The Moral Status of Animals

First published Tue Jul 1, 2003; substantive revision Mon Sep 13, 2010

What is distinctive about humanity such that humans are thought to have moral status and non-humans do not? Providing an answer to this question has become increasingly important among philosophers as well as those outside of philosophy who are interested in our treatment of non-human animals. For some, answering this question will enable us to better understand the nature of human beings and the proper scope of our moral obligations. Some argue that there is an answer that can distinguish humans from the rest of the natural world. Many of those who accept this answer are interested in justifying certain human practices towards non-humans—practices that cause pain, discomfort, suffering and death. This latter group expect that in answering the question in a particular way, humans will be justified in granting moral consideration to other humans that is neither required nor justified when considering non-human animals. In contrast to this view, many philosophers have argued that while humans are different in a variety of ways from each other and other animals, these differences do not provide a philosophical defense for denying non-human animals moral consideration. What the basis of moral consideration is and what it amounts to has been the source of much disagreement.

1. The Moral Considerability of Animals

To say that a being deserves moral consideration is to say that there is a moral claim that this being has on those who can recognize such claims. A morally considerable being is a being who can be wronged in a morally relevant sense. It is generally thought that all and only human beings make such claims, because it is only humans who can respond to these claims. However, when we ask why it is thought that all and only humans are the types of beings that can be wronged, answers are not particularly easy to come by. Humans are members of the species Homo sapiens. But species membership does not explain why there is a moral claim made by those that belong to this species and not other species. That humans are members of the species Homo sapiens is certainly a distinguishing feature of humans—humans share a genetic make-up and a distinctive physiology, but this is unimportant from the moral point of view. Species membership is a morally irrelevant characteristic, a bit of luck that is no more morally interesting than being born male or female, Malaysian or French. Species membership itself cannot support the view that members of one species, namely ours, deserve moral consideration that is not owed to members of other species. Of course, one might respond that it is not membership in a biological category that matters morally, it is our humanity that grounds the moral claims we make. Humans are morally considerable because of the distinctively human capacities we possess, capacities that only we humans have.

But which capacities mark out all and only humans as the kinds of beings that can be wronged? A number of candidate capacities have been proposed—developing family ties, solving social problems, expressing emotions, starting wars, having sex for pleasure, using language, or thinking abstractly, are just a few. As it turns out, none of these activities is uncontroversially unique to human. Both scholarly and popular work on animal behavior suggests that many of the activities that are thought to be distinct to humans occurs in non-humans. For example, many species of non-humans develop long lasting kinship ties—orangutan mothers stay with their young for eight to ten years and while they eventually part company, they continue to maintain their relationships. Less solitary animals, such as chimpanzees, baboons, wolves, and elephants maintain extended family units built upon complex individual relationships, for long periods of time. Meerkats in the Kalahari desert are known to sacrifice their own safety by staying with sick or injured family members so that the fatally ill will not die alone. All animals living in socially complex groups must solve various problems that inevitably arise in such groups. Canids and primates are particularly adept at it, yet even chickens and horses are known to recognize large numbers of individuals in their social hierarchies and to maneuver within them. One of the ways that non-human animals negotiate their social environments is by being particularly attentive to the emotional states of others around them. When a conspecific is angry, it is a good idea to get out of his way. Animals that develop life-long bonds are known to suffer terribly from the death of their partners. Some are even said to die of sorrow. Darwin reported this in The Descent of Man: “So intense is the grief of female monkeys for the loss of their young, that it invariably caused the death of certain kinds.” Jane Goodall's report of the death of the healthy 8 year old chimpanzee Flint just three weeks after the death of his mother Flo also suggests that sorrow can have a devastating effect on non-human animals. (see Goodall 2000, p. 140-141 in Bekoff 2000). Coyotes, elephants and killer whales are also among the species for which profound effects of grief have been reported (Bekoff 2000) and many dog owners can provide similar accounts. While the lives of many, perhaps most, non-humans in the wild are consumed with struggle for survival, aggression and battle, there are some non-humans whose lives are characterized by expressions of joy, playfulness, and a great deal of sex (Woods, 2010). Recent studies in cognitive ethology have suggested that some non-humans engage in manipulative and deceptive activity, can construct “cognitive maps” for navigation, and some non-humans appear to understand symbolic representation and are able to use language.[1] It appears then that most of the capacities that are thought to distinguish humans as morally considerable beings, have been observed, often in less elaborate form, in the non-human world. Because human behavior and cognition share deep roots with the behavior and cognition of other animals, approaches that try to find sharp behavioral or cognitive boundaries between humans and other animals remain controversial. For this reason, attempts to establish human uniqueness by identifying certain capacities, like those discussed in this paragraph and perhaps others, are not the most promising when it comes to thinking hard about the moral status of animals.

Nonetheless, there is something important that is thought to distinguish humans from non-humans that is not reducible to the observation of behavior best explained by possessing a certain capacity, namely our “personhood.” The notion of personhood identifies a category of morally considerable beings that is thought to be coextensive with humanity. Historically, Kant is the most noted defender of personhood as the quality that makes a being valuable and thus morally considerable. In the Groundwork, Kant writes:

...every rational being, exists as an end in himself and not merely as a means to be arbitrarily used by this or that will...Beings whose existence depends not on our will but on nature have, nevertheless, if they are not rational beings, only a relative value as means and are therefore called things. On the other hand, rational beings are called persons inasmuch as their nature already marks them out as ends in themselves. (Kant, 1785, 428)

And in the Lectures on Anthropology:

The fact that the human being can have the representation “I” raises him infinitely above all the other beings on earth. By this he is a person....that is, a being altogether different in rank and dignity from things, such as irrational animals, with which one may deal and dispose at one's discretion. (Kant, LA, 7, 127)

More recent work in a Kantian vein develops this idea. Christine Korsgaard, for example, argues that humans “uniquely” face a problem, the problem of normativity. This problem emerges because of the reflective structure of human consciousness. We can, and often do, think about our desires and ask ourselves “Are these desires reasons for action? Do these impulses represent the kind of things I want to act according to?” Our reflective capacities allow us and require us to step back from our mere impulses in order to determine when and whether to act on them. In stepping back we gain a certain distance from which we can answer these questions and solve the problem of normativity. We decide whether to treat our desires as reasons for action based on our conceptions of ourselves, on our “practical identities.” When we determine whether we should take a particular desire as a reason to act we are engaging in a further level of reflection, a level that requires an endorseable description of ourselves. This endorseable description of ourselves, this practical identity, is a necessary moral identity because without it we cannot view our lives as worth living or our actions as worth doing. Korsgaard suggests that humans face the problem of normativity in a way that non-humans apparently do not:

A lower animal's attention is fixed on the world. Its perceptions are its beliefs and its desires are its will. It is engaged in conscious activities, but it is not conscious of them. That is, they are not the objects of its attention. But we human animals turn our attention on to our perceptions and desires themselves, on to our own mental activities, and we are conscious ofthem. That is why we can think about them…

And this sets us a problem that no other animal has. It is the problem of the normative.... The reflective mind cannot settle for perception and desire, not just as such. It needs a reason. (Korsgaard, 1996, 93)

Here, Korsgaard understands “reason” as “a kind of reflective success” and given that non-humans are thought to be unable to reflect in a way that would allow them this sort of success, it appears that they do not act on reasons, at least reasons of this kind. Since non-humans do not act on reasons they do not have a practical identity from which they reflect and for which they act. So humans can be distinguished from non-humans because humans, we might say, are sources of normativity and non-humans are not.

Yet Kant's view of personhood cannot distinguish all and only humans as morally considerable. Personhood is not, in fact, coextensive with humanity when understood as a general description of the group to which human beings belong. And the serious part of this problem is not that there may be some extra-terrestrials or deities who have rational capacities (It seems likely that Kant recognized this when he wrote “man, and in general every rational being”). The serious problem is that many humans are not persons. Some members of humanity—i.e. infants, children, people with advanced forms of autism or Alzheimer's disease or other cognitive disorders—do not have the rational, self-reflective capacities associated with personhood. This problem, unfortunately known in the literature as the problem of “marginal cases,” poses serious difficulties for “personhood” as the criterion of moral considerability. Many beings whose positive moral value we have deeply held intuitions about, and who we treat as morally considerable, will be excluded from consideration by this account.

There are four ways to respond to this counter-intuitive conclusion. One, which can be derived from one interpretation of Kant, is to suggest that non-persons are morally considerable indirectly. Though Kant believed that animals were mere things it appears he did not genuinely believe we could dispose of them any way we wanted. In the Lectures on Ethics he makes it clear that we have indirect duties to animals, duties that are not toward them, but in regard to them insofar as our treatment of them can affect our duties to persons.

If a man shoots his dog because the animal is no longer capable of service, he does not fail in his duty to the dog, for the dog cannot judge, but his act is inhuman and damages in himself that humanity which it is his duty to show towards mankind. If he is not to stifle his human feelings, he must practice kindness towards animals, for he who is cruel to animals becomes hard also in his dealings with men. (Kant, LE, 212 (27: 459)

And one could argue the same would be true of those human beings who are not persons. We disrespect our humanity when we act in inhumane ways towards non-persons, whatever their species.

But this indirect view is unsatisfying—it fails to capture the independent wrong that is being done to the non-person. When someone rapes a woman in a coma, or whips a severely brain damaged child, or sets a cat on fire, they are not simply disrespecting humanity or themselves as representatives of it, they are wronging these non-persons. So, a second way to avoid the counter-intuitive conclusion is to argue that such non-persons stand in the proper relations to “rational nature” such that they should be thought of as morally considerable. Allen Wood (1998) argues in this way and suggests that all beings that potentially have a rational nature, or who virtually have it, or who have had it, or who have part of it, or who have the necessary conditions of it, what he calls “the infrastructure of rational nature”, should be directly morally considerable. Insofar as a being stands in this relation to rational nature, they are the kinds of beings that can be wronged.

This response is not unlike that of noted animal rights proponent, Tom Regan, who argues that what is important for moral consideration are not the differences between humans and non-humans but the similarities. Regan argues that because persons share with certain non-persons (which includes those humans and non-humans who have a certain level of organized cognitive function) the ability to be experiencing subject of a life and to have an individual welfare that matters to them regardless of what others might think, both deserve moral consideration. Regan argues that subjects of a life

want and prefer things, believe and feel things, recall and expect things. And all these dimensions of our life, including our pleasure and pain, our enjoyment and suffering, our satisfaction and frustration, our continued existence or our untimely death—all make a difference to the quality of our life as lived, as experienced, by us as individuals. As the same is true of … animals … they too must be viewed as the experiencing subjects of a life, with inherent value of their own. (Regan, 1985)

A third way of addressing this problem has been taken up by Korsgaard who maintains that there is a big difference between those with normative, rational capacities and those without, but unlike Kant, believes both humans and non-humans are the proper objects of our moral concern. She argues that those without normative, rational capacities share certain “natural” capacities with persons, and these natural capacities are often the content of the moral demands that persons make on each other. She writes, “what we demand, when we demand … recognition, is that our natural concerns—the objects of our natural desires and interests and affections—be accorded the status of values, values that must be respected as far as possible by others. And many of those natural concerns—the desire to avoid pain is an obvious example—spring from our animal nature, not from our rational nature” (Korsgaard 2007). What moral agents construct as valuable and normatively binding is not only our rational or autonomous capacities, but the needs and desires we have as living, embodied beings. Insofar as these needs and desires are valuable for agents, the ability to experience similar needs and desires in patients should also be valued.

A final response is simply to reject rational nature as the touchstone of moral considerability. This is the kind of direct argument that utilitarians have traditionally made. They argue that the truly morally important feature of beings is unappreciated when we focus on personhood or the rational, self-reflective nature of humans, or the relation a being stands in to such nature, or being the subject of a life. What is really important, utilitarians maintain, is the promotion of happiness, or pleasure, or the satisfaction of interests, and the avoidance of pain, or suffering, or frustration of interests. Bentham, one of the more forceful defenders of this “sentientist” view of moral considerability, famously wrote:

Other animals, which, on account of their interests having been neglected by the insensibility of the ancient jurists, stand degraded into the class of things. [original emphasis] ... The day has been, I grieve it to say in many places it is not yet past, in which the greater part of the species, under the denomination of slaves, have been treated ... upon the same footing as ... animals are still. The day may come, when the rest of the animal creation may acquire those rights which never could have been withholden from them but by the hand of tyranny. The French have already discovered that the blackness of skin is no reason why a human being should be abandoned without redress to the caprice of a tormentor. It may come one day to be recognized, that the number of legs, the villosity of the skin, or the termination of the os sacrum, are reasons equally insufficient for abandoning a sensitive being to the same fate. What else is it that should trace the insuperable line? Is it the faculty of reason, or perhaps, the faculty for discourse?...the question is not, Can they reason? nor, Can they talk? but, Can they suffer? (Bentham 1781)

Contemporary utilitarians, such as Peter Singer (1990, 1993), suggest that there is no morally justifiable way to exclude from moral consideration non-humans or non-persons who can clearly suffer. Any being that has an interest in not suffering deserves to have that interest taken into account. And a non-human who acts to avoid pain can be thought to have just such an interest. Even contemporary Kantians have acknowledged the moral force of the experience of pain. Korsgaard, for example, writes “it is a pain to be in pain. And that is not a trivial fact” (1996, 154).

When you pity a suffering animal, it is because you are perceiving a reason. An animal's cries express pain, and they mean that there is a reason, a reason to change its conditions. And you can no more hear the cries of an animal as mere noise than you can the words of a person. Another animal can obligate you in exactly the same way another person can. …So of course we have obligations to animals. (Korsgaard, 1996, 153)

When we encounter an animal in pain we recognize their claim on us, and thus beings who can suffer are morally considerable.

2. The Moral Significance of Animals' Moral Claims

That non-human animals can make moral claims on us does not in itself indicate how such claims are to be assessed and conflicting claims adjudicated. Being morally considerable is like showing up on a moral radar screen—how strong the signal is or where it is located on the screen are separate questions. Of course, how one argues for the moral considerability of non-human animals will inform how we are to understand the force of an animal's claims.

According to the view that an animal's moral claim is equivalent to a moral right, any action that fails to treat the animal as a being with inherent worth would violate that animal's right and is thus morally objectionable. According to the animal rights position, to treat an animal as a means to some human end, as many humans do when they eat animals or experiment on them, is to violate that animal's right. As Tom Regan has written,

…animals are treated routinely, systematically as if their value were reducible to their usefulness to others, they are routinely, systematically treated with a lack of respect, and thus are their rights routinely, systematically violated. (Regan, 1985)

The animal rights position is an absolutist position. Any being that is a subject of a life has inherent worth and the rights that protect such worth, and all subjects of a life have these rights equally. Thus any practice that fails to respect the rights of those animals who have them, e.g. eating animals, hunting animals, experimenting on animals, using animals for entertainment, is wrong, irrespective of human need, context, or culture.

The utilitarian position on animals, most commonly associated with Peter Singer and popularly, though erroneously, referred to as an animal rights position, is actually quite distinct. Here the moral significance of the claims of animals depends on what other morally significant competing claims might be in play in any given situation. While the equal interests of all morally considerable beings are considered equally, the practices in question may end up violating or frustrating some interests but would not be considered morally wrong if, when all equal interests are considered, more of these interests are satisfied than frustrated. For utilitarians like Singer, what matters are the strength and nature of interests, not whose interests these are . So, if the only options available in order to save the life of one morally considerable being is to cause harm, but not death, to another morally considerable being, then according to a utilitarian position, causing this harm may be morally justifiable. Similarly, if there are two courses of action, one which causes extreme amounts of suffering and ultimate death, and one which causes much less suffering and painless death, then the latter would be morally preferable to the former.

Consider factory farming, the most common method used to convert animal bodies into relatively inexpensive food in industrialized societies today. An estimated 8 billion animals in the United States are born, confined, biologically manipulated, transported and ultimately slaughtered each year so that humans can consume them. The conditions in which these animals are raised and the method of slaughter causes vast amounts of suffering. (See, for example, Mason and Singer 1990.) Given that animals suffer under such conditions and assuming that suffering is not in their interests, then the practice of factory farming would only be morally justifiable if its abolition were to cause greater suffering or a greater amount of interest frustration. Certainly humans who take pleasure in eating animals will find it harder to satisfy these interests in the absence of factory farms; it may cost more and require more effort to obtain animal products. The factory farmers, and the industries that support factory farming, will also have certain interests frustrated if factory farming were to be abolished. How much interest frustration and interest satisfaction would be associated with the end to factory farming is largely an empirical question. But utilitarians are not making unreasonable predictions when they argue that on balance the suffering and interest frustration that animals experience in modern day meat production is greater than the suffering that humans would endure if they had to alter their current practices.

Importantly, the utilitarian argument for the moral significance of animal suffering in meat production is not an argument for vegetarianism. If an animal lived a happy life and was painlessly killed and then eaten by people who would otherwise suffer hunger or malnutrition by not eating the animal, then painlessly killing and eating the animal would be the morally justified thing to do. In many parts of the world where economic, cultural, or climate conditions make it virtually impossible for people to sustain themselves on plant based diets, killing and eating animals that previously led relatively unconstrained lives and are painlessly killed, would not be morally objectionable. The utilitarian position can thus avoid certain charges of cultural chauvinism and moralism, charges that the animal rights position apparently cannot avoid.

It might be objected that to suggest that it is morally acceptable to hunt and eat animals for those people living in arctic regions, or for nomadic cultures, or for poor rural peoples, for example, is to potentially condone painlessly killing other morally considerable beings, like humans, for food consumption in similar situations. If violating the rights of an animal can be morally tolerated, especially a right to life, then similar rights violations can be morally tolerated. In failing to recognize the inviolability of the moral claims of all morally considerable beings, utilitarianism cannot accommodate one of our most basic prima facie principles, namely that killing a morally considerable being is wrong.

There are at least two replies to this sort of objection. The first appeals to the negative side effects that killing may promote. If, to draw on an overused and sadly sophomoric counter-example, one person can be kidnapped and painlessly killed in order to provide body parts for four individuals who will die without them, there will inevitably be negative side-effects that all things considered would make the kidnapping wrong. Healthy people, knowing they could be used for spare parts, might make themselves unhealthy to avoid such a fate or they may have so much stress and fear that the overall state of affairs would be worse than that in which four people died. Appealing to side-effects when it comes to the wrong of killing is certainly plausible, but it fails to capture what is directly wrong with killing.

A more satisfying reply would have us adopt what might be called a multi-factor perspective, one that takes into account the kinds of interest that are possible for certain kinds of morally considerable beings, the content of interests of the beings in question, their relative weight, and the context of those who have them. Consider a seal who has spent his life freely roaming the oceans and ice flats and who is suddenly and painless killed to provide food for a human family struggling to survive a bitter winter in far northern climes. While it is probably true that the seal had an immediate interest in avoiding suffering, it is less clear that the seal has a future directed interest in continued existence. If the seal lacks this future directed interest, then painlessly killing him does not violate this interest. The same cannot be said for the human explorer who finds himself face to face with a hungry Inuit family. Persons generally have interests in continued existence, interests that, arguably, non-persons do not have. So one factor that can be appealed to is that non-persons may not have the range of interests that persons do.

An additional factor is the type of interest in question. We can think of interests as scalar; crucial interests are weightier than important interests, important interests are weightier than replaceable interests, and all are weightier than trivial interests or mere whims. When there is a conflict of interests, crucial interests will always override important interests, important interests will always override replaceable interests, etc. So if an animal has an interest in not suffering, which is arguably a crucial interest, or at least an important one, and a person has an interest in eating that animal when there are other things to eat, meaning that interest is replaceable, then the animal has the stronger interest and it would be wrong to violate that interest by killing the animal for food if there is another source of food available.

Often, however, conflicts of interests are within the same category. The Inuit's interest in food is crucial and the explorer's interest in life is crucial. If we assume that the explorer cannot otherwise provide food for the hunter, then it looks as if there is a conflict within the same category. If you take the interests of an indigenous hunter's whole family into account, then their combined interest in their own survival appears to outweigh the hapless explorer's interest in continued existence. Indeed, if painlessly killing and eating the explorer were the only way for the family to survive, then perhaps this action would be morally condoned. But this is a rather extreme sort of example, one in which even our deepest held convictions are strained. So it is quite hard to know what to make of the clash between what a utilitarian would condone and what our intuitions tell us we should believe here. Our most basic prima facie principles arise and are accepted under ordinary circumstances. Extraordinary circumstances are precisely those in which such principles or precepts give way.[2]

The multi-factor utilitarian perspective is particularly helpful when considering the use of animals in medical research. According to the animal rights position, the use of animals in experimental procedures is a clear violation of their rights—they are being used as a mere means to some possible end—and thus animal rights proponents are in favor of the abolition of all laboratory research. The utilitarian position, particularly one that incorporates some kind of multi-factor perspective, might allow some research on animals under very specific conditions. Before exploring what a utilitarian might condone in the way of animal experimentation, let us first quickly consider what would be morally prohibited. All research that involves invasive procedures, constant confinement, and ultimate death can be said to violate the animal's crucial interests. Thus any experiments that are designed to enhance the important, replaceable, or trivial interests of humans or other animals would be prohibited. That would mean that experiments for cosmetics or household products are prohibited, as there are non-animal tested alternatives and many options already available for consumers. Experiments to determine the effects of recreational drugs, cigarettes, and alcohol would also be prohibited. Certain psychological experiments, such as those in which infant primates are separated from their mothers and exposed to frightening stimuli in an effort to understand problems teenagers have when they enter high school, would also come into question. There are many examples of experiments that violate an animal's crucial interests in the hopes of satisfying the lesser interests of some other morally considerable being, all of which would be objectionable from this perspective.

There are some laboratory experiments, however, that from a multi-factor utilitarian perspective may be permitted. These are experiments in which the probability of satisfying crucial or important interests for many who suffer from some debilitating or fatal disease is high, and the numbers of non-human animals whose crucial interests are violated is low. The psychological complexity of the non-humans may also be significant in determining whether the experiment is morally justified. In the case of experimenting in these limited number of cases, presumably a parallel argument could be made about experimenting on humans. If the chances are very high that experimenting on one human, who is a far superior experimental animal when it comes to human disease, can prevent great suffering or death in many humans, then the utilitarian may, if side effects are minimal, condone such an experiment. Of course, it is easier to imagine this sort of extreme case in the abstract, what a utilitarian would think actually morally justified, again depends on the specific empirical data.

In sum, the animal rights position takes the significance of morally considerable claims to be absolute. Thus, any use of animals that involves a disregard for their moral claims is problematic. The significance of an animal's morally considerable interests according to a utilitarian is variable. Whether an action is morally justified or permissible will depend on a number of factors. The utilitarian position on animals would condemn a large number of practices that involve the suffering and death of billions of animals, but there are cases in which some use of non-human animals, and perhaps even human animals, may be morally justified.

3. Alternative Perspectives on Human Relations to Other Animals

Given the long-standing view that non-humans are mere things, there are still many who reject the arguments presented here for the moral considerability of non-humans and the significance of their interests. Nonetheless, most now realize that the task of arguing that humans have a unique and exclusive moral status is rather difficult. Yet even amongst those who do view animals as within the sphere of moral concern, there is disagreement about the nature and usefulness of the arguments presented on behalf of the moral status of animals.

Some, in the neo-Aristotelian or “virtue ethics” tradition, have argued that while our behavior towards animals is indeed subject to moral scrutiny, the kinds of arguments that have been presented frame the issues in the wrong way. According to many in this tradition, rational argumentation fails to capture those features of moral experience that allow us to really see why treating animals badly is wrong. The point, according to commentators such as Stephen R.L. Clark and Cora Diamond, for example, is that members of our communities, however we conceive of them, pull on us and it is in virtue of this indescribable pull that we recognize what is wrong with cruelty. Animals are individuals with whom we share a common life and this recognition allows us to see them as they are. A person striving for virtue comes to see that eating animals is wrong not because it is a violation of the animal's rights or because on balance such an act creates more suffering than other acts, but rather because in eating animals or using them in other harmful ways, we do not display the traits of character that kind, sensitive, compassionate, mature, and thoughtful members of a moral community should display. And carefully worked out arguments in which the moral considerability and moral significance of animals are laid out will have little if any grip on our thoughts and actions. Rather, by perceiving the attitudes that underlie the use and abuse of non-human animals as shallow or cruel, one interested in living a virtuous life will change their attitudes and come to reject treating animals as food or tools for research. As Rosalind Hursthouse recognized after having been exposed to alternative ways of seeing animals:[3]

I began to see [my attitudes] that related to my conception of flesh-foods as unnecessary, greedy, self-indulgent, childish, my attitude to shopping and cooking in order to produce lavish dinner parties as parochial, gross, even dissolute. I saw my interest and delight in nature programmes about the lives of animals on television and my enjoyment of meat as side by side at odds with one another…Without thinking animals had rights, I began to see both the wild ones and the ones we usually eat as having lives of their own, which they should be left to enjoy. And so I changed. My perception of the moral landscape and where I and the other animals were situated in it shifted. (Hursthouse, 2000, 165–166)

Feminists too have taken issue with the methods of argumentation used to establish the moral status of animals. For many feminists the traditional methods of rational argumentation fail to take into account the feelings of sympathy or empathy that humans have towards non-humans, feelings they believe are central to a full account of what we owe non-humans and why. While many feminists believe, following Hume, that our moral emotions are what ultimately move us to act compassionately towards animals, they do not reject the conclusions that the rights-based theorists or the utilitarian theorists draw. Rather, their criticisms are directed at the idea that these conclusions, drawn through reason alone, can change our behaviors. (See Adams and Donovan 1995.)

Feminist philosophers have also challenged the individualism that is central in the arguments for the moral status of animals. Rather than identifying intrinsic or innate properties that non-humans share with humans, properties that are thought to be morally valuable in themselves, some feminists have argued instead that we ought to understand moral status in relational terms given that moral recognition is invariably a social practice. As Elizabeth Anderson has written: “Moral considerability is not an intrinsic property of any creature, nor is it supervenient on only its intrinsic properties, such as its capacities. It depends, deeply, on the kind of relations they can have with us” (Anderson, 2004, 289).

Similarly ecological feminists have also argued that the standard approaches to determining the moral status of animals are flawed. For these critics, the focus on individuals in isolation from their context fails to capture the political structures, particularly the structures of power, that underlie current practices in which animals are used. According to some eco-feminists there is a conceptual link between the “logic of domination” that operates to reinforce sexism and the logic that supports the oppression of non-human animals, a link that translates into individual and institutional practices that are harmful to both women and animals. Gender hierarchies, in which men are thought to be separate from and superior to women share the same structure, according to this analysis, as hierarchies that separate humans from other animals and justify human dominance over the allegedly inferior others. According to an ecological feminist perspective, differences between groups and individuals can be acknowledged without attributing greater or lesser moral worth to those groups or individuals within them and just social relations require that such valuations be avoided. Like many social justice perspectives, the eco-feminist perspective maintains that no one will be free unless everyone is free, and that includes non-human animals. (See, for example, Gaard 1993.)

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