Thomas Paine

First published Thu Jul 18, 2013

Thomas Paine was a pamphleteer, controversialist and international revolutionary. His Common Sense (1776) was a central text behind the call for American independence from Britain; his Rights of Man (1791-2) was the most widely read pamphlet in the movement for reform in Britain in the 1790s and for the opening decades of the nineteenth century; he was active in the French Revolution and was a member of the French National Convention between 1792 and 1795; he is seen by many as a key figure in the emergence of claims for the state's responsibilities for welfare and educational provision, and his Age of Reason provided a popular deist text that remained influential throughout the 19th century. In his own lifetime, and subsequently, he has been extensively vilified and often dismissed. Yet many of his ideas still command wide interest and enthusiasm in readers throughout the world.

1. Life

Thomas Paine was born on January 29, 1737 to a family of moderate means in Norfolk, England. His father was a Quaker and his mother an Anglican, and it is likely Paine was baptized into the Anglican church. He had some schooling, although his father forbade him to learn Latin, and at the age of twelve he was withdrawn from school and apprenticed to his father to learn the craft of staymaking. When he was in his mid-teens, inspired by the romantic stories of naval life by one of his teachers, Paine twice ran away from home to sea. The first time he was intercepted. The second time he enlisted on the privateer, the King of Prussia. The exact sequence of events over the subsequent ten to fifteen years is unclear. He lived in London on and off, but also had periods in Sandwich and in Margate. He continued periodically to ply his skills as a staymaker; he may have done some preaching (in the Methodist persuasion); and in 1759 he married a Mary Lambert, who died the following year in childbirth. Following his wife's death, he sought his father-in-law's support to take up a career in the excise service. He first served as an officer in December 1762, but in August 1765 he was dismissed for ‘stamping’—providing certificates for goods not inspected. He wrote formally apologising and seeking re-admission to the service, which was granted. While awaiting a posting he taught school in London. In 1768 he accepted a posting to Lewes, on the South Coast of England, and he took up lodgings with a Samuel Ollive, a local tobacconist. In Lewes he became a member of the debating society—the Headstrong Club—and he was also reputed as a skater and player of bowls. Ollive died in July 1769, and Paine took lodgings elsewhere. But he sustained his links with the family, and in March 1771 he married the daughter, Elizabeth Ollive (1741-1808) and established himself as part proprietor of the business. The following year he went to London to press the claims of the excisemen for higher pay. Although he returned to Lewes, he was sacked by the excise and his marriage and business failed. In the final settlement between Paine and his wife he was awarded £400. He headed to London, where he secured letters of introduction from Benjamin Franklin, whom he had encountered on an earlier visit to the capital, and embarked in April 1774 for the New World. He was carried ashore in Philadelphia in November 1774 suffering from putrid fever, but he survived.

In Philadelphia Paine developed an acquaintance with Robert Aitkin, a publisher and bookseller, who employed him to edit the Pennsylvania Magazine. There remains considerable disagreement about which pieces in the Magazine were written by Paine, but it seems clear that he did contribute and that he developed a reputation among political circles in Philadelphia as a result, at just the time that tensions with Britain were reaching a crisis point. In the autumn of 1775, encouraged by Benjamin Rush, Paine began work on a pamphlet defending the case of American independence. He discussed his work with Rush, David Rittenhouse, Benjamin Franklin, and Samuel Adams, but the work was his own (save for the title, for which Rush claimed responsibility). Common Sense (1776) was the most widely read pamphlet of the American Revolution. It was a clarion call for unity, against the corrupt British court, so as to realize America's providential role in providing an asylum for liberty. Written in a direct and lively style, it denounced the decaying despotisms of Europe and pilloried hereditary monarchy as an absurdity. At a time when many still hoped for reconciliation with Britain, Common Sense demonstrated to many the inevitability of separation.

Paine consolidated his reputation as a pamphleteer with his series of American Crisis letters (1777-83); he also served in a number of capacities for Congress and the Pennsylvanian Assembly. Although he had links with the more radical elements of Pennsylvanian politics, he also committed his energies to a number of more elite projects—contributing to the establishment of the Bank of America to help raise money for the war, and working with Robert Morris to encourage State Legislatures to accept the need for Federal taxation to support the war. Following the conclusion of the war he was awarded a farm by the New York assembly, and Congress voted him a grant of $3,000 for his services.

After the Revolution he dedicated his time to scientific experiments, designing an iron bridge capable of spanning wide distances without the use of piers, experimenting with marsh gas with Washington, and attempting to produce a smokeless candle with Franklin. In 1787 he took a wooden model of his bridge to Paris, and subsequently to England where an iron model of 110 feet was forged and constructed for public display in a field near Paddington in May 1790. He also became increasingly caught up in the initial events of the French revolution, thanks in part to his involvement with a group of French intellectuals enabled by Thomas Jefferson (US Minister to France until late 1789). Paine contemplated writing a history of the French Revolution but he made slow progress—exacerbated by his poor French. When Edmund Burke's Reflections on the Revolution in France appeared in November 1790, he determined to answer it and turned his materials to that task. The result, Rights of Man (February/March 1791) coupled a narrative of French events with a trenchant attack on Burke and the Revolution Settlement of 1688. It was an immediate success, and brought Paine into the circles of those seeking to achieve parliamentary reform in Britain. He continued to visit France and was in Paris in June 1791 in the immediate aftermath of Louis XVI's flight to Varennes. He collaborated with a small group (including Nicholas Bonneville and the Marquis de Condorcet) to produce a republican manifesto that was pasted on the walls of Paris, to the outrage of most members of the National Assembly. That movement was firmly repressed at the Massacre of the Champs de Mars in July 1791, by which time Paine was already back in Britain. But the occasion marks a shift in his thinking—from seeing monarchy as an inevitable part of the institutional order in the corrupt states of Europe, to thinking that the American model could be applied more generally throughout Europe. Where Rights of Man had shown considerable tolerance for France's limited monarchy, his Rights of Man: Part the Second (March 1792) was explicitly republican and he drew extensively on his American experience in sketching the basic principles of a largely self-regulating commercial society, coupled with representative government, the rule of law, and a periodically renewable covenant. The final chapter, influenced by his friendship with Condorcet and other members of the Comité de Mendicité, outlined a program for welfare provision for the poor, aged, disabled and destitute.

The two parts of Rights of Man were quickly combined in cheap editions (at Paine's insistence) and sold in unprecedented numbers. Paine's advocacy of natural rights, his attacks on mixed government, his outspoken republicanism, and his extensive proposals for schemes of social welfare set him apart from the more common opposition rhetoric that emphasized the need to protect the integrity of the mixed constitution to secure English liberties. His success suggests that he was reaching a popular audience who attached diminishing weight to these traditions and were struck by his insistence on their essential equality and their right to challenge the status quo. In May 1792 a prosecution for sedition was initiated against him. When the case was heard in November of that year he was outlawed—but by this time he had returned to France, having been elected as a member to the National Convention in the summer of 1792.

He arrived in Paris shortly before the September massacres, and it seems clear that he found it hard to find his feet—being out of sympathy with the more sanguinary elements in the city. His closest connections were with Girondin leaders in Paris, who were rapidly to fall from favour. Moreover, his plea in the National Covention for clemency for Louis XVI at his trial at the end of 1792, led to his denunciation by Marat and the enmity of the Jacobin faction. He served with Condorcet and Sieyes on the Committee to design a republican constitution, but the extent of his contribution is unclear, and although Condorcet pressed on with the work, producing a report in the spring of 1793, it was immediately shelved. Paine led an increasingly constrained life as the Jacobins assumed ascendancy and his friends were arrested and executed, fled, or killed themselves. Orders for his arrest were issued on 27 December 1793. While he was being taken into custody he passed to his American friend Joel Barlow the manuscript for the first part of Age of Reason which was published shortly thereafter. Paine spent eleven months in the Luxembourg (not unconnected to the studied neglect of his case by the US Minister, Gouvernor Morris), and seems only narrowly to have escaped the guillotine. When he left prison, after Robespierre's execution, it was thanks to the intervention of Morris's successor, James Monroe. On his release, Paine was in an extremely debilitated state, and Monroe looked after him in his home. Paine's angry denunciation of Washington, whom he believed had ignored his pleas for help, and the publication of subsequent parts of Age of Reason made Monroe increasingly uncomfortable with his guest and Paine left to live with the printer Nicholas Bonneville and his family.

Although still a member of the National Convention, Paine had rarely attended and did not do so after his release. His one intervention was his Dissertation on First Principles of Government (1795), a critique of the Constitution of 1795, and a summary of his own thinking about politics, in which he urged the Convention to institute universal manhood suffrage. In 1796, responding to the attempted coup by Babeuf's ‘conspiracy of equals’, Paine's Agrarian Justice developed further ideas fist canvassed in the second part of Rights of Man and set out a principled case for a tax on inheritance so as to provide a capital grant for all reaching the age of majority, together with an annual pension for all at fifty, arguing that the earth is common property to the human race and that everyone is owed compensation for the private appropriation of it.

Paine finally left France to return to America in 1803, during the Peace of Amiens, but was vilified on his return for his radicalism, his deism, and for his embittered critique of Washington. He was joined in America in 1804 by the wife of Nicholas de Bonneville and her three sons who lived with him for a period; but this arrangement broke down and Paine became increasingly ill and isolated. He died in obscurity in 1809. In 1819, William Cobbett, the Tory turned radical and critic of Paine turned supporter, had Paine's bones dug up and returned to England to be buried with honour. They were promptly lost, thereby ensuring that the man who declared his attachment to be ‘to all the world, not to any particular part’ retained his universal citizenship.

2. Political Theory

Paine's reputation has been a source of controversy since his own lifetime. He was a controversialist—what he wrote invariably provoked controversy and was intended to do so. As such, one needs a reasonably capacious understanding of ‘philosophy’ to count him as a philosopher. He was a pamphleteer, a journalist, a propagandist, a polemicist. Nonetheless, he also settled on a number of basic principles that have subsequently become central to much liberal-democratic culture. Few of these are original to Paine, but his drawing together of them, and his bringing them before a wide popular audience, at this key historical moment when the people emerge as a consistent and increasingly independent force on the political stages of Europe and North America, has ensured that his works remain widely read and are seen as of enduring value. That said, a great deal about his life and about the value and interpretation of his work is deeply contested and promises to remain so.

2.1 Society and Government

In Common Sense Paine opens his account with the contrast between society and government: ‘Society is produced by our wants and government by our wickedness; the former promotes our happiness positively by uniting our affections, the latter negatively by restraining our vices’ (CW I, 4). [CW refers to The Complete Writings of Thomas Paine, P.S. Foner (ed.), 1945.] As with many Paine claims, this seems simple, intuitive, and attractive. Our interests unite us, and it is only when we overstep the legitimate bounds of those interests, or push them to the detriment of others, that we need constraint. But when we do that, we ought to know better, and as such Government can appropriately be regarded as constraining our vices. What is less clear is how far we must assume vice (and thereby government). ‘Society in every state is a blessing, but government even in its best state is but a necessary evil; in its worst state an intolerable one.’ The opening of Common Sense can be read as a gloss on Locke's Second Treatise, without the references to God. Yet Paine claimed never to have read Locke. He also seems clear in his first major pamphlet that government ‘is a mode rendered necessary by the inability of moral virtue to govern the world’ (CW I, 6). The issue, then is how extensive must government be, and what sort of government provides the necessary benefits, without multiplying the evils. Paine's view is that ‘the more simple anything is, the less liable it is to be disordered…’ Simple government for Paine is ‘republican government’: he rejects monarchical and mixed forms of government, in favour of a system in which ‘the liberty of choosing an House of Commons out of their own body’ is the key republican moment (CW I, 16).

Paine's attack on monarchy in Common Sense is essentially an attack on George III. Whereas colonial resentments were originally directed primarily against the king's ministers and Parliament, Paine lays the responsibility firmly at the king's door. And he appeals to a sense among Americans that they have all the resources, and every claim, to rule themselves without the interference and control of a body half-way around the world. Subverting paternalist metaphors for Britain's colonial claims, Paine creates an image of a nation come of age, ready for freedom from its leading strings, having every justification for separation from its unnatural parent, and seeking to stand on its own as a commercial republic, trading in its own right. It is not America who is behaving unnaturally and ungratefully, but the ‘royal brute of Great Britain.’ ‘Nature has deserted the connection, and art cannot supply her place’ (CW I, 23).

Americans do not see the way forward, but it is simple. The colonies need to be divided into districts, districts should elect their representatives to Congress, and Congress should choose a President by ballot from the delegates of each state in turn, with the first state being chosen by lot. To avoid injustice, three fifths should be required for a majority. To avoid imposing his views, however, he suggests that each state nominate two members to a Continental Congress to frame a charter fixing the details of the government—‘always remembering that our strength is continental, not provincial’ (CW I, 29). And in a rare citation of another's works, Paine appeals to Dragonetti's adage that the aim should be ‘a mode of government that should combine the greatest sum of individual happiness with the least national expense’ (CW I, 29).

For all its success, Common Sense is not without flaws. It contains a digression on biblical accounts of the origin of monarchy; its powerful rhetoric leaves unanswered a range of more practical and theoretical questions, and the argument jumps around considerably. Later editions added an appendix denouncing the Quakers for their quietism. But its rhetorical effectiveness cannot be doubted - which suggests that it intersected powerfully with the concerns and beliefs that were widespread in colonial America at the point of rupture. Political theorists might want to press for more details about who will have the vote; about whether there is an implicit acceptance of a doctrine of the fall; about the extent to which his appeals to republics envisage a degree of republican civic virtue; about whether the argument is based on an account of natural rights; and so on. But on such issues the pamphlet is either silent or only barely suggestive. Unlike Locke, this is not a principled justification for resistance, so much as a concatenation of points about Americans taking their collective identity and independent interests seriously and separating from the increasingly arbitrary rule of Britain. Given these sweeping claims, it is easy to see why so many commentators have held that Paine was both lacking in intellectual sophistication and basically held to a consistent set of principles throughout his work, since it is difficult to demonstrate that much he says is actively inconsistent with what he later wrote. Nonetheless, if we take increasing precision in his claims as evidence of greater attention to issues that he felt he could confidently sweep past in Common Sense, then a case for a deepening of his thinking and for a process of change over time can be made.

2.2 Rights

While there may be suggestions of rights claims in Common Sense and in a number of minor texts attributed by some to Paine but where the authorship is a matter of dispute, it is clear that the fully fledged account of rights that Paine advances in the first part of Rights of Man (1791) represents a significant development in his thinking. It is common to attribute that development to the foil he found in Burke's Reflections on the Revolution in France (1790), where Burke inveighs against the idea that rights are preserved from the state of nature in the civil state. ‘Men cannot enjoy the rights of an uncivil and of a civil state together…That he may secure some liberty, he makes a surrender in trust of the whole of it’ (CW VIII, p. 110). And where he claims that, in England, ‘We have not been drawn and trussed, in order that we may be filled, like stuffed birds in a museum, with chaff and rage, and paltry, blurred shred of paper about the rights of man’ (CW VIII, p. 137). It seems more likely, however, that Paine's distinction between natural rights, where we necessarily have the power to execute the right (as in the right of conscience), as against rights where we need the arm of society to secure the right (as in property), although more sharply expressed in Rights of Man (1791), is a product of discussions with Jefferson and French sympathizers with America in the late 1780s, when they were discussing the proposed Federal Constitution and its failure to contain a bill of rights. In a letter to Jefferson written in 1788/9 Paine draws a distinction between ‘rights they could individually exercise fully and perfectly, and those they could not’ (CW II, 1298). In the reply to Burke this is used to show that every civil right grows out of a natural right or ‘is a natural right exchanged)’; that the civil power is made up of the aggregate of that class of the natural rights of man, which becomes defective in the individual in point of power; and that the power produced from the aggregate of natural rights, imperfect in power in the individual’, cannot be applied to invade the natural rights which are retained by the individual…’ (CW I, 276).

How much, in fact, separates Paine from Burke? The rights in which our power is perfect, are relatively few—so that many of the things that really matter, access to means of labour and sustenance, freedom of movement and contract, seem to fall under Burke's sense of matters of convenience which government orders on the basis of general utility. Although Paine does not provide much detail, it seems clear that he sees himself as different from Burke primarily because he argues for continuing normative salience of the natural right and for the on-going collective sovereignty of the people over the arrangements that they make the better to secure those rights. Paine's readers had little doubt that he sought to defend their rights from invasion, but his distinction does not in-itself do that. After all, what is to stop the collective encroaching on the rights of citizens? One answer is given in Paine's account of popular sovereignty.

2.3 Sovereignty and its limits

Common Sense might presume a principle of collective self-determination and the sovereignty of the people, but it does not articulate or defend it. Something like this issue does come under consideration in Paine's Dissertations on Government, a pamphlet written in 1786, defending the Bank of America and the principle that contracts formed by government ought to be respected by subsequent occupants of power. ‘Every government…contains within itself a principle common to all, which is that of a sovereign power, or a power over which there is no control, and which controls all others….In republics, such as those established in America, the sovereign power…remains where nature placed it—in the people. …This sovereignty is exercised in electing and deputing a certain number of persons to represent and to act for the whole. But he goes on to insist that

When a people agree to form themselves into a republic…it is understood that they mutually resolve and pledge themselves to each other, rich and poor alike, to support this rule of equal justice among them… (and) they renounce as detestable, the power of exercising, at any future time any species of despotism over each other, or of doing a thing not right in itself, because a majority of them may have the strength of numbers sufficient to accomplish it. (CW II, 373)

As a result,

The sovereignty in a republic is exercised to keep right and wrong in their proper and distinct places, and never suffer the one to usurp the place of the other. A republic, properly understood, is a sovereignty of justice, in contradistinction to a sovereignty of will. (CW II, 375)

This position sits uncomfortably with more direct and active interpretations of the sovereignty of the people or any general will. Hence Paine's claim in 1791 to be ‘a Citizen of a country which knows no other Majesty than that of the People; no other Government than that of the Representative body; no other sovereignty than that of the Laws…’ (CW II, 1315).

Paine's account of sovereignty dramatically delimits collective power to the securing of civil rights, based on natural right. In Rights of Man (1791) he quotes Lafayette's claim that ‘For a nation to be free it is sufficient that she wills it’ (CW I, 322). Lafayette most likely meant it as a call to reject despotism; but Paine's account is perhaps more subtle, seeing it as a right of the nation to determine its government, but also as a right that is itself delimited by the end of liberty—that is, by the protection of individual rights and by ensuring their more adequate security within the collective.

That this is so helps account for Paine's account of generational sovereignty. In Rights of Man (1791) he attacks Burke's claim that the terms of the 1688 Revolution Settlement ”bind us,” (meaning the people of the day) “our heirs and our posterity, to them, their heirs and posterity, to the end of time” (CW I, 250). Paine demurs:

There never did, there never will, there never can exist a parliament, or any description of men, or any generation of men, in any country, possessed of the right or the power of binding and controlling posterity to the ‘end of time’…Every generation must be as free to act for itself, in all cases, as the ages and generation which preceded it.

This too looks like a principle that Paine worked out with Jefferson, in 1788-9, when Jefferson first mentions it in his correspondence, although the prior source is likely to be Adam Smith's Wealth of Nations. The principle is a powerful one—but it is negative: no generation can be bound by those before it; and none can bind those after. But equally, no generation is free to act unjustly. In his Dissertations of Government (1786), Paine had struggled with precisely this issue in wanting to claim both the sovereign power of the people and the duty on the part of the state to respect contracts made previously by others in their capacity of representatives. Paine tries to reconcile the claims by arguing that a contract is not a law but an action, and while laws can be changed, acts are binding. He does not yet claim generational sovereignty, although the right to change laws is clearly there. But the insistence on a sovereignty of justice is designed to ensure that actions that involve the transfer of rights must have the protection of the state and cannot be justly abrogated.

What becomes clear, is that, as Paine struggles to articulate his account of rights, he comes to defend a very Lockean account in which the government is there to interpret and to secure antecedently defined rights and just claims that are the outcome of the exercise of these rights. Rights acquired through clear contract or agreement deserve every protection: even if subsequent generations are at liberty to question the laws of the nation and to alter them as they will, they are not at liberty to invade the property rights of people secured through past agreements.

2.4 The New Order of Government

Paine's institutional suggestions in Common Sense are hardly fully fledged proposals. Indeed, one of the most surprising aspects of Paine's writing is how little institutional discussion there is—he is not a man for the detailed discussions of constitutions and legislative and executive arrangements. Even his piece in the summer of 1791 Answer to Four Questions on the Legislative and Executive Power is not especially illuminating. Most modern commentators tend not to notice this. Paine is clearly a democrat, he advocates democratic institutions, and he rejects those of monarchy and aristocracy. But such judgments are often deeply anachronistic. If we examine what Paine actually says, we see that his own perspective was one which evolved and remained inclusive in many areas. It seems clear that Paine was a republican—but in a changing and always very specific sense. In Dissertations on Government (1786) he specifies it as government directed towards ‘the public good, or the good of the whole’ (II, 372). In Rights of Man (1791) he understands it as government by election and representation (I, 338)—a definition of republic that matches closely that advocated by Madison in the Federalist Papers. In Rights of Man (1792) he switches back to the earlier formulation:

What is called a republic is not any particular form of government. It is wholly characteristical of the purport, matter, or object for which government ought to be instituted, and on which it is to be employed, res-publica, the public affairs, or the public good….Republican government is no other than government established and conducted for the interest of the public, as well individually as collectively. (CW I, 369-70)

Yet he steadfastly refuses to call the form of government he is interested in a ‘democracy’—which he identifies with ancient direct democracy and sees as essentially limited. The system he sees as operating in America is ‘representation ingrafted upon democracy’ (CW I, 371). And, unlike Joel Barlow, he does not use the neologism ‘representative democracy’ nor, like John Adams, ‘representative government.’ Paine thus plays a part in the process of transforming representation from something that was seen as compatible with monarchical—indeed with absolutist—states, although it could also take more popular forms, often linked to a gothic feudal past—into something that was directly linked to the sovereignty of the people in their nations. But, in many respects, he does little especially innovative. The one major impact of his work was to bring to a wide audience some of the thinking that he shared with both Madison and Jefferson about the distinctive features of the American form of government.

Rights of Man (1791) is a rather mixed performance, combining historical narrative of events in France, engagement with Burke, the adumbration of principles, and some powerful moments of political rhetoric—suggesting that Burke has constructed a set of tragic paintings by which he has ‘outraged his own imagination’ (CW I, 258), that Burke ‘pities the plumage but forgets the dying bird’ (CW I, 260) and that he has worked ‘up a tale accommodated to his own passions and prejudices.’ He makes his points about rights polemically, as he does those concerning the sovereignty of each generation and in drawing a distinction between the constitution and the government, and his most passionate attacks are on the hereditary principle and its accompanying ‘gibberish’ of titles and distinctions—‘the idea of hereditary legislators is as inconsistent as that of hereditary judges , or hereditary juries; and as absurd as an hereditary mathematician, or an hereditary wise man; and as ridiculous as an hereditary poet-laureate’ (CW I, 289).

In Rights of Man (1792) Paine shifts the ground substantially. He hardly mentions events in France, and barely touches on Burke. Instead, the revolution in America is announced as an event of global importance—the place ‘where the principles of universal reformation could begin’ (CW I, 354). What began in America is now seen, not as an exception, but as the trigger for a renovation or the world as a whole. The relative tolerance for France's monarchy in the first part of Rights of Man is set aside, suggesting that Paine had not previously thought that the old world states could manage a representative system of the American form, but that he now does think this. Moreover, his old distinction between society and government is re-animated but, instead of emphasizing the inevitability of vice, he represents society as in almost every respect sufficient unto itself: ‘Government is no further necessary than to supply the few cases to which society and civilisation (a new concept) are not conveniently competent’ (CW I, 357-8). Indeed, ‘the more perfect civilisation is, the less occasion has it for government, because the more does it regulate its own affairs, and govern itself…’ (CW I, 358-9). And, again, it is America that is the model—where the country subsisted with hardly any form of government throughout the revolution and the subsequent period. Moreover, America becomes the model for reform: a society that agrees articles, establishes a constitution, and is able periodically to revise the constitution as the collective act of the people. Contrasting old forms of government, based on an assumption of power, for the aggrandizement of itself’; and the new: ‘a delegation of power, for the common benefit of the people’ (CW I, 363), Paine roots the new forms in the establishment of a constitution and the regulation of government in accordance with the constitution for the good of all, seeing the American example as one that may be spread throughout the globe. Indeed, Paine thinks ‘it is too soon to determine to what extent of improvement government may yet be carried. For what we can foresee, Europe may form but one great republic, and man be free of the whole’ (CW I, 397). This is a hymn to representative government, to minimal government, and to government with the primary concern of protecting the natural rights of man more effectively. It is not a defense of democracy or universal suffrage. For all his characterization as a democrat he does not embrace that description; and there is no advocacy of universal suffrage prior to Paine's Letter Addressed to the Addressers, written and published in the summer of 1792 shortly before he left for France. This should further alert us to the fact that, in this period, Paine's thinking was changing, often as rapidly as events around him changed.

2.5 Welfare

In the final chapter of Rights of Man, Paine addresses the expenditure of the British state and to issues of commerce. Since his Letter to the Abbe Raynal (1782), he had expressed a growing confidence in commerce as a means of uniting the interests of nations and rendering outdated and irrelevant the European system of war. The final chapter of Rights of Man develops the same view, suggesting the incompatibility between monarchical regimes and the growth of commerce and national wealth, and going on to itemize the taxation raised in Britain to support the costs of monarchical wars. Given the new era of peace between nations consequent upon the revolutions in America and France, Paine raises the question of what should be done about the immense sums raised in taxes in Britain (some £15.5 millions), suggesting that ‘whoever has observed the manner in which trade and taxes twist themselves together, must be sensible of the impossibility of separating them suddenly’ (CW I, 423). Paine then develops a series of welfare proposals that seem to have no underlying principle of justice, but are proffered wholly as a way of redirecting spending. He advocates that poor relief be removed as a local tax and replaced by central provision from government coffers; that pensions be offered for those advanced in age, starting at 50, and in full form at 60; that provision be made for the education of the poor; that maternity be benefit be granted to all women immediately after the birth of a child; that a fund be established for the burial of those who die away from home; and that arrangements be made for the many young people who travel to the metropolis in search of a livelihood to provide initial accommodation and support until they find work. Paine ends by identifying provision for those who have served in the army and navy, and suggesting that, as demands on the public purse from these sources declines, then items of indirect taxation might also be lifted, and the burden of taxation gradually shifted towards a progressive taxation on landed property, coupled with the abolition of primogeniture, and a progressive tax on the income from investments. Although certainly influenced by his acquaintance with Condorcet and members of the Comité de Menicité de la Constituante, this raft of proposals represents a major innovation on Paine's part, its slight oddity being the absence of any clear set of underlying principles for its justification.

2.6 Property

The ad hoc turn to welfare in the second part of Rights of Man (1792) finds some compensation in the short pamphlet, Agrarian Justice (1795-6), that Paine wrote after his release from prison in response to the unrest in 1795 in Paris as protests spread against the economic hardship suffered in the capital, stimulating culminating in Babeuf's conspiracy of equals. Unlike the final chapter of Rights of Man, Agrarian Justice provides a principled defense for welfare provision, rooted in a conception of the original equality of man and the equal right to a subsistence from the earth. He acknowledges that there are benefits to allowing private property in land and its cultivation, but argues that every proprietor owes the community a ground-rent for the land he holds, which should be used as a right of inheritance for all, paying the sum of £15 as a compensation for the loss of natural inheritance at the age of twenty-one and an annual grant to the aged. These payments are a matter of right, not of charity. A claim against the common stock that all may make, on the ground that ‘no person ought to be in a worse condition when born under what is called a state of civilization, than he would have been had he been born in a state of nature…’ (I, 613). The money is to be raised from progressive taxation in inherited wealth and will contribute to its more equal distribution.

To modern critics it may seem odd to couple the essentially libertarian sentiments of the opening of the second part of Rights of Man with a major raft of welfare reforms. But Paine clearly did not think about these reforms as an extension of government. Although he does not make the point, they seem to be more a matter of administration, and that is in keeping with his essentially consensual view of the formal exercise of responsibilities by those invested with the confidence of the nation as a whole.

Paine's proposals probably had little practical effect on the emergence of the welfare state, but they helped influence early socialist doctrines and working men's associations, and they have since been taken up by those advocating a right to basic income or a child inheritance as a way of ensuring that the young need not inherit their parents’ poverty.

2.7 Representation

In his Letter Addressed to the Addressers (1792), and more fully in Dissertation on First Principles of Government 1795) Paine commits to the conclusion that equal rights entail an equal right to have a say in one's representative. He provides two main arguments. In the Letter… he argues that as every man over the age of twenty-one pays taxes in one form of another, so everyone has a right to vote—or a form of entitlement through contribution. But in the Dissertation he makes the case wholly on the basis of equal natural rights: ‘the right of voting for representatives is the primary right by which other rights are protected. To take away this right is to reduce a man to slavery, for slavery consists in being subject to the will of another, and he that has not a vote in the election of representatives is in this case. (II, 579) ‘It is possible to exclude men from the right of voting, but it impossible to exclude them from the right of rebelling against that exclusion; and when other rights are taken away, the right of rebellion is made perfect.’ (II, 580) This suggests that the role of rights grows in importance for Paine, making little appearance at all before 1788, and then coming to play an expanding role in his account, to provide the underpinning for political authority and an account of its limits, to justify the right to vote, and to make the case for a right to land and the fruits of nature which is translated into an inheritance right and a range of welfare rights. In his account of the origin of rights in Rights of Man (1791), he suggests that those (like Burke) who appeal to the authority of antiquity simply do not go back far enough:

If antiquity is to be an authority, a thousand such authorities may be produced, successively contradicting each other; but if we proceed on, we shall at last come out right; we shall come to the time when man came from the hand of his Maker…we have now arrived at the origin of man, and at the origin of his rights…It is authority against authority all the way, until we come to the divine origin of the rights of man, at the Creation. Here or inquiries find a resting-place, and out reason finds a home. (I, 273)

3. Religion

For a man so frequently called an atheist, Paine shows a remarkable confidence in the divine order of the creation. The work that did most to damage his reputation in America, and which split his supporters in Britain, was his Age of Reason (1793/4), which was followed by a further part in 1795, and additional writings compiled by later editors into a third part, from 1804. The Age of Reason is not an atheist tract, but a deist one. It combines scathing criticism of claims to authority for the bible by religious authorities, with an expression of confidence in a divinely ordered world, revealed in nature through the exercise of reason, that drew heavily on the lectures he had attended in London prior to leaving for America, given by James Ferguson and Benjamin Martin. Indeed, he seemed to have committed their account to memory, and uses the text to lay out the order of the universe, to speculate on the possibility of a plurality of worlds, and to dismiss all claims for mystery, miracles and prophecy. God is an unmoved first cause, who designs and sets the universe in motion for the benefit of man, and the moral duty of man consists in ‘imitating the moral goodness and beneficence of God, manifested in the creation toward all His creatures…everything of persecution and revenge between man and man, and everything off cruelty to animals, is a violation of moral duty.’ (I, 512). Although the later parts of Age of Reason descend into detailed interpretation and controversy, and lose much of their intuitive appeal, the first part is a powerful confession of rationalist faith in a divine creator whose design can be appreciated by man in the Bible of Creation, whose principles are eternal, and which rejects as meaningless the claims to authority and the theology of the Christian Churches. ‘The study of theology, as it stands in the Christian churches, is the study of nothing; it is founded on nothing; it rests on no principles; it produces no authorities; it has no data; it can demonstrate nothing; and it admits of no conclusion’ (CW I, 601). ‘The only religion that has not been invented, and that has in it every evidence of divine originality, is pure and simple Deism’ (CW I, 600). And as simple government avoids us becoming the dupes of fraud, so simple belief protects us from the fraud of priestcraft, which so often runs hand in hand with despotism.

4. Significance and Legacy

Paine's religious views, not unlike his political views, are not especially original or subtle. They follow much of the deist writing of the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries. But, as with much Paine wrote, the bluntness and sweeping rhetoric that alienates the more philosophically inclined modern reader were an essential element in his success and his continuing importance. Paine spoke to ordinary people—and they read him in their thousands—indeed, he was often read aloud in public houses and coffee shops. He claimed no authority over them, but helped them to doubt those who did claim such authority, whether civil or religious, and he affirmed over and over again their right and responsibility to think for themselves and to reach their own judgment on matters. He did so at a time when the press had become capable of reaching even the poorest of society—when the Attorney General launched the prosecution of Rights of Man (1792) he distinguished between the first part, which was ‘ushered into the world under circumstances that led me to conceive that it would be confined to the judicious reader’, and the second part, which ‘with an industry incredible, it was either totally or partially thrust into the hands of all persons in this country, of subjects of every description…Gentlemen, to whom are those positions, that are contained in this book addressed…to the ignorant, to the credulous, to the desperate.’ (State Trails v. 22, 381-3).

Paine would have embraced the description—although he was less of a ‘common man’ than many who have subsequently eulogized him make him out to be. In many respects, he was a moderately respectable radical, with a deep suspicion of the hierarchical systems of Europe, a brimming confidence in his own judgment that his experience in America confirmed - which expressed itself in his willingness to tackle a range of subject areas, including bridge-building and scientific experiments—and with a growing sense that he knew how to communicate, with powerful effect, with a popular audience at exactly the point at which that popular audience was beginning to feel and test its political influence.

Paine was vehemently attacked in his own lifetime—if the scurrilous biography was not invented for him it certainly attained something of an art form in his depiction. He was outlawed in England, nearly lost his life in France, and was largely ostracized and excluded when he returned to America. A sizable collection of papers at his New Rochelle farm were destroyed in a fire, and his oeuvre remains contested, at least at the margins. Biographers have drawn heavily on early work by Moncure Conway, but while several new accounts appear each decade few add much to our knowledge. Serious analysis of his ideas is relatively rare, and tends to be more historically than philosophically orientated. In this sense, he remains on the edges of the cannon of political thought, easily dismissed by those who want more substantial philosophical fare, and subject to fits of enthusiasm by writers who are either insufficiently attuned to the complexities of the period or are simply uncritical. Such an attitude does poor service to the history, to the ideas, or to the man.


Archival Resources

  • American Philosophical Society, Philadelphia, Richard Gimbel Collection of Thomas Paine manuscripts
  • Indiana University, Bloomington, Lilly Library, Paine collection
  • Norwich Central Library, Thomas Paine collection at Thetford: an analytical catalogue
  • Thomas Paine National Historical Association, New York
  • Thomas Paine Society, Nottingham
  • Bodleian Library, Petty MSS, letters to Lord Lansdowne

Paine's Works

  • P. S. Foner (ed.), 1945, The Complete Writings of Thomas Paine, 2 vols., Secaucus, NJ: The Citadel Press. [This is referenced as CW in the text.]
  • M. D. Conway (ed.), 1894, The Writings of Thomas Paine, 4 vols., New York: G.P. Putnam's Sons.
  • Hazel Burgess (ed.), 2010, Thomas Paine: A Collection of Unknown Writings, Basingstoke, Hants: Palgrave MacMillan. [Many of the items in this collection are disputed. See (Philp 2011, p. 185).]

Bibliographic works

  • R. Gimbel, 1956, Thomas Paine: A Bibliographical Checklist of ‘Common Sense’, New Haven: Yale University Press.

Contemporary Writing

  • F. Oldys [pseud for G. Chalmers], 1791/3, The Life of Thomas Paine London: Stockdale. [Is "G. Chalmers" an editor?]
  • J. Cheetham, 1809, The Life of Thomas Paine,London.
  • C. Rickman, 1819, Life of Thomas Paine, London: T.C. Rickman.
  • Edmund Burke, Reflections on the Revolution in France, in L. G. Mitchell (ed.), The Writings and Speeches of Edmund Burke: Vol VIII The French Revolution 1790-1794, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.

Modern Biography and Commentary

  • Abel, D., 1942, ‘The significance of the letter to the Abbé Raynal in the progress of Thomas Paine's thought’, Pennsylvania Magazine of History and Biography, 66: 176–90
  • Aldridge, A. O., 1960, Man of Reason: The Life of Thomas Paine, London: The Cresset Press.
  • –––, 1984, Thomas Paine's American Ideology, Cranbury, NJ: Associated University Preses.
  • Armytage, W. H. G., 1951, ‘Thomas Paine and the Walkers: An early episode in Anglo-American cooperation’, Pennsylvania History, 18: 16–30
  • Ayer, A. J., 1988, Thomas Paine, London: Secker and Warberg.
  • Bailyn, B., 1990, Faces of Revolution: Personalities and Themes in the Struggle for American Independence, New York: Alfred A. Knopf.
  • Claeys, G., 1989, Thomas Paine: Social and Political Thought, Boston: Unwin Hyman: .
  • Clark, H. H., 1933, ‘An historical interpretation of Thomas Paine's religion’, University of California Chronicle, 35: 56–87
  • –––, 1944, Introduction to Thomas Paine: Representative Selections, with Introduction, Bibliography and Notes, New York: Hill and Wang.
  • Conway, M. D., 1892, The Life of Thomas Paine, with a History of his Literary, Political, and Religious Career in America, France, and England, 2 vols, London: Watts and Co.
  • –––, 1900, Thomas Paine (1737–1809) et la révolution dans les deux mondes, Paris: Plon-Nourrit et cie.
  • Copeland, T. 1950, ‘Burke, Paine, and Jefferson’, in his Edmund Burke: Six Essays, London: Jonathan Cape, pp. 146–89.
  • Dyck, I. (ed.), 1988, Citizen of the World: Essays on Thomas Paine, New York: St. Martin's Press.
  • –––, 1933, ‘Local attachments, national identities and world citizenship in the thought of Thomas Paine’, History Workshop Journal, 35: 117–35
  • Fennessy, R. R., 1963, Burke, Paine, and the ‘Rights of Man’, The Hague: Catholic University of Louvain.
  • Foner, Eric, 1976, Tom Paine and revolutionary America, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Fruchtman, Jack, 1994, Thomas Paine: Apostle of Freedom, New York: Four Walls Eight Windows.
  • –––, 1993, Thomas Paine and the religion of nature, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • –––, 2011, The Political Philosophy of Thomas Paine, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Hawke, D., 1974, Paine, New York: W. W. Norton.
  • James, J. G., 1988, ‘Thomas Paine's iron bridge work, 1785–1803’, Newcomen Society Transactions, 57: 189–221
  • Kates, G., 1989, ‘From liberalism to radicalism: Tom Paine's Rights of man’, Journal of the History of Ideas, 50: 569–87.
  • Keane, J., 1995, Tom Paine: A Political Life, London: Bloomsbury.
  • Kaye, H. J., 2005, Thomas Paine and the Promise of America, New York: Hill and Wang.
  • Kramnick, I., 1990, ‘Tom Paine: radical liberal’, reprinted in I. Kramnick, Republicanism and bourgeois radicalism: political ideology in late-eighteenth century England and America, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Kuklick, B. (ed.), 2006, Thomas Paine, Burington, VT: Ashgate.
  • Nelson, C., 2006, Thomas Paine: His Life, His Time and the Birth of Modern Nations, London: Profile Books.
  • Payne, E. A., 1947, ‘Tom Paine: preacher’, Times Literary Supplment May 31, No. 2365, p. 267
  • Philp, M., 1989, Paine, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Philp, M., 2011, ‘Review of Hazel Burgess (ed.), Thomas Paine: A Collection of Unknown Writings’, English Historical Review, 126 (518): pp. 185-7.
  • –––, 1998, ‘Paine and science’, Enlightenment and Dissent, 16: 210-249
  • –––, 2007, Thomas Paine, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, Reforming Ideas in Britain, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Prochaska, F. K., 1972, ‘Thomas Paine's “The age of reason revisited”,’, Journal of the History of Ideas, 33: 561–76
  • Robbins, C., 1983, ‘The lifelong education of Thomas Paine (1737–1809): Some reflections on his acquaintance among books’, Proceedings of the American Philosophical Society, 127: 135–42
  • Roosevelt, T., 1888, Gouverneur Morris, Boston: Houghton Mifflin.
  • Thomson, A., 1991, ‘Thomas Paine and the United Irishmen’, Études Irlandaises, 16: 109–19.
  • Turner, J., 1989, ‘Burke, Paine, and the nature of language’, in J. R. Watson (ed.), Yearbook of English Studies: The French Revolution in English Literature and Art, 19: 75–92
  • Vincent, B., 1987, Thomas Paine, ou la religion de la liberté, Paris: Aubier.
  • –––, 1993, Thomas Paine, ou la république sans frontières, Nancy: Presses universiaires de Nancy.
  • Williamson, A., 1973, Thomas Paine: His Life, Work and Times, London:George Allen.
  • Wilson, D. A., 1988, Paine and Cobbett: The Transatlantic Connection, Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press.
  • Woodward, W. E., 1945, Tom Paine: America's godfather, 1737–1809, London: Secker and Warberg.

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