The Problem of the Many

First published Thu Jan 9, 2003; substantive revision Fri Apr 10, 2009

As anyone who has flown out of a cloud knows, the boundaries of a cloud are a lot less sharp up close than they can appear on the ground. Even when it seems clearly true that there is one, sharply bounded, cloud up there, really there are thousands of water droplets that are neither determinately part of the cloud, nor determinately outside it. Consider any object that consists of the core of the cloud, plus an arbitrary selection of these droplets. It will look like a cloud, and circumstances permitting rain like a cloud, and generally has as good a claim to be a cloud as any other object in that part of the sky. But we cannot say every such object is a cloud, else there would be millions of clouds where it seemed like there was one. And what holds for clouds holds for anything whose boundaries look less clear the closer you look at it. And that includes just about every kind of object we normally think about, including humans. Although this seems to be a merely technical puzzle, even a triviality, a surprising range of proposed solutions has emerged, many of them mutually inconsistent. It is not even settled whether a solution should come from metaphysics, or from philosophy of language, or from logic. Here we survey the options, and provide several links to the many topics related to the Problem.

1. Introduction

In his (1980), Peter Unger introduced the “Problem of the Many”. A similar problem appeared simultaneously in P. T. Geach (1980), but Unger's presentation has been the most influential over recent years. The problem initially looks like a special kind of puzzle about vague predicates, but that may be misleading. Some of the standard solutions to Sorites paradoxes do not obviously help here, so perhaps the Problem reveals some deeper truths involving the metaphysics of material constitution, or the logic of statements involving identity.

The puzzle arises as soon as there is an object without clearly demarcated borders. Unger suggested that clouds are paradigms of this phenomena, and recent authors such as David Lewis (1993) and Neil McKinnon (2002) have followed him here. Here is Lewis's presentation of the puzzle:

Think of a cloud—just one cloud, and around it a clear blue sky. Seen from the ground, the cloud may seem to have a sharp boundary. Not so. The cloud is a swarm of water droplets. At the outskirts of the cloud, the density of the droplets falls off. Eventually they are so few and far between that we may hesitate to say that the outlying droplets are still part of the cloud at all; perhaps we might better say only that they are near the cloud. But the transition is gradual. Many surfaces are equally good candidates to be the boundary of the cloud. Therefore many aggregates of droplets, some more inclusive and some less inclusive (and some inclusive in different ways than others), are equally good candidates to be the cloud. Since they have equal claim, how can we say that the cloud is one of these aggregates rather than another? But if all of them count as clouds, then we have many clouds rather than one. And if none of them count, each one being ruled out because of the competition from the others, then we have no cloud. How is it, then, that we have just one cloud? And yet we do. (Lewis 1993: 164)

The paradox arises because in the story as told the following eight claims each seem to be true, but they are mutually inconsistent.

  1. There are several distinct sets of water droplets sk such that for each such set, it is not clear whether the water droplets in sk form a cloud.
  2. There is a cloud in the sky.
  3. There is at most one cloud in the sky.
  4. For each set sk, there is an object ok that the water droplets in sk compose.
  5. If the water droplets in si compose oi, and the objects in sj compose oj, and the sets si and sk are not identical, then the objects oi and oj are not identical.
  6. If oi is a cloud in the sky, and oj is a cloud in the sky, and oi is not identical with oj, then there are two clouds in the sky.
  7. If any of these sets si are such that its members compose a cloud, then for any other set sj, if its members compose an object oj, then oj is a cloud.
  8. Any cloud is composed of a set of water droplets.

To see the inconsistency, note that by 1 and 7 there is a cloud composed of water droplets. Say this cloud is composed of the water droplets in si, and let sj be any other set whose members might, for all we can tell, form a cloud. (Premise 0 guarantees the existence of such a set.) By 3, the water droplets in sj compose an object oj. By 4, oj is not identical to our original cloud. By 6, oj is a cloud, and since it is transparently in the sky, it is a cloud in the sky. By 5, there are two clouds in the sky. But this is inconsistent with 2. A solution to the paradox must provide a reason for rejecting one of the premises, or a reason to reject the reasoning that led us to the contradiction, or the means to live with the contradiction. Since none of the motivations for believing in the existence of dialetheia apply here, I will ignore the last possibility. And since 0 follows directly from the way the story is told, I will ignore that option as well. That leaves open eight possibilities.

(The classification of the solutions here is slightly different from that in Chapter One of Hud Hudson's “A Materialist Metaphysics of the Human Person.” But I have a deep debt to Hudson's presentation of the range of solutions, which should be clear from the discussion that follows.)

2. Nihilism

Unger's original solution was to reject 1. The concept of a cloud involved, he thought, inconsistent presuppositions. Since those presuppositions were not satisfied, there are no clouds. This is a rather radical move, since it applies not just to clouds, but to any kind of sortal for which a similar problem can be generated. And, Unger pointed out, this includes most sortals. As Lewis puts it, “Think of a rusty nail, and the gradual transition from steel … to rust merely resting on the nail. Or think of a cathode, and its departing electrons. Or think of anything that undergoes evaporation or erosion or abrasion. Or think of yourself, or any organism, with parts that gradually come loose in metabolism or excretion or perspiration or shedding of dead skin.” (Lewis 1993: 165)

Despite Lewis's presentation, the Problem of the Many is not a problem about change. The salient feature of these examples is that, in practice, change is a slow process. Hence whenever a cathode, or a human, is changing, be it by shedding electrons, or shedding skin, there are some things that are not clearly part of the object, nor clearly not part of it. Hence there are distinct sets that each have a good claim to being the set of parts of the cathode, or of the human, and that is what is important.

It would be profoundly counterintuitive if there were no clouds, or no cathodes, or no humans, and that is probably enough to reject the position, if any of the alternatives are not also equally counterintuitive. It also, as Unger noted, creates difficulties for many views about singular thought and talk. Intuitively, we can pick out one of the objects composed of water droplets by the phrase ‘that cloud’. But if it is not a cloud, then possibly we cannot. For similar reasons, we may not be able to name any such object, if we use any kind of reference-fixing description involving ‘cloud’ to pick it out from other objects composed of water droplets. If the problem of the many applies to humans as well as clouds, then by similar reasoning we cannot name or demonstrate any human, or, if you think there are no humans, any human-like object. Unger was happy to take these results to be philosophical discoveries, but they are so counterintuitive that most theorists hold that they form a reductio of his theory.

It is interesting that some recent theories of vagueness have adopted positions resembling Unger's in some respects, but without the extreme conclusions. Matti Eklund (2002) and Roy Sorensen (2001) have argued that all vague concepts involve inconsistent presuppositions. Sorensen spells this out by saying that there are some inconsistent propositions that anyone who possesses a vague concept should believe. In the case of a vague predicate F that is vulnerable to a Sorites paradox, the inconsistent propositions are that some things are Fs, some things are not Fs, any object that closely resembles (in a suitable respect) something that is F is itself F, and that there are chains of ‘suitably resembling’ objects between an F and a non-F. Here the inconsistent propositions are that a story like Lewis's is possible, and in it 0 through 7 are true. Neither Eklund nor Sorensen conclude from this that nothing satisfies the predicates in question rather they conclude that some propositions that we find compelling merely in virtue of possessing the concepts from which they are constituted are false. So while they don't adopt Unger's nihilist conclusions, two contemporary theorists agree with him that vague concepts are in some sense incoherent.

3. Over-population

A simple solution to the puzzle is to reject premise 2. Each of the relevant fusions of water droplets looks and acts like a cloud, so it is a cloud. As with the first option this leads to some very counterintuitive results. In any room with at least one person, there are many millions of people. But this is not as bad, I think, as saying that there are no people. And perhaps we don't even have to say the striking claim. In many circumstances, we quantify over a restricted domain. We can say, “There's no beer,” even when there is beer in some non-salient locales. With respect to some restricted quantifier domains, it is true that there is exactly one person in a particular room. The surprising result is that with respect to other quantifier domains, there are many millions of people in that room. The defender of the over-population theory will hold that this shows how unusual it is to use unrestricted quantifiers, not that there really is only one person in the room.

No one has seriously defended the over-population solution to the problem of the many. Hudson (2001: 34) attributes it to David Lewis, but Lewis says he is rejecting 5 not rejecting 2. As Lewis says, he is interested in a solution that, “concedes that the many are [clouds] but seeks to deny that the [clouds] are really many.” (On the other hand, if rejecting 5 is just incoherent, then it is not unfair to interpret Lewis as rejecting 2.)

Hudson (2001: 39–44) draws out a surprising consequence of the over-population solution as applied to people. Assume that there are really millions of people just where we'd normally say there was exactly one. Call that person Charlie. When Charlie raises her arm, each of the millions must also raise their arms, for the millions differ only in whether or not they contain some borderline skin cells, not in whether their arm is raised or lowered. Normally, if two people are such that whenever one acts a certain way, then so must the other, we would say that at most one of them is acting freely. So it looks like at most one of the millions of people around Charlie are free. There are a few possible responses here, though whether a defender of the over-population view will view this consequence as being more counter-intuitive than other claims to which she is already committed, and hence whether it needs a special response, is not clear. There are some other striking, though not always philosophically relevant, features of this solution. To quote Hudson:

Among the most troublesome are worries about naming and singular reference … how can any of us ever hope to successfully refer to himself without referring to his brothers as well? Or how might we have a little private time to tell just one of our sons of our affection for him without sharing the moment with uncountably many of his brothers? Or how might we follow through on our vow to practice monogamy? (Hudson 2001: 39)

4. Brutalism

As Unger originally states it, the puzzle relies on a contentious principle of mereology. In particular, it assumes mereological Universalism, the view that for any objects, there is an object that has all of them as its fusion. (That is, it has each of those objects as parts, and has no parts that do not overlap at least one of the original objects.) Without this assumption, the Problem of the Many may have an easy solution. The cloud in the sky is the object up there that is a fusion of water droplets. There are many other sets of water droplets, other than the set of water droplets that compose the cloud, but since the members of those sets do not compose an object, they do not compose a cloud.

There are two kinds of theories that imply that only one of the sets of water droplets is such that there exists a fusion of its atoms. First, there are principled restrictions on composition, theories that say that the xs compose an object y iff the xs are F, for some natural property F. Secondly, there are brutal theories, which say it's just a brute fact that in some cases the xs compose an object, and in others they do not. It would be quite hard to imagine a principled theory solving the Problem of the Many, since it is hard to see what the principle could be. (For a more detailed argument for this, set against a somewhat different backdrop, see McKinnon 2002.) But a brutal theory could work. And such a theory has been defended. Ned Markosian (1998) argues that not only does brutalism, the doctrine that there are brute facts about when the xs compose a y, solves the Problem of the Many, the account of composition it implies fits more naturally with our intuitions about composition.

It seems objectionable, in some not easy to pin down way, to rely on brute facts in just this way. Here is how Terrence Horgan puts the objection:

In particular, a good metaphysical theory or scientific theory should avoid positing a plethora of quite specific, disconnected, sui generis, compositional facts. Such facts would be ontological danglers; they would be metaphysically queer. Even though explanation presumably must bottom out somewhere, it is just not credible—or even intelligible—that it should bottom out with specific compositional facts which themselves are utterly unexplainable and which do not conform to any systematic general principles. (Horgan 1993: 694–5)

On the other hand, this kind of view does provide a particularly straightforward solution to the Problem of the Many. As Markosian notes, if we have independent reason to view favourably the idea that facts about when some things compose an object are brute fact, which he thinks is provided by our intuitions about cases of composition and non-composition, the very simplicity of this solution to the Problem of the Many may count as an argument in favour of brutalism.

5. Relative Identity

Assume that the brutalist is wrong, and every for every set of water droplets, there is an object those water droplets compose. Since that object looks for all the world like a cloud, we will say it is a cloud. The fourth solution accepts those claims, but denies that there are many clouds. It is true that there are many fusions of atoms, but these are all the same cloud. This view adopts a position most commonly associated with P. T. Geach (1980), that two things can be the same F but not the same G, even though they are both Gs. To see the motivation for that position, and a discussion of its strengths and weaknesses, see the article on relative identity.

Here I will just mention one objection that many have felt is telling against the relative identity view. Let w be a water droplet that is in s1 but not s2. The relative identity solution says that the droplets in s1 compose an object o1, and the droplets in s2 compose an object o2, and though o1 and o2 are different fusions of water droplets, they are the same cloud. Call this cloud c. If o1 is the same cloud as o2, then presumably they have the same properties. But o1 has the property of having w as a part, while o2 does not. Defenders of the relative identity theory here deny the principle that if two objects are the same F, they have the same properties. Many theorists find this denial to amount to a reductio of the view.

6. Partial Identity

Even if o1 and o2 exist, and are clouds, and are not the same cloud, it does not immediately follow that there are two clouds. If we analyse “There are two clouds” as “There is an x and a y such that x is a cloud and y is a cloud, and x is not the same cloud as y” then the conclusion will naturally follow. But perhaps that is not the correct analysis of “There are two clouds.” Or, more cautiously, perhaps it is not the correct analysis in all contexts. Following some suggestions of D. M. Armstrong's (Armstrong 1978, vol. 2: 37–8), David Lewis suggests a solution along these lines. The objects o1 and o2 are not the same cloud, but they are almost the same cloud. And in everyday circumstances (AT) is a good enough analysis of “There is one cloud”

(AT)     There is a cloud, and all clouds are almost identical with it.

As Lewis puts it, we ‘count by almost-identity’ rather than by identity in everyday contexts. And when we do, we get the correct result that there is one cloud in the sky. Lewis notes that there are other contexts in which we count by some criteria other than identity.

If an infirm man wishes to know how many roads he must cross to reach his destination, I will count by identity-along-his-path rather than by identity. By crossing the Chester A. Arthur Parkway and Route 137 at the brief stretch where they have merged, he can cross both by crossing only one road. (Lewis 1976: 27)

There are two major objections to this theory. First, as Hudson notes, even if we normally count by almost-identity, we know how to count by identity, and when we do it seems that there is one cloud in the sky, not many millions. A defender of Lewis's position may say that the only reason this seems intuitive is that it is normally intuitive to say that there is only one cloud in the sky. And that intuition is respected! More contentiously, it may be argued that it is a good thing to predict that when we count by identity we get the result that there are millions of clouds. After all, the only time we'd do this is when we're doing metaphysics, and we have noted that in the metaphysics classroom, there is some intuitive force to the argument that there are millions of clouds in the sky. It would be a brave philosopher to endorse this as a virtue of the theory, but it may offset some of the costs.

Secondly, something like the Problem of the Many can arise even when the possible objects are not almost identical. Lewis notes this objection, and provides an illustrative example to back it up. A similar kind of example can be found in W. V. O. Quine's Word and Object (1960). Lewis's example is of a house with an attached garage. It is unclear whether the garage is part of the house or an external attachment to it. So it is unclear whether the phrase ‘Fred's house’ denotes the basic house, call it the home, or the fusion of the home and the garage. What is clear is that there is exactly one house here. However, the home might be quite different from the fusion of the home and the garage. It will probably be smaller and warmer, for example. So the home and the home-garage fusion are not even almost identical. Quine's example is of something that looks, at first, to be a mountain with two peaks. On closer inspection we find that the peaks are not quite as connected as first appeared, and perhaps they could be properly construed as two separate mountains. What we could not say is that there are three mountains here, the two peaks and their fusions, but since neither peak is almost identical to the other, or to the fusion, this is what Lewis's solution implies.

7. Vagueness

A crucial part of the argument that the Problem of the Many is the argument that every oi is a cloud. If we can find a way to reject that step, then we the argument collapses. There are three obvious arguments for this premise, two of them presented explicitly by Unger, and the other by Geach. Two of the arguments seem to be faulty, and the third can be rejected if we adopt some familiar, though by no means universally endorsed, theories of vagueness. The first argument, due essentially to Geach, runs as follows. Geach's presentation did not involve clouds, but the principles are clearly stated in his version of the argument. (The argument shows that an ok is a cloud for arbitrary k, we can easily generalize to the claim that for every i, oi is a cloud.)

7.1 Argument from Duplication

D1. If all the water droplets not in sk did not exist, then ok would be a cloud.

D2. Whether ok is a cloud does not depend on whether things distinct from it exist.

C. ok is a cloud.

D2 implies that being a cloud is an intrinsic property. The idea is that by changing the world outside the cloud, we do not change whether or not it is a cloud. There is, however, little reason to believe this is true. And given that it leads to a rather implausible conclusion, that there are millions of clouds where we think there is one, some reason to believe it is false. We can argue directly for the same conclusion. Assume many more water droplets coalesce around our original cloud. There is still one cloud in the sky, but it determinately includes more water droplets than the original cloud. The fusion of those water droplets exist, and we may assume that they did not change their intrinsic properties, but they are now a part of a cloud, rather than a cloud. Even if something looks like a cloud, smells like a cloud and rains like a cloud, it need not be a cloud, it may only be a part of a cloud.

7.2 Argument from Similarity

Unger's primary argument takes a quite different tack.

S1. For some j, oj is a typical cloud.

S2. Anything that differs minutely from a typical cloud is a cloud.

S3. ok differs minutely from oj.

C. ok is a cloud.

Since we only care about the conditional if oj is a cloud, so is ok, it is clearly acceptable to assume that oj is a cloud for the sake of the argument. And S3 is guaranteed to be true by the set up of the problem. The main issue then is whether S2 is true. As Hudson notes, there appear to be some clear counterexamples to it. The fusion of a cloud with one of the water droplets in my bathtub is clearly not a cloud, but by most standards it differs minutely from a cloud, since there is only one droplet of water difference between them.

7.3 Argument from Meaning

The final argument is not set out as clearly, but it has perhaps the most persuasive force. Unger says that if exactly one of the oi is a cloud, then there must be a ‘selection principle’ that picks it over the others. But it is not clear just what kind of selection principle that could be. The underlying argument seems to be something like this:

M1. For some j, oj is a cloud.

M2. If oj is a cloud and ok is not, then there must be something that makes it the case that oj is a cloud and ok is not.

M3. There is nothing that could make it the case that oj is a cloud and ok is not.

C. ok is a cloud.

The idea behind M2 is that the only way our word ‘cloud’ could pick out a property that oj has and ok does not is if either we intend it to pick out such a property, or some such property is a natural kind. But it seems that oj instantiates no natural kinds that ok does not, and that we have no intentional attitudes towards oj as opposed to ok, so we could not have intended the word ‘cloud’ to pick out a property satisfied by oj as opposed to ok.

It is at this point that theories of vagueness can play a role in the debate. Two of the leading theories of vagueness, epistemicism and supervaluationism, provide principled reasons to reject M2. The epistemicist says that there are semantic facts that are beyond our possible knowledge. Arguably we can only know where a semantic boundary lies if that boundary was fixed by our use or by the fact that one particular property is a natural kind. But, say the epistemicists, there are many other boundaries that are not like this, such as the boundary between the heaps and the non-heaps. Here we have a similar kind of situation. It is vague just which of the oi is a cloud. What that means is that there is a fact about which of them is a cloud, but we cannot possibly know it. It might be thought that this is not so much a response to the argument above as a straight-out denial of one of its premises. And since we have to appeal to the most contentious feature of epistemicism, that there are these brute semantic facts that are beyond our epistemic access, some may doubt its plausibility. Weatherson 2003a argues that this problem becomes more pressing when one applies epistemicism to the Problem of the Many than when one merely wields epistemicism to solve the Sorites Paradox. However, epistemicism is a well developed research program that provides a coherent framework for thinking about vagueness. If, on the balance of considerations, epistemicism is thought to be the right theory of vagueness, then it is fair to simply deny M2, and say it could be a brute semantic fact that oj satisfies ‘cloud’ and ok does not.

The supervaluational response is more interesting, both because it engages directly with the intuitions behind this argument, and because two of its leading proponents (Vann McGee and Brian McLaughlin, in their 2001) have responded directly to this argument using the supervaluational framework. Roughly (and for more detail see the section on supervaluations in the entry on vagueness) supervaluationists say that whenever some terms are vague, there are ways of making them more precise consistent with our intuitions on how the terms behave. So, to use a classic case, ‘heap’ is vague, which to the supervaluationist means that there are some piles of sand that are neither determinately heaps nor determinately non-heaps, and a sentence saying that that object is a heap is neither determinately true nor determinately false. However, there are many ways to extend the meaning of ‘heap’ so it becomes precise. Each of these ways of making it precise is called a precisification. A precisification is admissible iff every sentence that is determinately true (false) in English is true (false) in the precisification. So if a is determinately a heap, b is determinately not a heap and c is neither determinately a heap nor determinately not a heap, then every precisification must make ‘a is a heap’ true and ‘b is a heap’ false, but some make ‘c is a heap’ true and others make it false. To a first approximation, to be admissible a precisification must assign all the determinate heaps to the extension of ‘heap’ and assign none of the determinate non-heaps to its extension, but it is free to assign or not assign things in the ‘penumbra’ between these groups to the extension of ‘heap’. But this is not quite right. If d is a little larger than c, but still not determinately a heap, then the sentence “If c is a heap so is d” is intuitively true. As it is often put, following Kit Fine (1975), a precisification must respect ‘penumbral connections’ between the borderline cases. If d has a better case for being a heap than c, then a precisification cannot make c a heap but not d. These penumbral connections play a crucial role in the supervaluationist solution to the Problem of the Many. Finally, a sentence is determinately true iff it is true on all admissible precisifications, determinately false iff it is false on all admissible precisifications.

In the original example, described by Lewis, the sentence “There is one cloud in the sky” is determinately true. None of the sentences “o1 is a cloud”, “o2 is a cloud” and so on are determinately true. So a precisification can make each of these either true or false. But, if it is to preserve the fact that “There is one cloud in the sky” is determinately true, it must make exactly one of those sentences true. McGee and McLaughlin suggest that this combination of constraints lets us preserve what is plausible about M2, without accepting that it is true. The term ‘cloud’ is vague; there is no fact of the matter as to whether its extension includes o1 or o2 or o3 or …. If there were such a fact, there would have to be something that made it the case that it included oj and not ok, and as M3 correctly points out, no such facts exist. But this is consistent with saying that its extension does contain exactly one of the oi. The beauty of the supervaluationist solution is that it lets us hold these seemingly contradictory positions simultaneously. We also get to capture some of the plausibility of S2 - it is consistent with the supervaluational position to say that anything similar to something that is determinately a paradigmatic cloud is a cloud.

Penumbral connections also let us explain some other puzzling situations. Imagine I point cloudwards and say, “That is a cloud”. Intuitively, what I have said is true, even though ‘cloud’ is vague, and so is my demonstrative ‘that’. (To see this, note that there's no determinate answer as to which of the oi it picks out.) On different precisifications, ‘that’ picks out different oi. But on every precisification it picks out the oi that is in the extension of ‘cloud’, so “That is a cloud” comes out true as desired. Similarly, if I named the cloud ‘Edgar’, then a similar trick lets it be true that “Edgar” is vague, while “Edgar is a cloud” is determinately true. So the supervaluationist solution lets us preserve many of the intuitions about the original case, including the intuitions that seemed to underwrite M2, without conceding that there are millions of clouds. But there are a few objections to this package.

  • Objection: There are many telling objections to supervaluationist theories of vagueness.
    • Reply: This may be true, but it would take us well beyond the scope of this entry to outline them all. See the entries on vagueness (the section on supervaluation) and the Sorites Paradox for more detail.

  • Objection: The supervaluationist solution makes some existentially quantified sentences, like “There is a cloud in the sky” determinately true even though no instance of them is determinately true.
    • Reply: As Lewis says, this is odd, but no odder than things that we learn to live with in other contexts. Lewis compares this to, “I owe you a horse, but there is no particular horse that I owe you.”

  • Objection: The penumbral connections here are not precisely specified. What is the rule that says how much overlap is required before two objects cannot both be clouds?
    • Reply: It is true that the connections are not precisely specified. It would be quite hard to carefully analyse ‘cloud’ to work out exactly what they are. But that we cannot say exactly what the rules are is no reason for saying no such rules exist, any more than our inability to say exactly what knowledge is provides a reason for saying that no one ever knows anything. Scepticism can't be proven that easily.

  • Objection: The penumbral connections appealed to here are left unexplained. At a crucial stage in the explanation, it seems to be just assumed that the problem can be solved, and that it is a determinate truth that there is one cloud in the sky.
    • Reply 1: We have to start somewhere in philosophy. This kind of reply can be spelled out in two ways. There is a ‘Moorean’ move that says that the premise that there is one cloud in the sky is more plausible than the premises that would have to be used in an argument against supervaluationism. Alternatively, it might be claimed that the main argument for supervaluationism is an inference to the best explanation. In that case, the intuition that there is exactly one cloud in the sky, but it is indeterminate just which object it is, is something to be explained, not something that has to be proven. This is the kind of position defended by Rosanna Keefe in her book Theories of Vagueness. Although Keefe does not apply this directly to the Problem of the Many, the way to apply her position to the Problem seems clear enough.

    • Reply 2: The penumbral connections we find for most words are generated by the inferential role provided by the meaning of the terms. It is because the inference from “This pile of sand is a heap”, and “That pile of sand is slightly larger than this one, and arranged roughly the same way,” to “That pile of sand is a heap” is generally acceptable that precisifications which make the premises true and the conclusions false are inadmissible. (We have to restrict this inferential rule to the case where ‘this’ and ‘that’ are ordinary demonstratives, and not used to pick out arbitrary fusions of grains, or else we get bizarre results for reasons that should be familiar by this point in the story.) And it isn't too hard to specify the inferential rule here. The inference from “oj is a cloud” and “oj and ok massively overlap” to “ok is not a cloud” is just as acceptable as the above inference involving heaps. Indeed, it is part of the meaning of ‘cloud’ that this inference is acceptable. (Much of this reply is drawn from the discussion of ‘maximal’ predicates in Sider 2001 and 2003, though since Sider is no supervaluationist, he would not entirely endorse this way of putting things.)

  • Objection: The second reply cannot explain the existence of penumbral connections between ‘cloud’ and demonstratives like ‘that’ and names like ‘Edgar’. It would only explain the existence of those penumbral connections if it was part of the meaning of names and demonstratives that they fill some kind of inferential role. But this is inconsistent with the widely held view that demonstratives and names are directly referential. (For more details on debates about the meanings of names, see the entries on propositional attitude reports and singular propositions.)
    • Reply: One response to this would be to deny the view that names and demonstratives are directly referential. Another would be to deny that inferential roles provide the only penumbral constraints on precisifications. Weatherson 2003b sketches a theory that does exactly this. The theory draws on David Lewis's response to some quite different work on semantic indeterminacy. As many authors (Quine 1960, Putnam 1981, Kripke 1982) showed, the dispositions of speakers to use terms are not fine-grained enough to make the language as precise as we ordinarily think it is. As far as our usage dispositions go, ‘rabbit’ could mean undetached rabbit part, ‘vat’ could mean vat image, and ‘plus’ could mean quus. (Quus is a function defined over pairs of numbers that yields the sum of the two numbers when they are both small, and 5 when one is sufficiently large.) But intuitively our language is not that indeterminate: ‘plus’ determinately does not mean quus.

      Lewis (1983, 1984) suggested the way out here is to posit a notion of ‘naturalness’. Sometimes a term t denotes the concept C1 rather than C2 not because we are disposed to use t as if it meant C1 rather than C2, but simply because C1 is a more natural concept. ‘Plus’ means plus rather than quus simply because plus is more natural than quus. Something like the same story applies to names and demonstratives. Imagine I point in the direction of Tibbles the cat and say, “That is Edgar's favourite cat.” There is a way of systematically (mis)interpreting all my utterances so ‘that’ denotes the Tibbles-shaped region of spacetime exactly one metre behind Tibbles. (We have to reinterpret what ‘cat’ means to make this work, but the discussions of semantic indeterminacy in Quine and Kripke make it clear how to do this.) So there's nothing in my usage dispositions that makes ‘that’ mean Tibbles, rather than the region of space time that ‘follows’ him around. But because Tibbles is more natural than that region of space time, ‘that’ does pick out Tibbles. It is the very same naturalness that makes ‘cat’ denote a property that Tibbles (and not the trailing region of space time) satisfies that makes ‘that’ denote Tibbles, a fact that will become important below.

      The same kind of story can be applied to the cloud. It is because the cloud is a more natural object than the region of space time a mile above the cloud that our demonstrative ‘that’ denotes the cloud and not the region. However, none of the oi are more natural than any other, so there is still no fact of the matter as to whether ‘that’ picks out oj or ok. Lewis's theory does not eliminate all semantic indeterminacy; when there are equally natural candidates to be the denotation of a term, and each of them is consistent with our dispositions to use the term, then the denotation of the term is simply indeterminate between those candidates.

      Weatherson's theory is that the role of each precisification is to arbitrarily make one of the oi more natural than the rest. Typically, it is thought that the denotation of a term according to a precisification is determined directly. It is a fact about a precisification P that, according to it, ‘cloud’ denotes property c1. On Weatherson's theory this is not the case. What the precisification does is provide a new, and somewhat arbitrary, standard of naturalness, and the content of the terms according to the precisification is then determined by Lewis's theory of content. The denotations of ‘cloud’ and ‘that’ according to a precisification P are those concepts and objects that are the most natural according to P of the concepts and objects that we could be denoting by those terms, for all one can tell from the way the terms are used. The coordination between the two terms, the fact that on every precisification ‘that’ denotes an object in the extension of ‘cloud’ is explained by the fact that the very same thing, naturalness according to P, determines the denotation of ‘cloud’ and of ‘that’.

  • Objection: (From Stephen Schiffer 1998) The supervaluationist account cannot handle speech reports involving vague names. Imagine that Alex points cloudwards and says, “That is a cloud”. Later Sam points towards the same cloud and says, “Alex said that that is a cloud.” Intuitively, Sam's utterance is determinately true. But according to the supervaluationist, it is only determinately true if it is true on every precisification. So it must be true that Alex said that o1 is a cloud, that Alex said that o2 is a cloud, and so on, since these are all precisifications of “Alex said that that is a cloud.” But Alex did not say all of those things, for if she did she would be committed to saying that there are millions of clouds in the sky, and of course she is not, as the supervaluationists have been arguing.
    • Reply: There is a little logical slip here. Let Pi be a precisification of Sam's word ‘that’ that makes it denote oi. All the supervaluationist who holds that Sam's utterance is determinately true is committed to is that for each i, according to Pi, Alex said that oi is a cloud. And this will be true if the denotation of Alex's word ‘that’ is also oi according to Pi. So as long as there is a penumbral connection between Sam's word ‘that’ and Alex's word ‘that’, the supervaluationist avoids the objection. Such a connection may seem mysterious at first, but note that Weatherson's theory predicts that just such a penumbral connection obtains. So if that theory is acceptable, then Schiffer's objection misfires.

Space prevents a further discussion of all possible objections to the supervaluationist account, but interested readers are particularly encouraged to look at Neil McKinnon's objection to the account (see the Other Internet Resources section), which suggests that distinctive problems arise for the supervaluationist when there really are two or more clouds involved.

Even if the supervaluationist solution to the Problem of the Many has responses to all of the objections that have been levelled against it, some of those objections rely on theories that are contentious and/or underdeveloped. So it is far from clear at this stage how well the supervaluational solution, or indeed any solution based on vagueness, to the Problem of the Many will do in future years.

8. Composition is not Identity

Some theorists have argued that the underlying cause of the problem is that we have the wrong theory about the relation between parts and wholes. Peter van Inwagen (1990) argues that the problem is that we have assumed that the parthood relation is determinate. We have assumed that it is always determinately true or determinately false that one object is a part of another. According to van Inwagen, sometimes neither of these options applies. He thinks that we need to adopt some kind of fuzzy logic when we are discussing parts and wholes. It can be true to degree 0.7, for example, that one object is part of another. Given these resources, van Inwagen says we are free to conclude that there is exactly one cloud in the sky, and that some of the ‘outer’ water droplets are true of it to a degree strictly between 0 and 1. This lets us keep the intuition that it is indeterminate whether these outlying water droplets are members of the cloud without accepting that there are millions of clouds. Note that this is not what van Inwagen would say about this version of the paradox, since he holds that some simples only constitute an object when that object is alive. For van Inwagen, as for Unger, there are no clouds, only cloud-like swarms of atoms. But van Inwagen recognises that a similar problem arises for cats, or for people, two kinds of things that he does believe exist and he wields this vague constitution theory to solve the problems that arise there.

As Hudson (2001) notes, it is far from clear just how the appeal to fuzzy logic is meant to help here. Originally it was clear for each of n water droplets whether they were members of the cloud to degree 1 or degree 0. So there were 2n candidate clouds, and the Problem of the Many is finding out how to preserve the intuition when faced with all these objects. It is unclear how increasing the range of possible relationships between each particle and the cloud from 2 to continuum-many should help here, for now it seems there are at least continuum-many cloud-like objects to choose between, one for each function from each of the n droplets to [0, 1], and we need a way of saying exactly one of them is a cloud. When van Inwagen addresses an objection like this one, he solves it by saying that not every function will correspond to an object. That is, he appeals to something like brute composition, although in this case it is mixed with fuzzy logic. But it is the bruteness not the fuzziness that does the philosophical work. So it does not look like this solution is any better than Markosian's brutal composition solution, and may even be worse given the contentious appeal to fuzzy logic.

A different kind of solution is offered by Mark Johnston (1992) and E. J. Lowe (1982, 1995). Both of them suggest that the key to solving the Problem is to distinguish cloud-constituters from clouds. They say it is a category mistake to identify clouds with any fusion of water droplets, because they have different identity conditions. The cloud could survive the transformation of half its droplets into puddles on the footpath (or whatever kind of land it happens to be raining over), it would just be a smaller cloud, the fusion could not. As Johnston says, “Hence Unger's insistent and ironic question “But which of o1, o2, o3, … is our paradigm cloud c?” has as its proper answer “None”.” (1992: 100, numbering slightly altered).

Lewis (1993) listed several objections to this position, and Lowe (1995) responds to them. (Lewis and Lowe discuss a version of the problem using cats not clouds, and I will sometimes follow them below.)

Lewis's first objection is that it positing clouds as well as cloud-constituting fusions of atoms is metaphysically extravagant. As Lowe (and, for separate reasons, Johnston) point out, these extra objects are arguably needed to solve puzzles to do with persistence. Hence it is no objection to a solution to the Problem of the Many that it posits such objects. Resolving these debates would take us too far afield, so I will assume (as Lewis does) that we have reason to believe that these objects exist.

Secondly, Lewis says that even with this move, we still have a Problem of the Many applied to cloud-constituters, rather than to clouds. Lowe responds that since ‘cloud-constituter’ is not a folk concept, we don't really have any philosophically salient intuitions here, so this cannot be a way in which the position is unintuitive.

Finally, Lewis says that each of the constituters is so like the object it is meant to merely constitute (be it a cloud, or a cat, or whatever), it satisfies the same sortals as that object. So if we were originally worried that there were 1001 cats (or clouds) where we thought there were one, now we should be worried that there are 1002. But as Lowe points out, this argument seems to assume that being a cat, or being a cloud is an intrinsic property. If we assume that it is extrinsic, if it turns on the history of the object, perhaps its future or its possible future, and on which object it is embedded in, then the fact that a cloud-constituter looks, when considered in isolation, to be a cloud is little reason to think it actually is a cloud.

Johnston provides an argument that the distinction between clouds and cloud-constituting fusions of water droplets is crucial to solving the Problem. He thinks that the following principle is sound, and not threatened by examples like our cloud.

(9′) If y is a paradigm F, and x is an entity that differs from y in any respect relevant to being an F only very minutely, and x is of the right category, i.e. is not a mere quantity or piece of matter, then x is an F. (Johnston 1992: 100)

The theorist who thinks that clouds are just fusions of water droplets cannot accept this principle, or they will conclude that every oi is a cloud, since for them each oi is of the right category. On the other hand, Johnston himself cannot accept it either unless he denies there can be another object c´ which is in a similar position to c, and is of the same category as c, but differs with respect to which water droplets constitute it. It seems that what is doing the work in Johnston's solution is not just the distinction between constitution and identity, but a tacit restriction on when there is a ‘higher-level’ object constituted by certain ‘lower-level’ objects. To that extent, his theory also resembles Markosian's brutal composition theory, though since Johnston can accept that every set of atoms has a fusion his theory has different costs and benefits to Markosian's theory.

9. Rethinking Parthood

After concluding that all of these solutions face serious difficulties, Hudson (2001: Chapter 2) outlines a new solution, one which rejects so many of the presuppositions of the puzzle that it is best to count him as rejecting the reasoning, rather than rejecting any particular premise. (Hudson is somewhat tentative about endorsing this view, as opposed to merely endorsing the claim that it looks better than its many rivals, but for expository purposes I'll refer to it here as his view.) To see the motivation behind Hudson's approach, consider a slightly different case, a variant of one discussed in Wiggins 1968. Tibbles is born at midnight Sunday, replete with a splendid tail, called Tail. An unfortunate accident involving a guillotine sees Tibbles lose his tail at midday Monday, though the tail is preserved for posterity. Then midnight Monday, Tibbles dies. Now consider the timeless question, “Is Tail part of Tibbles?” Intuitively, we want to say the question is underspecified. Outside of Monday, the question does not arise, for Tibbles does not exist. Before midday Monday, the answer is “Yes”, and after midday the answer is “No”. This suggests that there is really no proposition that Tail is part of Tibbles. There is a proposition that Tail is part of Tibbles on Monday morning (that's true) and that Tail is part of Tibbles on Monday afternoon (that's false), but no proposition involving just the parthood relation and two objects. Parthood is a three-place relation between two objects and a time, not a two-place relation between two objects.

Hudson suggests that this line of reasoning is potentially on the right track, but that the conclusion is not quite right. Parthood is a three-place relation, but the third place is not filled by a time, but by a region of space-time. To a crude approximation, x is part of y at s is true if (as we'd normally say), x is a part of y and s is a region of spacetime containing no region not occupied by y and all regions occupied by x. But this should be taken as a heuristic guide only, not as a reductive definition, since parthood is really a three-place relation, so the crude approximation does not even express a proposition according to Hudson.

To see how this applies to the Problem of the Many, let's simplify the case a little bit so there are only two water droplets, w1 and w2, that are neither determinately part of the cloud nor determinately not a part of it. As well there is the core of the cloud, call it a. On an orthodox theory, there are four proto-clouds here, a, a + w1, a + w2 and a + w1 + w 2. On Hudson's theory the largest and the smallest proto-clouds still exist, but in the middle there is a quite different kind of object, which we'll call c. Let r1 be the region occupied by a and w1, and r2 the region occupied by a and w2. Then the following claims are all true according to Hudson:

  • c exactly occupies r1
  • c exactly occupies r2
  • c does not occupy the region consisting of the union of r1 and r2
  • c has w1 as a part at r1, but not at r2
  • c has w2 as a part at r2, but not at r1
  • c has no parts at the region consisting of the union of r1 and r2

Hudson defines x exactly occupies s as follows:

  • x has a part at s,
  • there is no region of spacetime, s*, such that s* has s as a subregion, while x has a part at s*, and
  • for every subregion of s, s´, x has a part at s´. (Hudson 2001: 63)

At first, it might look like not much has been accomplished here. All that we did was turn a Problem of 4 clouds into a Problem of 3 clouds, replacing the fusions a + w1 and a + w2 with the new, and oddly behaved, c. But that is to overlook a rather important feature of the remaining proto-clouds. The three remaining proto-clouds can be strictly ordered by the ‘part of’ relation. This was not previously possible, since neither a + w1 nor a + w2 were part of the other. If we adopt the principle that ‘cloud’ is a maximal predicate, so no cloud can be a proper part of another cloud, we now get the conclusion that there is exactly one of the proto-clouds is a cloud, as desired.

This is a quite ingenious approach, and it deserves some attention in the future literature. It is hard to say what will emerge as the main costs and benefits of the view in advance of that literature, but the following two points seem worthy of attention. First, if we are allowed to appeal to the principle that no cloud is a proper part of another, why not appeal to the principle that no two clouds massively overlap, and get from 4 proto-clouds to one actual cloud that way? Secondly, why don't we have an object that is just like the old a + w1, that is, an object that has w1 as a part at r1, and does not have w2 (or anything else) as a part at r2? If we get it back, as well as a + w2, then all of Hudson's tinkering with mereology will just have converted a problem of 4 clouds into a problem of 5 clouds.

Neither of these points should be taken to be conclusive refutations. As things stand now, Hudson's solution joins the ranks of the many and varied proposed solutions to the Problem of the Many. For such a young problem, the variety of these solutions is rather impressive. Whether the next few years will see these ranks whittled down by refutation, or swelled by imaginative theorising, remains to be seen.

Bibliography

The numbers after each entry refer to the sections to which that book or article is relevant.

  • Armstrong, D. M. (1978) Universals and Scientific Realism. 2 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [6]
  • Eklund, Matti (2002) “Inconsistent Languages” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 64: 251–275. [2, 7]
  • Fine, Kit (1975) “Vagueness, Truth and Logic” Synthese 30: 265–300. [7]
  • Geach, P. T. (1980) Reference and Generality. 3rd edn. Ithaca: Cornell University Press. [1, 5]
  • Horgan, Terrence (1993) “On What There Isn't” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 53: 693–700. [4]
  • Hudson, Hud (2001) A Materialist Metaphysics of the Human Person. Ithaca: Cornell University Press [1, 2, 3, 4, 5, 6, 7, 8, 9]
  • Johnston, Mark (1992) “Constitution is Not Identity” Mind 101: 89–105. [6, 8]
  • Keefe, Rosanna (2000) Theories of Vagueness. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [7]
  • Kripke, Saul (1982) Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. [7]
  • Lewis, David (1983) “New Work for a Theory of Universals” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 61: 343‑77. [7]
  • Lewis, David (1984) “Putnam's Paradox” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 62: 221‑36. [7]
  • Lewis, David (1993) “Many, but Almost One” in Ontology, Causality and Mind: Essays in Honour of D M Armstrong, Bacon, John (ed) New York: Cambridge University Press. [3, 6, 7, 8]
  • Lowe, E. J. (1982) “The Paradox of the 1,001 Cats” Analysis 42: 27‑30. [8]
  • Lowe, E. J. (1995) “The Problem of the Many and the Vagueness of Constitution” Analysis 55: 179–82. [8]
  • Marksonian, Ned (1998) “Brutal Composition” Philosophical Studies 92: 211‑49. [4]
  • McGee, Vann and Brian McLaughlin (2000) “The Lessons of the Many” Philosophical Topics 28: 129‑51. [7]
  • McKinnon, Neil (2002) “Supervaluations and the Problem of the Many” Philosophical Quarterly 52: 320‑39. [7]
  • Putnam, Hilary (1981) Reason, Truth and History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [7]
  • Quine, W. V. O. (1960) Word and Object. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. [6, 7]
  • Schiffer, Stephen (1998) “Two Issues of Vagueness” The Monist 81: 193‑214. [7]
  • Sorensen, Roy (2001) Vagueness and Contradiction. Oxford: Oxford University Press. [2, 7]
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  • van Inwagen, Peter (1990) Material Beings. Ithaca: Cornell University Press [4, 8]
  • Weatherson, Brian (2003a) “Epistemicism, Parasites and Vague Names” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, forthcoming. [7]
  • Weatherson, Brian (2003b) “Many Many Problems” Philosophical Quarterly, forthcoming [7]

Other Internet Resources

The papers in this list not cited above usually bear indirectly on the Problem of the Many

Copyright © 2009 by
Brian Weatherson <brian@weatherson.org>

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