First published Mon Oct 11, 2010; substantive revision Sat Jul 2, 2011
[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Timothy McGrew replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

A miracle (from the Latin mirari, to wonder), at a first and very rough approximation, is an event that is not explicable by natural causes alone. A reported miracle excites wonder because it appears to require, as its cause, something beyond the reach of human action and natural causes. Historically, the appeal to miracles has formed one of the primary lines of argument in favor of specific forms of theism, the argument typically being that the event in question can best (or can only) be explained as the act of a particular deity.

1. Concepts and Definitions

The philosophical discussion of miracles has focused principally on the credibility of certain claims in the Jewish and Christian scriptures. But inquiry into the credibility of specific miracle claims inevitably raises questions regarding the concept of a miracle, and arguments regarding particular claims cannot be evaluated until the nature of that concept has been at least reasonably clarified.

1.1 Miracles as events that exceed the productive power of nature

A common approach is to define a miracle as an interruption of the order or course of nature. (Sherlock 1843: 57) Some stable background is, in fact, presupposed by the use of the term, as William Adams (1767: 15) notes:

An experienced uniformity in the course of nature hath been always thought necessary to the belief and use of miracles. These are indeed relative ideas. There must be an ordinary regular course of nature, before there can be any thing extraordinary. A river must flow, before its stream can be interrupted.

As it stands, however, this definition leaves us wanting a more precise conception of what is meant by the order or course of nature. We might therefore try to tighten the definition by saying that a miracle is an event that exceeds the productive power of nature (St. Thomas Aquinas, SCG 3.103; ST 1.110, art. 4), where “nature” is construed broadly enough to include ourselves and any other creatures substantially like ourselves. Variations on this include the idea that a miracle is an event that would have happened only given the intervention of an agent not wholly bound by nature (Larmer 1988: 9) and that a miracle is an event that would have happened only if there were a violation of the causal closure of the physical world.

1.2 Miracles as violations of the laws of nature

David Hume (Hume 1748/2000; cf. Voltaire 1764/1901: 272) famously defined a miracle as “a violation of the laws of nature,” and this definition has been the focus of lively discussion ever since. Hume evidently means to denote something beyond mere changes in the regular course of nature, raising the bar higher for something to qualify as a miracle but also raising the potential epistemic significance of such an event if it could be authenticated.

Bringing the concept of natural laws into the definition of “miracle” is, however, problematic, and for a variety of reasons many writers have found it untenable. (Brown 1822: 219–33; Beard 1845: 35; Lias 1890: 5–7; Huxley 1894:154–58; Joyce 1914: 17; Hesse 1965; Montgomery 1978; but see Wardlaw 1852: 27–41) First, the concept of a miracle predates any modern concept of a natural law by many centuries. While this does not necessarily preclude Hume's concept, it does raise the question of what concept or concepts earlier thinkers had in mind and of why the Humean concept should be thought preferable. (Tucker 2005) One benefit of defining miracles in terms of violations of natural law is that this definition entails that a miracle is beyond the productive power of nature. But if that is the key idea, then it is hard to see why we should not simply use that as the definition and leave out the problematic talk of laws.

Second, it becomes difficult to say in some cases just which natural laws are being violated by the event in question. (Earman 2000) That dead men stay dead is a widely observed fact, but it is not, in the ordinary scientific use of the term, a law of nature that dead men stay dead. The laws involved in the decomposition of a dead body are all at a much more fundamental level, at least at the level of biochemical and thermodynamic processes and perhaps at the level of interactions of fundamental particles.

Third, there are deep philosophical disagreements regarding the nature and even the existence of natural laws. On Hume's own “regularity” view of natural laws, it is difficult to see what it would mean for a natural law to be violated. If the natural laws are simply compendious statements of natural regularities, an apparent “violation” would most naturally be an indication, not that a supernatural intervention in the course of nature had occurred, but rather that what we had thought was a natural law was, in fact, not one. On metaphysically rich conceptions of natural laws, violations are problematic since the laws involve relations of necessity among universals. And on the view that there are no natural laws whatsoever, the set of events satisfying the Humean definition of a miracle is, trivially, empty.

Speaking of miracles as violations of the laws of nature also raises questions about the nature of violation. Richard Swinburne (1970) has suggested that a miracle might be defined as a non-repeatable counter-instance to a law of nature. If a putative law has broad scope, great explanatory power, and appealing simplicity, it may be more reasonable, Swinburne argues, to retain the law (defined as a regularity that virtually invariably holds) and to accept that the event in question is a non-repeatable counter-instance of that law than to throw out the law and create a vastly more complex law that accommodates the event.

One way to get around all of these problems and still retain the Humean formulation is simply to redefine the laws of nature. J. L. Mackie sums up this perspective neatly:

The laws of nature … describe the ways in which the world—including, of course, human beings—works when left to itself, when not interfered with. A miracle occurs when the world is not left to itself, when something distinct from the natural order as a whole intrudes into it. (Mackie 1982: 19–20)

With the notion of “natural law” thus redefined, the “violation” definition becomes virtually equivalent to the earlier definition of a miracle as an event that exceeds the productive power of nature. And in Mackie's formulation it has the desirable feature that it makes evident the connection between a miracle and supernatural agency.

1.3 The relevance of religious context

Beyond all of these considerations, one can make a case for the restriction of the term “miracle” to events that are supernaturally caused and have some palpable religious significance. An insignificant shift in a few grains of sand in the lonesome desert might, if it exceeded the productive powers of nature, qualify as a miracle in some thin sense, but it would manifestly lack religious significance and could not be used as the fulcrum for any interesting argument. Considerations such as this have led many authors to build both the type of agency and some intimation of the purpose into the definition of a miracle. Thus, Samuel Clarke (1719: 311–12) writes that

the true Definition of a Miracle, in the Theological Sense of the Word, is this; that it is a work effected in a manner unusual, or different from the common and regular Method of Providence, by the interposition either of God himself, or of some Intelligent Agent superiour to Man, for the Proof or Evidence of some particular Doctrine, or in attestation to the Authority of some particular Person.

Hume also, in one of his definitions of “miracle,” speaks of an event brought about “by a particular volition of the Deity, or by the interposition of some invisible agent.” (Hume 1748/2000: 87) Since the paradigmatic cases under discussion are for the most part claims that, if true, would answer to the theological dimension of Clarke's description, we may take a supernatural cause to be a necessary condition for an event's being a religiously significant miracle and use the word “miracle” in this sense where there is no danger of confusion.

On the whole, then, the project of giving a definition for the term “miracle” appears to have reached a point where further refinements offer only diminshing returns. A miracle is an event that exceeds the productive power of nature, and a religiously significant miracle is a detectable miracle that has a supernatural cause. For practical purposes, we need nothing further. The paradigmatic claims under discussion—that a man who has died was raised to life again several days after his death, for example, or that water was changed instantaneously into wine—satisfy not only this definition but also most of the alternative proposals that have been seriously advanced.

2. Arguments for Miracle Claims

“Miracles, indeed, would prove something,” admits the eponymous skeptic in Berkeley's Alciphron. “But what proof have we of these miracles?” (Berkeley 1732/1898: 364) There is no lack of answers in the literature. But the variety of premises, the multiplicity of argumentative structures, and the diversity of aims employed to this end can be bewildering.

Many arguments for miracles adduce the testimony of sincere and able eyewitnesses as the key piece of evidence on which the force of the argument depends. But other factors are also cited in favor of miracle claims: the existence of commemorative ceremonies from earliest times, for example, or the transformation of the eyewitnesses from fearful cowards into defiant proclaimers of the resurrection, or the conversion of St. Paul, or the growth of the early church under extremely adverse conditions and without any of the normal conditions of success such as wealth, patronage, or the use of force. These considerations are often used jointly in a cumulative argument. It is therefore difficult to isolate a single canonical argument for most miracle claims. The various arguments must be handled on a case-by-case basis.

2.1 Categorical and confirmatory arguments

Two dimensions of classification help to bring into focus the nature of the various arguments that have been advanced on behalf of miracle claims, one having to do with the aims of the arguments and the other having to do with their structure.

We may first distinguish between arguments designed to show that their conclusions are true, reasonable, or justified, on the one hand, and arguments designed to show that their conclusions are more reasonable or more justified than they were apart from the considerations adduced. The former we may stipulatively call categorical arguments; the latter, confirmatory arguments. When the arguments are probabilistic in nature, this reduces to Richard Swinburne's terminology of P-inductive and C-inductive arguments, the former intending to show that the conclusion (in this case that the miracle in question has actually occurred) is probable to some specific degree, or at least more probable than not, and the latter intending to show that the conclusion is more probable given the evidence presented than it is considered independently of that evidence. (Swinburne, 2004) But the broader distinction between arguments that purport to command our rational assent and arguments that have the more modest goal of showing their conclusions to be to some (perhaps specified) extent confirmed is one that can be employed independently of the use of the language of probability.

2.2 Four types of arguments

In addition to this classification of the aims of an argument, there is a more common distinction among arguments in terms of their structure. Broadly speaking, most arguments for miracle claims fall into one of four structural categories: deductive, criteriological, explanatory, or probabilistic. A valid deductive argument is one in which, given the truth of the premises, the conclusion must also be true. A criteriological argument sets forth some criteria ostensibly met by the claim in question and concludes that the satisfaction of those criteria reflects well on the claim—that it is certain, or true, or likely to be true, or plausible, or more plausible than it would have been had it not met the criteria. An explanatory argument is typically contrastive: it aims to show, for example, that one hypothesis is a better explanation of a certain body of facts than any rival hypothesis or than the disjunction of all rival hypotheses. A probabilistic argument aims to show that the conclusion is more probable than not, or that it is more probable than some fixed standard (say, 0.99), or that it is far more probable given the evidence adduced than it is considered independent of that evidence.

The latter three categories are not mutually exclusive. An argument may be put forward as criteriological but be best analyzed, on reflection, as explanatory; an explanatory argument may be best analyzed in probabilistic terms. But the fourfold classification will do for a first rough sorting.

2.2.1 Deductive arguments

Deductive arguments for miracle claims are relatively rare in serious modern discussions, since they are subject to peculiar liabilities. Here, for example, is a deductive reconstruction of an argument given by William Paley (1859), broadly modeled on the version given by Richard Whately (1870: 254–258) and other Victorian logicians:

  1. All miracles attested by persons, claiming to have witnessed them, who pass their lives in labors, dangers, and sufferings in support of their statements, and who, in consequence of their belief, submit to new rules of conduct, are worthy of credit.
  2. The central Christian miracles are attested by such evidence.
  1. The central Christian miracles are worthy of credit.

There are several strategies available for pressing a critique of this argument. In ancient times, premise 2 was generally conceded, while premise 1 was contested; since the Enlightenment, it has become somewhat more common for critics to contest premise 2 as well. There are also indirect approaches that exploit the deductive structure of the argument to argue that something must be wrong with the argument without getting bogged down in the details of a specific critique. Adding further true premises does not reduce the support that a deductive argument gives to its conclusion; but the addition of such premises may bring to light some awkward consequences. One interpretation of one part of Hume's strategy in “Of Miracles,” part 2 is that he has in mind the addition of a further premise:

2*. Various non-Christian miracles are attested by such (or better) evidence,

the conclusion envisaged being, of course, that

3*. Various non-Christian miracles are worthy of credit.

The strategy is intended as a reductio ad absurdum of the first premise, since prima facie it is not the case that both the Christian miracles and the non-Christian miracles are worthy of credit. Paley does not cast his own argument into a deductive form, but he does attempt to forestall this sort of criticism by adding, in rounding out Part 1, an additional claim for which he offers several lines of argument:

[T]here is not satisfactory evidence, that persons professing to be original witnesses of other miracles, in their nature as certain as these are, have ever acted in the same manner, in attestation of the accounts which they delivered, and properly in consequence of their belief of those accounts. (Paley 1859: 181)

2.2.2 Criteriological arguments

A classic formulation of a criteriological argument for miracles is employed by Charles Leslie (1697/1815: 13), who argues that we may safely believe an historical claim that meets four criteria:

  1. That the matters of fact be such, as that men's outward senses, their eyes and ears, may be judges of it.
  2. That it be done publicly in the face of the world.
  3. That not only public monuments be kept up in memory of it, but some outward actions to be performed.
  4. That such monuments, and such actions or observances, be instituted, and do commence from the time that the matter of fact was done.

The first two criteria, Leslie explains, “make it impossible for any such matter of fact to be imposed upon men, at the time when such fact was said to be done, because every man's eyes and senses would contradict it.” The latter two criteria assure those who come afterwards that the account of the event was not invented subsequent to the time of the purported event. Leslie points out that these criteria are not necessary conditions of factual truth, but he insists that they are—taken jointly—sufficient. Hence we may speak of Leslie's principle: If any reported event meets all four of these criteria, then its historicity is certain.

In assessing a criteriological argument, we need to ask not only whether the event in question meets the criteria but also whether the criteria themselves are good indicators of truth. An argument for the criteria that Leslie gives cannot proceed wholly a priori, since there is not a necessary connection between an event's satisfying the criteria and its being true. In this case, perhaps the most promising approach would be to argue that the criteria effectively rule out explanations other than the truth of the claim. Leslie's remarks suggest that this is the direction he would go if challenged, but he does not offer a fully developed defense of his criteria.

Leslie's argument is, in the sense outlined above, categorical—he holds that, as the claim of the resurrection meets all four criteria (the memorials being supplied by the Christian commemoration of the last supper and the transfer of the day of worship from the Sabbath (Saturday) to the first day of the week (Sunday)), the certainty of the matter of fact in question is “demonstrated.” This rather bold claim opens the possibility of refutation of Leslie's principle by counterexample, though reportedly Conyers Middleton, a contemporary of Hume whose critique of the ecclesiastical miracles was notable for its thoroughness, searched vainly for years for a counterexample to Leslie's principle. Be that as it may, a criteriological argument may also be constructed on the basis of a more modest principle, such as that if any reported event meets all four of these criteria, then it is reasonable to accept its historicity.

The chief difficulty with criteriological arguments, whether bold or modest, is that they provide no means for taking into account any other considerations that might weigh against the historical claim in question. Intuitively, extreme antecedent improbability ought to carry some weight in our evaluation of the credibility of a factual claim. A defender of a criteriological argument might respond that so long as the bar is set high enough, antecedent improbability will be overwhelmed by the fact that the event does indeed meet the stipulated criteria. But this is a claim that requires argument; and the bolder the conclusion, the more argument it requires.

2.2.3 Explanatory arguments

A third approach to arguing for a miracle claim is to argue that it is the best explanation for a small set of widely conceded facts. A typical “minimal facts” argument for the resurrection of Jesus starts with a list of facts such as these (Habermas 1996: 162):

  1. Jesus died by crucifixion.
  2. His disciples subsequently had experiences which they believed were literal physical appearances of the risen Jesus.
  3. The disciples were transformed from fearful cowards into bold proclaimers who were willing to face persecution and death for their message.
  4. Paul, who had previously been a persecutor of the Christians, had an experience that he also believed was an appearance of the risen Jesus.

None of these four facts is, in itself, a supernatural claim, and virtually all critical scholars with relevant expertise concur in these facts on ordinary historical grounds. The explanatory argument starts with this scholarly consensus and contends that all alternative explanations for these facts are inferior to the explanation that Jesus actually did rise from the dead. The conclusion is therefore typically categorical.

One advantage of this approach over the criteriological approach is that the inference is explicitly contrastive: the argument engages directly with alternative explanations of the data. Such engagement brings with it the burden of examining a variety of alternative explanations, a burden that is sometimes discharged by reference to established criteria of historical explanation. (Craig 2008: 233)

This sort of explanatory argument may be contested in at least five ways, a number of which have been explored. First, one might try, the scholarly consensus notwithstanding, to dispute the facts asserted. (Crossan, in Copan 1998) If successful, this strategy would undermine the positive argument. Second, one might grant, if only for the sake of the argument, the prima facie force of the positive argument but attempt to neutralize it by widening the factual basis to include a matching set of facts, equally well attested, for which the falsehood of the resurrection account is the best explanation. Third, one might argue that the relative merits of the miraculous and non-miraculous explanations have been improperly assessed and that, rightly considered, one or more of the non-miraculous explanations is actually preferable as an explanation of the facts in question. (Lüdemann, in Copan and Tacelli 2000) Fourth, one might produce a non-miraculous explanation not addressed in the explanatory argument and argue that it is superior to the miraculous explanation. (Venturini 1800; cf. O'Collins and Kendall 1996) Fifth, one might contest the implication that an explanation that is superior to its rivals in pairwise comparisons is actually more reasonable to believe than not. It is not difficult to imagine (or even to find) cases where one explanation is marginally better than any given rival but where the disjunction of the rival explanations is more believable. This final criticism applies only when the explanatory argument is categorical; but in that case, a further argument would be necessary to close off this line of criticism.

2.2.4 Probabilistic arguments

A fourth method of arguing for a miracle claim is to employ the machinery of Bayesian probability and argue that some fact or set of facts renders the conclusion probable (for a categorical argument) or significantly more probable than it was taken apart from those facts (for a confirmatory one). The argument could be cast in categorical form using the odds form of Bayes's Theorem. It is a simple consequence of Bayes's Theorem that, where ‘M’ is the claim that a miracle has taken place and ‘E’ is some evidence bearing on that claim, and where all of the relevant terms are defined,

P(M|E)/P(~M|E) = P(M)/P(~M) × P(E|M)/P(E|~M)

Verbally, this says that the posterior odds on M (that is, the ratio of the posterior probability of M to the posterior probability of its negation) equal the product of the prior odds and the Bayes factor. More colloquially, M becomes more plausible when we take into account evidence E that is more to be expected if M is true than if M is false. A categorical argument of this sort would involve plugging in values (either point-valued or interval-valued) for each term in this equation and concluding that P(M|E) > k, where k is some constant with a value greater than or equal to 0.5. The evaluation of such an argument is likely to turn principally on the relative magnitudes of P(M) and P(E|~M), since in many contexts the disputants will grant that the other two probabilities that appear on the right side of the equation—P(~M) and P(E|M)—are very close to 1. A confirmatory probabilistic argument might proceed from the same premises but dispense with the ratio of the priors, focusing on the fact that the ratio P(E|M)/P(E/~M) is top heavy.

The equation may give the impression that what is going on is rather arcane. In fact, the mathematics is simply a means of making explicit a common process of reasoning described well by Joseph Butler (1736/1819: 194):

[T]he truth of our religion, like the truth of common matters, is to be judged of by all the evidence taken together. And unless the whole series of things which may be alleged in this argument, and every particular thing in it, can reasonably be supposed to have been by accident (for here the stress of the argument for Christianity lies); then is the truth of it proved: in like manner, as if in any common case, numerous events acknowledged, were to be alleged in proof of any other event disputed; the truth of the disputed event would be proved, not only if any one of the acknowledged ones did of itself clearly imply it but, though no one of them singly did so, if the whole of the acknowledged events taken together could not in reason be supposed to have happened, unless the disputed one were true.

Allowing for the change in terminology over the centuries, Butler's description can be read as a verbal explication of the categorical form of the Bayesian argument. If the facts can be accounted for without difficulty on the supposition of M but not, without great implausibility, on the assumption of ~M, then they provide significant evidence in favor of M. On this reading, Butler is tacitly assuming that the prior probability of M is not so low as to overcome the cumulative force of the evidence in its favor.

Historically, probabilistic arguments for miracles have centered on the credibility of eyewitness testimony to the miraculous. Where Ti(M) stands for “Witness i testifies that M,” we may write the relevant form of Bayes's Theorem as

P(M|T1(M) & … & Tn(M)) / P(~M|T1(M) & … & Tn(M)) =
    P(M)/P(~M) ×
      P(T1(M) & … & Tn(M)|M) / P(T1(M) & … & Tn(M)|~M)

If we assume that these testimonies are independent of each other relative both to M and to ~M—an assumption that should not be made casually (Kruskal 1988)—we can replace the final term on the right with the product

P(T1(M)|M)/P(T1(M)|~M) × … × P(Tn(M)|M)/P(Tn(M)|~M)

On the further simplifying assumption that all of the testimonies are of equal weight, this product reduces to


If P(T1(M)|M)/P(T1(M)|~M) > 1, it follows at once that the claim, arguably attributable to Hume, that the evidence of testimony can never overcome the antecedent presumption against a miracle, is false. As Charles Babbage puts it:

[I]f independent witnesses can be found, who speak truth more frequently than falsehood, it is ALWAYS possible to assign a number of independent witnesses, the improbability of the falsehood of whose concurring testimony shall be greater than the improbability of the alleged miracle. (Babbage 1837: 202, emphasis original; cf. Holder 1998 and Earman 2000)

The evaluation of such an argument requires the consideration of historical details that go beyond the bounds of philosophy as a discipline. (McGrew and McGrew 2009) But some general points regarding its structure are of philosophical interest. If the argument is categorical, then its conclusion is (at least) that, where “E” stands for the sum of the relevant evidence, P(M|E) > 0.5. But where “G” stands for “God exists” (where “God” is conceived classically, as an eternal, personal being of maximal power, knowledge, and goodness who created the universe), it is generally acknowledged that P(M|G) >> P(M|~G) and that either P(M|~G) = 0 (if miracles are strictly the prerogative of God) or at least P(M|~G) ≈ 0. The evaluation of the claim that a miracle has occurred will therefore be sensitive to the probability of the claim that God exists, and the evaluation of the categorical form of the argument will therefore depend on the overall evaluation of the evidence of natural theology and of atheological arguments such as the problem of evil. By far the most sophisticated and elaborate development of such an argument is to be found in the work of Richard Swinburne (1970, 1977, 1979, 1992, 2003), who has pioneered the application of Bayesian probability to questions in the philosophy of religion and whose work spans the full range of natural theology.

The confirmatory form of the probabilistic argument is more modest; it aims to show that there is a considerable contribution to the argument for M arising from the facts indicated. (McGrew and McGrew 2009) It has been objected (Oppy 2006: 5–6) that probabilistic arguments of this sort are of no interest unless they are founded on all of the relevant available evidence. But this objection would, if legitimate, count equally against the use of arguments from comparison of likelihoods in scientific reasoning, where they are ubiquitous. More cautiously, one might ask why an argument that places no definite restrictions on the probability of M should be of any interest. One answer would be that a successful confirmatory argument may shift the burden of proof. If there is a substantial body of evidence in favor of M, it is incumbent on those who deny M to explain in some detail either (1) why the antecedent presumption against M should override this evidence or (2) what the other evidential considerations are that mitigate against M.

3. Arguments against Miracle Claims

Arguments against miracle claims, like arguments in their favor, come in a variety of forms, invoke diverse premises, and have distinct aims. We may distinguish general arguments, designed to show that all miracle claims are subject in principle to certain failings, from particular arguments, designed to show that, whatever may be the case in principle, such miracle claims as have historically been offered are inadequately supported.

3.1 General arguments

General arguments against miracle claims fall into two broad classes: those designed to show that miracles are impossible, and those designed to show that miracle claims could never be believable.

3.1.1 Arguments that miracles are impossible

The boldest claim that could be made against reported miracles is that such events are impossible. Insofar as the definition of “miracle” in question is one that involves divine agency, any argument that demonstrated the non-existence of God would be eo ipso a demonstration that miracles do not take place; and an argument that demonstrated that the existence of God is impossible would demonstrate that miracles are likewise impossible. But the more common arguments for this conclusion are more modest; rather than setting out to show the existence of God to be impossible, they typically invoke theological premises to show that if there were a God, then miracles would not occur.

In chapter 6 of his Tractatus Theologico-Politicus, Baruch Spinoza sets out to argue for the claim that nature cannot be contravened, but that she “preserves a fixed and immutable course,” in consequence of which a miracle is “a sheer absurdity.” (Spinoza 1670/1862: 123, 128) His argument for this claim is somewhat difficult to follow, but it appears to run approximately like this:

  1. The will of God is identical with the laws of nature.
  2. A miracle is a violation of the laws of nature.
  3. Necessarily, God's will is inviolable.
  1. Miracles cannot happen.

Spinoza's argument is unlikely to persuade anyone who does not start out with his identification of the laws of nature with the will of God. From a more traditional theistic standpoint, the argument is simply an elaborate exercise in begging the question.

A non-theological version of this argument, sometimes mistakenly attributed to Hume, is actually due to Voltaire (1764/1901: 272):

A miracle is the violation of mathematical, divine, immutable, eternal laws. By the very exposition itself, a miracle is a contradiction in terms: a law cannot at the same time be immutable and violated.

The trouble with this crude argument is once again in the definition of “miracle,” which here goes beyond a mere violation concept in adding immutability, which generates the contradiction. One retort that historically proved attractive is to accept the violation concept but deny that the laws of nature are immutable; instead the truly immutable laws are higher laws—laws that govern not only the behavior of physical entities but the interactions of physical and non-physical entities—and what appear to us to be violations of the laws of nature are really nothing less than instances of a higher law. (Trench 1847:14–17; cf. Venn 1888: 433 ff)

A more subtle version of a theological objection can also be found in the entry “Miracles” in Voltaire's Philosophical Dictionary (1764/1901: 273):

[I]t is impossible a being infinitely wise can have made laws to violate them. He could not … derange the machine but with a view of making it work better; but it is evident that God, all-wise and omnipotent, originally made this immense machine, the universe, as good and perfect as He was able; if He saw that some imperfections would arise from the nature of matter, He provided for that in the beginning; and, accordingly, He will never change anything in it.

It is therefore impious to ascribe miracles to God; they would indicate a lack of forethought, or of power, or both.

This argument was popular during the deist controversy of the early and mid 18th century, and the orthodox response is summed up well by Paley (1859: 12): “[I]n what way can a revelation be made but by miracles? In none which we are able to conceive.” Paley's point is not merely negative; rather, it is that only by setting up a universe with regularities that no mere human can abrogate and then suspending them could God, if there were a God, authenticate a revelation, stamping it with divine approval by an act of sovereignty. If there is a God who wishes to authenticate a communication to man in an unmistakable fashion, then, in Paley's view, an authenticating miracle is inevitable. It is therefore not at all impious to ascribe miracles to God, and they imply no limit either on His knowledge or on His power; they are both a sign of His approval and evidence of His benevolent foresight.

3.1.2 Arguments that miracle claims could never be rationally believed

The principal argument against the rational credibility of miracle claims derives from Hume. “A miracle,” he writes,

is a violation of the laws of nature; and as a firm and unalterable experience has established these laws, the proof against a miracle, from the very nature of the fact, is as entire as any argument from experience can possibly be imagined. (Hume 1748/2000: 86–87)

He ends the first Part of his essay “Of Miracles” with a general maxim:

The plain consequence is (and it is a general maxim worthy of our attention), “That no testimony is sufficient to establish a miracle, unless the testimony be of such a kind, that its falsehood would be more miraculous, than the fact, which it endeavours to establish: And even in that case, there is a mutual destruction of arguments, and the superior only gives us an assurance suitable to that degree of force, which remains, after deducting the inferior.”

The maxim itself is open to interpretive disputes. George Campbell (1762/1839) considers it to be trivial, a judgment with which Earman (2000) concurs. One simple way to arrive at it from a Bayesian point of view is to take the initial equation

P(M|E)/P(~M|E) = P(M)/P(~M) × P(E|M)/P(E|~M),

where E is the proposed evidence for a miracle, and make the simplifying approximation that P(E|M) ≈ P(~M), since both terms are close to 1. Then the right side reduces to the ratio of the two remaining “small” terms, P(M)/P(E|~M), which will be a fair approximation of the posterior odds. Then the posterior probability of M will exceed 0.5 just in case P(M) > P(E|~M). This interpretation is endorsed by Holder (1998) but challenged by Millican (2002), who also surveys various other probabilistic interpretations of Hume's maxim.

Hume immediately illustrates this maxim by applying it to the case of testimony to a resurrection:

When anyone tells me, that he saw a dead man restored to life, I immediately consider with myself, whether it be more probable, that this person should either deceive or be deceived, or that the fact, which he relates, should really have happened. I weigh the one miracle against the other; and according to the superiority, which I discover, I pronounce my decision, and always reject the greater miracle. If the falsehood of his testimony would be more miraculous, than the event which he relates; then, and not till then, can he pretend to command my belief or opinion. (Hume 1748/2000: 87–88)

Is this an argument, or even an elliptical statement of one premise in an argument? And if so, what is its structure? The traditional interpretation has been that it is an argument from the nature of the case, the conclusion being that a miracle story could not be believed on testimony even under the most favorable circumstances. As far as we can tell, all of Hume's contemporaries, including John Leland (1755), William Adams (1767), Richard Price (1777), and George Campbell (1762/1839), read him this way. There is, however, considerable recent disagreement as to whether Hume intended Part 1 of his essay as an argument, disagreement that arises in part from the apprehension on the part of some of Hume's defenders that if it is an argument, it is not very good. The interpretive issues are too extensive to summarize; see Flew (1961), Levine (1989: 152), Johnson (1999), Earman (2000), Fogelin (2003), McGrew (2005), and Hájek (2008). But it is beyond contesting that some such argument, widely attributed to Hume, has been tremendously influential.

A very simple version of the argument, leaving out the comparison to the laws of nature and focusing on the alleged infirmities of testimony, can be laid out deductively (following Whately, in Paley 1859: 33):

  1. Testimony is a kind of evidence very likely to be false.
  2. The evidence for the Christian miracles is testimony.
  1. The evidence for the Christian miracles is likely to be false.

This is, however, much too crude an argument to carry any weight, since it turns on a simple ambiguity between all testimony and some testimony. Whately offers an amusing parody that makes the fallacy obvious: Some books are mere trash; Hume's Works are [some] books; therefore, etc.

Another crude argument that focuses solely on the improbability of miracle claims (Ehrman 2003: 228–229) may be laid out thus:

  1. A miracle is by definition the most improbable of events; the probability of a miracle is infinitesimally remote.
  2. An historian can establish only what probably happened in the past.
  1. An historian can never establish that a miracle happened.

Waiving the tendentious definition in premise 1, the supposed contradiction involved in denying the conclusion—“that the most improbable event is the most probable” (Ehrman 2003: 229)—is merely verbal, arising from a failure to distinguish between the probability of a miracle claim considered apart from the evidence and the probability of the claim given that evidence.

Flew (1966: 146; cf. Bradley 1874/1935) offers a more sophisticated criticism, arguing from the nature of historical inquiry that rational belief in miracles is precluded:

The basic propositions are: first, that the present relics of the past cannot be interpreted as historical evidence at all, unless we presume that the same fundamental regularities obtained then as still obtain today; second, that in trying as best he may to determine what actually happened the historian must employ as criteria all his present knowledge, or presumed knowledge, of what is probable or improbable, possible or impossible; and, third, that, since miracle has to be defined in terms of practical impossibility the application of these criteria inevitably precludes proof of a miracle.

The most obvious rejoinder here is that the believer in miracles does not generally believe that there are no dependable regularities in the physical world; it is in the nature of a miracle to be an exception to the ordinary course of nature. The feared undermining of the principles of historical inquiry is therefore an illusion generated by exaggerating the scale on which the order of nature would be disrupted were a miracle actually to occur.

An alternative reading of Hume, proposed by Dorothy Coleman (1988: 338–339), is that

an event that has no ready natural explanation is not necessarily an event that has no natural cause. To be a miracle, an event must be inexplicable not in terms of what appears to us to be the laws of nature but in terms of what laws of nature actually are…. [O]ne must ask if it is always more likely, i.e., conformable to experience, that those claiming the event to be a miracle are mistaken rather than that the event is a genuine violation of a law of nature. Counterinstances of what are taken to be natural laws are not by themselves evidence establishing that no natural law could possibly explain them: at most they provide grounds for revising our formulations of natural laws or seeking an improved understanding of the nature of the phenomena in question. At the very least they provide grounds for suspending judgments about the nature of their cause until more evidence is available. On the other hand, past experience shows that what are at one time considered violations of natural laws are frequently found at some later time not to be so. Proportioning belief to evidence, therefore, it is more reasonable to believe that the claim that an event is a miracle is mistaken than it is that the event is a violation of natural law.

There is not much to commend this line of argument as a reading of Hume; both the casual attitude toward our identification of the laws of nature and the willingness to grant the occurrence of the event jar with Hume's own presentation of his view. As Hajek (2008: 86–87) stresses, Hume is unambiguously arguing that we should disbelieve testimony to an event's occurrence, when that event really would be miraculous.

As an independent objection to belief in reported miracles, Coleman's argument has limited force. On a ceteris paribus conception of natural laws, apparent counterevidence to a putative law may, depending on circumstances, reduce the probability of the law only slightly, the majority of the impact of the evidence going to raise the probability that all else is not, in the present case, equal. There is no general principle that would license the conclusion that it is more reasonable to accept the falsehood of the putative law than to suppose the causal closure of nature to be violated. Everything depends on the details of specific cases.

A more faithful representation of Hume's reasoning brings back in the comparison between “two opposite experiences,” reconstructing his argument along these lines:

  1. The argument against a miracle, from the nature of the case, is as strong as any argument from experience could possibly be.
  2. The argument for a miracle, from testimony, is at best a strong but somewhat weaker argument from experience.
  3. In any case where two arguments from experience point to contradictory conclusions, the stronger argument must prevail.
  4. A conclusion is credible only if the argument supporting it is not overcome by a stronger argument for a contradictory conclusion.
  1. The argument for a miracle, from testimony, cannot even under the most favorable circumstances render belief in a miracle credible.

Hume's early critics objected vigorously to the claims embodied in the first two premises. Price (1777: 402; cf. Adams 1767: 10–11 and Paley 1859: 13–14) retorts against the claim in premise 1 that “a miracle is more properly an event different from experience than contrary to it.” The presumptive case against the resurrection from universal testimony would be as strong as Hume supposes only if, per impossible, all mankind throughout all ages had been watching the tomb of Jesus on the morning of the third day and testified that nothing occurred. Even aside from the problems of time travel, there is not a single piece of direct testimonial evidence to Jesus' non-resurrection. Premise 1 is therefore a wild overstatement.

Adams (1767: 37) mounts an attack on premise 2 by drawing attention to the manner in which the lives of the apostles corroborate their testimony:

That men should love falshood rather than truth—that they should chuse labour and travail, shame and misery, before pleasure, ease, and esteem—is as much a violation of the laws of nature, as it is for lead or iron to hang unsupported in the air, or for the voice of a man to raise the dead to life: but this, I have granted to the author, is, not miraculous, but impossible, and shall therefore have his leave, I hope, to assert, that falshood, thus attested, is impossible—in other words, that testimony, thus tried and proved, is infallible and certain.

And he drives home the point by a quotation from Hume himself:

We cannot make use of a more convincing argument, than to prove that the actions ascribed to any person are directly contrary to the course of nature, and that no human motives, in such circumstances, could ever induce him to such a conduct. (Adams 1767: 48, quoting Hume 1748/2000: 65)

This argument, of course, proves at best only the sincerity of the witnesses. But in the present case, he goes on to argue, the nature of the facts attested precludes the possibility that the witnesses are themselves deceived (Adams 1767:37–38; cf. Jenkin 1708: 488–93).

Alan Hájek (2008: 88) offers a more detailed reconstruction of this argument. The first stage corresponds to the argument in “Of Miracles,” Part I:

  1. A miracle is a violation of the laws of nature.
  2. A law of nature is, inter alia, a regularity to which no exception has previously been experienced.
  1. There is as compelling a ‘proof’ from experience as can possibly be imagined against a miracle.
  2. In particular, the proof from experience in favour of testimony of any kind cannot be more compelling.
  3. There is no other form of proof in favour of testimony.
  1. The falsehood of the testimony to a miraculous event is always at least as probable as the event attested to (however good the testimony seems to be).
  1. Hume's balancing principle. The testimony should be believed if, and only if, the falsehood of the testimony is less probable than the event attested to.
Therefore, (by 7 and 8):
  1. Conclusion 1. Testimony to a miraculous event should never be believed—belief in a miracle report could never be justified.

Hájek makes a strong case that this is a faithful reconstruction of Hume's reasoning. But as he goes on to point out, this argument is problematic at multiple points. The definition in 1 is at the least not forced upon us; and the inference from 1 and 2 to 3 overlooks the possibility that a regularity to which no exception has previously been experienced is also a regularity of which no instance has previously been experienced—a possibility that is countenanced on some major conceptions of laws—or that the law in question has not been instanced very often. (Hájek 2008: 91) Hume might reply that, while this is theoretically possible, it does not hold in the cases of interest. But even granting that reply, Hájek points out that 5 may be questioned; and 6 is deeply problematic, since lack of analogy is at best an obscure reason for concluding that an event is maximally improbable. For if strength of analogy is a critical determinant in a rational agent's probability function, then he should be comparably skeptical regarding all spectacular scientific discoveries—“And that is absurd.” (Hájek 2008: 103)

3.2 Particular arguments

Because the field of arguments for miracles is so wide, a consideration of all of the criticisms that have been leveled against particular arguments for miracles would fill many volumes. But four particular arguments raised by Hume are sufficiently well known to be of interest to philosophers.

In Part 2 of his essay “Of Miracles,” Hume argues that there never was a miraculous event established on evidence so full as to amount to an “entire proof.” The considerations Hume marshals in this section had, for the most part, been canvassed thoroughly during the deist controversy in the preceeding half century; Hume's credit in this Part is not that of originating the arguments but rather that of stating them clearly and forcefully.

3.2.1 The argument from inauspicious conditions

First, Hume lists a set of conditions that would, in his view, be necessary in order for an argument from testimony to have its full force, and he argues that no miracle report has ever met these conditions:

[T]here is not to be found, in all history, any miracle attested by a sufficient number of men, of such unquestioned good sense, education, and learning, as to secure us against all delusion in themselves; of such undoubted integrity, as to place them beyond all suspicion of any design to deceive others; of such credit and reputation in the eyes of mankind, as to have a great deal to lose in case of their being detected in any falsehood; and at the same time attesting facts, performed in such a public manner, and in so celebrated a part of the world, as to render the detection unavoidable: All which circumstances are requisite to give us a full assurance in the testimony of men. (Hume 1748/2000: 88)

Hume does not elaborate on these conditions, and it is difficult to say how he might have responded to Leland's charge that they are not necessary and would in some cases cut the other direction. For example, Leland argues that meeting the condition of “credit and reputation” would actually have weakened the evidence for the Christian miracles:

It might have been said with some shew of plausibility, that such persons by their knowledge and abilities, their reputation and interest, might have it in their power to countenance and propagate an imposture among the people, and give it some credit in the world. (Leland 1755: 90–91; cf. Beckett 1883: 29–37)

3.2.2 The argument from the passions of surprise and wonder

Thomas Morgan (1739: 31) raises a second charge in these words:

Men are the more easily imposed on in such Matters, as they love to gratify the Passion of Admiration, and take a great deal of Pleasure in hearing or telling of Wonders.

The implication is twofold: miracle stories are more likely than other falsehoods to be told, since they cater to a natural human desire to be amazed; and they are more likely than other falsehoods to be believed, since the same passions conduce to their uncritical reception. Hume, perhaps following Morgan, makes much the same point in nearly the same words. But he goes beyond Morgan in specifying a further exacerbating factor: the religious context of a miracle claim, he urges, makes the telling of a miracle story even more likely.

[I]f the spirit of religion join itself to the love of wonder, there is an end of common sense; and human testimony, in these circumstances, loses all pretensions to authority. A religionist may be an enthusiast, and imagine he sees what has no reality: He may know his narrative to be false, and yet persevere in it, with the best intentions in the world, for the sake of promoting so holy a cause: Or even where this delusion has not place, vanity, excited by so strong a temptation, operates on him more powerfully than on the rest of mankind in any other circumstances; and self-interest with equal force. (Hume 1748/2000: 89)

But as George Campbell points out (1762/1839: 48–49), this consideration cuts both ways; the religious nature of the claim may also operate to make it less readily received:

[T]he prejudice resulting from the religious affection, may just as readily obstruct as promote our faith in a religious miracle. What things in nature are more contrary, than one religion is to another religion? They are just as contrary as light and darkness, truth and error. The affections with which they are contemplated by the same person, are just as opposite as desire and aversion, love and hatred. The same religious zeal which gives the mind of a Christian a propensity to the belief of a miracle in support of Christianity, will inspire him with an aversion from the belief of a miracle in support of Mahometanism. The same principle which will make him acquiesce in evidence less than sufficient in one case, will make him require evidence more than sufficient in the other….

… [T]hat the evidence arising from miracles performed in proof of a doctrine disbelieved, and consequently hated before, did in fact surmount that obstacle, and conquer all the opposition arising thence, is a very strong presumption in favour of that evidence; just as strong a presumption in its favour, as it would have been against it, had all their former zeal, and principles, and prejudices, co-operated with the evidence, whatever it was, in gaining an entire assent.

Moreover, as Campbell (1762/1839: 49) immediately points out,

there is the greatest disparity in this respect, a disparity which deserves to be particularly attended to, betwixt the evidence of miracles performed in proof of a religion to be established, and in contradiction to opinions generally received; and the evidence of miracles performed in support of a religion already established, and in confirmation of opinions generally received.

It is, therefore, a debatable question whether the consideration of the passions evoked by tales of the miraculous works for or against the miracle claim in any given instance. This is not an issue that can be settled in advance of a detailed consideration of the facts.

3.2.3 The argument from ignorance and barbarism

A third general argument is that miracle stories are most popular in backward cultures. As John Toland (1702: 148) puts it,

it is very observable, that the more ignorant and barbarous any People remain, you shall find 'em most abound with Tales of this nature …

The unstated moral to be drawn is that both the production and the reception of miracle stories are due to a failure to understand the secondary causes lying behind phenomena, while increasing knowledge and culture leaves no room for such stories. Hume (2000: 90–91) also borrowed this line of reasoning.

But the supposed trajectory of societies from ignorant superstition to enlightened rationalism owes a good deal more to selective illustration than one would suspect from reading Toland and Hume. Campbell (1762/1839: 70) points out that in the Qur'an Mohammed made no claim to work public miracles, though by Toland's (and Hume's) reasoning the circumstances would have been most propitious for such tales. Coming forward in time, miracle stories abounded in the 18th century, as Hume well knew. And renowned scientists such as Isaac Newton and Robert Boyle were well known defenders of the Christian miracle claims. Other forces are at work in the creation and acceptance of miracle stories besides the relative level of civilization and education.

3.2.4 The argument from parity

As a fourth and final argument, Hume sketches some accounts of purported miracles outside of the canonical Christian scriptures—two cures ascribed to Vespasian, one Catholic miracle reported to have been worked at Saragossa, and some cures ascribed to the influence of the tomb of the Jansenist Abbe Paris in the early 1700s—and suggests that their affidavits are in various respects as good as one could wish for. Hume clearly expects his Protestant readers to reject these stories with disdain. He leaves unstated the obvious conclusion: by parity, his readers should also reject the miracles of the New Testament.

Setting Protestants and Catholics by the ears over the miracles of later ecclesiastical history was an old game by Hume's time, and a small industry had grown up on the Protestant side providing criteria for sifting the genuine apostolic miracles from their Catholic counterfeits (Leslie 1697/1815, Douglas 1757, Warfield 1918). Hume's contemporary critics rose to the challenge and argued vigorously that his descriptions of the alleged “miracles,” Pagan, Catholic, and Jansenist, distorted the historical sources and were hopelessly one sided (Leland 1755: 102 ff, Adams 1767: 74 ff, Campbell 1762/1839: 96 ff, Douglas 1757: 96 ff).

Aside from these specific criticisms, one important general line of argument emerges in the criticisms, articulated well by Adams (1767: 73):

There is a wide difference betwixt establishing false miracles, by the help of a false religion, and establishing a false religion by the help of false miracles. Nothing is more easy than the former of these, or more difficult than the latter.

All attempts to draw an evidential parallel between the miracles of the New Testament and the miracle stories of later ecclesiastical history are therefore dubious. There are simply more resources for explaining how the ecclesiastical stories, which were promoted to an established and favorably disposed audience, could have arisen and been believed without there being any truth to the reports.

3.3 The impact of Hume's “Of Miracles”

Hume's critique of the credibility of reported miracles provoked a tidal wave of responses, of which the most important are Adams (1767), Leland (1755), Douglas (1757), Price (1777), and Campbell (1762/1839). There is not yet anything approaching a comprehensive survey of these responses. For limited but still useful historical discussions of Hume and his influence, see Leland (1755: 47–135), Lechler (1841: 425 ff), Farrar (1862: 148 ff), Stephen (1876: 309 ff), Burns (1981: 131 ff), Craig (1985), Houston (1994: 49–82), Tweyman (1996), Earman (2000), and Beauchamp's introduction to the critical edition of Hume's Enquiry (Hume 1748/2000).

As Charles Sanders Peirce notes (Peirce 1958: 293), the Humean in-principle argument has left an indelible impression on modern biblical scholarship. Humean considerations are expressly invoked in the work of the great German critic David Friedrich Strauss (1879: 199–200), transformed into one of the “presuppositions of critical history” in the work of the philosopher F. H. Bradley (1874/1935), rechristened as the “principle of analogy” in the writings of the theologian Ernst Troeltsch (1913), and endorsed, explicitly or implicitly, in many contemporary studies of the historical Jesus (Dawes 2001: 97–106) and the New Testament (Ehrman 2003: 228–30). Commitment to something like Hume's position lies on one side of a deep conceptual fault line that runs through the discipline of biblical studies.

The Humean objection has also been vigorously contested as destructive not only of miracle stories but of common sense as well. The 19th century saw a proliferation of satires in which Humean scruples about accepting testimony for extraordinary tales were applied to the events of secular history, with consequences that are equally disastrous and humorous. (Whately 1819/1874, Hudson 1857, Buel 1894) Whately's satire, which is the most famous, “establishes” on the basis of many historical improbabilities that Napoleon never existed but was a mythic figure invented by the British government to enhance national unity. Each of these satires makes the same point. One may legitimately require more evidence for a miracle story than for a mundane story (Sherlock 1729/1843: 55); but in exaggerating this sensible requirement into an insuperable epistemic barrier, Hume and his followers are applying a standard that cannot be applied without absurdity in any other field of historical investigation.

A curious feature of recent discussions is that Hume's critique has itself come under heavy fire and is now viewed in some quarters as requiring defense. For a range of views on the matter, see Levine (1989: 152 ff), who maintains that Part 1 contains an argument but that the argument is a failure, Johnson (1999), who argues that Part 1 is confused and unclear and that various attempts to clarify it have failed to elicit a compelling line of argument, Earman (2000), who argues that Part 1 is an “abject failure,” and Fogelin (2003), who aims to rehabilitate Hume against the critiques of Johnson and Earman in particular.

4. Arguments from Miracles

Granting for the sake of argument that a reported miracle, in the sense of an event beyond the productive capacity of nature, has been established, what follows? Historically, many participants in the discussion have been ready to grant that, at least when the religious significance of the event is obvious and the doctrine or claim it ostensibly attests is not otherwise objectionable, the miracle must have been worked by God and that it provides significant confirmation for the doctrine or claim. Indeed, the enduring popularity of the argument from miracles underscores the truth of Butler's observation that miracles are one of the “direct and fundamental proofs” of Christianity. (Butler 1736/1819: 173)

4.1 Would miracles be evidence for the existence of God?

There are two exceptions to this general acquiescence in the evidential value of miracles. First, there is a question regarding the identity of the cause. If God alone can work miracles, this is easily settled; but this claim has been a point of contention in the theological literature, with some writers (Clarke 1719: 305 ff; Trench 1847) maintaining that lesser, created spirits may work miracles, while others (e.g. Farmer 1771, Wardlaw 1852, Cooper 1876) vigorously deny this. The point is of some interest to the evaluation of arguments for miracles, since as Baden Powell points out, there is a distinction

between an extraordinary fact,—which is a proper matter for human testimony—and the belief in its being caused by Divine interposition, which is a matter of opinion, and consequently not susceptible of support by testimony, but dependent on quite other considerations. (Powell 1859: 287–88, following up on a distinction made in Less 1773: 260–62)

Powell is quite right to say that testimony is not the proper source for evidence of the supernatural nature of the event. But it does not follow that all opinions on the point are equally reasonable. The very description of the event—and even more, of the context in which it occurs—might render any naturalistic alternatives non-starters. Whether this is the case will depend, not on general considerations, but on the details of the case in question.

Second, it is occasionally argued that, contrary to what most philosophers and theologians have assumed, actual confirmed cases of miracles could not count in favor of the existence of God. George Chryssides (1975) argues that a miracle, conceived as a violation of a scientific law, could never be attributed to any agent, divine or otherwise, since the assignment of agency implies predictability. This bold contention has not attracted many defenders. Gregory Dawes (2009) pursues a related but more moderate line of argument, urging that it is difficult to meet the standard necessary to attribute particular events to the personal agency of God. But Dawes does not present this as an absolute barrier to theistic explanations.

Overall (1985) argues for the more radical contention that a miracle would count as evidence against the existence of God, on three grounds: (1) if order and harmony are evidence for the existence of God, then a miracle, which entails a breach in the order and harmony of the universe, must count against the existence of God; (2) the inevitable controversies over the identification and authentication of a miracle are an impediment to the growth of scientific knowledge and philosophical comprehension; and (3) an omnipotent God who does intervene in His creation would be obliged, on pain of moral defect, to intervene more often and more evenhandedly than He is supposed to have done in the Christian tradition.

These considerations have not, however, moved many philosophers to endorse Overall's position. Argument (1), besides giving a tendentious characterization of a miracle, exemplifies a fallacy in probabilistic reasoning, assuming that if F entails ~E and E is evidence for H, then F is evidence against H, which is not in general true. Claim (2) is arguably simply false, as such controversies do not appear noticeably to have impeded the progress of science or philosophy. Argument (3) will be effective against a certain sort of theological position, but it is not one that many believers in miracles actually hold. For further discussion of this issue, see the exchanges between Larmer and Overall. (Larmer 1988: 75–82, Overall 1997, Overall 2003, and Larmer 2004)

4.2 How much would credible miracle reports establish?

In the final analysis, the relevance of background beliefs looms large. To say this is not to endorse a lazy and unprincipled relativism; rather, the point is that one's considered rational judgment regarding the existence and nature of God must take into account far more than the evidence for miracle claims. That is not to say that they could not be an important or even, under certain circumstances, a decisive piece of evidence; it is simply that neither a positive nor a negative claim regarding the existence of God can be established on the basis of evidence for a miracle claim alone, without any consideration of other aspects of the question.

For the evidence for a miracle claim, being public and empirical, is never strictly demonstrative, either as to the fact of the event or as to the supernatural cause of the event. It remains possible, though the facts in the case may in principle render it wildly improbable, that the testifier is either a deceiver or himself deceived; and so long as those possibilities exist, there will be logical space for other forms of evidence to bear on the conclusion. Arguments about miracles therefore take their place as one piece—a fascinating piece—in a larger and more important puzzle.


  • Aquinas, St. Thomas, Summa Contra Gentiles (SCG), [Available online, translation by J. Rickaby, London: Burns and Oates, 1905].
  • Aquinas, St. Thomas, Summa Theologiae (ST), [Available online, translated by the Fathers of the English, in The Catholic Encyclopedia].
  • Adams, William, 1767, An Essay in Answer to Mr. Hume's Essay on Miracles, 3rd ed., London: B. White.
  • Babbage, Charles, 1837, The Ninth Bridgewater Treatise, London: John Murray.
  • Basinger, David, and Basinger, Randall, 1986, Philosophy and Miracle: The Contemporary Debate, Lewiston, ID: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • Beard, John Relly, 1845, Voices of the Church, London: Simpkin, Marshall, and Co.
  • Beckett, Edmund, 1883, A Review of Hume and Huxley on Miracles, New York: E. & J. B. Young & Co.
  • Berkeley, George, 1732, Alciphron, in George Sampson, ed., The Works of George Berkeley, D. D., Bishop of Cloyne, vol. 2, London, George Bell and Sons, 1898.
  • Bradley, Francis Herbert, 1874, “The Presuppositions of Critical History,” in Collected Essays, vol. 1, Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1935.
  • Brown, Colin, 1984, Miracles and the Critical Mind, Grand Rapids: Eerdmans.
  • Brown, Thomas, 1822, Inquiry into the Relation of Cause and Effect. Andover: Mark Newman.
  • Buel, Oliver Price, 1894, The Abraham Lincoln Myth, New York: The Mascot Publishing Co.
  • Burns, Robert M, 1981, The Great Debate on Miracles from Joseph Glanvill to David Hume, London and Toronto: Associated University Presses.
  • Butler, Joseph, 1736, The Analogy of Religion, Hartford: Samuel G. Goodrich, 1819.
  • Campbell, George, 1762, A Dissertation on Miracles, London: Thomas Tegg, 1839.
  • Chryssides, George, 1977, “Miracles and Agents,” Religious Studies 13: 319–327.
  • Clarke, Samuel, 1719, A Discourse Concerning the Being and Attributes of God, 5th ed., London: James Knapton.
  • Coleman, Dorothy P., 1988, “Hume, Miracles and Lotteries,” Hume Studies 14: 328–346.
  • Cooper, Thomas, 1876, The Verity and Value of the Miracles of Christ, London: Hodder and Stoughton.
  • Copan, Paul, ed., 1998, Will the Real Jesus Please Stand Up? Grand Rapids: Baker Books.
  • Copan, Paul, and Tacelli, Ronald, eds., 2000, Jesus' Resurrection: Fact or Figment? Downer's Grove, IL: InterVarsity.
  • Craig, William Lane, 2002, Assessing the New Testament Evidence for the Resurrection of Jesus, Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • Craig, William Lane, 1985, The Historical Argument for the Resurrection of Jesus During the Deist Controversy, Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • Craig, William Lane, 1986, “The Problem of Miracles: A Historical and Philosophical Perspective,” in David Wenham and Craig Blomberg, eds., Gospel Perspectives VI. Sheffield, England: JSOT Press, pp. 9–40.
  • Craig, William Lane, 2008, Reasonable Faith, 3rd ed., Wheaton, IL: Crossway Books.
  • Dawes, Gregory, 2001, The Historical Jesus Question, Louisville: Westminster John Knox Press.
  • Dawes, Gregory, 2009, Theism and Explanation, New York: Routledge.
  • Dawid, Philip and Gillies, Donald, 1989, “A Bayesian Analysis of Hume's Argument Concerning Miracles,” Philosophical Quarterly 39, pp. 57–65.
  • Douglas, John, 1757, The Criterion, London: A. Millar.
  • Dulles, Avery, 1971, A History of Apologetics, Eugene, OR: Wipf and Stock, 1999.
  • Earman, John, 2000, Hume's Abject Failure, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ehrman, Bart D., 2003, The New Testament: A Historical Introduction to the Early Christian Writings, 3rd ed., New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Farmer, Hugh, 1771, A Dissertation on Miracles, London: T. Cadell.
  • Flew, Antony, 1961, Hume's Philosophy of Belief, New York: Humanities Press.
  • Flew, Antony, 1966, God and Philosophy, London: Hutchinson.
  • Flew, Antony, 1967, “Miracles.” Encyclopedia of Philosophy, vol. 5, New York: Macmillan and Free Press, pp. 346–353.
  • Fogelin, Robert, 2003, A Defense of Hume on Miracles, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Garrett, Don, 2002, “Hume on Testimony Concerning Miracles,” in Millican, Peter, ed., Reading Hume on Human Understanding: Essays on the First Enquiry, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 301–334.
  • Greenleaf, Simon, 1847, An Examination of the Testimony of the Four Evangelists, by the Rules of Evidence Administered in Courts of Justice, 2nd ed. London: A. Maxwell & Son.
  • Habermas, Gary, 1996, The Historical Jesus. Joplin: College Press.
  • Hájek, Alan, 1995, “In Defense of Hume's Balancing of Probabilities in the Miracle Argument,” Southwest Philosophy Review 11, pp. 111–118.
  • Hájek, Alan, 2008, “Are Miracles Chimerical?” In Jonathan Kvanvig, ed., Oxford Studies in Philosophy of Religion 1, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 82–104.
  • Hesse, Mary, 1965, “Miracles and the Laws of Nature,” in C. F. D. Moule, ed., Miracles: Cambridge Studies in their Philosophy and History, London: A. R. Mowbray & Co., pp. 33–42.
  • Holder, Rodney, 1998, “Hume on Miracles: Bayesian Interpretation, Multiple Testimony, and the Existence of God,” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 49, pp. 49–65.
  • Houston, Joseph, 1994, Reported Miracles: A Critique of Hume, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hudson, Charles, 1857, Doubts Concerning the Battle of Bunker's Hill, Boston and Cambridge: James Munroe and Co..
  • Hume, David, 1748 et seq., An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, Ed. Tom L. Beauchamp. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Huxley, Thomas Henry, 1894, Hume: with Helps to the Study of Berkeley, London: Macmillan and Co.
  • Jenkin, Robert, 1708, The Reasonableness and Certainty of the Christian Religion, 2nd ed., vol. 2, London: Richard Sare.
  • Johnson, David, 1999, Hume, Holism, and Miracles, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Joyce, George Hayward, 1914, The Question of Miracles, St. Louis: B. Herder.
  • Kruskal, William, 1988, “Miracles and Statistics: the Casual Assumption of Independence,” Journal of the American Statistical Association 83, pp. 929–940.
  • Langtry, Bruce, 1985, “Miracles and Principles of Relative Likelihood,” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 18, pp. 123–131.
  • Langtry, Bruce, 1990, “Hume, Probability, Lotteries and Miracles,” Hume Studies 16, pp. 67–74.
  • Larmer, Robert, 1988, Water Into Wine? An Investigation of the Concept of Miracle, Montreal & Kingston: McGill-Queen's University Press.
  • Larmer, Robert, 2004, “Miracles and Overall: An Apology for Atheism?” Dialogue 43, pp. 555–568.
  • Leland, John, 1755, A View of the Principal Deistical Writers, vol. 2, London: B. Dod.
  • Leslie, Charles, 1697, A Short and Easy Method with the Deists, London: F. C. and J. Rivington, 1815.
  • Less, Gottfried, 1773, Wahrheit der christlichen Religion, Gšttingen & Bremen: Georg Ludewig Fšrster.
  • Levine, Michael, 1989, Hume and the Problem of Miracles: A Solution, Dordrecht: Kluwer Publishers.
  • Levine, Michael, 1998, “Bayesian Analyses of Hume's Argument concerning Miracles,” Philosophy and Theology 10 (1), pp. 101–106.
  • Levine, Michael, 2002, “Review of Hume's Abject Failure: The Argument Against Miracles,” Hume Studies 28.
  • Lewis, C. S., 1947, Miracles. New York: Macmillan.
  • Lias, John James, 1883, Are Miracles Credible? London: Hodder and Stoughton.
  • Locke, John, 1706, A Discourse of Miracles, In Ian T. Ramsey, ed., The Reasonableness of Christianity, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1958, pp. 78–87.
  • Mackie, J. L., 1982, The Miracle of Theism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • McGrew, Timothy, 2005, “Review of Robert Fogelin, A Defense of Hume on Miracles,” Mind 114, pp.145–149.
  • McGrew, Timothy & Lydia, 2009, “The Argument from Miracles,” in William Lane Craig and J. P. Moreland, eds., The Blackwell Companion to Natural Theology, New York: Blackwell, pp. 593–662.
  • Millican, Peter, 2002, Reading Hume on Human Understanding, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Montgomery, John Warwick, 1978, “Science, Theology, and the Miraculous,” Journal of the American Scientific Association 30: 145–153.
  • Morgan, Thomas, 1739, The Moral Philosopher, vol. 2, London: Printed for the author.
  • Mozely, James Bowling, 1865, Eight Lectures on Miracles. London: Rivingtons.
  • O'Collins, Gerald, and David Kendall, 1996, “Reissuing Venturini,” in O'Collins and Kendall, eds., Focus on Jesus: Essays in Soteriology and Christology, Herefordshire: Fowler Wright Books, pp. 153–75.
  • Oppy, Graham, 2006, Arguing about Gods, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Overall, Christine, 1985, “Miracles as Evidence Against the Existence of God,” The Southern Journal of Philosophy 23: 47–53.
  • Overall, Christine, 1997, “Miracles and God: A Reply to Robert H. Larmer,” Dialogue 36: 741–752.
  • Overall, Christine, 2003, “Miracles and Larmer,” Dialogue 42: 123–135.
  • Owen, David, 1987, “Hume versus Price on Miracles and Prior Probabilities: Testimony and the Bayesian Calculation,” Philosophical Quarterly 37: 187–202.
  • Paley, William, 1794, A View of the Evidences of Christianity, London: John W. Parker and Son, 1859.
  • Peirce, Charles S., 1958, Values in a Universe of Chance: Selected Writings of Charles S. Peirce, Ed. Philip P. Wiener. New York: Doubleday Anchor.
  • Powell, Baden, 1859, The Order of Nature: Considered in Reference to the Claims of Revelation, London: Longman, Brown, Green, Longmans, & Roberts.
  • Price, Richard, 1777, Four Dissertations, 4th ed. London: T. Cadell.
  • Russell, Paul, 2008, “Hume on Religion,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2008 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <http://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2008/entries/hume-religion/>.
  • Schlesinger, George, 1987, “Miracles and Probabilities,” Nous 21: 219–232.
  • Schlesinger, George, 1991, “The Credibility of Extraordinary Events,” Analysis 51: 120–126.
  • Sherlock, Thomas, 1729, The Trial of the Witnesses of the Resurrection of Jesus, Philadelphia: Presbyterian Board of Publication, n.d. [1843].
  • Sobel, Jordan Howard, 1987, “On the Evidence of Testimony for Miracles: A Bayesian Interpretation of Hume's Analysis,” Philosophical Quarterly 37: 166–186.
  • Sobel, Jordan Howard, 1991, “Hume's Theorem on Testimony Sufficient to Establish a Miracle,” Philosophical Quarterly 41: 229–237.
  • Sobel, Jordan Howard, 2004, Logic and Theism: Arguments for and Against Beliefs in God, Cambridge University Press: Cambridge.
  • Sober, Elliott, 2004, “A Modest Proposal,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 68: 487–494.
  • Spinoza, Baruch, 1670, Tractatus Theologico-Politicus. London: Trübner and Co., 1862.
  • Starkie, Thomas, 1876, A Practical Treatise on the Law of Evidence, 10th ed., Philadelphia: T. & J. W. Johnson & Co.
  • Stephen, Leslie, 1876, History of English Thought in the Eighteenth Century, vol. 1, London: Smith, Elder, & Co.
  • Stewart, M.A., 1995, “Hume's Historical View of Miracles,” in Hume and Hume's Connexions, M.A. Stewart (ed.), University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Strauss, David Friedrich, 1879, A New Life of Jesus, 2nd edition, Volume 1, London: Williams and Norgate.
  • Swinburne, Richard, 1970, The Concept of a Miracle, London: Macmillin and Co.
  • Swinburne, Richard, 1977, The Coherence of Theism, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Swinburne, Richard, 1979, The Existence of God, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Swinburne, Richard, ed., 1989, Miracles, New York: Macmillan.
  • Swinburne, Richard, 1993, Revelation: From Metaphor to Analogy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Swinburne, Richard, 2003, The Resurrection of God Incarnate, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Taylor, James E., 2007, “Hume on Miracles: Interpretation and Criticism,” Philosophy Compass, 2(4): 611–624, available online.
  • Toland, John, 1702, Christianity Not Mysterious, London: n.p.
  • Trench, Richard Chenevix, 1847, Notes on the Miracles of Our Lord, 2nd ed., London: John W. Parker.
  • Troeltsch, Ernst, 1913, “Über historische und dogmatische Methode in der Theologie,” in Gesammelte Schriften 2, Tübingen: J. C. B. Mohr, pp. 729–753.
  • Tucker, Aviezer, 2005, “Miracles, Historical Testimonies, and Probabilities,” History and Theory 44: 373–390.
  • Twelftree, Graham H., ed., 2009, The Cambridge Companion to Miracles, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Tweyman, Stanley, ed., 1996, Hume on Miracles, Bristol, Thoemmes Press.
  • Venn, John, 1888, The Logic of Chance, 3rd ed., London: Macmillan and Co.
  • Venturini, Karl, 1800, Natürliche Geschichte des grossen Propheten von Nazareth, Copenhagen.
  • Voltaire, 1764, Philosophical Dictionary, in The Works of Voltaire, vol. 11, New York: E. R. DuMont, 1901.
  • Wardlaw, Ralph, 1852, On Miracles, Edinburgh: A. Fullarton and Co.
  • Warfield, Benjamin, 1918, Counterfeit Miracles, New York: Charles Scribner's Sons.
  • Whately, Richard, 1819, Historic Doubts Relative to Napoleon Bonaparte, Andover: Warren F. Draper, 1874.
  • Whately, Richard, 1826, Elements of Logic, London: Longmans, Green, Reader and Dyer, 1870.
  • Zabell, Sandy, 1988, “The Probabilistic Analysis of Testimony,” Journal of Statistical Planning and Inference 20: 327–354.

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
inpho icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
phil papers icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

abduction | analogy and analogical reasoning | Bayes' Theorem | Butler, Joseph: moral philosophy | Hume, David | Hume, David: on religion | laws of nature | Mackie, John Leslie | Scottish Philosophy: in the 18th Century | Voltaire

Copyright © 2011 by
Timothy McGrew <timothy.mcgrew@wmich.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free