Occasionalism

First published Mon Oct 20, 2008

We live in a world that seems to be brimming with causal activity. I push the keys on my keyboard, and letters appear on the screen. Outside the wind blows leaves across the patio. The ringing of the phone cuts short my idling thoughts.

Philosophers have long wondered about the nature of causality. Are there true causes at work in the world, and, if so, what makes them the causes they are? How do causes bring things about, and what kind of connection does a cause have to its effect? These questions took on another level of complexity when various religious and theological considerations were brought to bear on these issues. For instance, philosophers came to question how divine causal activity is to be understood, particularly, in relation to the natural causality of creatures. It is from this context, in which questions about the nature of causation intermixed with questions about the relation between divine and natural causality, that occasionalism emerged. Occasionalism attempts to address these questions by presenting as its core thesis the claim that God is the one and only true cause. In the words of the most famous occasionalist of the Western philosophical tradition, Nicolas Malebranche, “there is only one true cause because there is only one true God; …the nature or power of each thing is nothing but the will of God; … all natural causes are not true causes but only occasional causes” (OCM II, 312 / Search 448) A full-blown occasionalist, then, might be described as one who subscribes to the following two tenets: (1) the positive thesis that God is the only genuine cause; (2) the negative thesis that no creaturely cause is a genuine cause but at most an occasional cause. Not all philosophers who have been identified as occasionalists, however, were full-blown occasionalists in this sense, since some argued that only a limited subset of creatures lack causal powers, and thus affirmed the causal efficacy of other creatures. In addition to this issue of the scope of occasionalism, we will, in the following sections, examine how these core theses of occasionalism address the issues aforementioned and what arguments are presented in their favor. We begin, however, with a brief discussion about its history.


1. The History of Occasionalism

1.1 Islamic Occasionalism

Though the term “occasional cause” has been suggested as originating with the French philosopher Louis de la Forge (Carraud 2002, 347), the first philosophers to explicitly expound the position were the Islamic occasionalists. Our brief discussion here will not be able to do justice to its complex and rich development, but Islamic occasionalism seems to have emerged when the theologians of the Ash’arite school of kalām (Islamic doctrinal theology) began to consider the implications of the systematic reinterpretation, development, and integration of Aristotelianism and Neo-Platonism that occurred within the Islamic intellectual world in the tenth and eleventh centuries (cf. Adamson, P. & Taylor, R.C. 2005, 4–6). Among these Islamic occasionalists, al-Ash’ari (873–935), the founder of Ash’arite school, appears to have been particularly influential (Griffel 2007).

If al-Ash’ari was the first of the Islamic occasionalists, it was al-Ghazālī (c.1055-1111), the great philosopher and theologian of the Ash’arite school, who presented some of the most significant and influential arguments for occasionalism in his influential work, The Incoherence of the Philosophers (Tahâfut al-falâsifa). This work has long been the source of the interpretation that al-Ghazālī himself was a committed occasionalist, but recent interpretations have challenged this view, arguing that al-Ghazālī's goal simply is to defend the possibility of miracles against the claims of the falâsifa, and that he leaves open the possibility of some kind of genuine causality in creatures (Griffel 2007). Notwithstanding this issue of whether al-Ghazālī was an occasionalist or not, no one doubts that al-Ghazālī found some key views of the falâsifa Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā, 980–1037) problematic and worthy of criticism. In particular, it seems to have been Avicenna's “Aristotelian” approach to creaturely natures and powers that was most problematic for al-Ghazālī in rendering consistent with Ash’arite kalām.[1] The main point of tension seems to stem from the Avicennan view that, given the natures or essences of creatures, there are causally necessitating relations between creaturely causes and their effects such that the creaturely cause necessarily brings about the effect. Al-Ghazālī took this view to be in tension with the doctrinal claim that theological orthodoxy requires the possibility of miracles, which consist in the divine interruption of the ordinary course of events in nature. Thus, what worried al-Ghazālī most is the idea that if creatures genuinely necessitate their effects, this would seem to imply that even in the face of divine miraculous intervention, the natural effects would follow from the cause. But such an implication was unacceptable for those holding the standard understanding of divine omnipotence, which al-Ghazālī and other philosophers of the Ash’arite theological tradition thought to be essential to kalām. In addition to this theologically motivated argument, al-Ghazālī's criticism of causally necessitating relations between creaturely causes and effects also incorporates his distinctive views on the modal relations between distinct entities or facts, according to which “the connection between what is habitually believed to be a cause and what is habitually believed to be an effect is not necessary” (TF 170) Al-Ghazālī's central claim, as we will examine in more detail later, was that “each of the two things has its own individuality and is not the other, and neither the affirmation nor the negation, neither the existence nor the non-existence of the one is implied in the affirmation, negation, existence, and non-existence of the other” (Weinberg 1964, 123).[2]

We end this section with the observation that the main disagreement between those who regard al-Ghazālī as an occasionalist and those who do not seems to rest on whether they take al-Ghazālī to have accepted the principle that a genuine cause must causally necessitate its effect. Those who argue for the occasionalist reading of al-Ghazālī appear to regard him as committed to this principle, while their opponents (such as Griffel) argue that al-Ghazālī is not fully committed to this principle. If al-Ghazālī is indeed committed to this principle, then given that al-Ghazālī only grants such causally necessitating powers to God, he would be committed to denying any causal powers in creature. In contrast, if al-Ghazālī does not think that genuine causality implies that the cause causally necessitates the effect, then he would in effect be making room for a different conception of causation, one that is distinct from divine causality, the unique causally necessitating power. This different conception of cause would allow for genuine secondary causality in that creaturely causes would be real causes on this alternative conception, despite the fact that they do not causally necessitate their effects.

1.2 Medieval Christian Europe

The criticism of positing “necessary connections” between creaturely powers and their alleged effects also emerged in medieval Christian Europe, most notably, in the work of Nicholas of Autrecourt (1300—d. after 1350). Autrecourt was a precursor to the general criticism of Scholasticism that swept through Europe in the early modern period, and his critique of our alleged knowledge of causal connections was part of his overall project of critically examining the various knowledge claims within natural philosophy that were central to Aristotelian scholasticism. But his criticisms might have been too radical for his time, for he was summoned to the Curia at Avignon to answer charges of error and heresy, and in 1347 his writings were publicly burned. He himself is said to have been banned from lecturing (Weinberg 1962, 267).

Sources suggest that Autrecourt was acquainted with the arguments set forth by al-Ghazālī (cf. Wolfson 1969, 234-8). Thus, it is no surprise that Autrecourt presents various arguments that are reminiscent of al-Ghazālī's. For instance, like al-Ghazālī, Autrecourt in one formulation of his criticism of necessary connections relies on a dictum that the existence of one thing cannot be logically inferred from the existence of another thing (Weinburg 1964, 272). Hence Autrecourt held that, unless there were overwhelming reasons to the contrary, the default position should be to assume the lack of logically necessary connections between two distinct entities.

We should note, however, that the overall focus of Autrecourt's project was to persuade us that our various judgments about the natural world, including those concerning genuine causal connections, lack certainty, and that we thus ought to suspend judgment in such matters. And it is with this goal in mind that he presented a variety of epistemological, metaphysical, and theological arguments to support this skeptical stance toward affirming genuine causality among creatures. Therefore, while Autrecourt's arguments much resemble the arguments deployed by occasionalists, it is far from clear that Autrecourt himself was an occasionalist. For his overall attitude seems to have been closer to that of a skeptic, in contrast to the “dogmatic” position of the occasionalists, who unequivocally denied creaturely causation and affirmed divine causation. In this respect, the often quoted epithet that Autrecourt was “the fourteenth-century Hume” seems rather appropriate (Nadler 1996, 458). Thus, in the Western philosophical tradition, occasionalists in the proper sense of the term emerge in earnest in the wake of René Descartes (1596–1650) in the form of “Cartesian occasionalists”. [3]

1.3 Descartes and the Cartesian Occasionalists (Louis de la Forge, Géraud de Cordemoy, and Arnold Geulincx)

The issue of whether Descartes himself was an occasionalist has been the subject of some debate. Given how many prominent Cartesians were indeed occasionalists, it is not surprising that Descartes has been suggested as the source of this new wave of occasionalism that swept through the European continent in the second half of the seventeenth century. Some interpreters, accordingly, have held that, while perhaps not fully endorsing occasionalism across the board, Descartes did hold occasionalist views with regard to extended substances, or bodies. In other words, according to these interpreters, Descartes denied that bodies acted on either other bodies or minds.[4] Others disagree and have argued, for instance, that in cases of body-body interaction, Descartes affirmed the genuine causal powers of extended substances.[5] Note that, given the general framework of Cartesian dualism, four types of causal interaction among finite substances are usually considered: (1) body-body causation, where one extended substance affects another; (2) body-mind causation, where bodily changes bring about changes in the mind; (3) mind-body causation, where the direction of causation is reverse to that of body-mind causation, and certain thoughts or volitions bring about changes in bodies; (4) intra-mental causation, where various forms of mental activity, such as producing ideas, are considered as typical cases. It is within this framework that the respective positions about causation, occasionalist or not, can be identified.

Cases (2) and (3) have received much attention from the general philosophical audience. This phenomenon stems as far back to Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia (see her astute exchange with Descartes in AT III 663–8 (CSM III, 218)). As we can see in Elisabeth's correspondence, from the beginning much of the focus has been directed at the issue of how or even whether two radically different substances can causally interact. And this attention has at times led to the caricature of occasionalism as an ad hoc solution to this problem for Cartesian dualists. But, as we have already seen and will further see, the scope and depth of the issues surrounding the emergence of occasionalism make it clear that this depiction is indeed a caricature at best.

In contrast to the situation concerning Descartes’ alleged commitment to occasionalism, there is no disagreement in the case of Nicolas Malebranche, whose works provide some of the most extensive and important discussions of occasionalism. Thus, his arguments will be the topic of further examination. But in addition to Malebranche, there were a number of other Cartesians, prior to Malebranche, that presented a variety of views indicative of the occasionalist current in the 1660's. Among these Cartesians, the French physician and philosopher Louis de la Forge (1632–66), the Parisian lawyer and philosopher Géraud de Cordemoy (1614–83), and the Dutch philosopher Arnold Geulincx (1624–69) are the most prominent.

In the case of La Forge, his credentials as an occasionalist about the causal efficacy of extended substances or bodies has never been in doubt. In fact, as noted earlier, it is La Forge who has been suggested to have first employed the expression “occasional cause” in his Traité de l’esprit de l’homme (Carraud 2002, 347), where he argues that bodies are merely the “remote and occasional” causes of our ideas of them (TEH 132–4). Some interpreters have argued that La Forge's occasionalism extended to minds as well and thus was a global occasionalist (Prost 1907, ch.6; Bouillier 1865, vol. 1, 503, 513; cf. Nadler 1993b, 60, especially footnote 11), but others have argued against this view (Bardout 2002, 145; Nadler 1993b, 60–61). The case for restricting the scope of La Forge's occasionalism to only extended substances seems well grounded, if we take into consideration such texts as the following: “All of our ideas considered in themselves in so far as they are only different ways of thinking, need … no cause for their production other than our mind” (TEH 177; cf. Nadler 1993b, 65).

La Forge's work is also significant in that he seems to have been the first in this period to present an argument for occasionalism on the basis of how God conserves an extended substance in existence. This argument puts particular emphasis on the fact that God must not only “continue to produce [a body], if he wants to preserve it in existence; but, in addition, because he cannot create it everywhere nor outside of any particular place, he must himself put it in a place” (TEH 241; cf. Nadler 1993b, 63; Nadler 1998, 219). As we shall see, this argument bears a strong resemblance to Malebranche's most persuasive argument for global occasionalism, the “conservation is but continuous creation” argument.

Géraud de Cordemoy's work appears to have had a direct influence on Malebranche, as Malebranche himself acknowledges in the Search (OCM I 123/Search 49; Nadler 2005, 38; cf. Gouhier 1926 95ff.; Battail 1973, 146ff.). Though there has been some disagreement about the scope of Cordemoy's occasionalism, the consensus seems to be that he was a global occasionalist, denying causal efficacy to both minds and bodies. Thus, in this respect, he is a precursor to Malebranche. Cordemoy is also known for a rather distinctive argument for why bodies are not real causes, one that employs the controversial premise that the motion of a body can be continued only by the causal agent that initiated it (Discernement 135–36; cf. Nadler 2005, 42). Based on the observation that bodies do not self-initiate movement, Cordemoy argues that bodies thus need to be set into motion by a non-material first mover (Nadler 2005, 42). But given the aforementioned premise, any subsequent movement of bodies can only be continued by the causal agent that initially moved them, which leads to the occasionalist conclusion that God is the cause of all bodily motion. This argument seems to be related to a slightly different argument employed by Malebranche to argue for the same conclusion—that is, the lack of causal efficacy of extended substances. This latter argument, which emphasizes the passivity or passive nature of bodies, is one of Malebranche's favorites and will be examined in more detail later.

Arnold Geulincx's most distinctive contribution to the development of occasionalism comes in the form of a causal principle that puts an epistemic restriction on the exercise of genuine causality (see Nadler 1999, 268). In his Metaphysica vera, Geulincx states that “it is impossible to bring about something when one does not know how it is brought about…you are not the cause of that which you do not know how to bring about (impossibile est, ut is faciat, qui nescit quomodo fiat … quod nescis quomodo fiat, id non facis)” (MV 150–1). If restricted to the causality of rational, intentional agents, the principle seems to have some intuitive appeal. But Geulincx, interestingly enough, does not restrict the principle in this way. Rather, he takes it to be universally applicable, even to bodily causes, which has raised questions about the plausibility of this overall argument. Malebranche appears to be taking up a version of this principle, which we will discuss later in the section on the “no representation” argument.

1.4 Nicolas Malebranche

Given Malebranche's influence on the development of occasionalism, a substantial portion of the section on the arguments for occasionalism will be devoted Malebranche's views. Here we simply note that Malebranche appears to have been committed to occasionalism from early on in his philosophical career, since his occasionalism emerges clearly in his first major work, The Search for Truth (De la recherche de la vérité, 1674–75). In addition to the Search, Malebranche in the Elucidations to the Search presents a long defense of his occasionalism against objections. And in the Dialogues we get Malebranche's second major work to discuss the thesis of occasionalism centrally. Whether or in what way Malebranche's views were influenced by earlier occasionalists, as discussed earlier, will not be centrally addressed here, given the limitations of space.[6] We will however compare some of Malebranche's arguments with his predecessors when relevant.

1.5 Berkeley

The extent of George Berkeley's occasionalism is also a matter of some controversy. But there is general agreement among interpreters that Berkeley was an occasionalist with regard to the causal powers of physical objects. In other words, physical objects for Berkeley are not causally active in bringing about any events in the world. This denial is not surprising, if we consider the nature of physical objects in Berkeley's ontological scheme, along with his views about the passivity of ideas. For, according to Berkeley, physical objects, properly understood, are but bundles or collections of ideas, and ideas are manifestly passive—no power or activity is perceived in them (PHK 25).[7]

In De Motu, Berkeley also argues for the causal passivity of bodies in a more traditional manner, where he does not rely on his views about the nature of physical objects as collections of ideas:

Today indeed Cartesian philosophers recognize God as the principle of natural motions. And Newton everywhere frankly intimates that not only did motion originate from God, but that still the mundane system is moved by the same action. This is agreeable to Holy Scripture; this is approved by the opinion of the Schoolmen; for though the Peripatetics tell us that nature is the principle of motion and rest, yet they interpret natura naturans to be God. They understand of course that all the bodies of this mundane system are moved by Almighty Mind according to a settled and unchanging plan. (De Motu 32)

Modern thinkers consider motion and rest in bodies as two states of existence in either of which every body, without pressure from external force, would naturally remain passive; whence one might gather that the cause of the existence of bodies is also the cause of their motion and rest. For no other cause of the successive existence of the body in different parts of space should be sought, it would seem, than that cause whence is derived the successive existence of the same body in different parts of time. (De Motu 34)

Here Berkeley seems to be arguing that the proper understanding of how God relates to bodies and their motion would naturally lead us to conclude that all bodies are causally passive. The passive nature of bodies in this argument does not depend on their status as collections of ideas, but rather follows from the fact that the cause of the existence of bodies is identical to the cause of the motion and rest of bodies, namely, God. In the background appears to be the widely held theological principle that “conservation is but continuous creation”, which, as we shall see, was most forcefully presented by Malebranche.

Despite this clear occasionalist stance toward physical objects, Berkeley firmly maintains that spirits, both infinite and finite, are causally active. The affirmation of the causal efficacy of finite spirits or minds like us raises questions about consistency, since the “conservation is but continuous creation” principle, which seems to be doing the work in Berkeley's occasionalist claims in De Motu, is typically thought to be applicable universally, without discriminating between minds and bodies. Moreover, the exact nature of the causal activity of finite spirits has been a topic of interest to interpreters of Berkeley's views.[8]

2. Occasionalism in Context

Before examining the actual arguments for occasionalism, it might be helpful to compare and contrast occasionalism with alternative, competing accounts of causation that aim to address similar issues and concerns. The comparison can be done in two ways, since occasionalism can be seen as dealing with two distinct issues concerning causation.

2.1 Cartesian Interactionism, Pre-established Harmony, and Occasionalism

One way to view occasionalism is to see it as one of three possible responses to the aforementioned problem of mind-body interaction. The other two responses would be “Cartesian interactionism” and Leibniz's “pre-established harmony.”

Faced with the issue of accounting for the apparent phenomena of mind-body interaction, those who subscribed to “Cartesian interactionism” (following Williams 1978, 287; Williams actually describes the situation as a “scandal”) held that the causal interaction is not merely apparent but real. In other words, changes in the body and mind really bring about changes in each other. But many found this position deeply unsatisfying. Some raised questions about whether it was intelligible that such radically distinct substances with nothing in common causally interacted, and others questioned whether such a view was consistent with the view that was gaining popularity, namely, that the material universe is causally closed and governed solely by physical laws of nature. Whether or not Descartes actually held this interactionist position is, as discussed earlier, a matter of controversy, but even in Descartes’ time the list of the critics of interactionism was a long one.

Occasionalism and pre-established harmony emerged as alternatives to the model of interactionism, in rejecting that there is genuine causal interaction. In fact, their denial of real causal interaction among distinct finite substances is not limited to mind-body interaction but applies across all board, be it body-body or mind-body causation. In other words, both views can be said to deny all inter-substantial causation, where by “substance” we refer to finite substances or creatures.[9] However, occasionalism and pre-established parted ways when it came to the question of intra-substantial causation—that is, whether or not there is causal activity going on within the substances such that finite substances are active in causing their own states. Leibniz, the principal proponent of pre-established harmony, held firm to the view that, while finite substances do not have the causal power to bring about changes in other substances, they are causally active internally, that is, in causing their own states. Each creature causally contributes to the occurrence of its own states, and the apparent interaction between distinct substances is due to how the states of distinct substances harmonize with each other. Malebranche, in contrast, denied all causal powers to creatures, including the intra-substantial powers endorsed by Leibniz. For Malebranche, even the internal states of a creature are mere occasions for God to bring about the relevant subsequent states.

2.2 Mere Conservationism, Divine Concurrentism, and Occasionalism

The other issue that occasionalism addresses is one that concerns how divine causality relates to natural causality, or as Alfred Freddoso has put it, “the general problem of divine action in nature” (Freddoso 1994, 131–5). The problem, as Freddoso notes, consists of the following questions: if God ultimately is the first and direct cause of everything, including whatever occurs and exists in nature, can there be any causal activity on the part of creatures?; and if there is secondary causation, how does this causal activity fit in with God's causal activity? In response to these questions, historically, three positions have appeared: “conservationism,” “concurrentism,” and “occasionalism.”

We might distinguish the three positions by the degree of causal activity assigned to God and the creature respectively, when a natural event takes place. At one end is conservationism, which keeps divine causal involvement to a minimum. According to conservationism, while God conserves substances with their powers in existence, when creatures are causally active in bringing about their natural effects, God's contribution is remote or indirect. In other words, God's causal contribution consists in merely conserving the being or esse of the creature in question along with its power, and the causal activity of the creature is in some straightforward sense the creature's own and not God's (Freddoso 1991, 554). At the other end is occasionalism, where divine causal activity is maximal and creaturely causal activity is non-existent, since divine causal activity is the only type of genuine causality. Creatures provide at most an occasion for God's activity, which is direct and immediate in bringing about all effects in nature. Concurrentism (or “divine concurrentism”) can then be seen as occupying the middle ground. Concurrentists hold that when a natural effect is produced, it is immediately caused by both God and the creature. God and the creature are both directly involved and “concur” in bringing about the natural effects typically attributed to the creature.[10]

3. The Arguments for Occasionalism

In this section, we will examine in more detail the main arguments in support of occasionalism. We will focus on the arguments provided by Malebranche and discuss relevant versions by other occasionalists when appropriate.[11]

3.1 The Passive Nature Argument

The “passive nature” (hereafter “PN”) argument aims to establish the occasionalist conclusion for bodies—that is, Cartesian extended substances—and only bodies by focusing on the characteristic features of these substances. In this respect, the argument appears to be an instance of a “local” argument for occasionalism in that the scope of the argument is limited to a particular type of substance. The argument aims to establish the occasionalist conclusion for some finite substances, that is, bodies, and not all substances.

The first passages that stress the lack of activity of bodies as well as their lack of ability to initiate movement emerge in the Search (OCM II 312–3/Search 448), soon after Malebranche's first statement of his occasionalist thesis. In the Elucidations, mixed together with the claim that the “motor force of bodies is but the will of God,” we are presented with the following description of bodies as being “purely passive substances”:

When I see one ball strike another, my eyes … seem to tell me, that the one is truly the cause of the motion it impresses on the other… . But when I consult my reason I clearly see that since bodies cannot move themselves, and since their motor force is but the will of God that conserves them successively in different places, they cannot communicate a power they do not have and could not communicate even if it were in their possession. For the mind will never conceive that one body, a purely passive substance, can in any way whatsoever transmit to another body the power transporting it. (OCM III 208–9/Search 660, my emphasis)

But why are bodies purely passive substances? The answer, according to Malebranche, lies in our idea of extension:

Consult the idea of extension and decide by this idea which represents bodies… whether they can have any property other than the passive faculty of receiving various figures and movements. Is it not entirely obvious that all the properties of extension can consist only in relations of distance? (OCM XII 150–51/Dialogues 106, my emphasis)

The central point seems as follows: given that all the properties of extension are exhausted by relations of distance, it would be a category mistake, as it were, to ascribe powers to bodies. Powers or forces are not properties that bodies can have at all, since powers do not consist in relations of distance. That something possesses a motive force and, thus, moves a body or affects a mind would entail that the thing in question is not a body, since there would be more to this thing than relations of distance. The key premise here is that causal powers or forces are not relations of distance and, hence, not modes that bodies possess. This assumption gets expressed more explicitly in the following argument, which reinforces the understanding of bodily “passivity” as the body's being constituted by relations of distance alone:

But that bodies should receive in themselves a certain power, by the efficacy of which they could act on the mind—this I do not understand. For what would this power be? Would it be a substance, or a modality? If a substance, then bodies will not act, but rather this substance in bodies. If this power is a modality, then there will be a modality in bodies which will be neither motion nor figure. Extension will be capable of having modalities other than relations of distance. (OCM XII 151/Dialogues 107)

With the help of the commonly accepted Scholastic assumption that any real being must either be a substance or mode, Malebranche presents a rather clever argument that active powers have no place in bodies (see Clatterbaugh 1999, 114–5). One might wonder what would be so bad with the first option—that is, that of granting the existence of a separate, distinct substance in bodies responsible for the bodies’ activity. But Malebranche's response is clear: even if we bracket the worry of whether we could have a sufficiently clear idea of what kind of thing this substance would be, it is unlikely that this substance would be a Cartesian extended substance. For it would possess modes or properties other than relations of distance. And in discussing why the second option is going to fail, we see the explicit statement that, though an active power perhaps could be a mode of some other substance, it is not a mode that belongs to bodies, since forces or powers are not relations of distance.[12]

But is it obvious that powers or forces are not relations of distance? This question along with the questions about how powers or forces relate to the more obvious properties of extension—for instance, size and shape—raise interesting and important questions that go to the heart of the PN argument. I believe that the main intuitive thrust behind Malebranche's PN argument is to convince the reader that, if we understand the Cartesian conception of matter or extension properly, we can see that motive force or power is neither necessary nor sufficient for being an extended substance.[13] This view seem rather close to Descartes’ original insight that having specific spatial features and standing in particular spatial relations to other bodies are both necessary and sufficient conditions to be a bodily substance,[14] and Malebranche takes this to imply that whether these bodies further possess a motive force is an issue peripheral to the basic nature of bodies. Such a view seems to be expressed in his discussion of motion and rest in the Search:

I am not considering motion and rest here according to their relative being: for it is obvious that bodies at rest have relations just as real to those around them as those in motion. I conceive only that bodies in motion have a motor force, and that those at rest have no force for their state of rest, because the relation of moving bodies to those around them is always changing; and therefore there has to be a continuous force producing these continuous changes, for in effect it is these changes which cause everything new that happens in nature. But there need be no force to make nothing happen. When the relation of a body to those around it is always the same, nothing happens; and the preservation of this relation, I mean the action of God's will that preserves this relation, is no different from what preserves the body itself. (OCM II 431–32/Search 517)

Here we get the impression that Malebranche is thinking that motive force is something additional or added on, as it were, to bodies, and that, in this respect, there is a fundamental difference between the two modes of motion and rest. In other words, whatever causal contribution is needed on the part of God to bring bodies into existence, there needs to be an additional causal contribution on the part of God in the form of a motive force to bring about changes in relations of distance, which occur when bodies are moved. It is as if the default mode of existence for extended substances is to be at rest, and motive force is added on through another divine volition, one that is distinct from the volition that brings the body into existence in the first place.[15] If so, this understanding of motion and rest fits well with the PN argument: motive force is not essential to extension because motive force is not only not a relation of distance but rather some additional feature that is added on to bodies, which are by default at rest and passive.

We end this section with the observation that Malebranche's views on motion and rest just discussed seems to be at odds with one of his global arguments for occasionalism, in particular, the CCC argument. For the CCC argument strongly suggests a symmetry between God's act of continuously creating a body at rest and continuously creating a body in motion, since the latter is described as differing from the former only in that in the latter case, God continuously creates the body in different locations over time.

3.2 The No Knowledge Argument

The “no knowledge” (hereafter “NK”) argument aims to secure the occasionalist conclusion by presenting an intriguing, if controversial, epistemic condition on causal agency.[16] As noted earlier, Geulincx had argued that “you are not the cause of that which you do not know how to bring about” (MV 2 150–1). Malebranche presents his version of the argument in numerous places, including the following passage from the Elucidations, where he denies that our minds are true causes, based on our lack of knowledge of the intended effects:

But I deny that my will is the true cause of my arm's movement, of my mind's ideas, and of other things accompanying my volitions, for I see no relation whatever between such different things. I even see clearly that there can be no relation between the volition I have to move my arm and the agitation of the animal spirits, i.e., of certain tiny bodies whose motion and figure I do not know and which choose certain nerve canals from a million others I do not know in order to cause in me the motion I desire through an infinity of movements I do not desire. (OCM III 226/Search 669)

Though not explicitly stated, many commentators have read Malebranche as endorsing, in places such as this passage, the claim that the agent must know how to bring about the effect in order to be its cause.

This “knowledge principle” (hereafter “KP”) raises a number of questions. One question concerns the scope of its applicability. For the principle to be plausible, it might be thought, one ought to restrict it to intelligent, volitional agents. As long as we accept the traditional conception of the will as being “blind” and dependent on the guidance of the intellect, we might think that there is something to be said for the claim that we can only bring about what we know. In other words, bringing about a volitional effect seems to presuppose intending the effect, and we seem to only intend what we, through our intellect, actually represent or know. While most commentators seem to favor reading Malebranche as restricting the knowledge principle to minds, there is, as Steven Nadler has argued, at least one passage that seems to suggest that Malebranche is endorsing the wide scope applicability of KP (Conversations Chrétiennes, OCM 4:15–6). And, as Nadler has also pointed out, Geulincx and some Islamic occasionalists indeed pressed the view that the principle applies ubiquitously to all cases of genuine efficacy (Nadler 1999, 263–74).

If Geulincx and Al-Ghazālī (and, arguably, even Malebranche) did hold KP to be applicable to chairs and rocks as well as thinking substances, our next question then would be why they would hold such a counter-intuitive view. Nadler has made the interesting suggestion that the wide-scope application of KP could have been motivated by the view that takes “volitional agency to be the paradigm of causality” (Nadler 1999, 270). Why take volitional agency to be paradigmatic? According to Nadler, the critical link is divine causal activity, which was the paradigmatic case of causality for the occasionalists in question. For if we take God's causal activity to be fundamentally intentional and volitional in character, then it seems indeed a short step to taking volitional agency to be also paradigmatic of causality.

That the occasionalist would take divine causality to be the paradigm case, of course, is no surprise, and this might indeed explain why Geulincx and Al-Ghazālī held the wide-scope view. For, if they further assumed that all cases of genuine causation resemble the paradigmatic case of causation in this way, then insofar as KP is a critical feature of divine causality, they would think that KP should be satisfied in all cases of creaturely causation. This last assumption, however, is not trivial. For one wonders whether creaturely causation ought to resemble divine causation in this respect. Consider the fact that not all the features of the paradigmatic divine substance are replicated in created substances. In particular, knowledge and intentionality are key divine features that are not present in bodily substances. But this absence does not prevent extended substances from being the substances they are. But if knowledge and intentionality are not necessary for substancehood as a body, we might wonder whether they are necessary for causal activity in bodies.

The second question about KP concerns the plausibility of the principle itself. Even if we just consider the best case scenarios—that is, when its application is restricted to thinking substances, it is not obvious that KP is without problems. As mentioned earlier, on the assumption that volitional power is blind, the requirement that the intentional agent possess some degree of knowledge of the effect does not seem completely implausible. The key issue, however, concerns the level of detail in the description of the intended outcome that is required for KP to be satisfied. For instance, returning to Malebranche's example, when I will to raise my arm, I do seem to represent the outcome of my arm going up, insofar as the description of this outcome is left at a fairly general level. It is obvious, however, that I do not have knowledge of the outcome, if the description of the outcome is at the level of detail that Malebranche wants it to be, such that it would involve the movements of the minute components of my arm, such as the minute organic matter making up the muscle, nerves, bones, etc. So depending on the level of description, one might think that I do satisfy KP. For the NK argument to work, then, Malebranche has to restrict the description of outcomes in KP to the highest level of detail. And it is not clear that Malebranche can provide non-question begging reasons to support this restriction.

3.3 The “No Necessary Connection” (NNC) Argument[17]

As noted earlier, the criticism of positing necessary connections between creaturely powers and their effects first emerges in the work of al-Ghazālī. In the “Seventeenth Discussion” of The Incoherence of the Philosophers, al-Ghazālī writes:

The connection between what is habitually believed to be a cause and what is habitually believed to be an effect is not necessary, according to us. But [with] any two things, where “this” is not “that” and “that” is not “this,” and where neither the affirmation of the one entails the affirmation of the other nor the negation of the one entails the negation of the other, it is not a necessity of the existence of the one that the other should exist, and it is not a necessity of the nonexistence of the one that the other should not exist—for example, the quenching of thirst and drinking, satiety and eating, burning and contact with fire, light and the appearance of the sun, death and decapitation, healing and the drinking of medicine, the purging of the bowels and the using of a purgative, and so on to [include] all [that is] observable among connected things in medicine, astronomy, arts, and crafts. Their connection is due to the prior decree of God, who creates them side by side, not to its being necessary in itself, incapable of separation. On the contrary, it is within [divine] power to create satiety without eating, to create death without decapitation, to continue life after decapitation, and so on to all connected things. The philosophers denied the possibility of [this] and claimed it to be impossible. (TF 170)

Al-Ghazālī's target is the “Aristotelian philosopher”, exemplified by Avicenna, who affirms strict causal necessitation relations between creaturely causes and their effects. A central motivation behind this criticism is to secure the possibility of miracles reported in the Qur’ân and the prophetic traditions that were considered impossible by these philosophers (TF 166; cf. Marmura 2005, 146).

According to al-Ghazālī, the proper understanding of divine omnipotence dictates that no limitation on divine power is justified, unless the state of affairs impermeable to divine power is one that is logically inconsistent. In other words, it is within divine power to bring about any state of affairs except for those that are logically inconsistent—for instance, where I both exist and not exist:

The impossible is not within the power [of being enacted]. The impossible consists in affirming a thing conjointly with denying it, affirming the more specific while denying the more general, or affirming two things while negating one [of them]. What does not reduce to this is not impossible, and what is not impossible is within [divine] power. (TF 179)

Given the examples in TF 170, we see that al-Ghazālī does not take the state of affairs in which, say, a burning fire does not burn a dry piece of cotton to be impossible. For, according to al-Ghazālī, there is no logical entailment relation between the cotton coming into contact with the fire and its burning. Hence, it is logically consistent to suppose that cotton not burn when it comes into contact with fire.

The interesting question is how the Aristotelian philosopher would respond to this claim. Why couldn’t Avicenna simply deny that this state of affairs is possible in that the suggestion of fire not burning cotton indeed is logically inconsistent, given their respective natures or essences? In other words, why couldn’t the Aristotelian philosopher contest the non-entailment claim and argue that the essences of fire and cotton along with the event of their coming into contact do entail the event of the cotton burning?

As we can see in the long quote from TF 170 and other passages in The Incoherence (e.g. TF 1), the operative conception of entailment for al-Ghazālī appears to that of “conceptual” entailment, where the concepts of “fire” and “cotton” are rather sparse in terms of content. Whatever content is contained in these concepts, they are still sparse enough to not entail such facts as “the burning of appropriately dry cotton that comes into contact with fire.” In other words, the causal powers typically identified as being part of the essences of created substances, something the Aristotelian philosophers would have found very hard to resist, are not built into the concepts, as it were, for al-Ghazālī.

In this case, the main issue of contention between al-Ghazālī and the falâsifa would concern how rich the contents of the concepts of creatures are. What al-Ghazālī needs is a rather thin notion of what a concept or essence of a creature is, while the Aristotelian philosopher would obviously argue for a richer understanding of the contents of these concepts, one that would include various causal powers as their essences. A key intuition driving al-Ghazālī's view seems to be that if one takes the concepts of creatures to be rich in this way, then there is no logical space for the miraculous intervention on the part of God. For on the Aristotelian scheme, divine intervention such as God's keeping the cotton from burning would imply that either God has to change the cotton into something else at the time of intervention,[18] or that God has to done something that is logically inconsistent, or impossible.

Neither option seems palatable to Al-Ghazālī, and his innovative proposal is to distinguish between logical connections and causal connections. On al-Ghazālī's scheme, the logically necessary constitute a much narrower set of connections that those that are causally necessary (Dutton 2001, 24–5; Schmaltz 2008b, 299–301). This setup allows him to claim that when God intervenes to stop a piece of dry cotton from burning, which obviously diverges from the natural course of events, God need not change the cotton fibers into some material that is fire-resistant, nor is he doing something that is logically impossible. Rather, God is bringing about a state of affairs that is perfectly consistent, hence, possible, but one that is exceptional to the normal type of causal connections we come to expect between fire and cotton.

But what then grounds these normal types of causal connections that we typically anticipate? If they are not grounded in the natures or essences of things, what is their source? As we saw in the long quote from TF 170, al-Ghazālī not surprisingly holds that “[t]heir connection is due to the prior decree of God, who creates them side by side, not to its being necessary in itself, incapable of separation.” In other words, the law-like relations that we typically think to hold between creaturely natures are actually grounded in divine decrees.

The question of whether al-Ghazālī himself is committed to occasionalism depends on whether al-Ghazālī regards this claim that the “connection [between creatures] is due to the prior decree of God” to be incompatible with there being real secondary causation—that is, genuine creaturely causation. As noted earlier, interpreters disagree on this issue. Some, such as Marmura, argue that al-Ghazālī did find the two claims to be inconsistent, and rejects the latter claim that there are real secondary causes. Marmura grants that the texts in the Incoherence are insufficient to support this claim, but argues that other texts well establish al-Ghazālī's commitment to occasionalism (Marmura 2005, 145–52). Other interpreters, such as Griffel as well as Perler and Rudolph, have argued that al-Ghazālī leaves open the possibility that God's causal activity is consistent with some form of genuine secondary causality, on the condition that the secondary causation in question is not of the type espoused by the falâsifa (Griffel 2007; Perler & Rudolph 2000, 75–77).

We end our discussion of al-Ghazālī on necessary connections with the following observation: if al-Ghazālī does consider genuine secondary causation to be consistent with the divine causal activity, he would have to concede that there are distinct types of causation. For al-Ghazālī would have granted that the causal connection between the decree of God and its effect is substantially different from the causal connection between a creaturely cause and its effect. The former type of connection would be the strongest of all possible causal connections, since divine omnipotence would require that for all events that are logically possible, should God decree their occurrence, they would come about with causal necessity. In contrast, creaturely causes obviously lack this omnipotent power, such that whatever causal connection they have to their effects, it cannot be, in principle, as strong as that of divine decree. So this suggests that the strength of the causal connection would differ substantially between divine causation and secondary causation, and this difference might lead one to wonder these two types of causation can be brought under a single, univocal notion of causation.

In the work of Nicolas Malebranche, to whom we now turn, we are presented with an explicit argument denying secondary causation on the grounds that (1) something is a true cause if and only if there is a necessary connection between it and its effect and (2) there are necessary connections only between the will of God and its effects. Consider the following passage from the Search:

A true cause as I understand it is one such that the mind perceives a necessary connection between it and its effect. Now the mind perceives a necessary connection only between the will of an infinitely perfect being and its effects. Therefore, it is only God who is the true cause and who truly has the power to move bodies. (OCM II 316/Search 450)

Though the argument clearly is couched in terms of perceiving necessary connections, the overall context makes it clear the central point is more metaphysical in nature. Malebranche's key point here is that there are no causally necessary connections between alleged creaturely causes and their effects, since creaturely causes cannot but fall short of the criterion of genuine causation, that is, necessary efficaciousness.[19]

Why is it that creaturely causes cannot but fall short in this way? According to Malebranche, this is due to the fact that God could always will some event contrary to what the creature allegedly brings about. For instance, Malebranche invites us to consider the case of demons, where God wills to bring about a state of affairs contrary to what demons will:

…[L]et us suppose that God wills to produce the opposite of what some minds will, as might be thought in the case of demons… that deserve this punishment. One could not say in this case that God would communicate His power to them, since they could do nothing they willed to do. (OCM II 316/Search 450)

Similar to what we had seen in al-Ghazālī, Malebranche's core intuition appears to be that it is plainly possible for a creature to fail to bring about some effect that is typically thought to be within the purview of its causal powers. To deny such a possibility would entail a problematic restriction on divine omnipotence, or so Malebranche appears to be thinking. This is not to say that Malebranche is willing to expand divine omnipotence limitlessly, such that divine volition would have power over logical truths, for instance. In contrast to Descartes, Malebranche was against the doctrine of the creation of eternal truths. Certain truths for Malebranche hold of logical necessity: those truths whose denials are contradictory are independent of and insulated from divine volition. In this respect, he is in agreement with al-Ghazālī. For both philosophers, divine power extends to all and only that which is possible, that is, logically consistent.

Once again, the interesting question is how one should think of the natures of things, and whether the natures of things are rich enough to have various conceptual entailments that are logically binding. An Aristotelian realist about secondary causes would likely hold that the natures of creatures are such that even God could not bring about those effects that are not conceptually contained in their natures. Malebranche is denying this, and we wonder on what grounds Malebranche can argue for this view. A reason that is independent of theological motivations might be available to Malebranche in the following way: armed with a Cartesian understanding of extended substances, Malebranche could say that given the sparse essence of bodies, merely consisting of size, shape, and motion, there are no conceptual entailments that follow from a concept of a given body rich enough to support the typical causal connections the Aristotelian would take to hold. In other words, proper consideration of what bodily substances are, Malebranche could argue, clearly reveal that there are no such entailments. And, perhaps, an analogous case can be made for thinking substances, to the effect that that a thinking substance essentially has thoughts does not lead to any obvious conceptual connections that would dovetail nicely with the causal powers traditionally identified as belonging to the mind. In other words, the mere having of certain thoughts, which is the essence of the mind, carries no implications as to what other thoughts one must have or what other states of mind one must be in.

Not surprisingly, Malebranche also has some theologically motivated reasons for rejecting such rich conceptions of natures as well. He appears to find the idea that divine efficient causality is bound by natures of creatures to be rather problematic: “when one thinks about the idea of God, i.e., of an infinitely perfect and consequently all-powerful being, one knows that there is such a connection between His will and the motion of all bodies, that it is impossible to conceive that He wills a body to be moved and that this body not be moved” (OCM II 313/Search 448). In other words, were there a conceptually necessary connection between body A moving body B in a particular way, then even if God were to will body B to move in a different manner, given the assumed conceptually necessary connection holding being body A and body B, God's volition would fail. But this is impossible, Malebranche is arguing, given the proper understanding of divine omnipotence. So, for Malebranche, the proper understanding of divine omnipotence dictates the absence of conceptual entailments that completely determine specific movements.

Interestingly enough, from this claim concerning the necessary efficaciousness of divine volition, Malebranche immediately infers “[w]e must therefore say that only His will can move bodies if we wish to state things as we conceive them and not as we sense them” (OCM II 313/Search 448). This is a problematic move, as we have already seen in our discussion of al-Ghazālī. For to accept that divine power is unique in its necessary efficaciousness need not itself imply that God is the only cause. Many a theist would grant that creaturely causes lack necessary efficaciousness on the very grounds that Malebranche had presented, but still argue that this does not mean that they lack causal powers. Divine concurrentists, for instance, typically argue that all secondary causation requires divine concurrence, such that the creature's powers in themselves are never sufficient to bring about an effect, and that God's power is such that he could always override the causal contribution of the creature and bring about a contrary effect. Despite such concessions, divine concurrentists nonetheless affirm the causal activity of the creature in producing the effect when the effect is concurrently produced. What Malebranche needs to establish, then, is the claim that causation just is necessary efficaciousness, and the pressing question for Malebranche is how he can defend this claim.

In the Search at least, Malebranche seems to be thinking that the divine intervention cases provide us with a reason to think that it is God who does all the causal work. For when God intervenes to bring about an effect contrary to what the demon wills, it is clear that God is the unique cause of the event. So parity of reason suggests, or so Malebranche seems to be thinking, that in the normal case in which I will my arm to go up and it does go up, it is also God who alone brings about my arm going up. But this argument is not very convincing, since it does not follow from the fact that my power can be overridden in certain circumstances, that I am powerless, even when my power is not overridden—for instance, that I pushed the door shut when my son pulled to open it does not entail that when my son is successful in opening the door with my help, my son is causally ineffective.

In fairness to Malebranche, we might point out that, in identifying necessary connections with genuine causality, Malebranche is presenting an attractive reductive analysis of causation, one that we, benefitting from the exposure to David Hume's work, are already familiar with. But note that the intellectual climate of Malebranche's time period was rather different: philosophers were trying to come to grips with the complicated task of understanding the nature of causality given the new scientific developments of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries. Moreover, this endeavor took place against the backdrop of the traditional approaches to causation, involving the confusing myriad of the four Aristotelian causes. Compared to the Aristotelian conception, Malebranche's conception of causation is remarkably simple and unified, and does not face the question of how such diverse and distinct types of Aristotelian causes can come under a single conception of causation. Furthermore, there is some evidence that Malebranche might have responded to our challenge to produce a better argument for this conception of causation as necessary connections by noting how difficult it is to imagine what causation would be if not necessary connections, much like Hume did. In other words, given his statement in the Search that “[a] true cause as I understand it [c’est ainsi que je l’etends] is one such that the mind perceives a necessary connection between it and its effect” (Search 450, my emphasis), Malebranche might have had something close to the Humean idea in mindthough not developed as clearly and emphatically as in Humethat we have no conception of what a causal connection would be, if it is not a necessary connection. If so, this intuition could have provided a rationale for the claim that an event is a true cause if and only if there is a necessary connection between it and its effect. But given how controversial such a claim is within the context of considering divine causation in nature, one wonders whether this central claim identifying necessary connection with causation could have been further motivated.[20]

3.4 The “Conservation is but Continuous Creation” (CCC) Argument

The main strategy of this argument is to establish the thesis of occasionalism by drawing out the implications of the commonly held thesis that “conservation is but continuous creation.”[21] If the main premise of the NNC argument—that is, the premise that genuine causation just consists in necessary connection—would have been resisted by many concurrentists, the strategy behind the CCC argument holds more promise in that the CCC thesis was a widely accepted doctrine, adopted by concurrentists as well. The issue of how to interpret the CCC thesis, however, is at the center of the dispute between the two sides that accept the CCC thesis, namely those who affirm genuine creaturely causation despite accepting the CCC thesis—for instance, concurrentists like Leibniz— and those who deny creaturely causation because they accept CCC—such as Malebranche.

An early version of something close to the core idea behind the CCC argument emerges in the views of al-Ash’ari (873-935), the founder of Ash’arite school. As Perler and Rudolph have argued, according to al-Ash’ari, God rearranges the atoms that make up this world anew at every instant, and in so doing he continuously creates the accidents that inhere in these atomic substances (Perler and Rudolph 2000, 28–62). The view seems to have been one where the accidents of a substance possess only a momentary existence. Hence, at every instant, God brings about the accidents that inhere in the substances by continuously recreating these modes. If God sustains the existence of the atoms themselves, while continuously recreating all of their modes, then the occasionalist conclusion that God is the only genuine cause does follow from this interpretation of divine conservative activity.

On the European continent, the most artful presentation of the CCC argument is found in Malebranche. But the argument is not thought to have originated with Malebranche, and it has typically been traced back to Descartes, though whether he was indeed an occasionalist is some matter of controversy, as noted earlier. One of the main texts in question is from the third Meditation:

…[I]t does not follow from the fact that I existed a little while ago that I must exist now, unless there is some cause which as it were creates me afresh at this moment—that is, which preserves me. For it is quite clear to anyone…that the same power and action are needed to preserve anything at each individual moment of its duration as would be required to create that thing anew if it were not yet in existence. Hence the distinction between preservation and creation is only a conceptual one, and this is one of the things that are evident by the natural light. (AT VII 49/CSM II 33)[22]

Taken in isolation, this passage does suggest that Descartes took our souls to be continuously created by God in a way that would preclude any genuine causal activity on our part. For if, in initially creating of my soul—that is, in its creation ex nihilo—God brings about both the existence of my soul and its modes or modification, then, since the “same power and action” of God is required in preserving my existence subsequent to creation ab initio, God would be the sole causal agent that brings about my preserved existence with the modes I possess. But to conclude on the basis of this interpretation that Descartes was an occasionalist would be premature, since there is a good supply of other texts that suggest Descartes’ affirmation of our genuine causal efficacy.

In contrast, Louis de la Forge's commitment to the occasionalist thesis, at least with regard to bodies, is unquestionable. For he makes explicit the critical claim that God's causal activity of producing a body is inseparable from his producing the particular modes of the body in question:

Not only must [God] continue to produce it [a body], if he wants it to persevere in existence; but in addition, because he cannot create it everywhere nor outside of any particular place, he must himself put it in place [lieu] B if he wants it there. (TEH 240)

The central idea is that God's causal activity with regard to the production of a body is an “all or nothing” affair, in the sense that if God produces the body, God produces it with all of its specific modes or properties. In other words, though God need not create a body, as long as he does create or conserve it, he cannot do so without bringing about its specific spatial properties or modes. Given that God has a monopoly over producing both the body itself and its modes, no other cause is operative in bringing about any aspect of the world. Conservation is but continuous creation.

But might some creaturely effects be overdetermined in conservation? In other words, might God and some creature overdetermine certain natural effects? If by overdetermination, we take the creature's overdetermining power to be the same type of power as God exercises, then the possession of such powers by creatures can effectively be ruled out. For divine causal power includes that of keeping the being or esse of the creature in existence, and even the conservationist grants that the role of a conserving cause—that is, the causal power of keeping the being of creatures in existence—is unique to God as the causa secundum esse. In other words, all parties in this dispute concerning secondary causation in nature agree, regardless of their views about the reality of creaturely causal powers, that the being or esse of a creature when the creature is conserved is just as dependent on God as when the creature is created ex nihilo. God is the unique creative and conserving cause of any being or esse in this world.

Ruling out the possibility of overdetermination is not as simple, however, if we take the creaturely power to be restricted to that of bringing about a creature's modes. For in this case, the creature would not share in the power of the causa secundum esse, and its power to produce modes or modifications would be effective only insofar as the creature's being or esse has been produced by God. Hence, the critical dependence of the creature's esse or being on God is maintained in this case. But there are other reasons why the suggestion that some modes are causally overdetermined by God and a creature might be resisted. For instance, we might think that this overdetermination suggests that God is engaging in needlessly redundant causal behavior. Not only would God be producing the modes himself but he would also be producing the causal power of the creature that is an overdetermining cause of these modes.

One last observation about issues related to overdetermination. If the core intuition behind the CCC thesis is the point that a creature's dependence on God when it is conserved is no less than when it is initially created ex nihilo, then we might think that the overdetermination of an effect in conservation conflicts with this symmetric dependency. For if some effects are overdetermined in conservation, then with regard to those effects of the creature, the creature's dependence is in some significant sense less than in creation, since the effects would come about even if the causal activity of God were absent. The fact that the occurrence of these effects are causally guaranteed through overdetermination could be thought to be inconsistent with the radical dependence of creatures expressed in the doctrine of creation ex nihilo. Though neither La Forge nor Malebranche directly address the possibility of overdetermination, the following passage from La Forge seems to support the view that this intuition about the symmetry of dependence is indeed behind his endorsement of the CCC thesis:

It was necessary for [God] to employ his omnipotent power in order to bring all of Nature out of nothing. … It would all return to nothing if God ceased bringing it out of nothing at each moment that he conserves it.[23]

As we have seen, the success of the CCC argument relies heavily on the claim that the act of creation ex nihilo and the act of conservation are indistinguishable in terms of both the dependence of the creature on God and the role and content of divine causal activity. Malebranche reinforces this claim in his Dialogues by emphasizing that God's causal activity of sustaining the being or esse of a creature and his causal activity of bringing about the modes of a creature cannot come apart:

Creation does not pass, because the conservation of creatures is—on the part of God—simply a continuous creation, a single volition subsisting and operating continuously. Now, God can neither conceive nor consequently will that a body exist nowhere, nor that it does not stand in certain relations of distance to other bodies. Thus, God cannot will that this armchair exist, and by this volition create or conserve it, without situating it here, there, or elsewhere. … Now it is a contradiction that God wills this armchair to exist, unless He wills it to exist somewhere and unless, by the efficacy of His will, He puts it there, conserves it there, creates it there. (OCM XII 160/ Dialogues 115–6)

Malebranche here is assuming that in the case of creation ex nihilo God is the cause of not only the being or esse of a creature but also its modes—presumably because no other possible cause actually exists prior to the act of creation ex nihilo. So by identifying God's conserving activity with his activity as creator ex nihilo, Malebranche appears to arguing that even in cases where the creatures are conserved, God is the unique cause of both their esse and modes. In other words, since the modes of a creature cannot in principle have been causally overdetermined in the case of creation ex nihilo—for creation ex nihilo suggests that no cause exists prior to the act of creation—if the creature's dependence on God in instances of conservation are identical to the instance of creation ex nihilo, then there can be no overdetermination in the production of modes in cases of conservation. Now the concurrentist might reply at this point that concurrentists deny overdetermining creaturely causes as well, since their point is that the creature is a concurring cause of the modes of the creature: the causal contribution of neither God nor the creature are redundant, since both are necessary in some manner. But notice that if it is indeed the case that the act of creation ex nihilo should be understood to imply that God is the unique cause of both the esse and modes of the creature, and if conservation is identified with continuous creation ex nihilo, then the concurrentist would have to either reject the CCC thesis or suggest a different account of what is going on at creation ex nihilo.[24] For if this way of understanding continuous creation rules out overdetermining causes, it also rules out concurring causes. However, this way of understanding the CCC thesis raises different issues, since if the condition of ex nihilo is strictly interpreted, conservation on this reading seems to come worryingly close to continuous recreation, and the creature that is supposedly “conserved” seems to continuously fall out of existence before it is continuously recreated.[25]

While La Forge appears to have limited his occasionalism to extended substances and held that we as minds are causally active in producing our ideas (TEH 166), Malebranche extends his occasionalism to thinking substances. Consider the following passage from the Treatise on Ethics (1684):

Glory and Honor belong to God alone. Toward Him alone, all the movements of all minds ought to tend, because only in Him does power reside. All willing by creatures is inefficacious in itself. Only He who gives being could be able to give the ways of being, since the ways of being are nothing but beings themselves, in this or that fashion. Nothing is more evident to one who knows how to consult the inner truth. For what is more evident than that if God, for example, keeps a body always in one place, then no creature could move it to another? Or that no man could even move his own arm unless God wills to concur in doing that which ungrateful and stupid man thinks he is doing by himself? And the same goes for the ways of being of minds. If God keeps or creates the soul in a way of being which afflicts it, such as with pain, no mind can deliver itself therefrom, nor make itself to feel pleasure thereby, unless God concurs with it to carry out its desires. (OCM XI 160/TE 147, my emphasis)

Here we get something close to a generalized version of the key claim of the CCC argument in the Dialogues that God cannot will that an extended substance exist, “without at the same time willing that it exist either here or there and without His will placing it somewhere” (OCM XII 156/Dialogues 110): only he who gives being could be able to give the ways of being. And, importantly, this principle is said to be applicable to the “ways of being of minds.”[26] In effect, we are presented with an explicit denial of the possibility that God's sustaining activity of the being or esse of a creature can be separated from his activity of bringing about the modes of the creature, regardless of whether the creature is an extended or thinking substance. Hence, the CCC argument seems to be fully applicable to the modes or ways of the being of the minds, just like bodies.

Malebranche's extension of the thesis of occasionalism to thinking substances, as presented here in the Treatise on Ethics, is not an aberration. In one of his most careful statements about how minds relate to his occasionalism, Malebranche claims as follows:

I agree that God is the sole author of all substances and of all their modes, that He is the author of all beings: not only of all bodies but of all minds. But be careful: I understand by a mode of a substance only that which cannot change without there being some real or physical change in the substance of which it is the mode. … Once again, I agree that God is the sole efficacious cause of all the real changes that take place in the world (Prémotion Physique, OC XVI 40; the translation is from Kremer 2000, 210–11).

Here, once again, we get an explicit statement that God is the sole author of all substances and their modes. Note, however, that Malebranche is careful to specify what he means by a “mode” of a substance. This clarification is motivated by the attempt to make room for a kind of power within minds or thinking substances that will allow for the attribution of freedom and moral responsibility to them. This power of consent or withholding of consent is further developed in the following:

There are in the soul two different powers or activities. The first is properly only the action of God … [who] continually creates the soul with the invincible desire to be happy, or continually moves it toward the good in general. But the second … which is the essence of freedom, is … very different from the first. It consists in a true power, not to produce, by its own efficacy, new modifications in itself, that is, new interesting perceptions or new movements in the will, but … a true power of the soul to suspend or to give its consent to the movements that follow naturally upon interesting perceptions. (OCM XVI 46–7; the translation is from Kremer 2000, 1999)

Interestingly enough, this power of the soul is described as not being a power that produces modifications, which I take to be an expression of Malebranche's attempt to reconcile the positing of such powers in minds with his occasionalism about minds. In other words, insofar as all powers that bring about changes in modes are in God, and merely non-modal powers are in the creature, then Malebranche seems to be thinking that such non-modal powers of creatures are consistent with his occasionalism. This, however, raises the question of whether such non-modal powers are robust enough to anchor the free will and moral responsibility of thinking substances.[27]

If we bracket the issue of how to render a full-blown occasionalism with a sufficiently robust account of free will, then, as we have hopefully seen, the CCC argument is a fairly powerful argument as an argument for global occasionalism.

Bibliography

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AT Descartes, René, 1983, Oeuvres De Descartes, 11 vols., ed. Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
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Search Malebranche, N., 1997, The Search for Truth and Elucidations of the Search for Truth, trans. Lennon and Olscamp, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
TE Malebranche, N., 1993, Treatise on Ethics, trans. Walton, C., Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
TEH La Forge, Louis de, 1666, Traité de l'esprit de l'homme et de ses facultez et fonctions, et de son union avec le corps. Suivant les principes de René Descartes in La Forge, 1974, Oeuvres philosophiques, ed. Pierre Clair, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
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Al-Ghazali | Arabic and Islamic Philosophy, disciplines in: natural philosophy and natural science | Berkeley, George | causation: the metaphysics of | Cordemoy, Géraud de | creation and conservation | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm: on causation | Malebranche, Nicolas

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