Analogy and Analogical Reasoning

First published Tue Jun 25, 2013

An analogy is a comparison between two objects, or systems of objects, that highlights respects in which they are thought to be similar. Analogical reasoning is any type of thinking that relies upon an analogy. An analogical argument is an explicit representation of a form of analogical reasoning that cites accepted similarities between two systems to support the conclusion that some further similarity exists. In general (but not always), such arguments belong in the category of inductive reasoning, since their conclusions do not follow with certainty but are only supported with varying degrees of strength. Here, ‘inductive reasoning’ is used in a broad sense that includes all inferential processes that “expand knowledge in the face of uncertainty” (Holland et al. 1986: 1), including abductive inference.

Analogical reasoning is fundamental to human thought and, arguably, to some nonhuman animals as well. Historically, analogical reasoning has played an important, but sometimes mysterious, role in a wide range of problem-solving contexts. The explicit use of analogical arguments, since antiquity, has been a distinctive feature of scientific, philosophical and legal reasoning. This article focuses primarily on the nature, evaluation and justification of analogical arguments. Related topics include metaphor, models in science, and precedent and analogy in legal reasoning.

1. Introduction: the many roles of analogy

Analogies are widely recognized as playing an important heuristic role, as aids to discovery. They have been employed, in a wide variety of settings and with considerable success, to generate insight and to formulate possible solutions to problems. According to Joseph Priestley, a pioneer in chemistry and electricity,

analogy is our best guide in all philosophical investigations; and all discoveries, which were not made by mere accident, have been made by the help of it. (1769/1966: 14)

Priestley may be over-stating the case, but there is no doubt that analogies have suggested fruitful lines of inquiry in many fields. Because of their heuristic value, analogies and analogical reasoning have been a focus of AI research.

Analogies have a related (and not entirely separable) justificatory role. This role is most obvious where an analogical argument is explicitly offered in support of some conclusion. The intended degree of support for the conclusion can vary considerably. At one extreme, these arguments can be demonstrative. For example (Example 1), hydrodynamic analogies exploit mathematical similarities between the equations governing ideal fluid flow and torsional problems. To predict stresses in a planned structure, one can construct a fluid model, i.e., a system of pipes through which water passes (Timoshenko and Goodier 1970). Here we have a special type of analogy, nomic isomorphism (Hempel 1965): the physical laws governing the two systems have identical mathematical form. Within the limits of idealization, the analogy allows us to make demonstrative inferences from a measured quantity in the fluid model to the analogous value in the torsional problem. In practice, there are numerous complications (Sterrett 2006).

At the other extreme, an analogical argument may provide very weak support for its conclusion, establishing no more than minimal plausibility. Consider (Example 2) Thomas Reid's (1785) argument for the existence of life on other planets (Stebbing 1933; Mill 1843/1930; Robinson 1930; Copi 1961). Reid notes a number of similarities between Earth and the other planets in our solar system: all orbit and are illuminated by the sun; several have moons; all revolve on an axis. In consequence, he concludes, it is “not unreasonable to think, that those planets may, like our earth, be the habitation of various orders of living creatures” (1785: 24).

Such modesty is not uncommon. Often the point of an analogical argument is just to persuade people to take an idea seriously. For instance (Example 3), Darwin takes himself to be using an analogy between artificial and natural selection to argue for the plausibility of the latter:

Why may I not invent the hypothesis of Natural Selection (which from the analogy of domestic productions, and from what we know of the struggle of existence and of the variability of organic beings, is, in some very slight degree, in itself probable) and try whether this hypothesis of Natural Selection does not explain (as I think it does) a large number of facts…. (Letter to Henslow, May 1860 in Darwin 1903)

Here it appears, by Darwin's own admission, that his analogy is employed to show that the hypothesis is probable to some “slight degree” and thus merits further investigation.

Sometimes analogical reasoning is the only available form of justification for a hypothesis. The method of ethnographic analogy is used to interpret

the nonobservable behaviour of the ancient inhabitants of an archaeological site (or ancient culture) based on the similarity of their artifacts to those used by living peoples. (Hunter and Whitten 1976: 147)

For example (Example 4), Shelley (1999, 2003) describes how ethnographic analogy was used to determine the probable significance of odd markings on the necks of Moche clay pots found in the Peruvian Andes. Contemporary potters in Peru use these marks (called sígnales) to indicate ownership; the marks enable them to reclaim their work when several potters share a kiln or storage facility. Analogical reasoning may be the only avenue of inference to the past in such cases, though this point is subject to dispute (Gould and Watson 1982; Wylie 1982, 1985).

As philosophers and historians such as Kuhn (1996) have repeatedly pointed out, there is not always a clear separation between the two roles that we have identified, discovery and justification. Indeed, the two functions are blended in what we might call the programmatic (or paradigmatic) role of analogy: over a period of time, an analogy can shape the development of a program of research. For example (Example 5), an ‘acoustical analogy’ was employed for many years by certain nineteenth-century physicists investigating spectral lines. Discrete spectra were thought to be

completely analogous to the acoustical situation, with atoms (and/or molecules) serving as oscillators originating or absorbing the vibrations in the manner of resonant tuning forks. (Maier 1981: 51)

Guided by this analogy, physicists looked for groups of spectral lines that exhibited frequency patterns characteristic of a harmonic oscillator. This analogy served not only to underwrite the plausibility of conjectures, but also to guide and limit discovery by pointing scientists in certain directions.

In some cases, a programmatic analogy culminates in the theoretical unification of two different areas of inquiry. Descartes's (1637/1954) correlation between geometry and algebra, for example (Example 6), provided methods for systematically handling geometrical problems that had long been recognized as analogous. A very different relationship between analogy and discovery exists when a programmatic analogy breaks down, as was the ultimate fate of the acoustical analogy. That atomic spectra have an entirely different explanation became clear with the advent of quantum theory. In this case, novel discoveries emerged against background expectations shaped by the guiding analogy. There is a third possibility: an unproductive or misleading programmatic analogy may simply become entrenched and self-perpetuating as it leads us to “construct… data that conform to it” (Stepan 1996: 133). Arguably, the danger of this third possibility provides strong motivation for developing a critical account of analogical reasoning and analogical arguments.

Analogical reasoning goes well beyond the three roles already identified (heuristic, justificatory and programmatic). For example, analogies are often pedagogically useful. In general, analogical cognition, which embraces all cognitive processes involved in discovering, constructing and using analogies, is much broader than analogical reasoning (Hofstadter 2001). Understanding these processes is an important objective of current cognitive science research, and an objective that generates many excellent questions. How do humans identify analogies? Do nonhuman animals use analogies and analogical reasoning in ways similar to humans? How do analogies and metaphors influence concept formation?

This entry, however, concentrates specifically on analogical arguments. Specifically, it focuses on three central epistemological questions:

  1. What criteria should we use to evaluate analogical arguments?
  2. What philosophical justification can be provided for analogical inferences?
  3. How do analogical arguments fit into a broader inferential context (i.e., how do we combine them with other forms of inference)?

Following a preliminary discussion of the basic structure of analogical arguments, the entry reviews selected attempts to provide answers to these three questions. To find such answers would constitute an important first step towards understanding the nature of analogical reasoning. To isolate these questions, however, is to make the non-trivial assumption that there can be a theory of analogical arguments—an assumption which, as we shall see, is attacked in different ways by both philosophers and cognitive scientists.

2. Analogical arguments

2.1 Examples

Analogical arguments vary greatly in subject matter, strength and logical structure. In order to appreciate this variety, it is helpful to increase our stock of examples. First, a geometric example:

Example 7 (Rectangles and boxes). Suppose that you have established that of all rectangles with a fixed perimeter, the square has maximum area. By analogy, you conjecture that of all boxes with a fixed surface area, the cube has maximum volume.

Two examples from the history of science:

Example 8 (Morphine and meperidine). In 1934, the pharmacologist Schaumann was testing synthetic compounds for their anti-spasmodic effect. These drugs had a chemical structure similar to morphine. He observed that one of the compounds—meperidine, also known as Demerol—had a physical effect on mice that was previously observed only with morphine: it induced an S-shaped tail curvature. By analogy, he conjectured that the drug might also share morphine's narcotic effects. Testing on rats, rabbits, dogs and eventually humans showed that meperidine, like morphine, was an effective pain-killer (Lembeck 1989: 11; Reynolds and Randall 1975: 273).

Example 9 (Priestley on electrostatic force). In 1769, Priestley suggested that the absence of electrical influence inside a hollow charged spherical shell was evidence that charges attract and repel with an inverse square force. He supported his hypothesis by appealing to the analogous situation of zero gravitational force inside a hollow shell of uniform density.

Finally, an example from legal reasoning:

Example 10 (Duty of reasonable care). In a much-cited case (Donoghue v. Stevenson 1932 AC 562), the United Kingdom House of Lords found the manufacturer of a bottle of ginger beer liable for damages to a consumer who became ill as a result of a dead snail in the bottle. The court argued that the manufacturer had a duty to take “reasonable care” in creating a product that could foreseeably result in harm to the consumer in the absence of such care, and where the consumer had no possibility of intermediate examination. The principle articulated in this famous case was extended, by analogy, to allow recovery for harm against an engineering firm whose negligent repair work caused the collapse of a lift (Haseldine v. CA Daw & Son Ltd. 1941 2 KB 343). By contrast, the principle was not applicable to a case where a workman was injured by a defective crane, since the workman had opportunity to examine the crane and was even aware of the defects (Farr v. Butters Brothers & Co. 1932 2 KB 606).

2.2 Characterization

What, if anything, do all of these examples have in common? We begin with a simple, quasi-formal characterization (versions may be found in most elementary critical thinking texts, e.g., Copi and Cohen 2005). An analogical argument has the following form:

  1. S is similar to T in certain (known) respects.
  2. S has some further feature Q.
  3. Therefore, T also has the feature Q, or some feature Q* similar to Q.

(1) and (2) are premises. (3) is the conclusion of the argument. The argument form is inductive; the conclusion is not guaranteed to follow from the premises.

S and T are referred to as the source domain and target domain, respectively. A domain is a set of objects, properties, relations and functions, together with a set of accepted statements about those objects, properties, relations and functions. More formally, a domain consists of a set of objects and an interpreted set of statements about them. The statements need not belong to a first-order language, but to keep things simple, any formalizations employed here will be first-order. We use unstarred symbols (a, P, R, f) to refer to items in the source domain and starred symbols (a*, P*, R*, f*) to refer to corresponding items in the target domain. In Example 9, the source domain items pertain to gravitation; the target items pertain to electrostatic attraction.

Formally, an analogy between S and T is a one-to-one mapping between objects, properties, relations and functions in S and those in T. Not all of the items in S and T need to be placed in correspondence. Commonly, the analogy only identifies correspondences between a select set of items. In practice, we specify an analogy simply by indicating the most significant similarities (and sometimes differences).

We can improve on this preliminary characterization of the argument from analogy by introducing the tabular representation found in Hesse (1966). We place corresponding objects, properties, relations and propositions side-by-side in a table of two columns, one for each domain. For instance, Reid's argument (Example 2) can be represented as follows (using ⇒ for the analogical inference):

Earth (S)Mars (T)
verticalKnown similarities:
orbits the sun ← horizontal → orbits the sun
has a moonhas moons
revolves on axisrevolves on axis
subject to gravitysubject to gravity
Inferred similarity:
supports lifemay support life

Hesse introduced useful terminology based on this tabular representation. The horizontal relations in an analogy are the relations of similarity (and difference) in the mapping between domains, while the vertical relations are those between the objects, relations and properties within each domain. The correspondence (similarity) between earth's having a moon and Mars' having moons is a horizontal relation; the causal relation between having a moon and supporting life is a vertical relation within the source domain (with the possibility of a distinct such relation existing in the target as well).

In an earlier discussion of analogy, Keynes (1921) introduced some terminology that is also helpful.

Positive analogy.
Let P stand for a list of accepted propositions P1, …, Pn about the source domain S. Suppose that the corresponding propositions P*1, …, P*n, abbreviated as P*, are all accepted as holding for the target domain T, so that P and P* represent accepted (or known) similarities. Then we refer to P as the positive analogy.
Negative analogy.
Let A stand for a list of propositions A1, …, Ar accepted as holding in S, and B* for a list B1*, …, Bs* of propositions holding in T. Suppose that the analogous propositions A* = A1*, …, Ar* fail to hold in T, and similarly the propositions B = B1, …, Bs fail to hold in S, so that A, ~A* and ~B, B* represent accepted (or known) differences. Then we refer to A and B as the negative analogy.
Neutral analogy.
The neutral analogy consists of accepted propositions about S for which it is not known whether an analogue holds in T.

Finally we have:

Hypothetical analogy.
The hypothetical analogy is simply the proposition Q in the neutral analogy that is the focus of our attention.

These concepts allow us to provide a characterization for an individual analogical argument that is somewhat richer than the original one.

(4)
Augmented tabular representation
SOURCE (S) TARGET (T)
PP* [positive analogy]
A ~A* [negative analogy]
~BB*
Q
Q* (plausibly)

An analogical argument may thus be summarized:

It is plausible that Q* holds in the target because of certain known (or accepted) similarities with the source domain, despite certain known (or accepted) differences.

In order for this characterization to be meaningful, we need to say something about the meaning of ‘plausibly.’ To ensure broad applicability over analogical arguments that vary greatly in strength, we interpret plausibility rather liberally as meaning ‘with some degree of support’. In general, judgments of plausibility are made after a claim has been formulated, but prior to rigorous testing or proof. The next sub-section provides further discussion.

Note that this characterization is incomplete in a number of ways. The manner in which we list similarities and differences, the nature of the correspondences between domains: these things are left unspecified. Nor does this characterization accommodate reasoning with multiple analogies (i.e., multiple source domains), which is ubiquitous in legal reasoning and common elsewhere. To characterize the argument form more fully, however, is not possible without either taking a step towards a substantive theory of analogical reasoning or restricting attention to certain classes of analogical arguments.

2.3 Plausibility

To say that a hypothesis is plausible is to convey that it has epistemic support: we have some reason to believe it, even prior to testing. An assertion of plausibility within the context of an inquiry typically has pragmatic connotations as well: to say that a hypothesis is plausible suggests that we have some reason to investigate it further. For example, a mathematician working on a proof regards a conjecture as plausible if it “has some chances of success” (Polya 1954 (v. 2): 148). On both points, there is ambiguity as to whether an assertion of plausibility is categorical or a matter of degree. These observations point to the existence of two distinct conceptions of plausibility, probabilistic and modal, either of which may reflect the intended conclusion of an analogical argument.

On the probabilistic conception, plausibility is naturally identified with rational credence (rational subjective degree of belief) and is typically represented as a probability. A classic expression may be found in Mill's analysis of the argument from analogy in A System of Logic:

There can be no doubt that every resemblance [not known to be irrelevant] affords some degree of probability, beyond what would otherwise exist, in favour of the conclusion. (Mill 1843/1930: 333)

In the terminology introduced in §2.2, Mill's idea is that each element of the positive analogy boosts the probability of the conclusion. Contemporary ‘structure-mapping’ theories (§3.4) employ a restricted version: each structural similarity between two domains contributes to the overall measure of similarity, and hence to the strength of the analogical argument.

On the alternative modal conception, ‘it is plausible that p’ is not a matter of degree. The meaning, roughly speaking, is that there are sufficient initial grounds for taking p seriously, i.e., for further investigation (subject to feasibility and interest). Informally: p passes an initial screening procedure. There is no assertion of degree. Instead, ‘It is plausible that’ may be regarded as a modal epistemic operator that aims to capture a notion, prima facie plausibility, that is somewhat stronger than ordinary epistemic possibility. The intent is to single out p from an undifferentiated mass of ideas that remain bare epistemic possibilities. To illustrate: in 1769, Priestley's argument (Example 9), if successful, would establish the prima facie plausibility of an inverse square law for electrostatic attraction. The set of epistemic possibilities—hypotheses about electrostatic attraction compatible with knowledge of the day—was much larger. Individual analogical arguments in mathematics (such as Example 7) are almost invariably directed towards prima facie plausibility.

The modal conception figures importantly in some discussions of analogical reasoning. The physicist N. R. Campbell (1957) writes:

But in order that a theory may be valuable it must … display an analogy. The propositions of the hypothesis must be analogous to some known laws…. (1957: 129)

Commenting on the role of analogy in Fourier's theory of heat conduction, Campbell writes:

Some analogy is essential to it; for it is only this analogy which distinguishes the theory from the multitude of others… which might also be proposed to explain the same laws. (1957: 142)

The interesting notion here is that of a “valuable” theory. We may not agree with Campbell that the existence of analogy is “essential” for a novel theory to be “valuable.” But consider the weaker thesis that an acceptable analogy is sufficient to establish that a theory is “valuable”, or (to qualify still further) that an acceptable analogy provides defeasible grounds for taking the theory seriously. (Possible defeaters might include internal inconsistency, inconsistency with accepted theory, or the existence of a (clearly superior) rival analogical argument.) The point is that Campbell, following the lead of 19th century philosopher-scientists such as Herschel and Whewell, thinks that analogies can establish this sort of prima facie plausibility. Snyder (2006) provides a detailed discussion of the latter two thinkers and their earlier ideas about the role of analogies in science.

In general, analogical arguments may be directed at establishing either sort of plausibility for their conclusions; they can have a probabilistic use or a modal use. Examples 7 through 9 are best interpreted as supporting modal conclusions. In those arguments, an analogy is used to show that a conjecture is worth taking seriously. To insist on putting the conclusion in probabilistic terms distracts attention from the point of the argument. The conclusion might be modeled (by a Bayesian) as having a certain probability value because it is deemed prima facie plausible, but not vice versa. Example 2, perhaps, might be regarded as directed primarily towards a probabilistic conclusion.

There should be connections between the two conceptions. Indeed, we might think that the same analogical argument can establish both prima facie plausibility and a degree of probability for a hypothesis. But it is difficult to translate between modal epistemic concepts and probabilities (Cohen 1980; Douven and Williamson 2006; Huber 2009; Spohn 2009, 2012). We cannot simply take the probabilistic notion as the primitive one. It seems wise to keep the two conceptions of plausibility separate. Further discussion of this point is found in section 5.

2.4 Analogical inference rules?

Schema (4) is a template that represents all analogical arguments, good and bad. It is not an inference rule. Despite the confidence with which particular analogical arguments are advanced, nobody has ever formulated an acceptable rule, or set of rules, for valid analogical inferences. There is not even a plausible candidate. This situation is in marked contrast not only with deductive reasoning, but also with elementary forms of inductive reasoning, such as induction by enumeration. (Carnap and his followers (Carnap 1980, Niiniluoto 1988 and elsewhere) have formulated principles of “analogy by similarity” in inductive logic, but their project does not concern analogical reasoning as characterized here and will not be discussed further.)

Of course, it is difficult to show that no successful analogical inference rule will ever be proposed. But consider the following candidate, formulated using the concepts of schema (4) and taking us only a short step beyond that basic characterization.

(5)
Suppose S and T are the source and target domains. Suppose P1, …, Pn (with n ≥ 1) represents the positive analogy, A1, …, Ar and ~B1, …, ~Bs represent the (possibly vacuous) negative analogy, and Q represents the hypothetical analogy. In the absence of reasons for thinking otherwise, infer that Q* holds in the target domain with degree of support p > 0, where p is an increasing function of n and a decreasing function of r and s.

Rule (5) is modeled on the straight rule for enumerative induction and inspired by Mill's view of analogical inference, as described in §2.3. We use the generic phrase ‘degree of support’ in place of probability, since other factors besides the analogical argument may influence our probability assignment for Q*.

It is pretty clear that (5) is a non-starter. The main problem is that the rule justifies too much. The only substantive requirement introduced by (5) is that there be a nonempty positive analogy. Plainly, there are analogical arguments that satisfy this condition but establish no prima facie plausibility and no measure of support for their conclusions.

Here is a simple illustration. Achinstein (1964: 328) observes that there is a formal analogy between swans and line segments if we take the relation ‘has the same color as’ to correspond to ‘is congruent with’. Both relations are reflexive, symmetric, and transitive. Yet it would be absurd to find positive support from this analogy for the idea that we are likely to find congruent lines clustered in groups of two or more, just because swans of the same color are commonly found in groups. The positive analogy is antecedently known to be irrelevant to the hypothetical analogy. In such a case, the analogical inference should be utterly rejected. Yet rule (5) would wrongly assign non-zero degree of support.

To generalize the difficulty: not every similarity increases the probability of the conclusion and not every difference decreases it. Some similarities and differences are known to be (or accepted as being) utterly irrelevant and should have no influence whatsoever on our probability judgments. To be viable, rule (5) would need to be supplemented with considerations of relevance, which depend upon the subject matter, historical context and logical details particular to each analogical argument. To search for a simple rule of analogical inference thus appears futile.

Norton (2010, and 2012—see Other Internet Resources) has argued that the project of formalizing inductive reasoning in terms of one or more simple formal schemata is doomed. His criticisms seem especially apt when applied to analogical reasoning. He writes:

If analogical reasoning is required to conform only to a simple formal schema, the restriction is too permissive. Inferences are authorized that clearly should not pass muster… The natural response has been to develop more elaborate formal templates… The familiar difficulty is that these embellished schema never seem to be quite embellished enough; there always seems to be some part of the analysis that must be handled intuitively without guidance from strict formal rules. (2012: 1)

Norton takes the point one step further, in keeping with his “material theory” of inductive inference. He argues (in 2012) that there is no universal logical principle that “powers” analogical inference “by asserting that things that share some properties must share others.” Rather, each analogical inference is warranted by some local constellation of facts about the target system that he terms “the fact of analogy”. These local facts are to be determined and investigated on a case by case basis. Notice: the point about warrant must apply to the initial plausibility of the analogical argument as well as to the worked-out theory for the target. (One difficulty with this position will be explored in §4.1.)

To embrace a purely formal approach to analogy and to abjure formalization entirely are two extremes in a spectrum of strategies. There are intermediate positions. Most recent analyses (both philosophical and computational) have been directed towards elucidating general criteria and procedures, rather than formal rules, for reasoning by analogy. So long as these are not intended to provide a universal ‘logic’ of analogy, there is room for such criteria even if one accepts Norton's basic point. The next section discusses some of these criteria and procedures.

3. Criteria for evaluating analogical arguments

3.1 Commonsense guidelines

Logicians and philosophers of science have identified ‘textbook-style’ general guidelines for evaluating analogical arguments (Mill 1843/1930; Keynes 1921; Robinson 1930; Stebbing 1933; Copi and Cohen 2005; Moore and Parker 1998; Woods, Irvine, and Walton 2004). Here are some of the most important ones:

(G1)
The more similarities (between two domains), the stronger the analogy.
(G2)
The more differences, the weaker the analogy.
(G3)
The greater the extent of our ignorance about the two domains, the weaker the analogy.
(G4)
The weaker the conclusion, the more plausible the analogy.
(G5)
Analogies involving causal relations are more plausible than those not involving causal relations.
(G6)
Structural analogies are stronger than those based on superficial similarities.
(G7)
The relevance of the similarities and differences to the conclusion (i.e., to the hypothetical analogy) must be taken into account.
(G8)
Multiple analogies supporting the same conclusion make the argument stronger.

These principles can be helpful, but are frequently too vague to provide much insight. How do we count similarities and differences in applying (G1) and (G2)? Why are the structural and causal analogies mentioned in (G5) and (G6) especially important, and which structural and causal features merit attention? More generally, in connection with the all-important (G7): how do we determine which similarities and differences are relevant to the conclusion? Furthermore, what are we to say about similarities and differences that have been omitted from an analogical argument but might still be relevant?

An additional problem is that the criteria can pull in different directions. To illustrate, consider Reid's argument for life on other planets (Example 2). Stebbing (1933) finds Reid's argument “suggestive” and “not unplausible” because the conclusion is weak (G4), while Mill (1843/1930) appears to reject the argument on account of our vast ignorance of properties that might be relevant (G3).

There is a further problem that relates to the distinction just made (in §2.3) between two kinds of plausibility. Each of the above criteria apart from (G7) is expressed in terms of the strength of the argument, i.e., the degree of support for the conclusion. The criteria thus appear to presuppose the probabilistic interpretation of plausibility. The problem is that a great many analogical arguments aim to establish prima facie plausibility rather than any degree of probability. Most of the guidelines are not directly applicable to such arguments.

3.2 Aristotle's theory

Aristotle sets the stage for all later theories of analogical reasoning. In his theoretical reflections on analogy and in his most judicious examples, we find a sober account that lays the foundation both for the commonsense guidelines noted above and for more sophisticated analyses.

Although Aristotle employs the term analogy (analogia) and talks about analogical predication, he never talks about analogical reasoning or analogical arguments per se. He does, however, identify two argument forms, the argument from example (paradeigma) and the argument from likeness (homoiotes), both closely related to what would we now recognize as an analogical argument.

The argument from example (paradeigma) is described in the Rhetoric and the Prior Analytics:

Enthymemes based upon example are those which proceed from one or more similar cases, arrive at a general proposition, and then argue deductively to a particular inference. (Rhetoric 1402b15)

Let A be evil, B making war against neighbours, C Athenians against Thebans, D Thebans against Phocians. If then we wish to prove that to fight with the Thebans is an evil, we must assume that to fight against neighbours is an evil. Conviction of this is obtained from similar cases, e.g., that the war against the Phocians was an evil to the Thebans. Since then to fight against neighbours is an evil, and to fight against the Thebans is to fight against neighbours, it is clear that to fight against the Thebans is an evil. (Pr. An. 69a1)

Aristotle notes two differences between this argument form and induction (69a15ff.): it “does not draw its proof from all the particular cases” (i.e., it is not a “complete” induction), and it requires an additional (deductively valid) syllogism as the final step. The argument from example thus amounts to single-case induction followed by deductive inference. It has the following structure (using ⊃ for the conditional):

[a tree diagram where S is source domain and T is target domain. First node is P(S)&Q(S) in the lower left corner.  It is connected by a dashed arrow to (x)(P(x) superset Q(x)) in the top middle which in turn connects by a solid arrow to P(T) and on the next line P(T) superset Q(T) in the lower right.  It in turn  is connected by a solid arrow to Q(T) below it.]

In the terminology of §2.2, P is the positive analogy and Q is the hypothetical analogy. In Aristotle's example, S (the source) is war between Phocians and Thebans, T (the target) is war between Athenians and Thebans, P is war between neighbours, and Q is evil. The first inference (dashed arrow) is inductive; the second and third (solid arrows) are deductively valid.

The paradeigma has an interesting feature: it is amenable to an alternative analysis as a purely deductive argument form. Let us concentrate on Aristotle's assertion, “we must assume that to fight against neighbours is an evil,” represented as ∀x(P(x) ⊃ Q(x)). Instead of regarding this intermediate step as something reached by induction from a single case, we might instead regard it as a hidden presupposition. This transforms the paradeigma into a syllogistic argument with a missing or enthymematic premise, and our attention shifts to possible means for establishing that premise (with single-case induction as one such means). Construed in this way, Aristotle's paradeigma argument foreshadows deductive analyses of analogical reasoning (see §4.1).

The argument from likeness (homoiotes) seems to be closer than the paradeigma to our contemporary understanding of analogical arguments. This argument form receives considerable attention in Topics I, 17 and 18 and again in VIII, 1. The most important passage is the following.

Try to secure admissions by means of likeness; for such admissions are plausible, and the universal involved is less patent; e.g. that as knowledge and ignorance of contraries is the same, so too perception of contraries is the same; or vice versa, that since the perception is the same, so is the knowledge also. This argument resembles induction, but is not the same thing; for in induction it is the universal whose admission is secured from the particulars, whereas in arguments from likeness, what is secured is not the universal under which all the like cases fall. (Topics 156b10–17)

This passage occurs in a work that offers advice for framing dialectical arguments when confronting a somewhat skeptical interlocutor. In such situations, it is best not to make one's argument depend upon securing agreement about any universal proposition. The argument from likeness is thus clearly distinct from the paradeigma, where the universal proposition plays an essential role as an intermediate step in the argument. The argument from likeness, though logically less straightforward than the paradeigma, is exactly the sort of analogical reasoning we want when we are unsure about underlying generalizations.

In Topics I 17, Aristotle states that any shared attribute contributes some degree of likeness:

We should also look at things which belong to the same genus, to see if any identical attribute belongs to them all, e.g. to a man and a horse and a dog; for in so far as they have any identical attribute, in so far they are alike. (Topics 108a13)

It is natural to ask when the degree of likeness between two things is sufficiently great to warrant inferring a further likeness. In other words, when does the argument from likeness succeed? Aristotle does not answer explicitly, but a clue is provided by the way he justifies particular arguments from likeness. As Lloyd (1966) has observed, Aristotle typically justifies such arguments by articulating a causal principle which governs the two phenomena being compared. For example, Aristotle explains the saltiness of the sea, by analogy with the saltiness of sweat, as a kind of residual earthy stuff exuded in natural processes such as heating. The common principle is this:

everything that grows and is naturally generated always leaves a residue, like that of things burnt, consisting in this sort of earth. (Mete 358a17)

From this method of justification, we might conjecture that Aristotle believes that the important similarities are those that enter into such general causal principles.

Summarizing, Aristotle's theory provides us with four important and influential criteria for the evaluation of analogical arguments:

  • The strength of an analogy depends upon the number of similarities.
  • Similarity reduces to identical properties and relations.
  • Good analogies derive from underlying common causes or general laws.
  • A good analogical argument need not pre-suppose acquaintance with the underlying universal (generalization).

These four principles form the core of a common-sense model for evaluating analogical arguments (which is not to say that they are correct; indeed, the first three will shortly be called into question). The first, as we have seen, appears regularly in textbook discussions of analogy. The second is largely taken for granted, with important exceptions in computational models of analogy (§3.4). Versions of the third are found in most sophisticated theories. The final point, which distinguishes the argument from likeness and the argument from example, is endorsed in many discussions of analogy (e.g., Quine and Ullian 1970).

A slight generalization of Aristotle's first principle helps to prepare the way for discussion of later developments. As that principle suggests, Aristotle, in common with just about everyone else who has written about analogical reasoning, organizes his analysis of the argument form around overall similarity. In the terminology of section 2.2, horizontal relationships drive the reasoning: the greater the overall similarity the two domains, the stronger the analogical argument. Hume makes the same point, though stated negatively, in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion:

Wherever you depart, in the least, from the similarity of the cases, you diminish proportionably the evidence; and may at last bring it to a very weak analogy, which is confessedly liable to error and uncertainty. (1779/1947: 144)

Most theories of analogy agree with Aristotle and Hume on this general point. Disagreement relates to the appropriate way of measuring overall similarity. Some theories assign greatest weight to material analogy, which refers to shared, and typically observable, features. Others give prominence to formal analogy, emphasizing high-level structural correspondence. The next two sub-sections discuss representative accounts that illustrate these two approaches.

3.3 Material criteria: Hesse's theory

Hesse (1966) offers a sharpened version of Aristotle's theory, specifically focused on analogical arguments in the sciences. She formulates three requirements that an analogical argument must satisfy in order to be acceptable:

  1. Requirement of material analogy. The horizontal relations must include similarities between observable properties.
  2. Causal condition. The vertical relations must be causal relations “in some acceptable scientific sense” (1966: 87).
  3. No-essential-difference condition. The essential properties and causal relations of the source domain must not have been shown to be part of the negative analogy.

A. Requirement of material analogy

For Hesse, an acceptable analogical argument must include “observable similarities” between domains, which she refers to as material analogy. Material analogy is contrasted with formal analogy. Two domains are formally analogous if both are “interpretations of the same formal theory” (1966: 68). Nomic isomorphism (see §1) is a special case where what is involved is a physical theory: heat and fluid flow exhibit formal analogy because the relevant physical laws have a common mathematical form. A second example is the analogy between the flow of electric current in a wire and fluid in a pipe. Ohm's law

(6)
Δv = iR

states that voltage difference along a wire equals current times a constant resistance. This has the same mathematical form as Poiseuille's law (for ideal fluids):

(7)
Δp = V̇k

which states that the pressure difference along a pipe equals the volumetric flow rate times a constant. Both of these systems can be represented by a common equation.

By contrast, material analogy consists of what Hesse calls “observable” or “pre-theoretic” similarities. These are horizontal relationships of similarity between properties of objects in the source and the target. Similarities between echoes (sound) and reflection (light), for instance, were recognized long before we had any detailed theories about these phenomena. Hesse (1966, 1988) regards such similarities as metaphorical relationships between the two domains and labels them “pre-theoretic” because they draw on personal and cultural experience.

There are good reasons not to accept Hesse's requirement of material analogy, construed in this narrow way. First, it is apparent that formal analogies are the starting point in many important inferences. That is certainly the case in mathematics, a field in which material analogy, in Hesse's sense, plays no role at all. Analogical arguments based on formal analogy have also been extremely influential in physics (Steiner 1989, 1998).

In Norton's broad sense, however, ‘material analogy’ simply refers to similarities rooted in factual knowledge of the source and target domains. With reference to this broader meaning, Hesse proposes two additional material criteria.

B. Causal condition

Hesse requires that the hypothetical analogy, the feature transferred to the target domain, be causally related to the positive analogy. In her words, the essential requirement for a good argument from analogy is “a tendency to co-occurrence”, i.e., a causal relationship. She states the requirement as follows:

The vertical relations in the model [source] are causal relations in some acceptable scientific sense, where there are no compelling a priori reasons for denying that causal relations of the same kind may hold between terms of the explanandum [target]. (1966: 87)

The causal condition rules out analogical arguments where there is no causal knowledge of the source domain. It derives support from the observation that many analogies do appear to involve a transfer of causal knowledge.

The causal condition is on the right track, but is arguably too restrictive. For example, it rules out analogical arguments in mathematics. Even if we limit attention to the empirical sciences, persuasive analogical arguments may be founded upon strong statistical correlation in the absence of any known causal connection. Consider (Example 11) Benjamin Franklin's prediction, in 1749, that pointed metal rods would attract lightning, by analogy with the way they attracted the “electrical fluid” in the laboratory:

Electrical fluid agrees with lightning in these particulars: 1. Giving light. 2. Colour of the light. 3. Crooked direction. 4. Swift motion. 5. Being conducted by metals. 6. Crack or noise in exploding. 7. Subsisting in water or ice. 8. Rending bodies it passes through. 9. Destroying animals. 10. Melting metals. 11. Firing inflammable substances. 12. Sulphureous smell.—The electrical fluid is attracted by points.—We do not know whether this property is in lightning.—But since they agree in all the particulars wherein we can already compare them, is it not probable they agree likewise in this? Let the experiment be made. (Benjamin Franklin's Experiments, 334)

Franklin's hypothesis was based on a long list of properties common to the target (lightning) and source (electrical fluid in the laboratory). There was no known causal connection between the twelve “particulars” and the thirteenth property, but there was a strong correlation. Analogical arguments may be plausible even where there are no known causal relations.

C. No-essential-difference condition

Hesse's final requirement is that the “essential properties and causal relations of the [source] have not been shown to be part of the negative analogy” (1966: 91). Hesse does not provide a definition of “essential,” but suggests that a property or relation is essential if it is “causally closely related to the known positive analogy.” For instance, an analogy with fluid flow was extremely influential in developing the theory of heat conduction. Once it was discovered that heat was not conserved, however, the analogy became unacceptable (according to Hesse) because conservation was so central to the theory of fluid flow.

This requirement, though once again on the right track, seems too restrictive. It can lead to the rejection of a good analogical argument. Consider the analogy between a two-dimensional rectangle and a three-dimensional box (Example 7). Broadening Hesse's notion, it seems that there are many ‘essential’ differences between rectangles and boxes. This does not mean that we should reject every analogy between rectangles and boxes out of hand. The problem derives from the fact that Hesse's condition is applied to the analogy relation independently of the use to which that relation is put. What counts as essential should vary with the analogical argument. Absent an inferential context, it is impossible to evaluate the importance or ‘essentiality’ of similarities and differences.

Despite these weaknesses, Hesse's ‘material’ criteria constitute a significant advance in our understanding of analogical reasoning. The causal condition and the no-essential-difference condition incorporate local factors, as urged by Norton, into the assessment of analogical arguments. These conditions, singly or taken together, imply that an analogical argument can fail to generate any support for its conclusion, even when there is a non-empty positive analogy. Hesse offers no theory about the ‘degree’ of analogical support. That makes her account one of the few that is oriented towards the modal, rather than probabilistic, use of analogical arguments (§2.3).

3.4 Formal criteria: the structure-mapping theory

Many people take the concept of model-theoretic isomorphism to set the standard for thinking about similarity and its role in analogical reasoning. They propose formal criteria for evaluating analogies, based on overall structural or syntactical similarity. Let us refer to theories oriented around such criteria as structuralist.

A number of leading computational models of analogy are structuralist. They are implemented in computer programs that begin with (or sometimes build) representations of the source and target domains, and then construct possible analogy mappings. Analogical inferences emerge as a consequence of identifying the ‘best mapping.’ In terms of criteria for analogical reasoning, there are two main ideas. First, the goodness of an analogical argument is based on the goodness of the associated analogy mapping. Second, the goodness of the analogy mapping is given by a metric that indicates how closely it approximates isomorphism.

The most influential structuralist theory has been Gentner's structure-mapping theory, implemented in a program called the structure-mapping engine (SME). In its original form (Gentner 1983), the theory assesses analogies on purely structural grounds. Gentner asserts:

Analogies are about relations, rather than simple features. No matter what kind of knowledge (causal models, plans, stories, etc.), it is the structural properties (i.e., the interrelationships between the facts) that determine the content of an analogy. (Falkenhainer, Forbus, and Gentner 1989/90: 3)

In order to clarify this thesis, Gentner introduces a distinction between properties, or monadic predicates, and relations, which have multiple arguments. She further distinguishes among different orders of relations and functions, defined inductively. Consider the sentence,

Gravitational attraction between the sun and a planet, and the fact that the mass of the sun is much greater than that of the planet, causes the planet to orbit the sun.

Gentner represents this in the following form:

CAUSE( AND [ATTRACTS(sun, planet),
   GREATER( MASS(sun), MASS(planet)],
      REVOLVE-AROUND(planet, sun)).

In this sentence, ‘REVOLVE-AROUND’ and ‘ATTRACTS’ are first-order relations, ‘GREATER’ is second-order; ‘CAUSE’ is higher-order still.

An analogy mapping M is a one-to-one function from the items in the source domain to those in the target, such that if R holds of objects a1, …, an in the source domain, then M(R) holds of objects R(a1), …, R(an) in the target. The order of M(R) must be the same as the order of R. M may be a partial mapping; not every item in the source domain needs to have a target image.

The best mapping M is determined by systematicity: the extent to which it places higher-order relations, and items that are nested in higher-order relations, in correspondence. Properties and functions are unimportant, unless they are part of a relational network. Gentner's Systematicity Principle states:

A predicate that belongs to a mappable system of mutually interconnecting relationships is more likely to be imported into the target than is an isolated predicate. (1983: 163)

By extension, predicates occurring in statements involving higher-order relations are more likely to be imported into the target than those occurring only in lower-order relations. And a systematic analogy (one that places high-order relations and their components in correspondence) is better than a less systematic analogy. Hence, an analogical inference has a degree of plausibility that increases monotonically with the degree of systematicity of the associated analogy mapping. Gentner's fundamental criterion for evaluating candidate analogies (and analogical inferences) thus depends solely upon the syntax of the given representations and not at all upon their content. The contrast with Hesse's approach is striking.

Later versions of the structure-mapping theory incorporate additional ideas and constraints (Forbus, Ferguson, and Gentner 1994; Forbus 2001 and elsewhere), and the same is true of other structuralist computational approaches, such as ACME (discussed in §3.4). Still, some of the fundamental difficulties with the structure-mapping approach are easiest to appreciate if we focus on the early version.

There is an obvious worry about hand-coded representations of source and target domains. As Hofstadter (1995: 282) has written about one of the examples, “the analogy is already effectively given in the representations.” Rather than dwell on this problem, which is ubiquitous for computational models, let us concentrate on the Systematicity Principle itself. Supposing suitable representations of the two domains, does the value of an analogy derive entirely, or even chiefly, from systematicity? There appear to be two main difficulties with this view.

First: it is not always appropriate to give priority to systematic, high-level relational matches. Material criteria, and notably what Gentner refers to as “superficial feature matches,” can be extremely important in some types of analogical reasoning. As noted earlier (§1), archaeologists employ the method of ethnographic analogy to determine the probable use of tools and artifacts from ancient cultures. The idea is to compare the artifacts in the archaeological record to similar items in existing cultures. The strength of these analogies is based, to a considerable degree, on surface resemblances between the two artifacts, regardless of whether these resemblances are known to participate in elaborate relational networks.

Second and more significantly: systematicity seems to be at best a fallible marker for good analogies rather than the essence of good analogical reasoning. Greater systematicity is neither necessary nor sufficient for a more plausible analogical inference. It is obvious that increased systematicity is not sufficient for increased plausibility. An implausible analogy can be represented in a form that exhibits a high degree of structural parallelism. High-order relations can come cheap, as we saw with Achinstein's “swan” example (§2.4).

More pointedly, increased systematicity is not necessary for greater plausibility. Indeed, in causal analogies, it may even weaken the inference. That is because systematicity takes no account of the direction of causal relevance. Reducing high-level similarity may contribute to the plausibility of an analogy if what is eliminated is a preventive cause. To illustrate, consider an updated version of Example 2, Reid's argument that life exists or has existed on Mars. In this recent version (McKay 1993), the source domains are frozen lakes in Antarctica or glaciers in Greenland. In these lakes, microbes have been found to thrive despite the cold; by analogy, simple life forms might exist on Mars. The word “despite” is crucial here. Freezing temperatures are preventive or counteracting causes. They are negatively relevant to the existence of life. The climate of Mars was probably more favorable to life 3.5 billion years ago than it is today, because temperatures were warmer. Yet the analogy between Antarctica and present-day Mars is more systematic than the analogy between Antarctica and ancient Mars. According to the Systematicity Principle, the analogy with Antarctica should provide stronger support for life on Mars today than it does for life on ancient Mars.

The point of the example should be clear. Increased systematicity does not always increase plausibility; reduced systematicity does not always decrease it. The elimination of systematic analogy can contribute to plausibility when what is eliminated is a counteracting cause (see Lee and Holyoak 2008). The more general point is that systematicity can be misleading, unless we take into account the nature of the relationships between various factors and the hypothetical analogy. This problem applies to any theory that equates structural isomorphism with plausibility.

In sum: systematicity can be a rough indicator of a plausible analogical argument, and this explains why the structure-mapping approach enjoys a measure of success. But systematicity does not magically produce or explain the plausibility of an analogical argument. When we reason by analogy, we must determine which features of both domains are relevant and how they relate to the analogical conclusion. There is no short-cut via syntax.

Schlimm (2008) offers an entirely different critique of the structure-mapping theory from the perspective of analogical reasoning in mathematics—a domain where one might expect a formal approach such as structure mapping to perform well. Schlimm introduces a simple distinction: a domain is object-rich if the number of objects is greater than the number of relations (and properties), and relation-rich otherwise. Proponents of the structure-mapping theory typically focus on relation-rich examples (such as the analogy between the solar system and the atom). By contrast, analogies in mathematics typically involve domains with an enormous number of objects (like the real numbers), but relatively few relations (addition, multiplication, less-than).

Schlimm provides an example of an analogical reasoning problem in group theory that involves a single relation in each domain. In this case, attaining maximal systematicity is trivial. The difficulty is that, compatible with maximal systematicity, there are different ways in which the objects might be placed in correspondence. The structure-mapping theory appears to yield the wrong inference. We might put the general point as follows: in object-rich domains, systematicity ceases even to be a reliable guide to plausible analogical inference.

3.5 Other theories

3.5.1 Connectionist models

During the past thirty years, cognitive scientists have conducted extensive research on analogy. Gentner's SME is just one of many computational theories, implemented in programs that construct and use analogies. Three helpful anthologies that span this period are Helman 1988; Gentner, Holyoak, and Kokinov 2001; and Kokinov, Holyoak, and Gentner 2009.

The predominant objective of this research has been to model the cognitive processes involved in using analogies. Early models tended to be oriented towards “understanding the basic constraints that govern human analogical thinking” (Hummel and Holyoak 1997: 458). Recent connectionist models have been directed towards uncovering the psychological mechanisms that come into play when we use analogies: retrieval of a relevant source domain, analogical mapping across domains, and transfer of information and learning of new categories or schemas.

In some cases, such as the structure-mapping theory (§3.4), this research overlaps directly with the normative questions that are the focus of this entry. In other cases, we might view the projects as displacing those traditional normative questions with up-to-date, computational forms of naturalized epistemology. Two approaches are singled out here because both raise important challenges to the very idea of finding sharp answers to those questions, and both suggest that connectionist models offer a more fruitful approach to understanding analogical reasoning.

The first is the constraint-satisfaction model (also known as the multiconstraint theory), developed by Holyoak and Thagard (1989, 1995). Like Gentner, Holyoak and Thagard regard the heart of analogical reasoning as analogy mapping, and they stress the importance of systematicity, which they refer to as a structural constraint. Unlike Gentner, they acknowledge two additional types of constraints. Pragmatic constraints take into account the goals and purposes of the agent, recognizing that “the purpose will guide selection” of relevant similarities. Semantic constraints represent estimates of the degree to which people regard source and target items as being alike, rather like Hesse's “pre-theoretic” similarities.

The novelty of the multiconstraint theory is that these structural, semantic and pragmatic constraints are implemented not as rigid rules, but rather as ‘pressures’ supporting or inhibiting potential pairwise correspondences. The theory is implemented in a connectionist program called ACME (Analogical Constraint Mapping Engine), which assigns an initial activation value to each possible pairing between elements in the source and target domains (based on semantic and pragmatic constraints), and then runs through cycles that update the activation values based on overall coherence (structural constraints). The best global analogy mapping emerges under the pressure of these constraints.

As a psychological account of how humans construct analogies, the constraint-satisfaction model is attractive. The introduction of semantic and pragmatic criteria allows the program to account for factors that genuinely influence the persuasiveness of analogies. The cyclical updating structure reflects our tendency to revise ideas about the correspondences in an analogy.

Not surprisingly, it is difficult to view ACME as a traditional normative theory of analogical reasoning. If we try to extract a ‘theory for good analogical reasoning’ from the constraint-satisfaction model, we face a dilemma. The ‘light’ version of such a theory is as follows: structural, semantic and pragmatic constraints contribute to the overall coherence of an analogy, and the best analogies are those that maximize coherence (cf. Thagard 1989). But this ‘light theory’ does not yet specify how coherence is determined. For that, we turn to the ‘heavy’ version of the theory: the program ACME itself, together with conventions on representation for hand-coded inputs to the program. One concern is that there appears to be no way to extract any specific norms of analogical reasoning from the algorithms and coding conventions. There is also a second concern about performance: the objections about causal relevance that apply to Gentner's criterion of systematicity (§3.4) also apply to coherence.

But computational models are meant to challenge traditional epistemological objectives. Efforts to develop a quasi-logical theory of analogical reasoning, it might be argued, have failed. In place of faulty inference schemes such as those described earlier (§2.2, §2.4), computational models substitute procedures that should be judged on their performance rather than on traditional philosophical standards. It is worth noting that subsequent computational models, such as Hummel and Holyoak's LISA program (1997, 2003), have made significant advances and hold promise for offering a more complete theory of analogical reasoning.

Before responding to this argument, we describe a similar challenge raised by a very different computer program: Hofstadter and Mitchell's Copycat (Hofstadter 1995; Mitchell 1993). This program is “designed to discover insightful analogies, and to do so in a psychologically realistic way” (Hofstadter 1995: 205). Copycat operates in the domain of letter-strings. The program handles the following type of problem:

Suppose the letter-string abc were changed to abd; how would you change the letter-string ijk in “the same way”?

Most people would answer ijl, since it is natural to think that abc was changed to abd by the “transformation rule”: replace the rightmost letter with its successor. Alternative answers are possible, corresponding to different rules: ijd (replace the rightmost letter with d), ijk (replace each c with d), or abd (replace the entire string with abd). But these alternatives do not agree with most people's sense of what counts as the natural analogy.

Hofstadter and Mitchell believe that analogy-making is in large part about the perception of novel patterns, and that such perception requires concepts with “fluid” boundaries. Genuine analogy-making involves “slippage” of concepts. The Copycat program combines a set of core concepts pertaining to letter-sequences (successor, leftmost and so forth) with probabilistic “halos” that link distinct concepts dynamically. The program sends out “fingers” along different routes, creating groups of letters, making or destroying links between different groups, and building structures through activation strengths assigned to these links. What makes the program distinctive is the fluidity of the “halo” concepts. This allows for a kind of open-mindedness “not possible in an architecture with frozen representations”: any concept might turn out to be relevant. Nevertheless, orderly structures do emerge and the program produces plausible solutions.

In the authors' view, this emergence of order out of random low-level processes is the essence of perception. Copycat shows that analogy-making can be modeled as a process akin to perception, even if the program employs mechanisms distinct from those in human perception. That is a significant achievement.

The multiconstraint theory and Copycat share the idea that analogical cognition involves cognitive processes that operate below the level of abstract reasoning. Both computational models—to the extent that they are capable of performing successful analogical reasoning—challenge the idea that a successful model of analogical reasoning must take the form of a set of quasi-logical criteria.

In response: there is no doubt at all about the value of the connectionist models, but there is still a strong case that we need a theory, such as Hesse's, that offers normative principles for evaluating analogical arguments. In the first place, even if the recognition and construction of analogies are largely a matter of perception, this does not eliminate the need for critical evaluation of analogical inferences. Regardless of how a program (or human) generates such an inference, we are entitled to ask: Is this a good analogy? Second and more importantly, we need to look not just at the construction of analogy mappings but at the ways in which individual analogical arguments are subsequently debated in fields such as mathematics, physics, philosophy and the law. These high-level debates require reasoning that bears little resemblance to the computational processes of ACME or Copycat. (Ashley's HYPO (Ashley 1990) is one example of a non-connectionist program that focuses on this aspect of analogical reasoning.) There is, accordingly, room for both computational and traditional philosophical models of analogical reasoning.

3.5.2 Articulation model

Most prominent theories of analogy, philosophical and computational, are based on overall similarity between source and target domains—defined in terms of some favoured subset of Hesse's horizontal relations (see §2.2). Aristotle and Mill, whose approach is echoed in textbook discussions, suggest counting similarities. Hesse's theory (§3.3) favours “pre-theoretic” correspondences. The structure-mapping theory and its successors (§3.4) look to systematicity, i.e., to correspondences involving complex, high-level networks of relations. In each of these approaches, the problem is twofold: overall similarity is not a reliable guide to plausibility, and it fails to explain the plausibility of any analogical argument.

Bartha's articulation model (2010) proposes a different approach, beginning not with horizontal relations, but rather with a classification of analogical arguments on the basis of the vertical relations within each domain. The fundamental idea is that a good analogical argument must satisfy two conditions:

Prior Association.
There must be a clear connection, in the source domain, between the known similarities (the positive analogy) and the further similarity that is projected to hold in the target domain (the hypothetical analogy). This relationship determines which features of the source are critical to the analogical inference.
Potential for Generalization.
There must be reason to think that the same kind of connection could obtain in the target domain. More pointedly: there must be no critical disanalogy between the domains.

The first order of business is to make the prior association explicit. The standards of explicitness vary depending on the nature of this association (causal relation, mathematical proof, functional relationship, and so forth). The two general principles are fleshed out via a set of subordinate models that allow us to identify critical features and hence critical disanalogies.

To see how this works, consider Example 7 (Rectangles and boxes). In this analogical argument, the source domain is two-dimensional geometry: we know that of all rectangles with a fixed perimeter, the square has maximum area. The target domain is three-dimensional geometry: by analogy, we conjecture that of all boxes with a fixed surface area, the cube has maximum volume. This argument should be evaluated not by counting similarities, looking to pre-theoretic resemblances between rectangles and boxes, or constructing connectionist representations of the domains and computing a systematicity score for possible mappings. Instead, we should begin with a precise articulation of the prior association in the source domain, which amounts to a specific proof for the result about rectangles. We should then identify, relative to that proof, the critical features of the source domain: namely, the concepts and assumptions used in the proof. Finally, we should assess the potential for generalization: whether, in the three-dimensional setting, those critical features are known to lack analogues in the target domain. The articulation model is meant to reflect the conversations that can and do take place between an advocate and a critic of an analogical argument.

4. Philosophical foundations for analogical reasoning

What philosophical basis can be provided for reasoning by analogy? What justification can be given for the claim that analogical arguments deliver either plausible conclusions or some other desideratum? There have been several ideas for answering this question. One natural strategy assimilates analogical reasoning to some other well-understood argument pattern, a form of deductive or inductive reasoning (§4.1, §4.2). A few philosophers have explored the possibility of a priori justification (§4.3). A pragmatic justification may be available for practical applications of analogy, notably in legal reasoning (§4.4).

Any attempt to provide a general justification for analogical reasoning faces a basic dilemma. The demands of generality require a high-level formulation of the problem and hence an abstract characterization of analogical arguments, such as schema (4). On the other hand, as noted previously, many analogical arguments that conform to schema (4) are bad arguments. So a general justification of analogical reasoning cannot provide support for all arguments that conform to (4), on pain of proving too much. Instead, it must first specify a subset of putatively ‘good’ analogical arguments, and link the general justification to this specified subset. The problem of justification is linked to the problem of characterizing good analogical arguments. Many attempts to provide a justification for analogy fail to take this elementary point into account.

If all attempts to provide a philosophical basis for analogical reasoning fail, the most attractive alternative to skepticism may be Norton's “material theory” (§2.4), which allows that particular analogical arguments can be justified on the basis of local details.

4.1 Deductive justification

Analogical reasoning may be cast in a deductive mold. If successful, this strategy neatly solves the problem of justification. A valid deductive argument is as good as it gets.

An early version of the deductivist approach is exemplified by Aristotle's analysis of the argument from example (§3.2), or paradeigma. On this analysis, an analogical argument between source domain S and target T begins with the assumption of positive analogy P(S) and P(T), as well as the additional information Q(S). It proceeds via the generalization x(P(x) ⊃ Q(x)) to the conclusion: Q(T). Provided we can treat that intermediate generalization as an independent premise, we have a deductively valid argument. Notice, though, that the existence of the generalization renders the analogy irrelevant. We can derive Q(T) from the generalization and P(T), without any knowledge of the source domain.

Some recent analyses follow Aristotle in treating analogical arguments as reliant upon extra (sometimes tacit) premises, typically drawn from background knowledge, that convert the inference into a deductively valid argument. Davies and Russell introduce a version that relies upon what they call determination rules (Russell 1986; Davies and Russell 1987; Davies 1988). Suppose that Q and P1, …, Pm are variables, and we have background knowledge that the value of Q is determined by the values of P1, …, Pm. In the simplest case, where m = 1 and both P and Q are binary Boolean variables, this reduces to

(8)
x(P(x) ⊃ Q(x)) ∨ ∀x(P(x) ⊃ ~Q(x)),

i.e., whether or not P holds determines whether or not Q holds. More generally, the form of a determination rule is

(9)
Q = F(P1, …, Pm),

i.e., Q is a function of P1, …, Pm. If we assume such a rule as part of our background knowledge, then an analogical argument with conclusion Q(T) is deductively valid. More precisely, and allowing for the case where Q is not a binary variable: if we have such a rule, and also premises stating that the source S agrees with the target T on all of the values Pi, then we may validly infer that Q(T) = Q(S).

The “determination rule” analysis provides a clear and simple justification for analogical reasoning. Note that, in contrast to the Aristotelian analysis via the generalization ∀x(P(x) ⊃ Q(x)), a determination rule does not trivialize the analogical argument. Only by combining the rule with information about the source domain can we derive the value of Q(T). To illustrate by adapting one of the examples given by Russell and Davies, let's suppose that the value (Q) of a used car (relative to a particular buyer) is determined by its year, make, mileage, condition, color and accident history (the variables Pi). It doesn't matter if one or more of these factors are redundant or irrelevant. Provided two cars are indistinguishable on each of these points, they will have the same value. Knowledge of the source domain is necessary; we can't derive the value of the second car from the determination rule alone.

An interesting fact about these cases: they generate a problem for Norton's “material theory” of analogy (§2.4). Norton's approach, in which every analogy merely draws attention to facts about the target that are the ultimate warrant for the inference, requires that each analogy must be in principle eliminable. Yet the analogies in “determination rule” cases clearly play an ineliminable role in the argument. Norton could respond that such cases involve deductive reasoning and that his analysis is restricted to inductive inferences. But if we substitute statistical versions of determination rules, the difficulty remains.

Do determination rules give us a general solution to the problem of providing a justification for analogical arguments? In general: no. Analogies are commonly applied to problems where we do not possess determination rules, such as Example 8 (morphine and meperidine). In many (perhaps most) cases, we are not even aware of all relevant factors, let alone in possession of a determination rule. Medical researchers conduct drug tests on animals without knowing all attributes that might be relevant to the effects of the drug. Indeed, one of the main objectives of such testing is to guard against reactions unanticipated by theory. On the “determination rule” analysis, we must either limit the scope of such arguments to cases where we have a well-supported determination rule, or focus attention on formulating and justifying an appropriate determination rule. For cases such as animal testing, neither option seems realistic.

Weitzenfeld (1984) proposes a variant of this approach, advancing the slightly more general thesis that analogical arguments are deductive arguments with a missing (enthymematic) premise. That premise typically amounts to a determination rule. But Weitzenfeld does not insist that the missing premise should be background knowledge. Rather, he suggests that the missing premise is discovered and justified through independent processes: enumeration, surveillance, and inference. Enumeration amounts to examining source and target domains systematically. Surveillance is a matter of perceiving that the same determining structures are present in both domains:

when an array of elements is displayed, either in a visual presentation or to other senses, an isomorphism may be immediately apparent. (1984: 147)

But on the matter of acquiring this holistic grasp of similarity, Weitzenfeld concedes: “no one quite knows how it is done.” Finally, by inference Weitzenfeld appears to have in mind background theoretical considerations. In the case of drug testing on animals, for example, we appeal to common evolutionary history and similar functional organization.

In the end, Weitzenfeld acknowledges, the premise that there are common determining relations is “based upon plausibility arguments” (148). If that is right, then we have come full circle. We have replaced our argument by analogy, which required no commitment to any generalization, with a valid deductive argument that has an extra premise that has to be supported with plausibility arguments.

In sum: recasting analogy as a deductive argument may help to bring out background assumptions, but it makes little headway with the problem of justification. That problem re-appears as the need to establish the plausibility of the determination rule, and that is at least as difficult as justifying the original analogical argument.

4.2 Inductive justification

Some philosophers have attempted to portray, and justify, analogical reasoning in terms of some simpler inductive argument pattern. The problem of providing a general justification for analogies then reduces to the problem of justifying that simpler inference pattern.

There have been three moderately popular versions of this strategy. The first treats analogical reasoning as generalization from a single case; the second treats it as a kind of sampling argument. A third type of inductive justification recognizes the argument from analogy as a distinctive form, but treats its past successes as evidence for future success.

4.2.1 Single-case induction

Let's reconsider Aristotle's argument from example or paradeigma (§3.2), but this time regard the generalization as justified via induction from a single case (the source domain). Can such a simple analysis of analogical arguments succeed? In general, no.

A single instance can, perhaps, lead to justified generalization. Cartwright (1992) argues that we can sometimes generalize from a single careful experiment, “where we have sufficient control of the materials and our knowledge of the requisite background assumptions is secure” (51). Cartwright thinks that we can do this, for example, in experiments with compounds that have stable “Aristotelian natures.” In a similar spirit, Quine (1969) maintains that we can have instantial confirmation when dealing with natural kinds.

Even if we accept that there are such cases, the objection to understanding all analogical arguments as single-case induction should be obvious: the view is simply too restrictive. Most analogical arguments will not meet the requisite conditions. We may not know that we are dealing with a natural kind or Aristotelian nature when we make the analogical argument; we may not know which properties are essential properties. Anybody who acknowledges this point yet insists on the ‘single-case induction’ analysis is headed towards skepticism about analogical reasoning (Agassi 1964, 1988).

Interpreting the argument from analogy as single-case induction is also counter-productive in another way. Such a brutally simple analysis does nothing to advance the search for criteria that help us to distinguish between relevant and irrelevant similarities, and hence between good and bad analogical arguments.

4.2.2 Sampling arguments

On the sampling conception of analogical arguments, acknowledged similarities between two domains are treated as statistically relevant evidence for further similarities.

The simplest version of the sampling argument is due to Mill (1843/1930). An argument from analogy, he writes, is “a competition between the known points of agreement and the known points of difference.” Agreement of A and B in 9 out of 10 properties implies a probability of 0.9 that B will possess any other property of A: “we can reasonably expect resemblance in the same proportion” (367). His only restriction has to do with sample size: we must be relatively knowledgeable about both A and B. Mill saw no difficulty in using analogical reasoning to infer characteristics of newly discovered species of plants or animals, given our extensive knowledge of botany and zoology. But if the extent of unascertained properties of A and B is large, similarity in a small sample would not be a reliable guide; hence, Mill's dismissal of Reid's argument about life on other planets (Example 2).

The sampling argument is presented in more explicit mathematical form by Harrod (1956). The key idea is that the known properties of S (the source domain) may be considered a random sample of all S's properties—random, that is, with respect to the attribute of also belonging to T (the target domain). If the majority of known properties that belong to S also belong to T, then we should expect most other properties of S to belong to T, for it is unlikely that we would have come to know just the common properties. More precisely, Harrod's fair sampling postulate is the following supposition: if p is the proportion of observable properties of S that are actually shared with T, and n of these properties are observed, then the probability that exactly r of them will be shared with T is given by the binomial distribution:

(10)
(
n
r
) pr (1 − p)nr.

The sort of problem to which this distribution standardly applies is drawing balls from an urn. The binomial distribution gives the chance of drawing r black balls in n selections (with replacement) from an urn in which the proportion of black balls is p. If we grant this assumption, and if most of the properties in our ‘sample’ are shared by both domains, then the binomial distribution gives us a high probability that the two domains have additional observable similarities.

There are grave difficulties with Harrod's and Mill's analyses. One obvious difficulty is the counting problem, noted earlier: the ‘population’ of properties is poorly defined. How are we to count similarities and differences? The ratio of shared to total known properties varies dramatically according to how we do this. Should properties logically implied by other properties be counted? Alternatively, should some properties be weighted more heavily than others? If we can add similarities or differences at will, then these arguments yield inconsistent results. Sampling arguments have no value without guidelines for counting similarities, or better, a theory of relevance.

A second serious difficulty is the problem of bias: we cannot justify the assumption that the sample of known features is random. The paradigm of repeated selection from an urn seems totally inappropriate. In the case of the urn, the selection process is arranged so that the result of each choice is not influenced by the agent's intentions or purposes, or by prior choices. There is good reason to believe that samples are randomly selected. By contrast, the presentation of an analogical argument is always partisan. Bias enters into the initial representation of similarities and differences: an advocate of the argument will highlight similarities, while a critic will play up differences. We have excellent reason to reject a distribution based on random sampling.

Additional versions of the sampling approach have been developed (e.g., Russell 1988), but ultimately these versions also fail to solve either the counting problem or the problem of bias.

4.2.3 Argument from past success

In an interesting discussion, Steiner (1989, 1998) suggests that many of the analogies that played a major role in early twentieth-century physics count as “Pythagorean.” The term is meant to connote mathematical mysticism: a “Pythagorean” analogy is one founded on purely mathematical similarities that have no known physical basis at the time it is proposed. One example is Schrödinger's use of analogy to “guess” the form of the relativistic wave equation. In Steiner's view, Schrödinger's reasoning relies upon manipulations and substitutions based on purely mathematical analogies. Steiner argues that the success, and even the plausibility, of such analogies “evokes, or should evoke, puzzlement” (1989: 454).

Liston (2000) suggests that, despite the mystery, physicists are entitled to use Pythagorean analogies on the basis of induction from past successes.

[The scientist] can admit that no one knows how [Pythagorean] reasoning works and argue that the very fact that similar strategies have worked well in the past is already reason enough to continue pursuing them hoping for success in the present instance. (200)

Setting aside familiar worries about arguments from success, the real problem here is to determine what counts as a similar strategy. In essence, that amounts to isolating the features of successful Pythagorean analogies. As we have seen (§2.4), nobody has yet provided a satisfactory scheme that characterizes successful analogical arguments. This strategy would face an additional problem even if we could find such a characterization: the appeal to past triumphs provides no insight or explanation for the fact that a certain class of analogies has often been successful.

4.3 A priori justification

An a priori approach traces the validity of a pattern of analogical reasoning, or of a particular analogical argument, to some broad and fundamental principle. The fundamental principle, in turn, is held up as self-evident, philosophically indispensable, or (at the very least) highly plausible. Three such arguments will be considered here.

The first is due to Keynes (1921). Keynes's approach appeals to his famous Principle of the Limitation of Independent Variety, which he articulates as follows:

(LIV)
The amount of variety in the universe is limited in such a way that there is no one object so complex that its qualities fall into an infinite number of independent groups (i.e., groups which might exist independently as well as in conjunction) (1921: 258).

Actually, Keynes offers a weaker version (LIV*): we need only assume “finite a priori probability” that there is limitation of independent variety, and we can restrict the scope of the claim from the whole universe to “the objects of our generalization,” i.e., the objects of discourse (259–60).

In the Keynesian universe, there is a set of generator properties with two characteristics: any two generator properties are causally and statistically independent of each other, and the generator properties are jointly sufficient to generate (i.e., to cause) all derivative properties. Sets of generator properties are called groups, and a single derivative property might be produced by (or “fall into”) more than one group of generators. The independent variety of a system is its “ultimate constituents together with the laws of necessary connection” (251). In practical terms, the measure of the amount of independent variety in a system is either the number of groups or the number of generators. Thus, (LIV) amounts to the assumption that there is a finite number of generator properties, and the weaker principle (LIV*) to the assumption of positive probability, in any case of interest, that the number of relevant generator properties is finite. Keynes makes one further assumption: the a priori probability that each generator property is present in a group is positive.

Keynes also offers a simple characterization of the problem of justification. An analogical argument is justified if knowledge of the positive analogy increases the (logical) probability of the conclusion. In terms of schema (4): conditionalization on the positive analogy P(S), P(T) together with Q(S) is supposed to boost the probability of Q(T). (Here, P and Q are arbitrary finite conjunctions of properties.) We have a “logical foundation” for an analogical argument if this probability increase actually occurs.

Unfortunately, Keynes's account falls short at precisely this point. His assumptions are too weak to provide justification for anything other than perfect analogies, the cases where there is no negative analogy at all. The probability of the generalization ∀x(P(x) ⊃ Q(x)) is indeed increased by our knowledge of P(S) and Q(S) . But if there is a non-trivial negative analogy, then the target T will belong to a different group of generators and the probability of Q(T) will be unaffected by conditionalization on P(S)&P(T)&Q(S) (because of independence). This problem was noticed by Hesse (1966). Those familiar with Carnap's theory of logical probability will recognize the difficulty. In assuming that the generator properties are independent, Keynes has settled on a Carnapian measure that permits no learning from experience.

Hesse offers an alternative a priori approach, a refinement of Keynes's strategy. In her (1974), Hesse develops a justification for analogical reasoning along Carnapian lines by adopting what she calls the Clustering Postulate: the assumption that our epistemic probability function ought to have a built-in bias towards generalization. Specifically, for any attributes P and Q, and for any finite set of objects a1, …, an having the attribute P, the prior probability of finding a proportion of these objects with attribute Q is skewed in favour of the proportions 1 and 0. The objections to such global postulates of uniformity are well-known (see Salmon 1967), but even if we waive them, her argument fails. The objection—which also applies to Keynes—is the familiar problem of failure to discriminate: if Hesse's “Clustering Argument” succeeded, it would provide a justification even for analogical arguments that are clearly without value.

A rather different a priori strategy, proposed by Bartha (2010), limits the scope of justification to analogical arguments that satisfy tentative criteria for ‘good’ analogical reasoning. The criteria are those specified by the articulation model (§3.5). In simplified form, they require the existence of non-trivial positive analogy and no known critical disanalogy; the details depend upon a set of models reflecting the nature of the causal and logical relationships being transferred from the source to the target domain. The scope of Bartha's argument is also limited to analogical arguments directed at establishing prima facie plausibility, rather than degree of probability.

Bartha's argument rests on a principle of symmetry reasoning articulated by van Fraassen (1989: 236): “problems which are essentially the same must receive essentially the same solution.” A modal extension of this principle runs roughly as follows: if problems might be essentially the same, then they might have essentially the same solution. There are two modalities here. Bartha argues that satisfaction of the criteria of the articulation model is sufficient to establish the modality in the antecedent, i.e., that the source and target domains ‘might be essentially the same’ in relevant respects. He further suggests that prima facie plausibility provides a reasonable reading of the modality in the consequent, i.e., that the problems in the two domains ‘might have essentially the same solution.’ To call a hypothesis prima facie plausible is to elevate it to the point where it merits investigation, since it might be correct.

The argument is vulnerable to two major sorts of concerns. First, there are questions about the standing and interpretation of the symmetry principle on which it rests. Second, there remains a residual worry that this justification, like all the others, proves too much. The articulation model may be too vague or too permissive.

4.4 Pragmatic justification

Arguably, the most promising available defense of analogical reasoning may be found in its application to case law (see Precedent and Analogy in Legal Reasoning). Judicial decisions are based on the verdicts and reasoning that have governed relevantly similar cases, according to the doctrine of stare decisis (Levi 1949; Llewellyn 1960; Cross and Harris 1991; Sunstein 1993). Individual decisions by a court are binding on that court and lower courts; judges are obligated to decide future cases ‘in the same way.’ That is, the reasoning applied in an individual decision, referred to as the ratio decidendi, must be applied to similar future cases (see Example 10). In practice, of course, the situation is extremely complex. No two cases are identical. The ratio must be understood in the context of the facts of the original case, and there is considerable room for debate about its generality and its applicability to future cases. If a consensus emerges that a past case was wrongly decided, later judgments will distinguish it from new cases, effectively restricting the scope of the ratio to the original case.

The practice of following precedent can be justified by two main practical considerations. First, and above all, the practice is conservative: it provides a relatively stable basis for replicable decisions. People need to be able to predict the actions of the courts and formulate plans accordingly. Stare decisis serves as a check against arbitrary judicial decisions. Second, the practice is still reasonably progressive: it allows for the gradual evolution of the law. Careful judges distinguish bad decisions; new values and a new consensus can emerge in a series of decisions over time.

In theory, then, stare decisis strikes a healthy balance between conservative and progressive social values. This justification is pragmatic. It pre-supposes a common set of social values, and links the use of analogical reasoning to optimal promotion of those values. Notice also that justification occurs at the level of the practice in general; individual analogical arguments sometimes go astray. A full examination of the nature and foundations for stare decisis is beyond the scope of this entry, but it is worth asking the question: might it be possible to generalize the justification for stare decisis? Is a parallel pragmatic justification available for analogical arguments in general?

Bartha (2010) offers a preliminary attempt to provide such a justification by shifting from social values to epistemic values. The general idea is that reasoning by analogy is especially well suited to the attainment of a common set of epistemic goals or values. In simple terms, analogical reasoning—when it conforms to certain criteria—achieves an excellent (perhaps optimal) balance between the competing demands of stability and innovation. It supports both conservative epistemic values, such as simplicity and coherence with existing belief, and progressive epistemic values, such as fruitfulness and theoretical unification (McMullin (1993) provides a classic list).

5. Analogy and confirmation

How do we combine analogical reasoning with other inferential processes? As a more manageable question, which is also an important special case: how is analogical reasoning related to the confirmation of scientific hypotheses? Confirmation, in a broad sense, is the process by which a scientific hypothesis receives inductive support on the basis of evidence (see evidence and Bayes' Theorem). Confirmation may also signify the logical relationship of inductive support that obtains between a hypothesis H and a proposition E that expresses the relevant evidence. Can analogical arguments play a role, either in the process or in the logical relationship? Arguably yes (to both), but this role has to be delineated carefully, and several obstacles remain in the way of a clear account.

Earlier sections of this entry advanced the claim that a good analogical argument can make a hypothesis plausible, either in the sense of prima facie plausibility or in justifying the assignment of an appreciable subjective probability (or credence). On either version, a hypothesis derives inductive support from a credible analogy. Furthermore, the idea that analogical arguments can provide such support seems to be independent of one's theory of confirmation. But there are good reasons to reject the claim that analogies provide actual confirmation.

In the first place, there is a logical difficulty: analogies are not evidence. To appreciate this, let us concentrate on confirmation as a relationship between propositions. Christensen (1999: 441) offers a helpful general characterization:

Some propositions seem to help make it rational to believe other propositions. When our current confidence in E helps make rational our current confidence in H, we say that E confirms H.

In the Bayesian model, ‘confidence’ is represented in terms of subjective probability. A Bayesian agent starts with an assignment of subjective probabilities to a class of propositions. Confirmation is understood as a three-place relation:

(Bayesian confirmation)

(11)
E confirms H relative to KPr(HE · K) > Pr(HK).

E represents a proposition about accepted evidence, H stands for a hypothesis, K for background knowledge and Pr for the agent's subjective probability function. To confirm H is to raise its conditional probability, relative to K. The shift from prior probability Pr(HK) to posterior probability Pr(HE · K) is referred to as conditionalization on E. The relation between these two probabilities is typically given by Bayes' Theorem (setting aside more complex forms of conditionalization):

(12) Pr(HE · K) =
Pr(HK) Pr(EH · K)
Pr(EK)

For Bayesians, it seems that an analogical argument cannot provide confirmation. In the first place, it is not clear that we can encapsulate the information contained in an analogical argument in a single proposition, E. Second, even if we can formulate a proposition E that expresses all of that information, it is not appropriate to treat it as evidence. The information contained in E is already part of the background, K. This means that E · K is equivalent to K, and hence Pr(HE · K) = Pr(HK). According to the definition, we don't have confirmation. Third, and perhaps most important, analogical arguments are often applied to novel hypotheses H for which the prior probability Pr(HK) is not even defined. Again, the definition of confirmation seems inapplicable. Although these observations are based on a Bayesian approach, similar problems exist for other accounts of confirmation. On an error-statistical approach, for instance, it is readily apparent that analogical arguments should not be regarded as evidence.

If analogies don't provide inductive support via conditionalization, is there an alternative? Here we face a second difficulty, once again most easily stated within a Bayesian framework. Van Fraassen (1989) has a well-known objection to any belief-updating rule other than conditionalization. This objection applies to any rule that allows us to boost credences when there is no new evidence. The criticism, made vivid by the tale of Bayesian Peter, is that these ‘ampliative’ rules are vulnerable to a Dutch Book. Adopting any such rule would lead us to acknowledge as fair a system of bets that foreseeably leads to certain loss. This type of vulnerability provides good reason to reject such rules. If we think that good analogical arguments provide inductive support, it looks like we are vulnerable to van Fraassen's objection.

There is a way to avoid these difficulties and to find a role for analogical arguments within Bayesian epistemology. Within the Bayesian framework, a number of writers (Jeffreys 1973; Salmon 1967, 1990; Shimony 1970) have argued that a ‘seriously proposed’ hypothesis must have a sufficiently high prior probability to allow it to become preferred as the result of observation. Salmon has suggested that analogical reasoning is one of the most important means of showing that a hypothesis is ‘serious’ in this sense. If analogical reasoning influences prior probability assignments, it can provide inductive support while remaining formally distinct from confirmation, avoiding the first difficulty. If it can provide this support in non-rule-based fashion, then we avoid the second difficulty, i.e., van Fraassen's objection. The cost of taking this route, however, is high.

Analogical arguments are employed both for newly considered hypotheses and to shift existing opinion without marshalling new evidence. An orthodox Bayesian, such as de Finetti (de Finetti and Savage 1972, de Finetti 1974), might have no problem in allowing that analogies, in company with considerations of symmetry and other psychological predilections, play a causal role in influencing our prior probability assignments. But how can analogies lead to rational belief change (e.g., shifts in probability or changes to the underlying outcome space) without a clear rule? As Hawthorne (2012) notes, some Bayesians simply accept that both initial assignments and ongoing revision of prior probabilities (based on plausibility arguments) can be rational, but

the logic of Bayesian induction (as described here) has nothing to say about what values the prior plausibility assessments for hypotheses should have; and it places no restrictions on how they might change.

The cost of admitting analogical reasoning into the Bayesian tent in this manner is to acknowledge a dark corner of the tent in which rationality operates without any clear rules.

Of course, van Fraassen himself recognizes that belief change other than conditionalization can be rational, so long as three conditions are met. The first is synchronic rationality: our beliefs must be probabilistically coherent at any given time. Second, as already noted, such changes cannot be based on any rule. The third constraint is Reflection: present opinion must lie in the range of anticipated future opinions (van Fraassen 1984, 1995). In fact, this final (and controversial) constraint, Reflection, offers a way to mitigate the darkness.

The symmetry-based justification for analogical reasoning outlined in §4.3 gives us what amounts to a modal version of Reflection: if, so far as present opinion is concerned, I might come to accept a hypothesis, then I should regard that hypothesis as a serious (prima facie) possibility. A modicum of open-mindedness is required as a way of anticipating my possible future opinion, just as required by Reflection. Support from a good analogical argument provides sufficient justification for this type of open-mindedness. This position may be the common core of the ideas about analogy held by Herschel, Whewell and Campbell.

Significant challenges remain before this picture of how analogies fit into the framework of confirmation can be made perfectly clear. For instance: even though analogical arguments obviously vary in their degree of strength, the modal Reflection principle just identified does not provide any basis for assigning prior probability values. More generally, serious questions remain about how to make connections between prima facie plausibility and probabilistic credences. As noted in §2.3, some philosophers maintain that modal and probabilistic representations of uncertainty constitute distinct and, to some extent, incomparable approaches to epistemology. There now exists a wide variety of formal devices for representing uncertainty (Halpern 2003). It may be that some non-probabilistic representation proves more suitable than probability for modeling analogical reasoning. If so, the challenge will be to find a way that allows us to integrate prima facie plausibility reasoning with confirmation, for which a probabilistic representation appears indispensable.

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  • Norton, J., 2012. “Analogy”, unpublished draft, University of Pittsburg.

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