently random words, or word pairs) remember it very much better than subjects who do not use such techniques (Bower, 1970, 1972; Bugelski, 1970; Paivio, 1971; Neisser & Kerr, 1973). Secondly, and somewhat more controversially, Paivio and others claim to have shown that imagery plays a large role in verbal memory even when the experimental subjects are not given explicit instructions to form imagery, and make no deliberate effort to do so. To demonstrate this, Paivio and his associates initially determined quantitative imagery values for each of a long list of nouns: that is to say, the relative ease with which subjects could generate a mental image appropriate to the word, or the likelihood that an image would spontaneously be evoked by the word in question (Paivio, Yuille, & Madigan, 1968).[24] (On the whole, concrete nouns such as ‘cat’ have high imagery values, and abstract nouns such as ‘truth’ have low ones, although there are exceptions to this rule.) Once these quantitative imagery values were established, Paivio was able to show, in various experimental designs, that words with high imagery values were consistently remembered significantly better than those with lower ones, quite regardless of any conscious intent on the subjects' part to form relevant images (Paivio, 1971, 1983, 1991).[25]

Further discussion of theories of the mnemonic properties of imagery:

Supplement: Dual Coding and Common Coding Theories of Memory

Supplement: Conceptual Issues in Dual Coding Theory

4.3 The Spatial Properties of Imagery

By the end of the 1960s, the work of Paivio and others on the mnemonic properties of imagery had established a strong empirical case for the functional importance of imagery in cognition. The phenomenon could no longer be ignored by psychologists, or treated as a mere subjective epiphenomenon of no scientific interest, as it had been in the Behaviorist era. However, this work had done very little to illuminate the nature of imagery itself, or of the cognitive mechanisms that generate it.

This began to change in the early 1970s when Roger Shepard and his students began to publish experimental demonstrations of the “mental rotation” of images (e.g., Shepard & Metzler, 1971; Shepard & Cooper et al., 1982). Soon after, Stephen Kosslyn and his collaborators produced experimental evidence for the “mental scanning” of visual images, showing that it took longer for subjects to consciously scan between image features that were relatively further apart than between those that appeared close together (Kosslyn, 1973, 1980; Kosslyn, Ball, & Reiser, 1978; Pinker & Kosslyn, 1978; Pinker, 1980; Finke & Pinker, 1983; Pinker, Choate, & Finke, 1984; Borst & Kosslyn, 2008). (There were also related claims that “the visual angle of the mind's eye” could be experimentally measured (Kosslyn, 1978a; Finke & Kosslyn, 1980; Finke & Kurtzman, 1981a,b).)

Kosslyn also demonstrated that the subjective sizes of visual mental images (and the relative sizes of their sub-parts) measurably affect the times it takes to inspect and report on particular details of imagined objects. The presence of larger features of an object could be reported more quickly (from an image of the object) than smaller features. As this size-time relation, did not appear unless the subjects used imagery to do the task (i.e., to confirm that some named object type has some particular feature or sub-part), these experiments provided further evidence for the notion that imagery is a sui generis form of mental representation, with distinct properties from linguistic or purely conceptual representations (Kosslyn, 1975, 1976a, 1976b, 1980).

It should be noted that the methodology of many of these experiments leaves them vulnerable to the charge, pressed by several critics, that the results reflect not so much the normal workings of cognition, and the properties of the representational structures (such as mental images) that enable them, but, rather, what psychologists call the demand characteristics of the experimental situation (Orne, 1962; Rosnow, 2002) (see supplement). This is a well-known pitfall of psychological experimentation with human subjects, and experimenters are, for the most part, well aware of it, and take what precautions they can to rule out the possibility that demand characteristics might significantly influence their findings. Nevertheless, certain types of imagery experiment, including most of those discussed in this section, appear to be particularly susceptible to such influence (Intons-Peterson, 1983), and it may sometimes be effectively impossible to rule out the possibility that demand characteristics have played a large, or even predominant, role in determining the results. Thus, some of the results obtained in this area of research remain open to question. Despite this, however, converging evidence from several different types of experiment has been enough to convince a majority of cognitive scientists that processes like mental scanning, mental rotation, and size effects in image inspection are real and significant components of cognition.

Shepard, Kosslyn, and others argued that these results show that visual mental imagery has inherently spatial properties, and represents in an “analog” fashion that is quite different to the way that language and other symbolic systems represent (Shepard & Chipman, 1970; Shepard, 1975, 1978b, 1981; 1984; Kosslyn, 1975, 1980, 1981, 1983; Kosslyn, Pinker, Smith, & Shwartz, 1979). However, others, particularly among those who were strongly committed to a (digital) computational view of the mind, firmly rejected this conception of imagery (Simon, 1972; Anderson & Bower, 1973; Baylor, 1973; Moran, 1973; Pylyshyn, 1973, 1978, 1981, 1984; Hinton, 1979; Slezak, 1995). A lively and high-profile theoretical debate ensued, about the nature of mental imagery and of mental representation in general.

Further discussion of experiments on the spatial properties of imagery:

Supplement: Mental Rotation

Supplement: The Problem of Demand Characteristics in Imagery Experiments

4.4 The Analog-Propositional Debate

The analog-propositional debate, occasionally also called the picture-description debate, or sometimes just the imagery debate (as if there were no other debatable or hotly debated issues about imagery) is an ongoing and notoriously irreconcilable dispute within cognitive science about the representational format of visual mental imagery. The huge impact it had on the early development of the field appears to have resulted in a widespread belief, amongst both philosophers and cognitive scientists, that analog and propositional theories (those terms being understood in the rather special senses that they have acquired in this context), together, perhaps, with hybrid theories incorporating elements of both (e.g., Chambers, 1993), completely exhaust the space of possible or empirically plausible scientific accounts of imagery (Thomas, 2002). That is not the case, as we shall see in section 4.5.

To a first approximation, the analog side of the debate holds that the mental representations that we experience as imagery are, in some important sense, like pictures, with intrinsically spatial representational properties of the sort that pictures have (i.e., pictures do not just represent spatial relationships between the objects they depict, but represent those relationships, at least in part, via actual spatial relationships on the picture surface). The propositional side, by contrast, holds the relevant mental representations to be more like linguistic descriptions (of visual scenes), without inherently spatial properties of their own. Although it began as a dispute amongst scientists, the debate clearly touches on fundamental issues about the nature of mind and thought, and perhaps the nature of science too, so it soon attracted a good deal of interest from philosophers as well.

It is good to be aware that the terms analog and propositional, although they have become entrenched usage in this context, are both potentially misleading. On the one hand the propositions which are supposed by some to constitute the descriptions that constitute imagery, are not really propositions at all in the established philosophical sense of the word: rather they are a sort of sentence (albeit not sentences natural language, but of mentalese).[26] On the other hand, the “quasi-pictorial” theory of Kosslyn (1980, 1983, 1994, 2005), which has become very much the dominant theory on the other side of the debate, in fact models mental images as digitized pictures generated within a simulation program running on a digital computer (Kosslyn & Shwartz, 1977; Kosslyn, 1980).[27]

Although the debate began, and was at its fiercest, during the formative years of the discipline of cognitive science in the 1970s, it has yet to reach a generally accepted resolution. Despite Kosslyn's (1994) unilateral declaration of victory for the analog side, controversy has flared up anew, and continues in the 21st century (Slezak, 1995, 2002; Thomas, 1999b, 2002, 2003, 2009; Pylyshyn, 2002a,b, 2003a,b,c, 2004; Kosslyn, Ganis & Thompson, 2003, 2004; Kosslyn, 2005; Grueter, 2006; Kosslyn, Thompson, & Ganis, 2006; Dulin et al., 2008). The Behavioral and Brain Sciences target article by Kosslyn, Pinker, Smith, & Shwartz (1979), together with the appended commentaries, provides a good sense of the debate at its height, and many of the most important philosophically oriented contributions to its early stages can be found in two collections edited by Block (1981a,b). However, it may be difficult to understand the scientific and philosophical issues at stake unless one has a sense of the historical and intellectual context in which the dispute originated.

Matters became so hotly contested during the 1970s that some participants, most notably Anderson (1978) and Palmer (1975b, 1978), came to the conclusion that the disagreement was quite impossible to resolve by the methods of scientific psychology, or perhaps at all. Indeed, Anderson (1978) offered a formal proof purporting to show that the two main contending theories are empirically equivalent. Anderson's arguments in particular aroused much interest at the time, and were themselves vigorously disputed (Hayes-Roth, 1979; Pylyshyn, 1979b; Cohen, 1996) and defended (Anderson, 1979). However, the main debate continued, and it is probably fair to say that most observers have come to the conclusion that the empirical equivalence claimed by Anderson is ultimately not particularly interesting or important. It can probably be regarded as just a special case of the well known Duhem-Quine underdetermination of theory by evidence: many philosophers of science hold that any theory can be made to fit any evidence provided one is allowed freely to supplement the theory with arbitrary (and perhaps ad hoc, complex, and implausible) auxiliary hypotheses, which is essentially what Anderson was doing. Nevertheless, the fact that such claims could be seriously proposed and discussed is testament to just how acrimonious and intractable this debate about imagery had come to seem at the time, and how important it was to those involved. The very possibility of a science of cognition seemed to be under threat.

Despite this, the debate's focus has, in practice, been quite narrow. Although it is often understood to be a debate about the nature of imagery per se, it may more truly be seen as about what theory of imagery will best account for the facts within the parameters of a computational functionalist theory of the mind, i.e., a theory that holds that mental states in general are to be identified with states of the brain as individuated in terms of their computational/functional role in cognition. Although this computational functionalism still has many adherents, it no longer dominates the philosophy of mind and cognition to the extent that it once did, but in the early 1970s it was new and exciting, and the computational approach to cognitive theory that it sanctioned was being taken up with great enthusiasm by many psychologists (Baars, 1986; Gardner, 1987). Both the cognitive psychologists and the functionalist philosophers drew much of their inspiration from Artificial Intelligence research in the "physical symbol systems" tradition of what Haugeland has called GOFAI (Good Old Fashioned AI) (Newell, 1981; Haugeland, 1985).

Initially the concurrent rise of imagery research and computational psychology played mutually reinforcing roles within the cognitivist revolution against Behaviorism, because they both implied that the concept of mental representation should play a central role in the science of the mind. However, a tension soon became apparent between the symbolic and syntactic concept of mental representation that came from Artificial Intelligence and the, on the face of it, very different concept implicit in the work of the imagery researchers. The analog-propositional debate, and much of the passion and partisanship it aroused, grew out of that tension, and more particularly, the desire to bring imagery within the fold of computational functionalism.

4.4.1 Pylyshyn's Critique, and Description Theory

The analog-propositional debate may be said to have begun when this tension found its first clear expression, in a very influential article by Zenon Pylyshyn (1973).[28] Since then, Pylyshyn has continued to extend and defend his critique of pictorial (or analog) theories of imagery in many subsequent publications (e.g., Pylyshyn, 1978, 1981,1984, 2002a,b,2003a,b, 2005). Although a number of other cognitive scientists and philosophers have taken positions, and made empirical and theoretical arguments, similar to and supportive of those of Pylyshyn (e.g., Anderson & Bower, 1973; Reed, 1974; Palmer, 1975a, 1977; Kieras, 1978; Hinton, 1979; Lang, 1979; Slezak, 1991, 1992, 1993, 1995, 2002), and others continue to reject picture theories for different reasons (e.g., Neisser, 1979; Heil, 1982; White, 1990; Thomas, 1999b, 2009; O'Regan & Noë, 2001; Bartolomeo, 2002; Bennett & Hacker, 2003), Pylyshyn remains indisputably the most important, influential, and trenchant critic of pictorial theories of imagery.

Clearly Pylyshyn objects, as many philosophers have before him, to the notion of inner mental pictures that are somehow called to mind and reperceived by the “mind's eye”. In his 1973 article he raised a number of objections to this notion, some of which have withstood criticism better than others, but the underlying worry was clearly that the inner-picture theory of imagery inevitably commits the homunculus fallacy: it implicitly relies on the assumption that there is a little man (or rather, something that is the functional equivalent of a full-fledged visual system, including eyes), or, at the very least, something with inexplicable mental powers, inside the head to reperceive, experience, and interpret the image. The broad functional architecture of Kosslyn's theory, in fact, closely parallels that of Descartes' account of imagery (see section 2.3.1, and Supplement: The Quasi-Pictorial Theory of Imagery), and, of course, Descartes notoriously relied upon a conscious homunculus, the immaterial soul, that is placed forever beyond the reach of natural science. Modern defenders of the pictorial/analog theory protest that they cannot have committed the homunculus fallacy (let alone committed themselves to Cartesian dualism) because a computer model of the theory has been implemented, and they have outlined an account of how picture-like representations, formed at an early stage of visual processing in the brain, are subject to several more stages of neural processing before they give rise to visual knowledge and experience (Kosslyn, 1980, 1994; Kosslyn, Thompson, & Ganis, 2002, 2006).

However, their critics remain unconvinced that they have truly successfully avoided these pitfalls (Slezak, 1993, 1995; Thomas, 1999b, 2003, 2009; Pylyshyn, 2002a,b, 2005). For instance, in the computer simulation of pictorial imagery due to Kosslyn & Shwartz (1977, 1978; see also Kosslyn, Flynn, et al., 1990) the role of the homunculus is played by the humans who program and/or operate the computer. The program constructs and displays pictures (for an example, see figure 2 in the Supplement: The Quasi-Pictorial Theory of Imagery, and its Problems), and transforms them in various ways in order to model image transformations such as mental rotation and mental scanning. However, nothing in the program implements, or even simulates or models, conscious awareness of these pictures (despite a handwave towards a “mind's eye function”), and nothing in the program is even intended to correspond to a grasp of what it is that the pictures represent (or even that they are supposed to be representations). Only the human onlooker consciously experiences the pictures, knows that they are pictures, and can tell what they might be pictures of (Thomas, 2009). If quasi-pictorial theory is capable of accounting for the representational and conscious nature of imagery without appealing to a homunculus, then the Kosslyn-Shwartz program might constitute a useful model of how images are built up and transformed. However, despite vehement claims to the contrary (e.g., Kosslyn, Thompson, & Ganis, 2006 p. 41), nothing about the program in any way shows that the theory can avoid making such an appeal.

In a subsequent paper, Pylyshyn (1978) introduced an important new argument against pictorialism, based on the concepts (which he introduced) of cognitive penetrability and impenetrability. The distinction between cognitively impenetrable and cognitively penetrable processes closely parallels Fodor's later distinction between modularized and unmodularized, “central” cognitive systems (Fodor, 1983). Cognitive processes are said to be cognitively penetrable if their workings can be affected by the beliefs and goals of the person, and cognitively impenetrable if they cannot be. Pylyshyn argues (and Fodor (1983) concurs) that there are good reasons to believe that “early” visual processing, i.e., the processes by which visual inputs give rise to beliefs about our surroundings, is cognitively impenetrable. For example, he points out that well known visual illusions, such as the Ponzo and Müller-Lyer illusions, continue to deceive us even when we know perfectly well that they are illusions (figure 4.4.1_1). The two horizontal lines in both the Ponzo and the Müller-Lyer figures continue to look as though they are of different lengths even when we have measured them and are quite convinced that they are, in fact, the same.

Ponzo and Müller-Lyer illusions

Figure 4.4.1_1
The Ponzo Illusion (left) and the Müller-Lyer Illusion (right).
In both cases, the two horizontal lines are the same length, but appear to be different lengths.

As Pylyshyn sees it, the view that he rejects, the view that visual mental imagery involves a representational format that is peculiarly visual and is distinct from the format in which beliefs and propositional attitudes in general are represented, amounts to the claim that images are generated within this cognitively impenetrable, “early visual processing” module. If that were the case, imagery should be a cognitively impenetrable phenomenon, but it is not.[29] The way we experience our mental imagery is clearly affected by our beliefs and goals. Not only do we have a large degree of voluntary control over the content of our imagery experiences, but it has also been experimentally demonstrated that extra-visual beliefs can influence the course of supposed imagery processes. For example, the times taken to “mentally scan” between different landmarks on a mental image of a map (see section 4.3 above) are affected not only by the actual relative distances between the points on the map, but also by information that is verbally given about those distances. Subjects tend to take longer to “mentally scan” over a distance marked as representing 80 miles than over a distance marked as 20 miles, even though the actual distances depicted on the map (which they have learned and are supposedly imagining) are the same (Richman, Mitchell, & Reznick, 1979a,b; see also Mitchell & Richman, 1980; Goldston et al., 1985; Reed, Hock & Lockhead, 1983).

Pylyshyn's views about the cognitive impenetrability of “early vision”, the relevance of this to our understanding of imagery, and the concept of cognitive penetrability/impenetrability itself, all remain controversial (see, for example, the commentaries published with Pylyshyn (1999)), but he has continued to develop and refine the concept (which also has applications outside the imagery debate), as well as the associated argument, over many years (e.g., Pylyshyn, 1984, 1999, 2002a, 2002b, 2003b).

Pylyshyn also argues (1981, 2002a) that most if not all of the experimental evidence that is supposed to show that imagery has inherently spatial properties (such as Kosslyn's work on mental scanning (Kosslyn, Ball, & Reiser, 1978; Kosslyn, 1980)) can be explained away as the result of the interaction of the experimental subject's tacit knowledge of the properties of visual experience and the experimental instructions. For instance, he holds that if subjects are asked to scan their mental gaze from one point to another on a mental image of a map, what they interpret these instructions to be asking them to do is to behave as if they were actually looking at the relevant map and scanning their gaze between the points. Because they know from their history of ordinary visual experience that it takes longer to scan between points that are further apart, this will be reflected in their performance. Thus, the fact that people instructed to scan across their images take longer to scan longer distances is not evidence of the existence of some inner, mental, image-space. Rather, it is a reflection of people's implicit understanding (which they may not necessarily always be able to articulate) of the visual properties of the actual space around them (cf, Morgan, 1979).

Pylyshyn's critics have often been inclined to conflate his tacit knowledge theory with the view that the results of imagery experiments may be fatally contaminated by the effects of experimental demand characteristics (see supplement). However, although he clearly does think experimental demand plays a large role in determining many of the results on imagery, he resists this interpretation of his position. He is not saying (as is sometimes implied) that experimental subjects are, as it were, consciously faking their performances in order to please the experimenter. Rather they are doing their best to comply with experimental instructions that turn upon the slippery concept of mental imagery. The fact that the subjects and the experimenter may share similar assumptions about the causes of quasi-visual experience (the “folk theory” of images as inner pictures), so that both interpret the experiment in terms of operations on inner pictures in an inner space, is not evidence that those assumptions are correct. It is generally assumed that problems caused by demand characteristics can be avoided or minimized by careful and ingenious experimental design, or by such tactics as post-experimental questioning of subjects to see if they have guessed the experimental hypothesis (Kosslyn, for one, routinely throws out data from subjects who guess this correctly). However, Pylyshyn is not saying that what might otherwise be meaningful experimental results are “contaminated” by the effects of demand characteristics, so such “decontamination” tactics are not very relevant. Rather, the problem lies with the basic conceptualization of the phenomena and the experimental tasks (by experimenter and subject alike).

Of course, Pylyshyn was far from the first person to raise objections to the idea of inner pictures, or to criticize the standard interpretations of imagery experiments. What made his critique particularly effective was that he began, both in his 1973 article and in subsequent writings (e.g., Pylyshyn, 1978, 1981, 1984, 2003b), to sketch out an alternative, non-pictorial account of the nature of mental imagery. Instead of being like pictorial representations of a visual scene, he suggested, images might better be thought of as being a sort of description (sometimes referred to as a “structural description”) of that scene. Perhaps for the first time in the history of thought, there now seemed to be a viable alternative to the pictorial conception of imagery that had dominated folk, philosophical, and psychological thinking about imagery since ancient times.[30] Philosophers such as Shorter (1952) and Dennett (1969) (who both base their position on the oft repeated, but almost certainly unsound, argument from image indeterminacy, or “tiger's stripes” argument) had anticipated Pylyshyn in suggesting that mental images might be more like descriptions than pictures.[31] However, Pylyshyn was able to make the idea much more concrete and plausible by linking it with concepts of the nature of mental representation that were emerging from Artificial Intelligence research. Particularly important for Pylyshyn was the work of Simon (1972) and Newell (1972), and their students Baylor (1973) and Moran (1973), who had already made some progress in devising symbol systems suitable for the computational representation of the spatial structure of simple layouts or objects (such as rectangular blocks). They explicitly presented these representations as models of the image representations that people use in doing certain visuo-spatial cognitive tasks.[32] By presenting these ideas as the germ of an alternative to the venerable but highly problematic conception of images as inner pictures, Pylyshyn was able to make a powerful case.

In his original (1973) article, Pylyshyn alludes to a number of disparate schemes developed by various computer scientists, for the computational representation of visual information, and it is perhaps not altogether clear what these have in common as alternatives to a pictorial conception of imagery. This was very much clarified, however, when Fodor (1975) introduced the hypothesis of mentalese, the “language of thought” (see Language of Thought Hypothesis), a syntactically structured representational system innate to the human brain, which Fodor argued, was, in some form, implicitly required by all coherent computational functionalist theories of cognition. The vocabulary and syntax of mentalese (if it exists) remain unknown, but they are likely to be very different from those of English or any other natural (actually spoken) language. Nevertheless, Fodor holds that any cognitive theory capable of accounting for the full range of human mental capacities is bound to make appeal to some such inner language. Pylyshyn has embraced this hypothesis (Fodor & Pylyshyn, 1988), and, in the light of that, we can say that his view of the nature of imagery is that it consists of descriptions, in mentalese, of visual objects or scenes. (This means, of course, that Pylyshyn's positive view of imagery – description theory – is viable only if the controversial language of thought hypothesis is true. However, many of Pylyshyn's objections to pictorial theories of imagery might still stand even if this were not the case.)

Fodor did not, however, embrace Pylyshyn's objections to pictorial mental imagery. Although he holds that pictorial representations are not sufficient to support cognition on their own, and are probably dependent on associated mentalese representations for playing any cognitive roles that they do play, he nevertheless argues against some philosophical objections to mental pictures,[33] and thinks that the empirical evidence (from psychologists such as Paivio and Shepard) suggests that images do in fact play a real role in our cognitive processes (Fodor, 1975 pp.174–194).

It is sometimes objected that a description theory, like Pylyshyn's, is incompatible with the phenomenology of imagery (e.g., Fodor, 1975 p. 188). After all, having a mental image of a cat does not seem anything like reciting a description of a cat to oneself. However, this seems to be based on having drawn too close an analogy between the mentalese descriptions intended by the theory and descriptions in English (or other natural languages). In the first place, although we can be conscious of English sentences as such, we are (pretty much ex hypothesis) never conscious of our mentalese representations as such, but only (at most) of what they represent. Thus there is no reason to expect that entertaining a mentalese description would subjectively seem anything at all like reciting, or reading, or otherwise thinking of a description in English. In the second place, Pylyshyn presumably holds (quite consistently with mainstream “information processing” theories of perception (e.g., Marr, 1982)) that percepts, the end products of visual processing in the brain, are also mentalese descriptions. Thus his theory readily accounts for the phenomenological similarity between imagery and perceptual experience. (If, as seems likely, the perceptual descriptions are typically more detailed than those of imagery, this might also account for any phenomenological differences between imagery and perception.)

This introspectively based argument against description theory, weak though it is, is often prelude to the even stronger claim that the phenomenology of imagery directly supports the view that mental images are inner pictures. After all, it is said, in contrast to reciting a description to oneself, having a mental image of (say) a cat does seem very much like seeing a picture of a cat. Although some people seem to find this argument tempting (e.g., Sterelny, 1986), it does not stand up to much examination (Block,1983a; Tye, 1991; Thompson, 2007). There is very little to the alleged similarity between having a mental image of a cat and seeing a picture of one, apart from the fact that both these experiences in some ways resemble the experience of actually seeing a cat, and both differ from it in that no cat need actually be present. It is true that pictures (paintings, drawings, photographs, videos, etc.) provide a familiar and relatively well understood example of how we can have an experience as of seeing something that is not actually present. Indeed, pictures (and sculptures) may be our only familiar example of this, apart from mental imagery itself. However, it does not follow that mental images must therefore be a species of picture. The easy analogy may be a false one. Mental images, after all, are not similar to pictures in many other respects: you cannot turn them over and look at the back of them; they do not need to be in front of your eyes for you to see them; they do not normally seem to be located on a surface; and there is little reason to think that they are normally flat (and good reason, even beyond introspection, to think otherwise (Shepard & Metzler, 1971; Pinker & Kosslyn, 1978; Pinker, 1980; Pinker & Finke,1980; Kerr, 1987)).

4.4.2 The Defense of Analog Imagery

In fact, neither Paivio nor Shepard, who were undoubtedly the best known imagery researchers at the time Pylyshyn published his initial (1973) critique, were committed to the straightforward picture theory of imagery that he seemed to be criticizing. Paivio, in response to Pylyshyn, quite explicitly rejected the picture metaphor (and related ones, such as the photograph and the wax impression), and suggested, instead, that imagery is “a dynamic process more like active perception than a passive recorder of experience” (Paivio, 1977).[34] (Unfortunately, however, that is about as explicit as he ever gets about his positive view of the nature of imagery.) Shepard, although he continued to write about the “analog” nature of image representations, and to insist on the “second order isomorphism” between objects and the brain processes that constitute mental images of them (Shepard, 1975, 1978b, 1981, 1984), was also very wary of the picture metaphor, suggesting instead that imagery was related to perceptual anticipation or readiness to recognize (Shepard, 1978b; cf. Cooper, 1976).

Two other important early critics of Pylyshyn's position were Ulric Neisser and Ronald Finke. Neisser developed the notion of imagery as perceptual readiness or anticipation into a theory of imagery explicitly opposed to both the picture and description theories (Neisser, 1976, 1978a, b; 1979 – see section 4.5 below). Finke's experimental work on visual illusions and aftereffects induced by imagery (Finke, 1979, 1989 ch. 2; Finke & Schmidt, 1977, 1978) suggested that Pylyshyn was wrong to argue that imagery does not make use of the “cognitively impenetrable” mechanisms of “early” visual processing,[35] and he argued that there is evidence for functional equivalences between imagery and perception (i.e., shared mechanisms) at multiple levels or stages of perceptual processing (Finke, 1980, 1985, 1986, 1989).

Neither Paivio nor Shepard, nor, indeed, Neisser, shared the assumptions of the computational functionalist framework from within which Pylyshyn was arguing: Paivio developed a metatheoretical framework that remained rooted in Behaviorist empiricism, and which he called “neomentalism” or “behavioral mentalism” (1975c, 1986); Shepard speculated about the neural basis of imagery in a style reminiscent of the speculative neuroscience of Gestalt field theory[36] (Shepard, 1981, 1984); and Neisser aligned himself with the ecological psychology of J.J. Gibson (1966, 1979).[37] In this regard, Pylyshyn was much more in step than they were with the direction in which cognitive science was going at the time. However, Stephen Kosslyn soon intervened in the debate, proposing a theory of visual imagery that was both explicitly computational and overtly pictorialist (or, as he prefers, quasi-pictorial), based on an analogy with computer graphics programs (which were a fairly new thing back then) (Kosslyn, 1975).[38] Before long, a flood of theoretical and empirical publications from Kosslyn and his collaborators, including several books (Kosslyn, 1980, 1983, 1994; Kosslyn & Koenig, 1992), had established him as clearly the pre-eminent figure of the debate, alongside Pylyshyn. As the leading figures on each side were now both firmly wedded to the theoretical framework of computational functionalism,[39] the debate's scope was, in practice, greatly narrowed by this development, even as its intensity and contentiousness (and notoriety) grew. It developed not into an open ended inquiry into the nature and causes of imagery, but a manichean struggle between the computational pictorialism championed by Kosslyn and his supporters, and the computational description theory still most ably and enthusiastically represented by Pylyshyn.

In what remains one of the most effective critiques of Pylyshyn's position, Kosslyn & Pomerantz (1977; see also Kosslyn, 1980 ch. 1), besides giving a point-by-point rebuttal of Pylyshyn's original (1973) arguments, go on to compare how a description theory and a quasi-pictorial theory like that proposed by Kosslyn (1975) might respectively explain various alleged “imagery effects” such as mental rotation, selective interference, and the mental scanning and size/inspection time effects discovered by Kosslyn himself. Their general conclusion was that description (propositional) theories could only explain these effects by making ad hoc auxiliary assumptions about how the propositional (mentalese) code is organized and processed, whereas the explanations of quasi-pictorial theory flow naturally from the core theory itself. Indeed, they pointed out, it was pictorial conceptions of imagery, not “propositional” ones, that had suggested to psychologists that these effects might exist, and that it would be worthwhile devising experiments to confirm them. Pictorial theories had shown themselves to be scientifically fruitful in a way that description theories had not.

On the face of things, description theory predicts that imagery should depend upon the mechanisms and brain structures that subserve conceptual, non-imaginal thought, and not those that subserve perception. Indeed, one of Pylyshyn's favorite arguments against pictorial images turns on his view that perception (but not imagery) depends upon a “cognitively impenetrable,” highly modularized cognitive system (see section 4.4.1). Thus it can be (and has been) argued that it is difficult, or at the least very awkward, for the description theorist to account for a wealth of empirical findings from neuroscience research that indicate that there is a good deal of overlap between the neural structures and cognitive mechanisms involved in imagery and those involved in perception (Kosslyn, 1994, 2005; Kosslyn, Thompson, & Ganis, 2006; Kosslyn & Thompson, 2003; Bartolomeo, 2002; Kosslyn, Ganis, & Thompson, 2001; Kreiman, Koch, & Freid, 2000; Bisiach & Berti, 1990; Farah, 1988). Although a strong case can be made that (despite superficial appearances) these neuroscientific findings do not provide strong evidence in favor of the quasi-pictorial (or any other pictorial) theory of imagery (Thomas, 1999b; Abell & Currie, 1999; Pylyshyn, 2002a,b, 2003a,b; Bartolomeo, 2002), it does not follow that description theory can readily assimilate them.

(Incidentally, although it was once widely believed that visual imagery in humans was primarily a function of the right hemisphere of the brain (e.g., Ley, 1983), more recent research contradicts this. It now appears that imagery involves structures on both sides of the brain, with, if anything, the left hemisphere playing a slightly more extensive role (Ehrlichman & Barrett, 1983; Farah, 1984, 1995; Sergent, 1990; Tippett, 1992; Trojano & Grossi, 1994; Loverock & Modigliani, 1995; Michimata, 1997).)

As well as having continued to duel with Pylyshyn and other critics, Kosslyn has continued to develop his quasi-pictorial theory of imagery, initially as a computational model (Kosslyn & Shwartz, 1977, 1978; Kosslyn, Pinker, Smith, & Shwartz, 1979: Kosslyn, 1980, 1981), and latterly as a neurological one (Kosslyn, 1988, 1994, 2005; Kosslyn, Ganis, & Thompson, 2001; Kosslyn, Thompson, & Ganis, 2006). He calls the theory quasi-pictorial, to avoid the implication that he thinks images are pictures in too literal and implausible a sense. Quasi-pictures are not the sort of thing that can be hung on a wall (Kosslyn, 1978b), and you do not need actual eyes inside the head looking at them in order to experience them. Nevertheless, they remain like pictures in many important respects. It remains controversial whether there can be a coherent notion of a quasi-picture that both retains the explanatorily useful properties of true pictures (such as their inherent spatiality, and their capacity to cause visual experiences as of what they represent) and, at the same time, lacks those properties that make it impossible for true pictures to be mental, or even neural, representations (such as needing to be illuminated and before our eyes in order to be experienced).

It is clearly Pylyshyn's opinion that there is no such notion, and that much of the superficial plausibility of quasi-pictorial theory depends upon an equivocation between the relatively well understood concept of a picture in the everyday sense, and the essentially non-pictorial notion of an array data structure (Pylyshyn, 1981, 2002a, 2003b). The literal picture in the head theory appeals to our folk-theoretical intuitions, makes interesting predictions, and has the resources to be genuinely explanatory, but it is demonstrably false. On the other hand, the data-structure theory (to which quasi-pictorialists retreat when literal pictorialism is challenged) is really just a version of Pylyshyn's own description theory, and, properly understood, has none of the special intuitive, explanatory, or predictive advantages that picture theorists claim for their views. Any apparent similarity between pictures and two-dimensional array data structures is, according to Pylyshyn, no more than an artifact of the way we customarily present such arrays on paper (or screen) for the benefit of human eyes. It has nothing to do with their actual mathematical properties, or with how they might function in cognition.

Despite Pylyshyn's criticisms, however, many philosophers have clearly been impressed by Kosslyn's work. Some have directly defended the quasi-pictorial theory of imagery, attempting to clarify the notion of a quasi-picture, and to show that it has real content (von Eckardt, 1984, 1988, 1993; Tye, 1988, 1991; Cohen, 1996). Others are more circumspect, or less committed to the specifics of Kosslyn's theory, but are now persuaded to countenance the possibility of picture-like mental representations of some sort (e.g. Sober, 1976; Block, 1981a, 1981b, 1983a, 1983b; Bower, 1984; Sterelny, 1986; Rollins, 1989, 2001; Mortensen, 1989; Dennett, 1991; Brann, 1991). Yet others, however, for reasons discussed in the previous section (and the following supplement), remain entirely unpersuaded (e.g., Heil, 1982, 1998; White, 1990; Slezak, 1993, 1995, 2002; Thomas, 1997a, 1999b, 2002, 2003, 2009; Bennett & Hacker, 2003).

Further discussion of the analog-propositional debate:

Supplement: The Quasi-Pictorial Theory of Imagery, and its Problems

4.5 Beyond Pictures and Propositions

Reading most of the recent philosophical literature on imagery (and, it must be admitted, most of the broader cognitive science literature, especially textbooks) one might easily form the impression that quasi-pictures and "propositional" descriptions are the only possible theoretical models for imagery, or, at least, the only ones ever seriously proposed or considered. This is not the case, however.The analog-propositional debate arose, and was at its height, in the 1970s, when cognitive theories based upon symbolic computation seemed to many to be “the only game in town” in cognitive science (Fodor, 1975; Haugeland, 1978), and the quasi-pictorial and propositional models are both products of this mileu. Even in the 70s, however, a number of alternative, non-computational accounts of imagery were being put forward. On the one hand, Taylor (1973) and Skinner (1974) looked for ways to assimilate imagery into Behaviorism. On the other, several cognitive psychologists suggested versions of what may be called enactive (or sensorimotor, or perceptual activity)[40] imagery theories (Hochberg, 1968; Hebb, 1968, 1969; Gibson, 1970, 1979; Juhasz 1969, 1972; Sarbin & Juhasz, 1970; Sarbin, 1972; Neisser, 1976, 1978a, b).[41] Although this work had little impact at the time, more recently, spurred by related developments in perceptual theory, there has been some revival of interest in theories of this type.

4.5.1 Enactive Theories of Perception and Imagery

Enactive theories of imagery may be seen as modern successors to the motor theories of the early twentieth century (see Supplement: The American Response: Behaviorist Iconophobia and Motor Theories of Imagery). They depend the idea that perception is not mere passive receptivity (or even receptivity plus inner processing), but a form of action, something done by the organism. The perceiving organism is not merely registering but exploring and asking questions of its environment (Ellis, 1995), actively and intentionally (though not necessarily with conscious volition) seeking out the answers in the sensory stimuli that surround it.[42] Imagery is then experienced when someone persists in acting out the seeking of some particular information even though they cannot reasonably expect it to be there. We have imagery of, say, a cat, when we go through (some of) the motions of looking at something and determining that it is a cat, even though there is no cat (and perhaps nothing relevant at all) there to be seen. Visually imagining a cat is seeing nothing-in-particular as a cat (Thomas, 1999b, 2003, 2009; cf. Ishiguro, 1967).

Farley (1974, 1976) developed a computer simulation inspired by Hochberg's version of enactive theory, and Hampson & Morris (1978, 1979; Morris & Hampson, 1983) discussed and critiqued Neisser's version (which was undoubtedly the most detailed). However, with those exceptions, in the 1970s and 80s the enactive approach to imagery attracted very little attention. It was not just that these non-computational theories seemed irrelevant to psychologists and philosophers whose focus was on integrating imagery into the prevalent (symbolic, GOFAI (Haugeland, 1985)) computational model of the mind. More specifically, the enactive theories do not fit comfortably, if at all, into the framework of computational information processing theory that shaped most scientists' thinking about perception and perceptual experience. Information processing theories come in many varieties, but they all, broadly speaking, depict the sense organs as passive transducers of stimulus energies (light, sound, etc.), whose outputs are then computationally processed and enriched, in the brain, into meaningful mental representations (Lindsay & Norman, 1972; Haber, 1974; Frisby, 1979; Marr, 1982; Pylyshyn, 2003b; Boothe, 2002).[43] Kosslyn's quasi-pictorial theory and Pylyshyn's description theory of imagery were both designed to fit this framework. They differ merely in that Kosslyn holds that the representations comprising imagery are formed at an early stage of visual processing, whereas Pylyshyn holds that they are formed at a late stage. This difference, however, gave rise to the impassioned analog-propositional debate, whose sound and fury only served to further distract attention from theoretical alternatives that did not fit the information processing paradigm.[44]

But it is well known that GOFAI style symbolic computationalism did not remain the “only game in town” in cognitive science for long. Since the mid 1980s its hegemony has been repeatedly challenged, first by connectionism (e.g., Rumelhart, McClelland et al., 1986; Clarke, 1989), then by various versions of situated or embodied approaches to cognition (e.g., Varela et al., 1991; Smith, 1991; Clancey, 1997; Clark, 1997), by dynamical systems theory (e.g., Freeman & Skarda, 1990; Port & van Gelder, 1995; van Gelder, 1995; Garson, 1996), and by cognitive neuroscience (e.g., Kosslyn & Koenig, 1992; Gazzaniga, 2004).

Connectionism did not challenge the information processing view of perception, however, and thus proved of little significance for imagery theory, inspiring little more than a handful of variants of quasi-pictorial array theory (Julstrom & Baron, 1985; Mel, 1986, 1990; Stucki & Pollack, 1992). The robotic system Murphy, designed by Mel (1990), has some interesting features in that it combines such a connectionist model of visual imagery with a model of trial-and-error learning of motor control, wherein information in the putative image is used to control the reaching behavior of a robotic arm (although it is not obvious that imagery, as distinct from visual perception, plays any such role in human reaching). Grush (2004) adopts this model as the basis of his own account of visual mental imagery, within the wider context of his “emulation” theory of cognition. Nevertheless, Mel and Grush continue to conceive of the image itself as being a two dimensional array of elements, just as the quasi-pictorial theory of Kosslyn does, and, indeed, in support of their models both Mel and Grush follow Kosslyn in appealing to evidence about the spatial properties of imagery and about the involvement of visual areas of the brain in imagery. Thus, despite the fact that Mel and Grush situate their accounts of imagery in the context of motor control rather than of visual cognition, they remain quasi-pictorial accounts, and are, in most respects, considerably less developed than (though perhaps consistent with) the version of quasi-pictorial theory developed by Kosslyn. As such, they share most of the virtues of Kosslyn's version, and are subject to the same objections (see supplement: The Quasi-Pictorial Theory of Imagery, and its Problems).

Dynamical systems theory has also had relatively little to say about imagery, although Freeman (1983) has sketched an account of olfactory imagery in terms of neural dynamics. He explicitly distances himself from both sides of the analog-propositional debate, and makes appeal instead to the concept of search image as used in the science of Behavioral Ecology. A search image is (to a first approximation) a specific, learned recognitional capacity, or a form of selective attention, that leads a predator species to recognize and preferentially prey upon members of the more abundant prey species in its environment, whilst largely failing to notice less abundant types of potential prey (Tinbergen, 1960; Atema et al., 1980; Lawrence & Allen, 1983; Langley, 1996; Blough, 2002). However, it is less than clear that Freeman is justified in conflating this concept of search image with that of mental image, as used in folk psychology and cognitive science.

It is mainly the rise of situated and embodied approaches to cognition that has challenged the information processing approach to perception, and enabled the re-emergence and further development of enactive imagery theory. During the 1980s, robotics researchers interested in creating robots to operate in real wold environments were finding that getting a machine to process information from sensory transducers into an internal representation of its surroundings that would provide a suitable basis for action planning was a very difficult computational problem. Indeed, some became convinced that, even if it could be done in principle, in practice the process would be unacceptably slow, unreliable, and computationally expensive (by the time the robot knew what was going on, things would have changed). Thus, there was a turn toward “active” (or “animate”) techniques in robotic perception. Instead of attempting to build up detailed internal representations of their environment, robots began to be designed to deploy their sensors purposively, to actively seek out just the specific information needed at that particular moment for making an impending behavioral decision (e.g., Bajcsy, 1988; Ballard, 1991; Blake & Yuille, 1992; Aloimonos, 1993; Swain & Stricker, 1993; Landy et al.,1996; Davison, 2003; Lungarella & Sporns, 2006).

At around the same time, a number of neuroscientists, perceptual psychologists, and philosophers began, for diverse reasons, to converge on a similar view of human vision (Ramachandran, 1990; O'Regan, 1992; Churchland et al., 1994; Akins, 1996; Cotterill, 1997; Thomas, 1999b, 2009; Hayhoe, 2000; O'Regan & Noë, 2001; Noë, 2002, 2004, 2009). Studies of (amongst other things) exploratory perceptual behaviors such as eye movements (Yarbus, 1967; Noton & Stark, 1971a,b; Landy et al., 1996; Hayhoe & Ballard, 2005), and recently recognized perceptual effects such as change blindness (Grimes, 1996; Simons & Levin, 1997; O'Regan, 2003) and inattentional blindness (Neisser & Becklen, 1975; Mack & Rock, 1998, 1999; Simons & Chabris, 1999), cast doubt on the traditional idea that a rich and detailed inner representation of the visual scene mediates our visual consciousness. Instead, some now argue that perception depends on a multitude of special purpose neural and behavioral structures and/or routines (Ullman, 1984; Ramachandran, 1990; Thomas, 1999b, 2009; Roelfsema et al., 2000; Hayhoe, 2000; Roelfsema, 2005), each of which actively utilizes the sensory transducers (eyes, ears, etc.) in a different way in order to obtain specific types of information as and when needed. We do not have our sense of the immediate perceptual presence of the world because we have a representation of it in our heads, but rather because these routines operate (for the most part) so quickly and effortlessly that virtually as soon as we want to know some perceptually available fact, we are able to discover it.[45]

Although this way of thinking about perception remains a minority view, and certainly does not dominate perceptual theory in the way that information processing theory once did, it has nevertheless created a theoretical space in which enactive/motor theories of imagery can be more plausibly entertained, and the theory has recently been broached again by an assortment of philosophers, neuroscientists, psychologists, and computer scientists (Thomas, 1987, 1997b, 1999b, 2009; Newton, 1993, 1996; Ellis, 1995; Ramachandran & Hirstein, 1997 p. 442; Marks, 1990, 1999; Bartolomeo, 2002; Bartolomeo & Chokron, 2002; Blain, 2006). Thomas (1999b) argues that enactive theory can explain experimental cognitive psychology's findings about imagery (see sections 4.2 and 4.3 above) at least as well as the better-known quasi-pictorial and propositional/description theories, and, indeed, that it handles the facts about imagery in the blind and image reconstrual (see Supplement: The Quasi-Pictorial Theory of Imagery) in a more principled and plausible way than they do. It has also been argued that enactive theory can provide a more satisfactory explanation of the neurological evidence about imagery (i.e., the ways imagery experience and abilities may be impacted by various forms of brain damage), and, in particular, the syndrome of representational neglect (see Supplement: Representational Neglect) than other theories can (Bartolomeo, 2002; Bartolomeo & Chokron, 2002; Dulin et al., 2008).

Other relevant evidence comes from studies of eye movements during imagery. Saccades are quick, mostly unconscious, flicks of the eyes, which are now known to play an important role not only in vision, but in visual imagery as well. In normal human vision they occur, on average, about three times every second, and play a vital role in our visual system's exploration of the visual world, and the extraction of information from it. The pattern of our saccadic movements is purposeful, under cognitive control, and depends both on what we are looking at, and on what visual information we hope to obtain, on the purpose behind our looking (Yarbus, 1967; Noton & Stark, 1971a,b; Stark & Ellis, 1981; Findlay & Gilchrist, 2003; Hayhoe & Ballard, 2005; Rucci et al., 2007; Rothkopf et al., 2007; Martinez-Conde & Macknik, 2007; Trommershäuser et al., 2009). Although the scientific study of saccades began well over a century ago, in recent years technological advances in eye-tracking technology have led to a rapid growth in understanding and appreciation of the large role that they play in human vision (Richardson & Spivey, 2004; Wade & Tatler, 2005). It has also become apparent that saccades (and perhaps other types of eye movement too) play a significant role in visual mental imagery. Laboratory studies have shown that, when people hold a visual image in mind, they spontaneously and unconsciously make saccadic eye movements that (at least partially) enact the stimulus-specific pattern of such movements that they would make if actually looking at the equivalent visual stimulus (Brandt & Stark, 1997; Demarais & Cohen, 1998; Spivey & Geng, 2001; Laeng & Teodorescu, 2002; de'Sperati, 2003; Johansson et al., 2005, 2006; see also Jacobson, 1932).

Furthermore, imagery is disrupted (to a greater or lesser degree) if someone who is holding an image in their mind either restrains themselves (to the limited degree that this is possible) from making eye movements, or else deliberately moves their eyes in an image-irrelevant way, thus disrupting the spontaneous saccadic pattern (Antrobus et al., 1964; Singer & Antrobus, 1965; Andrade et al., 1997; Ruggieri, 1999; Laeng & Teodorescu, 2002; Barrowcliff et al., 2004; Gunter & Bodner, 2008). The psychotherapeutic technique known as EMDR (Eye Movement Desensitization and Reprocessing) may perhaps owe its effectiveness largely to this fact. EMDR is widely used in the treatment of Post-Traumatic Stress Disorder, and studies of therapeutic outcomes have found evidence of its effectiveness (Van Etten & Taylor, 1998; Shepherd et al., 2000; APA, 2006; Bisson et al., 2007; Högberg et al., 2007). In EMDR treatment, patients are induced to deliberately move their eyes back and forth whilst visually recalling the events that have traumatized them; it is claimed that this leads to a significant reduction in the vividness of their memories of those events, and of the distress, and consequent symptoms, that those memories cause (Shapiro & Forrest, 1997; Shapiro, 2001; Mollon, 2005).

Although the mechanisms and real therapeutic effectiveness of EMDR remain controversial (Herbert et al., 2000; Davidson & Parker, 2001; Perkins & Rouanzoin, 2002), the disruptive effect of deliberate eye movement upon visual imagery appears to be well established, and it implies that the eye movements that spontaneously occur when people visualize things (or, at the least, the brain processes that initiate and control these movements) are not mere accompaniments or epiphenomena of the imagery, but are (as enactive theory would lead one to expect) a true, functionally significant part of the physiological process that embodies it.[46] (However, Mast & Kosslyn (2002b) argue that the eye-movement evidence can also be accommodated to quasi-pictorial theory.[47])

Kosslyn, Thompson, Sukel, & Alpert (2005; see also Kosslyn, Thompson, & Ganis, 2006 pp. 90–92) report an experiment in which subjects were asked to recall mental images of simple geometrical arrangements while PET scans of their brains were taken. Although all subjects formed images of the same figures, some originally formed them on the basis of verbal descriptions, whereas others were shown separate segments of the entire structure to be visualized, and asked to assemble them mentally into the complete figure. The PET scan was not taken at the time the images were originally formed in one or other of these ways, but when they were later recalled. According to the experimenters, enactive theory holds that when someone recalls a mental image they re-enact what they did at the time of its original formation, and since the two subject groups originally formed their images in very different ways, the theory predicts that the two groups should display radically different patterns of brain activation at the time of recall. In fact, however, no marked differences were seen.

This is claimed to constitute a refutation of the enactive theory. It rests, however, on a demonstrable misunderstanding of the theory. No version of enactive imagery theory holds (either explicitly or implicitly) what these experimenters claim it holds: that recall of mental imagery is constituted by re-enactment of whatever was the original act of image formation. What enactive theory in fact holds is that imagery (recalled or otherwise) is constituted by (partial) enactment of the perceptual acts that would be carried out if one were actually perceiving whatever is being imagined. It is true that in the most straightforward and paradigmatic case of mental image formation – the direct recall of an earlier perceptual experience of something – enactment of what one would be doing if actually perceiving that thing is equivalent to re-enactment of what one did during the original perceptual episode. However, this equivalence clearly breaks down in most other circumstances, including those of the experiment in question. Since both groups of subjects in the experiment under discussion were supposed to be recalling an image of the same geometrical pattern when their brains were scanned, enactive theory actually predicts that the neural activity due to the recalled image should be much the same in each group, just as was found.

Quite apart from empirical evidence, certain distinctively philosophical advantages have been claimed for enactive theory. It has been suggested that it is better able than its rivals to explain imaginal consciousness (Ellis, 1995; Thomas, 1999b, 2001, 2009; Bartolomeo, 2002), and Thomas (1987, 1997a, 1999b) argues that enactive theory can provide the basis for an understanding of the concept of imagination, whereas quasi-pictorial theory and description theory cannot.[48] Traditionally, both philosophers and the folk have thought of the imagination as a mental faculty responsible both for mental imagery, and for the most admired forms of artistic (and other) creativity.[49] Unfortunately, neither picture nor description theories of imagery seem capable of providing a satisfactory account of how one mental faculty could be responsible for both these things (which may go some way toward explaining why many recent philosophers doubt whether there is any such faculty[50]). However, Thomas (1997a; 1999b) argues that enactive theory depicts both imagery and creative thinking as manifestations of the more basic imaginative capacity of intentionalistic perception (or “seeing as”).

It has also been suggested (Newton, 1993, 1996; Thomas, 1999b, 2003, 2009; see also Heil, 1998 ch. 6) that, because it regards imagery not as a form of representational inscription (whether pictorial or descriptive), but as a form of action, enactive theory may be able to account for the intentionality of imagery without making appeal either to the controversial language of thought hypothesis, or to the widely discredited (see section 3.3) resemblance theory of representation.[51]

However, if mental images are (as just about everybody believes) a species of mental representation, these latter claims are at odds with the idea that mental representations are token identical to brain states. The majority of cognitive scientists (and sympathetic philosophers) remain firmly committed to that idea, and perhaps it is largely for that reason that enactive theory remains a minority viewpoint. Certainly it has yet to receive anything like the amount of attention (either supportive or critical) that experimenters and theorists have devoted to quasi-pictorial and description theories.

Further discussion:

Supplement: Representational Neglect

4.6 The Return of the Imagery Theory of Cognition?

The analog-propositional debate and the enactive theory of imagery concern themselves primarily with the nature and underlying mechanisms of the phenomenon, and have thus had relatively little direct impact on views about the function of imagery in cognition. In fact, both of the best known cognitive theories of imagery, the quasi-pictorial theory of Kosslyn (1980, 1994, 2005; Kosslyn, Thompson, & Ganis, 2006) (especially as philosophically glossed by Tye (1991)), and the description theory of Pylyshyn (1973, 1978, 2003b), portray imagery as embedded within and dependent upon a more fundamental, language-like mental representational system, mentalese, from which it derives much or all of its semantic content. Thus neither of these theories did much to challenge the post-Wittgensteinian consensus (see section 3.3) that continues to give imagery, at most, a minor, auxiliary role in cognition, with most of the burden being carried by either natural language or the more basic and more flexible representations of the hypothetical mentalese.

Some neuroscientists and psychologists have been little moved by this consensus. Damasio (1994), for example, takes it for granted that mental representations are imagistic; Bisiach & Berti (1990) and Edelman (1992) argue that mentalese (but not image) representations are neuroscientifically implausible; and Paivio (e.g., 1971, 1986, 2007; Paivio & Begg, 1981; Sadoski & Paivio, 2001) elaborates a comprehensive theory of cognition entirely in terms of image and natural language representations, and holds that that the representational power of language derives from that of imagery (see Supplement: Dual Coding and Common Coding Theories of Memory). However, as these authors did rather little to address the arguments that have led most contemporary philosophers to think that imagery cannot be representationally basic, their views (in this regard) have had relatively little impact on philosophy.

However, more recently those arguments have been challenged by philosophers such as Lowe (1995, 1996, 2005), Nyíri (2001), and Ellis (1995). Ellis outlines a theory of how the meaningfulness of language may be grounded in imagery that appears to meet at least some of the stock objections (see section 3.3, and Thomas, 1997b). The arguments are also addressed, at least in part, by Barsalou and his collaborators, who have proposed a theory of what they call “perceptual symbol systems” as an alternative to the language-like, “amodal” (mentalese) symbol systems of traditional cognitive science (Barsalou, 1993, 1999; Barsalou & Prinz, 1997; Barsalou et al., 2003; Kan et al., 2003). Although Barsalou denies that the perceptual symbols of his theory can be straightforwardly equated with mental images (mainly because he holds that they may sometimes be active in cognitive processes without our being conscious of them)[52] he clearly conceives of them in a way very close to traditional conceptions of imagery, and certainly as being the immediate causes of our imagery experience when we actually do have it.

Barsalou holds that the neural basis of his perceptual symbols is a neural “simulation” of the brain processes that would be involved in the actual perception of whatever it is that is being symbolized. Others, such as Currie (1995; Currie & Ravenscroft, 1997; Abell & Currie, 1999) and Hesslow (2002), have also suggested that imagery is best understood as a simulation of perception. However, quasi-pictorial, enactive, and probably even propositional/descriptional theories of imagery can all reasonably be classed as simulative theories in the relevant sense (see Nichols et al., 1996), so it is not clear that this suggestion advances our understanding of the nature of imagery very much.[53] In any case, Barsalou's main interest is not in the nature of imagery, but in how perceptual symbols might function in cognition to do the jobs that others have thought can only be done by a more language-like system of representations, such as representing logical relations and propositions (as opposed to just representing things). His detailed suggestions about these questions have aroused much interest.

Perhaps inspired by Barsalou's work, Prinz (2002; see also Gallese & Lakoff, 2005) has recently made a detailed defense of something very like the traditional Empiricist theory of concepts (usually, although not invariably, interpreted as the view that concepts are images (see section 2.3.3)). Like Barsalou (and, indeed, Locke), he does not take any strong position as to the inherent nature of images or perceptual symbols (and thus avoids embroiling himself in the analog-propositional debate and its aftermath). Instead, he confines himself to trying to show that it is plausible that our fundamental concepts are perceptual in their genesis and character, a view that he is quite happy to acknowledge is very close to the traditional imagery theory of cognition. Prinz deals ingeniously with many of the standard philosophical objections to theories of this sort, and he sidesteps what has been the main philosophical objection to image theories of concepts by avoiding committing himself to the resemblance theory of representation (see section 3.3 above). Instead, he suggests that his account of perceptual representations can be combined with a version of the causal (or covariation) theory of intentional content developed by Fodor (1990, 1994), Dretske (1995, 2000), and others.[54] However, it remains open to question whether such a causal theory can work (Cummins, 1997; Horst, 1996, 1999).

Other recent work has sought to explore the relationship between current conceptions of mental imagery and the more resonant, but more nebulous, notion of imagination (and related concepts such as insight and creativity) (White, 1990; Brann, 1991; Finke et al., 1992; Thomas, 1997a,b, 1999a,b, 2006; Kind, 2001; McGinn, 2004; Blain, 2006). Perhaps the most ambitious claims in this regard are those of Arp (2005, 2008), who comes at the matter from the controversial perspective of evolutionary psychology. Arp suggests that an innate, evolved capacity for what he calls scenario visualization is unique to the human species, and is the crucial factor that has made our high-level creative problem-solving abilities possible. From this perspective, it is in large part thanks to our capacity to form and manipulate mental imagery that humankind has been able to out-compete rival species, and develop our complex cultures and technologies.

Bibliography

For reasons of space and convenience, the bibliography has been divided into three parts:

  • The supplement Mental Imagery Bibliography is an extensive, but inevitably incomplete, bibliography of the science and philosophy of mental imagery. Many, but not all, of the works listed in it are discussed, or at least cited, in the main text of the entry, or in its supplements. Many of the items are annotated.
  • The supplement Bibliography of cited works not about mental imagery lists works cited in the text of the entry, or in its supplements, but that themselves have little or nothing directly to say about mental imagery.
  • The Select Bibliography (below) consists only of particularly seminal or influential contributions to the imagery literature, or works that provide particularly useful reviews or collections of aspects of this literature. It does not include all the works cited in the text of the enty and supplements (for which, see the two supplementary bibliographies). Also, many well known classics of philosophy have not been included here, even though they may have a good deal to say about imagery, and may have had a significant influence on how the phenomenon is understood. Such works, together with many other relevant ones, are listed in the supplement Mental Imagery Bibliography.

Select Bibliography

Barsalou, L.W. (1999). Perceptual Symbol Systems (with commentaries and author's reply). Behavioral and Brain Sciences (22) 577–660. [Preprint available online (PDF)]
Purportedly not directly about imagery, but deals with the closely adjacent topic of mental representations that are inherently perceptual in character, and argues that they are adequate to account for cognition, and explanatorily superior to “amodal” conceptions of representation (such as mentalese) For some recent supporting evidence, that also makes the link with imagery explicit, see Kan et al. (2003), and for some philosophical support see Nyíri (2001) and Prinz (2002).
Bartolomeo, P. (2002). The Relationship Between Visual perception and Visual Mental Imagery: A Reappraisal of the Neuropsychological Evidence. Cortex (38) 357–378. Available online (also, from the Cortex archive)
Reviews the clinical evidence on deficits in visual mental imagery (and related deficits in visual perception) resulting from brain injury. He concludes that the evidence is not consistent with the quasi-pictorial theory of Kosslyn (1980, 1994), but favors an enactive theory. See also, Bartolomeo & Chokron (2002).
Bisiach, E. & Luzzatti, C. (1978). Unilateral Neglect of Representational Space. Cortex (14) 129–133.
The first scientific description of the phenomenon of representational neglect: brain damaged patients who ignore things to their left also ignore the left side in their imagery.
Block, N. (Ed.) (1981a). Imagery. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Widely read collection of philosophical and theoretical pieces concerned with the analog/propositional debate..
Chambers, D. & Reisberg, D. (1985). Can Mental Images be Ambiguous? Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance (11) 317–328.
A striking experiment revealing an important disanalogy between mental images and pictures; but see Peterson et al. (1992), Rollins (1994), Cornoldi et al, (1996), Slezak (1991, 1995), and other listed works by Chambers and/or Reisberg for related (and sometimes conflicting) experimental results, and competing interpretations.
Descartes, R. (1664). L'Homme (Treatise of Man). (Facsimile of the original French, together with an English translation by T.S. Hall: Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1972. An abridged translation, by R. Stoothoff, is also available in J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff & D. Murdoch (Trans. & Eds.), The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Vol.1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985.)
Descartes' mechanical theory of human physiology, including a mechanistic account of imagery closely akin to the modern quasi-pictorial theory. (The work is thought to have been written in or before 1633, but was not published until 1664.)
Finke, R.A. (1989). Principles of Mental Imagery. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Useful textbook of the experimental cognitive psychology of imagery.
Fodor, J.A. (1975). The Language of Thought. New York: Thomas Crowell. (Paperback edition: Harvard University Press, 1980)
The main thesis of this very influential book is that cognition depends upon an unconscious, language-like representational system innately built into the brain, and which Fodor calls mentalese. However, it also includes a substantial (and also very influential) section on imagery arguing that imagery representations probably have a real role in cognition, but that images (which he takes to be picture-like) cannot be unambiguously meaningful in their own right, and therefore must derive their semantics from mentalese: they function in cognition as "images under descriptions."
Galton, F. (1880). Statistics of Mental Imagery. Mind (5) 301–318. Reprint available online
Pioneering individual differences survey of imagery vividness. Galton claims to have found that many intellectuals, and scientists in particular, have very weak visual imagery, or even lack it altogether. However, a recent study by Brewer & Schommer-Aikins (2006) persuasively refutes this claim.
Holt, R.R. (1964). Imagery: The Return of the Ostracised. American Psychologist (19) 254–266.
Influential account of the historical vicissitudes of the concept of imagery in scientific psychology.
Intons-Peterson, M.J. (1983). Imagery Paradigms: How Vulnerable are They to Experimenter's Expectations? Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance (9) 394–412.
A salutary demonstration of the effects of demand characteristics on imagery experiments. Experimental results can be significantly distorted by even very subtle cues as to the experimenters' expectations.
Kosslyn, S.M. (1980). Image and Mind. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
Detailed statement and defence of the computational version of quasi-pictorial theory of imagery, which has been extremely influential. See Kosslyn (1981) and Kosslyn, Pinker, Smith, & Shwartz (1979) for more concise accounts.
Kosslyn, S.M. (1994). Image and Brain: The Resolution of the Imagery Debate. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Updates the quasi-pictorial theory with an account of how imagery may be neurologically embodied. For a more concise (and more recent) account see Kosslyn, Thompson & Ganis (2006) or Kosslyn (2005).
Kosslyn, S.M., Thompson, W.L., & Ganis, G. (2006). The Case for Mental Imagery. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
A relatively succinct and accessible defense of the quasi-pictorial theory of imagery.
Luria, A.R. (1968). The Mind of a Mnemonist. (Translated from the Russian by L. Solotaroff.) New York: Basic Books.
Seminal case study of a “hyper-imager”.
Morris, P.E. & Hampson, P.J. (1983). Imagery and Consciousness. Academic Press. London.
A textbook that usefully summarizes much experimental evidence. Covers quasi-pictorial, description, and enactive theories, and attempts a theoretical synthesis.
Neisser, U. (1976). Cognition and Reality. San Francisco, CA: W.H. Freeman.
Proposes one of the most fully developed versions of the enactive theory of imagery: an alternative to both pictorial/analog and propositional/descriptional accounts.
Paivio, A. (1971). Imagery and Verbal Processes. New York: Holt, Rinehart and Winston. (Republished in 1979 – Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.)
Classic statement of the Dual Coding (imaginal and linguistic) theory of memory and mental representation, with much empirical evidence on the mnemonic effects of imagery. Paivio's work (together with Shepard's mental rotation experiments) probably played the key role in re-establishing imagery as a scientifically wothwhile topic of investigation in cognitive science, aftre the era of Behaviorist neglect of the phenomenon.
Paivio, A. (1986). Mental Representations: A Dual Coding Approach. New York: Oxford University Press.
A major restatement and defense of Dual Coding Theory.
Perky, C.W. (1910) An Experimental Study of Imagination. American Journal of Psychology (21) 422–52.
A famous study showing that mental images can be confused with (faint) percepts under certain, special conditions. See Segal (1971, 1972) for a modern partial replication.
Prinz, J.J. (2002). Furnishing the Mind: Concepts and their Perceptual Basis. Boston, MA: MIT Press.
Defends an empricist theory of concepts, closely akin to the traditional image theory of ideas, but updated in the light of cognitive science. Strongly influenced by the work of Barsalou (1999).
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (1973). What the Mind's Eye Tells the Mind's Brain: A Critique of Mental Imagery. Psychological Bulletin (80) 1–25.
A seminal attack on pictorial accounts of imagery. This was the opening salvo of the infamous analog/propositional dispute.
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (1981). The Imagery Debate: Analogue Media Versus Tacit Knowledge. Psychological Review (88) 16–45.
A restatement of the propositional/descriptional account of imagery that squarely confronts the empirical arguments brought by pictorialists.
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (2002a). Mental Imagery: In search of a theory. Behavioral and Brain Sciences (25) 157–182 (–237 including commentaries and reply). Reprint available online
A major restatement and updating of Pylyshyn's conceptual and empirical objections to pictorial theories of imagery, including a critique of recent claims (e.g. Kosslyn, 1994; Kosslyn, Pascual-Leone et al., 1999) that neuroscientific evidence suports pictorialism.
Richardson, A. (1969). Mental Imagery. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
Despite its age, this remains a useful literature review, especially because it covers not only mental imagery in the narrower sense in which the term is usually used today (what Richardson calls “memory imagery”), but also other more or less distantly related quasi-perceptual phenomena such as eidetic imagery, hypnagogic imagery, hallucinations, and after-images.
Richardson, J.T.E. (1999). Mental Imagery. Psychology Press: Hove, U.K.
Useful textbook concisely surveying the cognitive psychology of imagery, including individual differences research.
Ryle, G. (1949). The Concept of Mind. London: Hutchinson.
Chapter 8 contains a seminal critique of pictorial accounts of imagery and questions the traditional concept of imagination as the image producing faculty. It is suggested that both imagination and imagery are conceptually related to pretending.
Sartre, J.-P. (1940). The Psychology of Imagination. (Translated from the French by B. Frechtman, New York: Philosophical Library, 1948.)
Presents Sartre's own positive theory of imagery and imagination. Argues for the intentionality of imagery, and holds that mental images are not inner objects.
Sheikh, A.A. (2002). Healing Images: The Role of Imagination in Health. Amityville, NY: Baywood.
A recent collection of essays on therapeutic techniques that make use of imagery.
Shepard, R.N. (1978b). The Mental Image. American Psychologist (33) 125–137.
Probably Shepard's clearest statement of his views about the nature of imagery, its analog nature and its “second order isomorphism” to what it represents.
Shepard, R.N., Cooper, L.A., et al. (1982). Mental Images and Their Transformations. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
A useful compendium of the seminal work by Shepard and his students on the mental rotation of images (and related phenomena).
Shepard, R.N. & Metzler, J. (1971). Mental Rotation of Three-Dimensional Objects. Science (171) 701–703.
A classic psychological experiment. The first, most striking, and best known of the mental rotation studies. Together with the work on the mnemonic effects of imagery (see Paivio, 1971) this played a major role in re-inspiring scientific interest in imagery research.
Slezak, P. (1995). The “Philosophical” Case Against Visual Imagery. In P. Slezak, T. Caelli, & R. Clark (Eds.) Perspectives on Cognitive Science: Theories, Experiments and Foundations. Norwood, NJ: Ablex.
An empirically well informed philosopher makes the cognitivist case against pictorialism. A valuable supplement to Pylyshyn's arguments.
Thomas, N.J.T. (1999b). Are Theories of Imagery Theories of Imagination? An Active Perception Approach to Conscious Mental Content. Cognitive Science (23) 207–245. Preprint available online
Discusses cognitive theories of imagery in the light of their relevance to theories of imagination and its role in creative thought. Proposes and defends a "perceptual activity" (enactive) theory of imagery, arguing that is both empirically and conceptually superior to both quasi-pictorial and propositional theories.
Tye, M. (1991). The Imagery Debate. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
This fills out the argument in defense of quasi-pictorial theory given earlier (Tye, 1988) and gives an admirably clear philosophical account of the analog/propositional debate and the conceptual basis of quasi-pictorialism. However, it fails to look seriously beyond this context, and is occasionally unreliable on historical and empirical issues.
Watson, J.B. (1913a). Psychology as the Behaviorist Views It. Psychological Review (20) 158–177. Reprint available online
The classic “Behaviorist manifesto”. Questions the very existence of imagery. See Watson (1913b) for more detail.
White, A.R. (1990). The Language of Imagination. Oxford: Blackwell.
Part 1 is an excellent, if selective, concise history of the concept of imagination in philosophy. Part 2 argues (in the teeth of the strong historical consensus detailed in part 1) that there is no conceptual connection whatsoever between imagination and imagery. See Thomas (1997a) for a critique of this view.
Wittgenstein, L. (1953). Philosophical Investigations. (Ed. G.E.M. Anscombe & R. Rhees, trans. G.E.M. Anscombe.). Oxford: Blackwell.
Contains a powerful and very influential critique of the imagery theory of linguistic meaning.
Yates, F.A. (1966). The Art of Memory. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
A celebrated and seminal history of mnemonic uses of imagery, from ancient to early modern times. Argues that such techniques have had a previously unrecognized importance in the history of western intellectual life.

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