Our everyday experiences present us with a wide array of objects: dogs and cats, tables and chairs, trees and their branches, and so forth. These sorts of ordinary objects may seem fairly unproblematic in comparison to entities like numbers, propositions, tropes, holes, points of space, and moments of time. Yet, on closer inspection, they are at least as puzzling, if not more so. Reflection on Michelangelo’s David and the piece of marble of which it is made threatens to lead to the surprising conclusion that these would have to be two different objects occupying the same location and sharing all of their parts. Reflection on the availability of microphysical explanations for events that we take to be caused by ordinary objects threatens to lead to the conclusion that ordinary objects—if they do exist—never themselves cause anything to happen. Reflection on the possibility of alternative conceptual schemes that “carve up the world” in radically different ways makes our own conception of which objects there are seem intolerably arbitrary. Taken together, the various puzzles that arise in connection with ordinary objects make a powerful case for their elimination. And, in many cases, what seem to be the best responses to these puzzles require the postulation of legions of objects that we fail to notice despite their being right before our eyes.
In §1, I articulate a variety of ways of departing from an ordinary, conservative conception of which objects there are, either by eliminating ordinary objects or by permitting more objects than we would ordinarily take to exist. In §2, I examine the puzzles and arguments that are meant to motivate these departures. In §3, I examine some arguments against eliminative and permissive views. Finally, in §4, I turn from the question of which objects exist to the question of which objects exist fundamentally.
- 1. The Positions
- 2. Against Conservative Ontologies
- 3. Against Revisionary Ontologies
- 4. Fundamental Existents
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
We find ourselves naturally inclined to make certain judgments about which objects are before us in various situations. Looking at a pool table just before the break, we are naturally inclined to judge there to be sixteen pool balls on the table, perhaps various parts of the individual balls (their top and bottom halves), and no other macroscopic objects. Looking at my nightstand, I am naturally inclined to judge there to be an alarm clock, a lamp, their various parts (lampshade, buttons, cords), and nothing else.
Conservative views are those according to which these sorts of judgments are by and large correct. Giving a precise characterization of conservatism, or of ordinary objects, is no easy task. Very roughly, ordinary objects are objects belonging to kinds that we are naturally inclined to regard as having instances on the basis of our perceptual experiences: dog, tree, table, and so forth. Extraordinary objects, by contrast, are objects belonging to kinds that we are not ordinarily inclined to regard as having instances, and whose instances—if they do have any—are highly visible. (More on these in §1.3.) And conservatism is roughly the view that there are just the ordinary objects and none of the extraordinary objects.
Revisionary views about which objects there are are those that depart in one way or another from conservatism. These include both eliminative views, on which there are fewer ordinary objects than are recognized by conservatives, and permissive views, on which there are extraordinary objects that conservatives do not recognize. There is, however, some controversy about whether various departures from conservatism actually deserve to be called ‘revisionary’. As we shall see in §3.1, many eliminativists and permissivists take their views to be entirely compatible with common sense and ordinary belief.
Our target question—namely, which highly visible objects exist—may be distinguished from related but independent questions concerning the nature of ordinary objects. Some views about the natures of objects may seem to be at odds with common sense, for instance, the view that ordinary objects can’t survive the loss of any of their parts, or that ordinary objects are all mind-dependent. But these views are entirely compatible with conservatism, as characterized above, because they do not (or at least need not) have any revisionary implications regarding which objects there are at a given place and time. That said, questions about the nature of ordinary objects are intimately connected with questions about which objects exist, insofar as certain views about the nature of these objects (including those just mentioned) provide the resources for addressing some of the puzzles and arguments that motivate revisionary conceptions.
A few terminological preliminaries. I use ‘object’ in its narrow sense, which applies only to individual material objects and not to other sorts of entities like numbers or events. I use ‘part’ in its ordinary sense, on which it is not true—or at least not trivially true—that things are parts of themselves. And when I say that some objects compose something, or that they have a fusion, what I mean is that there is something that has each of them as parts and every part of which overlaps at least one of them.
Eliminative views are those that deny the existence of some wide range of ordinary objects. (Denying merely that ordinary objects are fundamental is not by itself enough to qualify as an eliminativist; see §4 below.)
Some eliminativists accept nihilism, the thesis that no objects ever compose anything. In other words, every object is mereologically simple (i.e., partless). Together with the plausible assumption that ordinary objects (if they exist) are all composite objects, nihilism entails that there are no ordinary objects. Nihilists typically accept that there are countless microscopic objects: although there are “simples arranged dogwise” and “simples arranged statuewise”, there are no dogs or statues. But nihilism is also compatible with existence monism—the thesis that there is a single, all-encompassing simple (the cosmos, a.k.a. “the blobject”)—as well as the extreme nihilist thesis that there are no objects whatsoever.
Since many of the arguments for eliminativism actually fall short of establishing that composition never occurs, it is also open to eliminativists to reject nihilism and accept certain classes of composites. Many eliminativists make an exception for persons and other organisms. Some, for instance, accept organicism, the thesis that some objects compose something just in case the activities of those objects constitute a life. In other words, organisms are the only composite objects.
The motivations for making an exception for organisms vary. Van Inwagen (1990: Ch. 12) accepts organicism on the grounds that it yields the best answer to the special composition question (“under what conditions do some objects compose something?”), one that allows for one’s own existence and physicality, while at the same time escaping various problems that arise for competing answers. Merricks (2001: Ch. 4) argues that persons and some other composites must be recognized on account of their nonredundant causal powers. Making such exceptions naturally gives rise to concerns about the stability of the resulting positions, either because the reasoning behind allowing the exceptions threatens to generalize to all ordinary objects or because the arguments for eliminating ordinary objects threaten to generalize to the objects one wishes to permit.
It is also open to eliminativists to adopt non-nihilistic views that are fairly liberal about composition, allowing that composition occurs at least as often as we ordinarily suppose (if not more so). Peter Unger is one such non-nihilistic eliminativist:
There is nothing in these arguments [for eliminativism] to deny the idea, common enough, that there are physical objects with a diameter greater than four feet and less than five. Indeed, the exhibited [arguments] allow us still to maintain that there are physical objects of a variety of shapes and sizes, and with various particular spatial relations and velocities with respect to each other. It is simply that no such objects will be ordinary things; none are stones or planets or pieces of furniture. (1979b: 150)
He is not a nihilist because he affirms that there is a highly visible composite object occupying the exact location where we take the table to be, but he is an eliminativist insofar as he denies that that object is a table.
Permissive views are those according to which there are wide swathes of highly visible extraordinary objects, right before our eyes.
Universalism is the permissivist thesis that composition is unrestricted: for any objects, there is a single object that is composed of those objects. What universalism does not tell us is which kinds of objects there are. Whenever there are some atoms arranged turkeywise, universalism entails that there is some object that they compose. But it remains open to universalists (like the aforementioned non-nihilistic eliminativists) to deny that this composite is a turkey. However, assuming that there are such objects as turkeys, trout, and their front and back halves, universalism will entail that there are trout-turkeys, where a trout-turkey is a single object composed of the undetached front half of a trout and the undetached back half of a turkey. These are objects that have both fins and feathers and whose finned parts may be a good distance from their feathered parts.
Diachronic universalism is the permissivist thesis that, for any times and any function from those times to sets of objects that exist at those times, there is an object that exists at just those times and has exactly those parts at those times. Roughly: there is an object corresponding to every filled region of spacetime. So, assuming that your kitchen table and living room table both exist, there also exists a klable—an object that’s entirely made up of your kitchen table every day from midnight till noon and is entirely made up of your living room table from noon till midnight. This is an object that, twice a day, instantly and imperceptibly shifts its location.
The doctrine of plenitude is the permissivist thesis that, for every function from worlds to filled regions of spacetime, there is an object that exists at just those worlds and that occupies exactly those regions at those worlds (cf. Hawthorne 2006: 53). Put another way: if the empirical facts don’t directly rule out there being an object with a given modal property in a given location, then there is an object in that location with that modal property (cf. Eklund 2008: §4). When there is a red car parked in the garage, the empirical facts (e.g., that there is nothing blue there) do directly rule out there being an object in the exact location of the car that is necessarily blue. But they do not directly rule out there being an object there that is necessarily inside the garage: an incar. This is an extraordinary object which, as a matter of metaphysical necessity, cannot exist outside of a garage. As you begin to back out, the incar (if such a thing exists) shrinks and comes to be colocated with the part of the car that is still inside the garage. When you have finished pulling out, the incar has ceased to exist altogether.
One further way of being a permissivist is by permitting a multitude of parts of ordinary objects that we do not naturally judge them to have. For instance, one might hold that, in addition to ordinary parts like arms and legs, you have extraordinary parts like leg complements, where your left-leg complement is an object made up of all of you except for your left leg. Together with some natural assumptions (e.g., about regions of space), leg complements and a legion of other extraordinary parts will be delivered by the doctrine of arbitrary undetached parts—or DAUP—the thesis that for any material object o, if r is the region of space occupied by o, and if r′ is an occupiable sub-region of r, then there exists a material object that exactly occupies r′ and which is part of o. (Roughly: for every region of space within the boundaries of a given a object, that object has a part that exactly fills that region.)
Sorites arguments proceed from a premise to the effect that minute differences cannot make a difference with respect to whether some property F (or kind K) is instantiated to the conclusion that nothing (or everything) is F (or a K). Here is a sorites argument for the elimination of stones:
- (SR1) Every stone is composed of a finite number of atoms.
- (SR2) It is impossible for something composed of fewer than two atoms to be a stone.
- (SR3) For any number n, if it is impossible for an object composed of n atoms to be a stone, then it is impossible for an object composed of n+1 atoms to be a stone.
- (SR4) So, there are no stones.
Premises SR2 and SR3 together entail that, for any finite number of atoms, nothing made up of that many atoms is a stone. But this, together with SR1, entails that there are no stones.
Similar arguments may be given for the elimination of individual ordinary objects. One can construct a sorites series of contiguous bits of matter, running from a bit of matter, mk, at the peak of Kilimanjaro to a bit of matter, mp, in the surrounding plains. From the sorites premise that a bit of matter that’s n inches along the path from mp to mk is part of Kilimanjaro iff a bit of matter that’s n+1 inches along the path is part of Kilimanjaro (for any number n), together with the fact that mp is not part of Kilimanjaro, we reach the absurd conclusion that mk isn’t part of Kilimanjaro. So, by reductio, we may conclude that Kilimanjaro does not exist.
Why accept SR3? Imagine a series of cases, beginning with a case involving a single atom and terminating with a case involving what would seem to be a paradigm stone, where each case differs from the preceding case only by the addition of a single atom. It seems highly implausible that there should be adjacent cases in any such series where there is a stone in one case but not in the other. Rejecting SR3 would look to commit one to just such a sharp cut-off.
But one can deny that SR3 is true without accepting that there is a sharp transition from stones to non-stones in such series, that is, without accepting that there is some specific object in the series that definitely is a stone and whose successor definitely is not a stone. For one may instead hold that there is a range of cases in which it is vague whether the object in question is a stone.
Here is an illustration of how that sort of strategy might go. Let S be some object in the series that clearly seems to be a stone, let NS be an object that clearly seems to be a non-stone, and let BS be an object that seems to be a borderline case of being a stone. One might suggest that ‘stone’ is vague as a result of there being a range of candidate precise meanings (or “precisifications”) for the word ‘stone’,
- (i) all of which apply to S,
- (ii) none of which apply to NS,
- (iii) some but not all of which apply to BS, and
- (iv) none of which is definitely the meaning of ‘stone’.
‘S is a stone’ is true because S falls under all of these precisifications of ‘stone’. ‘NS is a stone’ is false because NS doesn’t fall under any of them. And ‘BS is a stone’ is neither true nor false because BS falls under some but not all of the precisifications. And then SR3 itself turns out to be false: on every precisification of ‘stone’, there is some object in the series such that it but not its successor falls under that precisification. (This is sometimes known as a “supervaluationist” account.)
Defenders of sorites arguments often complain that this line of response still commits one to some “sharp status transition”, for instance, a sharp transition from a case in which ‘there is a stone’ is true to a case in which it is neither true nor false.
It is natural to suppose that objects sometimes do, and other times do not, compose a further object. When a hammer head is firmly affixed to a handle, they compose something, namely, a hammer. When they’re on opposite ends of the room, they don’t compose anything. The following argument—commonly known as “the argument from vagueness”—purports to show that this natural assumption is mistaken.
- (AV1) If some pluralities of objects compose something and others do not, then it is possible for there to be a sorites series for composition.
- (AV2) Any such sorites series must contain either an exact cut-off or borderline cases of composition.
- (AV3) There cannot be exact cut-offs in such sorites series.
- (AV4) There cannot be borderline cases of composition.
- (AV5) So, either every plurality of objects composes something or none do.
If the argument is sound then either universalism or nihilism must be correct, though which of them is correct would have to be decided on independent grounds.
A sorites series for composition is a series of cases running from a case in which composition doesn’t occur to a case in which composition does occur, where adjacent cases are extremely similar in all of the respects that one would ordinarily take to be relevant to whether composition occurs (e.g., the spatial and causal relations among the objects in question). Understood in this way, AV1 should be unobjectionable. If it’s true that the handle and head compose something only once the hammer is assembled, then a moment-by-moment series of cases running from the beginning to the end of the assembly of the hammer would be just such a series. Premise AV2 looks trivial: any such series obviously must contain some transition from composition not occurring to composition occurring, and there either will or won’t be a determinate fact of the matter about where exactly that transition occurs in any given series.AV3 is plausible as well. If composition occurs in one case but not in another, then surely there must be some explanation for why that is. In other words, the facts about composition are not “brute”. Yet the sorts of differences that one finds among adjacent cases in a sorites series for composition—for instance, that the handle and head are a fraction of a centimeter closer together in the one than in the other—can’t plausibly explain why composition occurs in one case but not in the other.
Certain sorts of eliminativists are well positioned to resist AV3 without having to accept that compositional facts are brute. Suppose, for instance, that one accepts a view on which conscious beings are the only composite objects. Such eliminativists will deny that there is a sorites series for composition running from the beginning to the end of the assembly process, since they will deny that anything is composed of the handle and head (or that there are a handle and head) even at the end of the series. Every sorites series for composition, by their lights, will have to run from a case in which there is some number of conscious beings to a case in which there is some other number of conscious beings. And assuming that that there can’t be borderline cases of consciousness, every such series will contain a sharp cut-off with respect to the presence of the additional subject of consciousness. This, in turn, is poised to explain why composition occurs in the one case but not the other.
Why, though, should anyone accept AV4? On the face of it, it seems just as clear that there can be borderline cases of composition (e.g., when the hammer head is just beginning to be affixed to the handle) as it is that there can be borderline cases of redness and baldness. This is not, however, “just another sorites,” to be blocked in whichever way one blocks the sorites arguments in §2.1. That’s because questions about when composition occurs look to be intimately bound up with questions about how many objects exist. This suggests the following line of argument in defense of AV4, no analogue of which is available for other sorts of sorites arguments.
- (AV6) If there can be borderline cases of composition, then it can be indeterminate how many objects exist.
- (AV7) It cannot be indeterminate how many objects exist.
- (AV4) So, there cannot be borderline cases of composition.
To see the motivation for AV6, notice that if the handle and head do compose something then there are three things: the handle, the head, and a hammer. If they don’t, then there are only two things: the handle and head. And if it is vague whether they do, then it will be vague whether there are two things or three. As for AV7, notice that one can specify how many objects there are using what would seem to be entirely precise vocabulary. For any finite number, one can produce a “numerical sentence” saying that there are exactly that many concrete objects. Here, for instance, is the numerical sentence for two: ‘∃x∃y(x≠y & Cx & Cy & ∀z(Cz→(x=z ∨ y=z)))’. (The restriction to concreta ensures that numerical sentences aren’t trivially false simply on account of there being infinitely many numbers, sets, and so forth.) And since these numerical sentences contain no vague vocabulary, it would seem to follow that it cannot be indeterminate how many objects there are.
AV6 can be resisted by denying that composition affects the number of objects in the way suggested. For instance, one might contend that even before the handle and head definitely come to compose something, there exists an object—a “proto-hammer”—located in the region that the two of them jointly occupy. The proto-hammer definitely exists, but it is a borderline case of composition: it is indeterminate whether the handle and head compose the proto-hammer or whether they instead compose nothing at all (in which case the proto-hammer has no parts).
Alternatively, one might resist AV7 by pinning the vagueness on the quantifiers in the numerical sentence. After all, what seems to be vague is whether the handle and head are everything that there is and whether there is something other than the handle and head. But it is difficult to see how the quantifiers can be vague and, in particular, how their vagueness could be accounted for on the sort of standard, precisificational account of vagueness discussed in §2.1.
Ordinary objects are constituted by, or made up out of, aggregates of matter. A gold ring is constituted by a certain piece of gold. Clay statues are constituted by pieces of clay. We are naturally inclined to regard the statue and the piece of clay as being one and the same object, an object that simply belongs to multiple kinds (statue and piece of clay).
The puzzles of material constitution put pressure on this natural inclination. Here is one such puzzle. Let ‘Athena’ name a certain clay statue and let ‘Piece’ name the piece of clay that constitutes it. What is puzzling is that all of the following seem true:
- (MC1) Athena exists and Piece exists.
- (MC2) If Athena exists and Piece exists, then Athena = Piece.
- (MC3) Athena has different properties from Piece.
- (MC4) If Athena has different properties from Piece, then Athena ≠ Piece.
The motivation behind MC2 is that Athena seemingly has exactly the same location and exactly the same parts as Piece. So ‘Athena’ and ‘Piece’ are plausibly just different names for the same thing. The motivation behind MC3 is that Piece and Athena seem to have different modal properties: Piece is able to survive being flattened and Athena isn’t. MC4 follows from the Principle of the Indiscernibility of Identicals (a.k.a. Leibniz’s Law): ∀x∀y(x=y → ∀P(Px iff Py)). In other words, if x and y are identical, then they had better have all the same properties. After all, if they are identical, then there is only one thing there to have or lack any given property.
The puzzles are sometimes taken to motivate eliminativism, since eliminativists can simply deny MC1: there are no statues (and perhaps no pieces of clay either).
More often, however, the puzzles are taken to motivate constitutional pluralism, the thesis that ordinary objects are typically, if not always, distinct from the aggregates of matter that constitute them. (‘Typically’ because, in rare cases in which the ordinary object and the aggregate come into existence at the same time and cease to exist at the same time, some pluralists will take the ordinary object to be identical to the aggregate.) Pluralists reject MC2: clay statues are not identical to the pieces of clay that constitute them. Pluralists may deny that having the same parts at a given time suffices for identity, or they may instead deny that the statue and the piece of clay have all of the same parts.
One of the main problems facing the pluralist solution is the grounding problem: the modal differences between Athena and Piece (e.g., that the one but not the other can survive being flattened) seem to stand in need of explanation and yet there seems to be no further difference between them that is poised to explain, or ground, these differences.
Defenders of the pluralist response to these puzzles may, by similar reasoning, be led to accept that, in special cases, two objects of the same kind can coincide. Suppose, for instance, that we have a fantastically big net (Thin) with very thin netting. We then roll it up into a long rope, and we weave that rope into a smaller net (Thick) with a thicker weave. Since the nets intuitively have different modal properties—Thin, but not Thick, can survive the unraveling of the thicker net—the same sort of reasoning that leads one to reject MC2 underwrites an argument that the nets are not identical. In other words, there are two exactly colocated objects, both of which are nets.
Constitutional monists, according to whom Athena is identical to Piece, will deny MC3. There are various ways of developing the monist response. First, one might insist that both Athena and Piece (which, on this view, are identical) can survive flattening: upon flattening, Athena ceases to be a statue, but does not cease to exist. We can call those who opt for this approach ‘phasalists’, since they take being a statue to be a temporary phase that Piece (i.e., Athena) is passing through.
Alternatively, monists might deny that Piece (i.e., Athena) can survive being flattened. When Piece is flattened, Piece ceases to exist, at which point an entirely new piece of clay (composed of the same atoms) comes into existence. This strategy is sometimes called “the doctrine of dominant kinds”, since the idea is that when an object belongs to multiple kinds, the object has the persistence conditions associated with whichever of the kinds “dominates” the others. Because statue dominates piece, Piece is a statue essentially, and therefore cannot survive ceasing to be statue-shaped.
Finally, monists might agree that Piece is able to survive being flattened and that Athena is not able to survive being flattened, and yet deny that Athena and Piece have different modal properties. How can that be? On one version of this approach (often associated with counterpart theory), the idea is that ‘is able to survive being flattened’ is context-sensitive, expressing one property when affixed to ‘Athena’ and another when affixed to ‘Piece’. On another, the idea is that ‘is able to survive being flattened’ does not express a property at all. Either way, we do not end up with any one property that Piece has but Athena lacks.
A wooden ship is constructed and christened ‘Theseus II’. As planks come loose over the years, they are discarded and replaced. After three hundred years, the last of the original planks is replaced. Call the resulting ship ‘the mended ship’. The descendants of the original owners have been collecting the discarded original planks, and—three hundred years after the christening—they obtain the last of them and construct a ship that is indistinguishable from the original. Call the resulting ship ‘the reconstructed ship’. Which, if either, of these two ships is identical to Theseus II? It is natural to suppose that there is no fact of the matter: it is indeterminate which of the two ships is Theseus II.
However, there arguably can never be indeterminate cases of identity:
- (ST1) Suppose that it is indeterminate whether Theseus II = the mended ship.
- (ST2) If so, then Theseus II has the property of being indeterminately identical to the mended ship.
- (ST3) The mended ship does not have the property of being indeterminately identical to the mended ship.
- (ST4) If Theseus II has this property and the mended ship lacks this property, then Theseus II ≠ the mended ship.
- (ST5) If Theseus II ≠ the mended ship, then it isn’t indeterminate whether Theseus II = the mended ship.
- (ST6) So (by reductio), it isn’t indeterminate whether Theseus II = the mended ship.
ST2 relies on two seemingly trivial inferences: (a) from its being indeterminate whether Theseus II is identical to the mended ship to Theseus II’s being indeterminately identical to the mended ship and (b) from there to Theseus II’s having the property of being indeterminately identical to the mended ship. ST3 seems trivial as well: the mended ship is definitely self-identical, so it does not itself have this property. ST4 looks to be an immediate consequence of Leibniz’s Law: if Theseus II and the mended ship differ with respect to even one property, then they are distinct. ST5 is trivial: if they’re not identical, then it isn’t indeterminate whether they are identical.
Eliminativists may go on to argue from ST6 to the conclusion that there are no ships, as follows. If indeed it isn’t indeterminate whether Theseus II is the mended ship, then there would seem to be five options:
- (i) Theseus II is identical only to the mended ship.
- (ii) Theseus II is identical only to the reconstructed ship.
- (iii) Theseus II is identical both to the mended ship and to the reconstructed ship.
- (iv) Theseus II is neither ship; it has ceased to exist.
- (v) Theseus II never existed in the first place; there are no ships.
Options (i) and (ii) seem intolerably arbitrary, since the mended ship and reconstructed ship seem to have equal claim to being Theseus II. Option (iii) is out as well. If Theseus II is identical to both ships, then (by the transitivity of identity) they must be identical to one another; but they cannot be identical because they have different properties (e.g., the one but not the other is composed of the original planks). Option (iv) is problematic as well. The history of maintenance by itself would have sufficed for the persistence of Theseus II; the preservation and reassembly of the original parts by itself would likewise have sufficed for the persistence of Theseus II; and here we have managed to secure both. As Parfit (1971: 5) would say, “How could a double success be a failure?” Thus, we get (v) from argument by elimination. Fitting.
Some respond to the argument by maintaining that it is indeterminate which of various objects ‘Theseus II’ picks out. If that’s right, then ST2 is arguably false. One cannot infer the existence of an individual who is indeterminately identical to Sue from the fact that it is indeterminate whether Sue (or rather Morgan) is Harry’s best friend. Analogously, one cannot infer the existence of an individual that is indeterminately identical to the mended ship from the fact that it is indeterminate whether Theseus II is the mended ship.
The prima facie problem with this response is that there do not seem to be multiple objects such that it’s indeterminate which one ‘Theseus II’ picks out. After all, when ‘Theseus II’ was first introduced, there was only one ship around to receive the name! One can address this problem by maintaining that, despite appearances, two ships were present at the christening: one that would later be composed of entirely different planks and another that would later be reassembled from a pile of discarded planks. What is indeterminate is which of these two temporarily colocated ships was christened ‘Theseus II’.
Other responses are available. One might reject ST1 on the grounds that the object christened ‘Theseus II’ ceases to exist as soon as the first plank is discarded, either because ships have all of their parts essentially, or because the ship that existed at the time of the christening is not identical to any ship that exists at any earlier or later time. One might deny ST2 on the grounds that there is no such property as the property of being indeterminately identical to Theseus II. One might deny ST3, affirming that the mended ship is indeterminately identical to the mended ship. Or one might deny ST4 by denying that the distinctness of Theseus II and the mended ship can be inferred from the fact that they do not share the indicated property.
Arguments from arbitrariness turn on the observation that there would seem to be no ontologically significant difference between certain ordinary and extraordinary objects, that is, no difference between them that can account for why there would be things of the one kind but not the other. Here is an example (drawn from Hawthorne 2006: vii):
- (AR1) There are islands.
- (AR2) There is no ontologically significant difference between islands and incars.
- (AR3) If there is no ontologically significant difference between islands and incars, then: if there are islands then there are incars.
- (AR4) So, there are incars.
The idea behind AR2 is that islands and incars (see §1.3) would seem to be objects of broadly the same sort, namely, objects that go out of existence simply by virtue of changing their orientation with respect to some other thing (the water level in the one case, the garage in the other), without their constitutive matter undergoing any intrinsic change. The idea behind AR3 is that, if there truly are islands but no incars, then this is something that would seem to stand in need of explanation: there would have to be something in virtue of which it’s the case. To think otherwise would be to take the facts about what exists to be arbitrary in a way that they plausibly are not.
Similar arguments may be used to establish the existence of leg complements (on the grounds that there’s no ontologically significant difference between them and legs) and trout-turkeys (on the grounds that there’s no ontologically significant difference between them and scattered objects like solar systems).
Eliminativists may of course resist the argument by denying AR1.
The argument may also be resisted by denying AR2 and identifying some ontologically significant difference between islands and incars. For instance, a certain sort of anti-realist will say that which objects there are is largely determined by which objects we take there to be. Accordingly, the very fact that we take there to be islands but not incars marks an ontologically significant difference between them. Alternatively, one may attempt to identify an ontologically significant difference between the ordinary and extraordinary objects without endorsing anti-realism. In the case at hand, one might resist AR2 by insisting that islands have importantly different persistence conditions from incars. Incars are meant to cease to exist when their matter ceases to be inside a garage. But islands, contra hypothesis, do not cease to exist when they are completely submerged; they merely cease to be islands.
How about AR3? Part of why it seems arbitrary to countenance islands but not incars is that one would seem to be privileging islands over incars by virtue of taking them to exist. For this reason, proponents of certain deflationary ontological views are well positioned to deny AR3. Relativists, for instance, may maintain that islands exist and incars do not exist—relative to our conceptual scheme, that is. Relative to other possible schemes, incars exist and islands do not. Quantifier variantists, who maintain that there are counterparts of our quantifiers that are on a par with ours and that range over things that do not exist—but rather exist*—may maintain that islands exist but do not exist* while incars exist* but do not exist. On such views, islands and incars receive a uniform treatment at bottom; islands are not getting any sort of “special treatment” that cries out for explanation.
We encounter some atoms arranged treewise and some atoms arranged dogwise, and we naturally take there to be a dog and a tree. But there are different ways we might have carved up such a situation into objects. Instead of taking there to be a tree there, we might instead have taken there to be a trog—a partly furry, partly wooden object composed of the dog and the tree-trunk.
Why, though, do we naturally take there to trees rather than trogs? Plausibly, this is largely the result of various biological and cultural contingencies. If so, then there arguably is little reason to expect that our beliefs about which objects there are would be even approximately correct. This realization, in turn, is meant to debunk our beliefs about which objects there are:
- (DK1) There is no explanatory connection between how we believe the world to be divided up into objects the how the world actually is divided up into objects.
- (DK2) If so, then it would be a coincidence if our object beliefs turned out to be correct.
- (DK3) If it would be a coincidence if our object beliefs turned out to be correct, then we shouldn’t believe that there are trees.
- (DK4) So, we shouldn’t believe that there are trees.
The idea behind DK1 is that we are inclined to believe in trees rather than trogs largely because prevailing conventions in the communities we were born into generally prohibit treating some things as the parts of a single object unless they are connected or in some other way unified. These conventions themselves likely trace back to an innate tendency to perceive only certain arrays of qualities as being borne by a single object and its being adaptive for creatures like us to so perceive the world. But the facts about which distributions of atoms do compose something, or about which arrays of qualities truly are borne by a single object, have no role to play in explaining why this is adaptive. Thus, it would seem that we divide up the world into objects the way that we do for reasons having nothing at all to do with how the world actually is divided up.
The idea behind DK2 is that if there truly is this sort of disconnect between the object facts and the factors that lead us to our object beliefs, then it could only be a lucky coincidence if those factors led us to beliefs that lined up with the object facts. And the idea behind DK3 is that since we have no rational grounds for believing that we got lucky, we shouldn’t believe that we did, in which case we should suspend our beliefs about which objects there are and, in particular, our belief that there are trees.
Such debunking arguments fall short of establishing that eliminativism is true or that conservatism is false. But, if successful, they do lend powerful support to eliminativism, by effectively neutralizing any reasons we might take ourselves to have for accepting conservatism or for wanting to resist the arguments for eliminativism.
The arguments also lend indirect support to permissivism, insofar as permissivists are well positioned to deny DK2. By permissivist lights, having accurate beliefs about which kinds of objects there are is a trivial accomplishment (not a coincidence), since there are objects answering to virtually every way that we might have perceptually and conceptually divided up a situation into objects. The ordinary and extraordinary objects are all already out there waiting to be noticed; all that our conventions do is determine which ones are selected for attention.
Deflationists also seem well positioned to deny DK2. Relativists will say that, while we could easily have divided up the world differently, we could not easily had divided up the world incorrectly. For had we divided the world into trogs rather than trees, we would then have had a different conceptual scheme, and we would have correctly believed that trogs exist-relative-to-that-scheme. Quantifier variantists will say that, had we divided the world into trogs but not trees, we would then have correctly believed that trogs exist*.
Alternatively, one might try to resist DK1 by identifying an explanatory connection between the way the world is divided up and our beliefs about how it is divided up. For instance, one might say that we have the object beliefs that we do as a result of intelligent design: God, wanting us to have largely accurate beliefs, arranged for us to have experiences that represent trees and not trogs. Or one might take a rationalist line, according to which, through some capacity for rational insight, we intellectually apprehend relevant facts about which objects together compose something. Or one might opt for an anti-realist line and insist that there is a mind-to-world explanatory connection: object beliefs determine the object facts and are therefore an excellent guide to which kinds exist.
Overdetermination arguments aim to establish that ordinary objects of various kinds do not exist, by way of showing that, if they exist, they don’t do any distinctive causal work. Here is one such argument:
- (OD1) Every event caused by a baseball is caused by atoms arranged baseballwise.
- (OD2) No event caused by atoms arranged baseballwise is caused by a baseball.
- (OD3) So, no events are caused by baseballs.
- (OD4) If no events are caused by baseballs, then baseballs do not exist.
- (OD5) So, baseballs do not exist.
For the purposes of this argument, ‘atoms’ may be understood as a placeholder for whichever microscopic objects or stuff feature in the best microphysical explanations of observable reality. These may turn out to be the composite atoms of chemistry, they may be mereological simples, or they may even be a nonparticulate “quantum froth”.
One could resist OD1 by maintaining that some things that are caused by baseballs are not also caused by their atoms. On one way of developing this line of response, baseballs “trump” their atoms: atoms arranged baseballwise can’t collectively cause anything to happen so long as they’re parts of the baseball. On another, there is a division of causal labor: baseballs cause events involving macroscopic items like the shattering of windows, while their atoms cause events involving microscopic items like the scatterings of atoms arranged windowwise. Both strategies, however, look to be in tension with the plausible claim that there is a complete causal explanation for every physical event wholly in terms of microphysical items. Moreover, this line of response would seem to require that baseballs have emergent properties—causally efficacious properties that cannot be accounted for in terms of the properties of their atomic parts—which seems implausible.
OD2 can be motivated as follows:
- (OD6) If an event is caused by a baseball and by atoms arranged baseballwise, then the event is overdetermined by the baseball and atoms arranged baseballwise.
- (OD7) No event is overdetermined by a baseball and atoms arranged baseballwise.
- (OD2) So, no event caused by atoms arranged baseballwise is caused by a baseball.
Let us say that an event e is overdetermined by o1 and o2 just in case:
- (i) o1 causes e,
- (ii) o2 causes e,
- (iii) o1 is not causally relevant to o2’s causing e,
- (iv) o2 is not causally relevant to o1’s causing e, and
- (v) o1≠ o2.
Let’s just take this as a stipulation about how ‘overdetermined’ is to be understood in the argument, thus preempting nebulous debates about whether satisfying these five conditions suffices for “real” or “genuine” overdetermination. To say that o1 is causally relevant to o2’s causing e is to say that o1 enters into the explanation of how o2 causes e to occur in one of the following ways: by causing o2 to cause e, by being caused by o2 to cause e, by jointly causing e together with o2, or—where o2 is a plurality of objects—by being one of them.
Can OD6 be resisted? The idea would have to be that, although some events are caused both by atoms and by baseballs composed of those atoms, those events are not overdetermined (in the indicated sense). But if they are not overdetermined, then which of the five conditions for overdetermination do the baseball and the atoms fail to meet? This line of response takes for granted that (i) and (ii) are satisfied. And it is extremely plausible that (iii) and (iv) would be satisfied as well. However it is that baseballs “get in on the action”, it isn’t by entering into the causal explanation of how the atoms manage to cause things. Baseballs don’t cause their atoms to shatter windows, nor do their atoms cause them to shatter windows. So those who would deny OD6 will need to deny that condition (v) is satisfied, by taking the baseball to be identical to the atoms. See §3.3 below for discussion of the thesis that objects are identical to their various parts.
Why accept OD7? In certain cases, overdetermination strikes us as an overt violation of Ockham’s Razor: do not multiply entities beyond necessity. But given the intimate connection between baseballs and their atoms, it is natural to feel that even if these do count as cases of overdetermination (in the indicated sense), this isn’t an especially objectionable sort of overdetermination. One may then attempt to resist OD7 by articulating a further condition which distinguishes problematic from unproblematic cases of overdetermination. For instance, one might hold that overdetermination by o1 and o2 is unproblematic so long as o1 and o2 aren’t entirely independent.
Even supposing, however, that the line between objectionable and unobjectionable sorts of overdetermination can be drawn in some satisfactory way, there would still be pressure to accept OD7. We should accept that something other than the atoms shatters the window only if we have good reason to believe in this something. But there is no explanatory need to posit baseballs, since there is a complete causal explanation for all of the relevant events wholly in terms of the activities of the atoms. And the debunking arguments in §2.6 purport the show that our ordinary perceptual reasons for believing in baseballs are no good. So we would seem to have no good reason at all to accept that there are baseballs, in which case we ought to accept OD7.
Premise OD4 can be motivated in much the same way as OD7. If baseballs don’t cause anything to happen, then we have no good reason to believe in them, in which case we should accept OD4. One might also give a more direct defense of OD4 by appealing to the controversial Eleatic Principle (a.k.a. Alexander’s Dictum), according to which everything that exists has causal powers. Together with the plausible assumption that if baseballs don’t cause anything it’s because they can’t cause anything, the Eleatic Principle entails OD4.
The office appears to contain a single wooden desk. The desk is constituted by a single hunk of wood whose surface forms a sharp boundary with the environment, without even a single cellulose molecule coming loose from the others. Call this hunk of wood ‘Woodrow’. Now consider the object consisting of all of Woodrow’s parts except for a single cellulose molecule, ‘Molly’, making up part of Woodrow’s surface. Call this ever-so-slightly smaller hunk of wood ‘Woodrow-minus’. Because Woodrow-minus is extraordinarily similar to Woodrow, there is considerable pressure to accept that Woodrow-minus is a desk as well. This, in short, is the problem of the many.
- (PM1) Woodrow is a desk iff Woodrow-minus is a desk.
- (PM2) If so, then it is not the case that there is exactly one desk in the office.
- (PM3) There is exactly one desk in the office.
PM1 and PM2 straightforwardly entail that PM3 is false; one of these claims has to go.
PM1 is plausible. Woodrow-minus seems to have everything that it takes to be a desk: it looks like a desk, it’s shaped like a desk, it’s got a flat writing surface, and so forth. Accordingly, it would be arbitrary to suppose that Woodrow but not Woodrow-minus is a desk. Moreover, if Molly were removed, Woodrow-minus would certainly then be a desk. But since Woodrow-minus doesn’t itself undergo any interesting change when Molly is removed (after all, Molly isn’t even part of Woodrow-minus), it stands to reason that Woodrow-minus must likewise be a desk even while Molly is attached to it.
One might deny PM1 on the grounds that being a desk is a “maximal” property, that is, a property of an object that cannot be shared by large parts of that object. Since Woodrow is a desk, and since Woodrow-minus is a large part of Woodrow, Woodrow-minus is not a desk.
But this style of response can be rendered unavailable by introducing an element of vagueness into our story. Suppose now that Molly has begun to come loose from the other molecules, in such a way that it is naturally described as being a borderline part of the desk in the office. Let Woodrow-plus be the aggregate of cellulose molecules that definitely has Molly as a part. PM1 can then be replaced with PM1′:
- (PM1′) Woodrow-plus is a desk iff Woodrow-minus is a desk.
Woodrow-plus and Woodrow-minus each seem to have everything that it takes to be a desk, and neither seems to be a better candidate than the other for being a desk. PM2 would then be replaced with PM2′:
- (PM2′) If Woodrow-plus is a desk iff Woodrow-minus is a desk, then: it is not the case that there is exactly one desk in the office.
PM1′ can be resisted by proponents of the supervaluationist strategy sketched in §2.1 above. The vague term ‘desk’ has multiple precisifications, some of which apply to Woodrow-plus, some of which apply to Woodrow-minus, but none of which applies to both. Accordingly, PM1′ is false on some precisifications, and therefore is not true simpliciter.
Constitutional pluralists can deny both PM2 and PM2′. Regarding the original story, they may insist that neither Woodrow nor Woodrow-minus is a desk. Each is a mere hunk of wood, and no mere hunk of wood is a desk. Rather, there is exactly one desk, it is constituted by Woodrow, and while Woodrow-minus would constitute that desk if Molly were removed, as things stand it constitutes nothing at all. Regarding the revised story, pluralists may again say that there is exactly one desk, neither Woodrow-plus nor Woodrow-minus is a desk, and it is simply indeterminate whether it is Woodrow-plus or Woodrow-minus that constitutes that desk. So PM2′ is false: it’s true that each is a desk iff the other is—since neither is a desk—but it doesn’t follow that there’s more than one or fewer than one desk.
Finally, one might deny PM3, either by accepting an eliminative view on which there is no desk in the office or by accepting a permissive view on which there is more than one desk in the office. Proponents of the latter response will end up committed to far more than two desks, however. By parity of reason, there will also be a desk composed of all of the cellulose molecules except Nelly (≠ Molly). Likewise for Ollie. And so on. So there will be at least as many desks as there are cellulose molecules on the surface of the desk.
Universalism seems to conflict with our intuitive judgment that the front halves of trout and the back halves of turkeys do not compose anything. Put another way, universalism seems to be open to fairly obvious counterexamples. Here is an argument from counterexamples against universalism:
- (CX1) If universalism is true, then there are trout-turkeys.
- (CX2) There are no trout-turkeys.
- (CX3) So universalism is false.
Similar arguments may be lodged against other revisionary theses. The various forms of eliminativism wrongly imply that there are no statues; the doctrine of plenitude wrongly implies that there are incars; the doctrine of arbitrary undetached parts wrongly implies that there are leg complements; and so forth.
Compatibilist accounts of the apparent counterexamples take the targeted revisionary views to be entirely compatible with the intuitions or beliefs that are meant to motivate CX2. Such accounts often take the form of assimilating recalcitrant ordinary utterances to some familiar linguistic phenomenon that is known to be potentially misleading. For instance, when an ordinary speaker looks in the fridge and says ‘there’s no beer’, she obviously doesn’t mean to be saying that there is no beer anywhere in the universe. Rather, she is tacitly restricting her quantifier to things that are in the fridge. Universalists often suggest that something similar is going on when ordinary speakers say ‘there are no trout-turkeys’ (or ‘there’s nothing that has both fins and feathers’). Speakers are tacitly restricting their quantifiers to ordinary objects, and what they are saying is entirely compatible with there being extraordinary finned-and-feathered things like trout-turkeys. Universalists may then hold that the argument from counterexamples rests on an equivocation. If the quantifiers are meant to be restricted to ordinary objects, then CX2 is true, but CX1 is false: universalism does not entail that any ordinary things are trout-turkeys. If on the other hand the quantifiers are meant to be entirely unrestricted then CX2 is false; but in denying CX2, one is not running afoul of anything we are inclined to say or believe or intuit.
This is just one of many compatibilist strategies that have been deployed in defense of revisionary views. Universalists have also invoked an ambiguity in ‘object’ to explain the appeal of ‘there is no object that has both fins and feathers’. Eliminativists have claimed that ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ are instances of “loose talk”, or that they are context-sensitive, or that quantifiers are being used in a special technical sense in the “ontology room”.
One common complaint about compatibilist accounts is that these proposals about what we are saying and what we believe are linguistically or psychologically implausible. For instance, when ordinary speakers are speaking loosely or restricting their quantifiers, they will typically balk when their remarks are taken at face value. (“You’re saying uncooked rice literally lasts forever?” “There’s no beer anywhere in the world?”) But this sort of evidence seems just to be missing in the cases at hand. (“You literally think there are statues?” “There’s nothing at all with both fins and feathers?”)
Revisionaries may instead wish to give incompatibilist accounts of the putative counterexamples, conceding that the revisionary views they defend are incompatible with ordinary belief (ordinary discourse, common sense, intuition, etc.), but maintaining that the mistakes can be explained or excused. For instance, revisionaries may contend that the mistaken beliefs are nevertheless justified, so long as one is not aware of the defeaters that undercut our usual justification (e.g., those mentioned in §2.6). Or they may contend that ordinary speakers are not especially committed to these beliefs, which may in turn suggest that they do not deserve to be treated as data for purposes of philosophical inquiry. Or they may call attention to some respect in which the ordinary utterances and beliefs are “nearly as good as true”.
One way of approaching the question of whether there are statues is by asking whether the correct interpretation of the English language is one according to which ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ come out true. The interpretation of populations of speakers is plausibly governed by a principle of charity that prohibits the gratuitous ascription of false beliefs and utterances to populations of speakers. Such a principle—which is independently motivated by reflection on how it is that utterances come to have the meanings that they do—can be put to work in arguments for the existence of ordinary objects and for the nonexistence of extraordinary objects. Here is one such argument from charity:
- (CH1) The most charitable interpretation of English is one on which ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ comes out true.
- (CH2) If so, then ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ are true.
- (CH3) If ordinary utterances of ‘there are statues’ are true, then there are statues.
- (CH4) So, there are statues.
To see the idea behind CH1, notice that both eliminativists and conservatives can agree that there are atoms arranged statuewise. The question is whether the English sentence ‘there are statues’ should be interpreted in such a way that the existence of such atoms suffices for it to come out true. Let us call interpretations of ‘there are statues’ on which the existence of atoms arranged statuewise suffices for its truth liberal, and interpretations on which that does not suffice for its truth demanding. The idea then is that, given the availability of both liberal and demanding interpretations, the former would clearly be more charitable. CH2 is motivated by the thought that there are no other content-determining factors that favor a demanding interpretation over a liberal interpretation, in which case charity wins out and ‘there are statues’ is true. CH3 looks to be a straightforward application of a plausible disquotation principle: if sentence S says that p, and S is true, then p.
One might challenge CH1 on the grounds that charitable interpretation is a holistic matter, and, while the liberal interpretations are charitable in some respects, they are uncharitable in others. After all, the puzzles and arguments discussed in §2 seem to show that no interpretation can secure the truth of everything that we are inclined to say about ordinary objects. For instance, the liberal interpretations on which MC1 comes out true (‘Athena and Piece exist’) must, on pain of contradiction, make at least one of MC2 through MC4 come out false. But then some other intuitively true claim—perhaps, ‘Athena and Piece (if they exist) are identical’—will come out false. The demanding interpretations on which MC1 comes out false do better than the liberal interpretations on this score, since they can make all of MC2 through MC4 come out true. This gain in charity might then be held to counterbalance the loss in charity from rendering MC1 false.
One might also challenge CH1 on the grounds that the principle of charity, properly understood, demands only that the utterances and beliefs of ordinary speakers be reasonable, not that they be true. Since it looks to ordinary speakers as if there are statues, and since they have no reason to believe that appearances are misleading (having never encountered the arguments for eliminativism), their utterances and beliefs would be reasonable even if false. The principle of charity, so understood, would not favor liberal interpretations over demanding interpretations.
Another strategy involves resisting the argument at CH2, by maintaining that there are constraints beyond charity that favor the demanding interpretations. Charity, after all, is not the only factor involved in determining the meanings of our utterances. Certain puzzles about content determination have been thought to show that the content of an expression or utterance cannot be determined solely by which sentences we are inclined to regard as true; it is also partly a matter of the relative “naturalness” or “eligibility” of candidate contents. One who accepts this sort of account may maintain that the demanding interpretations, although less charitable, nevertheless assign more natural contents to English sentences than the liberal interpretations, for instance by assigning a more natural meaning to the quantifiers.
Finally, CH3 may be resisted by compatibilists, according to whom what ordinary speakers are saying is compatible with the eliminativist’s claim that statues do not exist. Since ontological discussions (like this one) are not carried out in ordinary English or ordinary contexts, one cannot infer that there are statues from the fact that ordinary speakers can truly say ‘there are statues’, any more than I can infer that I am on the moon from the fact that an astronaut truly utters ‘I am on the moon’.
Arguments from entailment purport to establish that eliminativism is self-defeating, insofar as certain things that eliminativists affirm entail the existence of the very ordinary objects that they wish to eliminate. Here is a representative argument from entailment:
- (ET1) There are atoms arranged statuewise.
- (ET2) If there are atoms arranged statuewise, then there are statues.
- (ET3) So, there are statues.
Below, I consider two arguments for ET2: the argument from identity and the argument from application conditions.
The argument from identity proceeds from the assumption that ordinary objects are identical to the smaller objects of which they are composed. The statue, for instance, is identical to its atomic parts. Accordingly, by affirming that there are atoms arranged statuewise, eliminativists let into their ontology the very things that they had intended to exclude.
However, the view that composites are identical to their parts is highly controversial. One common objection is that the identity relation simply isn’t the sort of relation that can hold between a single thing and many things. Another common objection is that ordinary objects have different persistence conditions from their parts. For instance, the atoms arranged statuewise, unlike the statue, will still exist if the statue disintegrates and the atoms disperse. It would then seem to follow by Leibniz’s Law that the atoms are not identical to the statue.
The argument from application conditions arises out of some general considerations about how it is that kind terms refer to what they do. Suppose an archaeologist uncovers an unfamiliar artifact, gestures towards it, and introduces the name ‘woodpick’ for things of that kind. Yet there are numerous things before her: the woodpick, the woodpick’s handle, the facing surface of the woodpick, etc. Furthermore, the woodpick itself belongs to numerous kinds: woodpick, tool, artifact, etc. So how is it that ‘woodpick’ came to denote woodpicks rather than something else? (This is an instance of what is known as the qua problem.) It must be because the speaker associates certain application conditions and perhaps other descriptive information with the term ‘woodpick’, which single out woodpicks—rather than all tools or just the facing surfaces of woodpicks—as the denotation of the term. And the same is plausibly so for already-entrenched kind terms like ‘statue’: their reference is largely determined by the application conditions that speakers associate with them.
Armed with this account of reference determination, one might then argue for ET2 as follows. The application conditions that competent speakers associate with ‘statue’—together with facts about the distribution of atoms—determine whether it applies to something. But these applications conditions are fairly undemanding: nothing further is required for their satisfaction than that there be atoms arranged statuewise. Accordingly, so long as there are atoms arranged statuewise, ‘statue’ does apply to something, from which it trivially follows that there are statues.
This argument may be resisted on the grounds that the application conditions that ordinary speakers associate with ‘statue’ aren’t quite so undemanding. It’s not enough simply that there be atoms arranged statuewise. Rather, there must be an object that is composed of the atoms—and (eliminativists might go on to insist) there are no such objects. However, those who are moved by the qua problem might respond that ‘object’ itself must be associated with application conditions, which are likewise sufficiently undemanding as to be satisfied so long as there are atoms arranged statuewise.
The material constitution puzzles from §2.3 can be repurposed as arguments against two forms of permissivism: universalism and the doctrine of arbitrary undetached parts (DAUP). The basic idea behind both arguments is that permissivists end up committed to objects that are distinct and yet share all of their parts, which is impossible.
Here is a coincidence argument against universalism. Let the ks be the atoms that presently compose my kitchen table, K, and let us suppose that there is some time, t, long before the table itself was made, at which the ks all existed.
- (CU1) If universalism is true, then there is some object, F, that the ks composed at t.
- (CU2) If the ks composed F at t, then F exists now.
- (CU3) If F exists now, then F = K.
- (CU4) If F = K, then K existed at t.
- (CU5) K did not exist at t.
- (CU6) So, universalism is false.
CU1 looks to be a consequence of universalism, given our assumption that the ks all existed at t. The idea behind CU2 is that there would seem to be only two nonarbitrary accounts of the persistence conditions of the widely scattered fusion F: (i) that F exists for as long as the ks are in precisely the arrangement that they enjoy at t or (ii) that F exists for as long as the ks exist. Option (i) imposes an implausibly severe constraint on the sorts of changes an object can survive, which leaves us with option (ii)—from which it follows that, since the ks exist now, so does F. The idea behind CU3 is that there cannot be distinct objects which (like F and K) have exactly the same parts and exactly the same location. CU4 is a straightforward consequence of Leibniz’s Law: F by hypothesis existed at t, so if F = K then K must also have existed at t. As for CU5, tables plausibly are essentially tables, in which case K could not have existed before the table was made.
Here are some options for resisting the argument (some mirroring responses to the puzzles of material constitution). One can deny CU2 on the grounds that table is the “dominant kind”, and once K comes into existence, it takes F’s place and F is annihilated. Constitutional pluralists can deny CU3 and affirm that F ≠ K, perhaps granting that distinct objects can have exactly the same parts and location, or insisting that F and K have different (e.g., temporal) parts. Or one can deny CU5, insisting that K is only contingently a table and (like F) was once a scattered fusion.
Now for the coincidence argument against DAUP. Take the example of Woodrow and Woodrow-minus from §2.8. At t1, Molly the cellulose molecule is a part of Woodrow and at t2 Molly is removed and destroyed. Let Woodrow1 be that (if anything) which ‘Woodrow’ picks out at t1; Woodrow2, that (if anything) which ‘Woodrow’ picks out at t2; and mutatis mutandis for Woodrow-minus1 and Woodrow-minus2. Here is the argument:
- (CD1) If DAUP is true, then Woodrow-minus1 exists.
- (CD2) If Woodrow-minus1 exists, then Woodrow-minus2 exists.
- (CD3) If Woodrow-minus2 exists, then Woodrow-minus2 = Woodrow2.
- (CD4) If Woodrow-minus2 = Woodrow2, then Woodrow-minus1 = Woodrow1.
- (CD5) Woodrow-minus1 ≠ Woodrow1.
- (CD6) So, DAUP is false.
CD1 looks trivial: DAUP guarantees that there is an arbitrary undetached part of Woodrow composed of all of its parts other than Molly. The idea behind CD2 is that Woodrow-minus doesn’t undergo any change between t1 and t2 that could threaten its existence; all that happens is that it is separated from something (Molly) that was not even a part of it. CD3, like CU3, is motivated by the intuition that objects with the same parts and same location must be identical. CD4 is an application of the transitivity of identity: Woodrow-minus1 = Woodrow-minus2, so if Woodrow-minus2 = Woodrow2, then (by transitivity) Woodrow-minus1 = Woodrow2; and since Woodrow2 = Woodrow1, it follows (by transitivity) that Woodrow-minus1 = Woodrow1. Finally, CD5 is a straightforward consequence of Leibniz’s Law: Woodrow-minus1 and Woodrow1 have different parts and thus cannot be identical.
As with the argument against universalism, one can resist this argument by denying CD2 and insisting that once Molly is removed, Woodrow-minus is “dominated” by Woodrow and ceases to exist. Or one can deny CD3 and insist that Woodrow and Woodrow-minus are distinct at t2 despite having all the same material parts at t2. Or one can deny CD4 by insisting that Woodrow has all of its parts essentially, in which case Woodrow1 ≠ Woodrow2.
A “gunky” object is a composite object all of whose parts themselves have parts. The mere possibility of gunky objects underwrites an argument against the nihilist thesis that (actually) there are no composite objects.
- (GK1) It is possible for there to be gunky objects.
- (GK2) If gunky objects are possible, then nihilism isn’t necessarily true.
- (GK3) If nihilism isn’t necessarily true, then nihilism isn’t actually true.
- (GK4) So, nihilism is false.
GK1 is plausible. It seems easy enough to imagine gunky objects, for instance by imagining an object with a right and left half, each of which itself has a right and left half, which themselves have right and left halves … “all the way down”, and never terminating in simple parts. Moreover, it may even be that actually all objects are gunky. GK2 is trivial: if there are gunky objects in world w, then there is something with parts in w, in which case there are composites in w and nihilism is false in w. GK3 is plausible as well: the actual world contains what would seem to be paradigm cases of composites (trees, etc.), so if composition occurs anywhere, it surely occurs here. Moreover, nihilism is meant to be an answer to the special composition question, and one would expect such an answer to be giving necessary and sufficient conditions for composition—in which case one would expect proponents of nihilism to regard it as a necessary truth.
Some will deny GK1. What does seem obviously possible (and easily imaginable) for there to be certain kinds of infinite descent. But infinite descent need not be mereological. For instance, it does seem possible for there to be objects that can be divided into two halves, and whose halves can in turn be divided into two halves, and so on. But it is controversial whether the fact that o can be divided into two halves, h1 and h2, entails that o is not simple. One might deny that h1 and h2 exist at all before the division: they are brought into existence when o is divided and, a fortiori, are not parts of o prior to division. Or one might concede that, prior to division, h1 and h2 exist and are partially colocated with o, but deny that they are thereby parts of o.
One might instead reject GK3 on the grounds that it runs afoul of “Hume’s Dictum”, according to which there can be no necessary connections among distinct existences. There is some controversy about how best to understand Hume’s Dictum and, in particular, whether it prohibits necessary connections even between overlapping items (which typically are thought not to be “distinct” in the relevant sense). But assuming that it does, then it will rule out any principle of composition according to which simples in certain arrangements cannot fail to compose something—for this would be to impose a necessary connection between simples being in that arrangement and the existence of a (numerically distinct) whole that they compose. And if we cannot in general expect theories of composition to be necessary if true, we should not expect nihilism to be necessary if true.
Just as the possibility of infinite descent can be wielded against nihilism, the possibility of infinite ascent can be wielded against universalism. Let us say that there is “junk” iff every object is a part of some further object.
- (JK1) It is possible for there to be junk.
- (JK2) If junk is possible, then universalism isn’t necessarily true.
- (JK3) If universalism isn’t necessarily true, then universalism isn’t actually true.
- (JK4) So, universalism is false.
The idea behind JK1 is that an infinite ascent of wholes is no less imaginable than an infinite descent of parts. The idea behind JK2 runs as follows. According to universalism, every plurality of objects has a fusion, and, in particular, the plurality consisting of all things has a fusion. But there can be no fusion of all things in a junky world. For that fusion would have to be a part of something (since the world is junky); but if it already has everything as a part, there is nothing left for it to be a part of. JK3 can be motivated in much the same way as GK3: universalism is meant to be an answer to the special composition question, and thus will presumably be necessary if true. The strategies considered above for resisting the gunk argument seem to apply equally to the junk argument—one can, for instance, deny that we are imagining what we think we are, or one can invoke Hume’s Dictum and deny that universalism is necessary if true.
As we have seen, there are some who deny that ordinary composite objects exist, and we have examined some of their reasons for embracing one or another form of eliminativism. But there are also some who grant that ordinary objects exist but deny that they exist fundamentally. This is an importantly different claim, which can be spelled out in either of two importantly different ways.
First, one might deny that any ordinary composite objects are fundamental, that is, one can insist that there is something in which they are grounded. Even those who think that ordinary objects exist will likely find it natural to suppose that no ordinary composites are fundamental: all ordinary composites are ultimately going to be grounded in their simple microscopic parts.
On the second understanding of the claim that ordinary objects do not exist fundamentally, the idea is that they are not in the domain of a fundamental quantifier, where the fundamental quantifiers are the quantifiers that appear in the best correct and complete theory of the world. To help see how the two understandings of “exists fundamentally” can come apart, notice that the identity relation is plausibly fundamental (appearing in the best theory of the world), despite the fact that it relates every object—including nonfundamental objects—to itself. A relation can be fundamental without dragging everything in its extension into the fundamental level with it. Similarly, even if the ordinary existential quantifier is a fundamental quantifier, that does not obviously entail that everything in its domain (namely: everything) is fundamental as well.
Even so, one might deny that the ordinary existential quantifier is a fundamental quantifier on grounds of parsimony. Explanations involving quantifiers whose domains include nonfundamental objects (the idea goes) will be less parsimonious than explanations involving quantifiers whose domains include only fundamental objects. And since the ordinary existential quantifier includes nonfundamental objects (e.g., ordinary composites), it will be less fundamental than restricted quantifiers ranging only over fundamental objects.
How do these stances on fundamentality—that ordinary objects are not fundamental or are not in the domain of fundamental quantifiers—compare to the eliminativist theses discussed above? Although there is a superficial resemblance, the differences are manifest when we consider how the views interact with the arguments against conservatism in §2. Eliminativists, who say that ordinary objects do not exist, can accept AV5, DK4, OD5, SR4, and ST8 and can reject AR1, MC1, and PM3 in the arguments above, since the latter affirm, and the former deny, the existence of ordinary objects. But those who are willing to deny only that ordinary objects exist fundamentally (in one or the other sense) must find some other way of addressing the arguments.
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