Property and Ownership

First published Mon Sep 6, 2004

Property is a general term for rules governing access to and control of land and other material resources. Because these rules are disputed, both in regard to their general shape and in regard to their particular application, there are interesting philosophical issues about the justification of property. Modern philosophical discussions focus mostly on the issue of the justification of private property rights (as opposed to common or collective property). ‘Private property’ refers to a kind of system that allocates particular objects like pieces of land to particular individuals to use and manage as they please, to the exclusion of others (even others who have a greater need for the resources) and to the exclusion also of any detailed control by society. Though these exclusions make the idea of private property seem problematic, philosophers have often argued that it is necessary for the ethical development of the individual, or for the creation of a social environment in which people can prosper as free and responsible agents.


1. Issues of Analysis and Definition

More than most policy areas dealt with by political philosophers, the discussion of property is beset with definitional difficulties. The first issue is to distinguish between property and private property.

Strictly speaking, ‘property’ is a general term for the rules that govern people's access to and control of things like land, natural resources, the means of production, manufactured goods, and also (on some accounts) texts, ideas, inventions, and other intellectual products. Disagreements about their use are likely to be serious because resource-use matters to people. They are particularly serious where the objects in question are both scarce and necessary. Some have suggested that property relations only make sense under conditions of scarcity (Hume [1739] 1888, pp. 484–98). But other grounds of conflict are possible: there may be disagreements about how a given piece of land should be used, which stem from the history or symbolic significance of that piece of land, whether land in general is scarce or not. (Intellectual property provides an example of property rules that do not respond directly to scarcity; moreover unlike material objects, the objects of intellectual property are not crowdable, for their use by any one person does not preclude their use by any number of others.)[1]

Any society with an interest in avoiding conflict needs such a system of rules. Their importance can hardly be overestimated, for without them cooperation, production, and exchange are virtually impossible, or possible only in the fearful and truncated forms we see in ‘black markets.’ This necessity is sometimes cited as an argument in favor of private property (Benn and Peters 1959, p. 155). In fact, all it establishes is that there ought to be property rules of some kind: private property rules are one variety. Some human societies have existed for millennia, satisfying the needs and wants of all their members, without private property or anything like it in land or the other major resources of economic life. So the first step in sound argumentation about property is distinguishing those arguments which support the existence of property in general from arguments which support the existence of a system of a specific kind (Waldron 1988).

There are three species of property arrangement: common property, collective property, and private property. In a common property system, resources are governed by rules whose point is to make them available for use by all or any members of the society. A tract of common land, for example, may be used by everyone in a community for grazing cattle or gathering food. A park may be open to all for picnics, sports or recreation. The aim of any restrictions on use is simply to secure fair access for all and to prevent anyone from using the common resource in a way that would preclude its use by others. Collective property is a different idea: here the community as a whole determines how important resources are to be used. These determinations are made on the basis of the social interest through mechanisms of collective decision-making—anything from a leisurely debate among the elders of a tribe to the forming and implementing of a Soviet-style ‘Five-Year Plan’.

Private property is an alternative to both collective and common property. In a private property system, property rules are organized around the idea that various contested resources are assigned to the decisional authority of particular individuals (or families or firms). The person to whom a given object is assigned (e.g., the person who found it or made it) has control over the object: it is for her to decide what should be done with it. In exercising this authority, she is not understood to be acting as an agent or official of the society. She may act on her own initiative without giving anyone else an explanation, or she may enter into cooperative arrangements with others, just as she likes. She may even transfer this right of decision to someone else, in which case that person acquires the same rights she had. In general the right of a proprietor to decide as she pleases about the resource that she owns applies whether or not others are affected by her decision. If Jennifer owns a steel factory, it is for her to decide (in her own interest) whether to close it or to keep the plant operating, even though a decision to close may have the gravest impact on her employees and on the prosperity of the local community.

Though private property is a system of individual decision-making, it is still a system of social rules. The owner is not required to rely on her own strength to vindicate her right to make self-interested decisions about the object assigned to her: if Jennifer's employees occupy the steel factory to keep it operating despite her wishes, she can call the police and have them evicted; she does not have to do this herself or even pay for it herself. So private property is continually in need of public justification—first, because it empowers individuals to make decisions about the use of scarce resource in a way that is not necessarily sensitive to others' needs or the public good; and second, because it does not merely permit that but deploys public force at public expense to uphold it.

It may be thought that the justificatory issue is nowadays moot, with the collapse of socialist systems in Eastern Europe and the former Soviet Union, and the triumph of market economies all over the world. It is tempting to conclude that since economic collectivism has been thoroughly discredited, the problem of justifying private property has been solved by default: there is simply no alternative. But the point of discussing the justification of an institution is not only to defend it against is competitors. Often we justify in order to understand and also to operate the institution intelligently. In thinking about property, there are a number of issues that make little sense unless debated with an awareness of what the point of private property might be. Some of these issues are technical. Consider, for example, the rule against perpetuities, the registration of land titles, or the limits on testamentary freedom; all these would be like an arcane and unintelligible code, to be learned at best by rote, unless we connect them with the point of throwing social authority behind individual control (or behind the individual disposition of control) over material resources. (See Ackerman 1977, p. 116.)

The same is true of some grander issues. The Fifth Amendment to the U.S. Constitution requires that private property not be taken for public use without compensation. Clearly this prohibits the simple seizure of someone's land for use, say, as a firing range or an airport. But what if the state places a restriction on the use of a person's land, telling the owner that she may not erect a modern skyscraper because it will compromise the historical aesthetics of the neighborhood? Does this amount to a taking? Certainly the owner has suffered a loss (she may have bought the land with the intention of developing it). On the other hand, we should not pretend that there is a taking whenever any restriction is imposed: I may not drive my car at 100 m.p.h. but I am still the owner of the car. Such questions cannot be answered intelligently without revisiting the reasons (if any) that there are for giving private property this sort of constitutional protection. Is it protected because we distrust the state's ability to make intelligent decisions about resource use? Or is it protected because we want to place limits on the burdens that any individual may be expected to bear for the sake of the public good? Our sense of the ultimate values that private ownership is supposed to serve may make a considerable difference to our interpretation of the takings clause and other doctrines.

Plainly private property and collective control are not all-or-nothing alternatives. In every modern society, some resources are governed by common property rules (e.g., streets and parks), some are governed by collective property rules (e.g., military bases and artillery pieces), and some are governed by private property rules (toothbrushes and bicycles). Also, there are variations in the degree of freedom that a private owner has over the resources assigned to him. Obviously, an owner's freedom is limited by background rules of conduct: I may not use my gun to kill another person. These are not strictly property rules. More to the point are things like zoning restrictions, which amount in effect to the imposition of a collective decision about certain aspects of the use of a given resource. The owner of a building in an historic district may be told, for example, that she can use it as a shop, a home, or a hotel but she may not knock it down and replace it with a skyscraper. In this case, we may still say that the historic building counts as private property; but if too many other areas of decision about its use were also controlled by public agencies, we would be more inclined to say that it was really subject to a collective property rule (with the ‘owner’ functioning as steward of society's decisions).

It is probably a mistake therefore to insist on any definition of private property that implies a proprietor has absolute control over his resource.[2] Some jurists have even argued that the terms ‘property’ and ‘ownership’ should be eliminated from the technical discourse of the law (see Grey 1980). They say that calling someone the ‘owner’ of a resource conveys no exact information about her rights in relation to that resource: a corporate owner is not the same as an individual owner; the owner of intellectual property has a different array of rights than the owner of an automobile; and even with regard to one and the same resource, the rights (and duties) of a landlord who owes nothing on his property might be quite different from those of a mortgagor.

The eliminative proposal makes sense to this extent: the position of a private owner is best understood not as a single right to the exclusive use and control of the object in question, but as a bundle of rights, which may vary from case to case (Honore 1961). Even ‘exclusive use’ is a complex idea. It implies, first, that the owner is at liberty to us the object as he pleases (within a range of generally acceptable uses). Secondly, it implies that others have an obligation to refrain from using the object without the owner's permission. The point about permission implies in turn that the owner has the power to license others to use her property. She may lend her automobile, rent her house, or grant a right of way over her land. The effect of this may be to create other property interests in the object, so that the various liberties, rights and powers of ownership are divided among several individuals.

More strikingly, the owner is legally empowered to transfer the whole bundle of rights in the object she owns to somebody else—as a gift or by sale or as a legacy after death. With this power, a private property system becomes self-perpetuating. After an initial assignment of objects to owners, there is no further need for the community or the state to concern itself with distributive questions. Objects will circulate as the whims and decisions of individual owners and their successive transferees dictate. The result may be that wealth is widely distributed or it may be that wealth is concentrated in a very few hands. It is part of the logic of private property that no-one has the responsibility to concern themselves with the big picture, so far as the distribution of resources is concerned. Society simply pledges itself to enforce the rights of exclusion that ownership involves wherever those rights happen to be. Any concern about the balance between rich and poor must be brought in as a separate matter of public policy (as tax and welfare policy or in extremis large scale redistribution). As we shall see, philosophers disagree as to whether this is an advantage or an indictment of private property systems.

At the furthest reaches of analysis, the concept of private property becomes quite contestable. Many people believe that ownership implies inheritance. But Mill once observed (Mill 1994 [1848], p. 28) that the private property idea implied only ‘the right of each to his (or her) own faculties, to what he can produce by them, and to whatever he can get for them in a fair market; together with his right to give this to any other person if he chooses.’ He said that passing the property of individuals who made no disposition of it during their lifetime to their children ‘may be a proper arrangement or not, but it is no consequence of the principle of private property’ (ibid.). Definitive resolution of such controversies is probably impossible. Some philosophers have suggested that certain concepts should be regarded as ‘essentially contested concepts’ (see Gallie 1956); if there is anything to this suggestion, private property might be one of them (see Waldron 1988, pp. 51–2).

2. Historical Overview

There are extensive discussions of property in the writings of Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, Hegel, Hobbes, Locke, Hume, Kant, Marx, and Mill. The range of justificatory themes they consider is very broad, and I shall begin with a summary.

The ancient authors speculated about the relation between property and virtue, a natural subject for discussion since justifying private property raises serious questions about the legitimacy of self-interested activity. Plato (Republic, 462b-c) argued that collective ownership was necessary to promote common pursuit of the common interest, and to avoid the social divisiveness that would occur ‘when some grieve exceedingly and others rejoice at the same happenings.’ Aristotle responded by arguing that private ownership promotes virtues like prudence and responsibility: ‘[W]hen everyone has a distinct interest, men will not complain of one another, and they will make more progress, because every one will be attending to his own business’ (Aristotle, Politics, 1263a). Even altruism, said Aristotle, might be better promoted by focusing ethical attention on the way a person exercises his rights of private property rather than questioning the institution itself (ibid.). Aristotle also reflected on the relation between property and freedom, and the contribution that ownership makes to a person's being a free man and thus suitable for citizenship. The Greeks took liberty to be a status defined by contrast with slavery, and for Aristotle, to be free was to belong to oneself, to be one's own man, whereas the slave was by nature the property of another. Self-possession was connected with having sufficient distance from one's desires to enable the practice of virtuous self-control. On this account, the natural slave was unfree because his reason could not prescribe a rule to his bodily appetites. Aristotle had no hesitation in extending this point beyond slavery to the conditions of ‘the meaner sort of workman.’ Obsessed with need, the poor are ‘too degraded’ to participate in politics like free men. ‘You could no more make a city out of paupers,’ wrote Aristotle, ‘than out of slaves’ (ibid., 1278a). They must be ruled like slaves, for otherwise their pressing and immediate needs will issue in envy and violence. Some of these themes have emerged more recently in civic republican theories, though modern theories of citizenship tend to begin with a sense of who should be citizens (all adult residents) and then proceed to argue that they should all have property, rather than using existing wealth as an independent criterion for the franchise (King and Waldron 1988).

In the medieval period, Thomas Aquinas continued discussion of the Aristotlean idea that virtue might be expressed in the use that one makes of one's property. But Aquinas gave it a sharper edge. Not only do the rich have moral obligations to act generously, but the poor also have rights against the rich. Beginning from the premise that ‘[a]ccording to the natural order established by Divine Providence, inferior things are ordained for the purpose of succoring man's needs…’ (Aquinas ST, p. 72), Aquinas argued that no division of resources based on human law can prevail over the necessities associated with destitution. This is a theme which recurs throughout our tradition—most notably in Locke's First Treatise on Government, (Locke 1988 [1689], I, para. 42)—as an essential qualification of whatever else is said about the legitimacy of private property (Horne 1990).

In the early modern period, philosophers turned their attention to the way in which property might have been instituted, with Hobbes and Hume arguing that there is no natural ‘mine’ or ‘thine,’ and that property must be understood as the creation of the sovereign state (Hobbes 1983 [1647]) or at the very least the artificial product of a convention ‘enter'd into by all the members of the society to bestow stability on the possession of…external goods, and leave every one in the peaceable enjoyment of what he may acquire by his fortune and industry’ (Hume 1978 [1739], p. 489). John Locke (1988 [1689]), on the other hand, was adamant that property could have been instituted in a state of nature without any special conventions or political decisions.

Locke's theory is widely regarded as the most interesting of the canonical discussions of property. In part this is a result of how he began his account; because he took as his starting point that God gave the world to men in common, he had to acknowledge from the outset that private entitlements pose a moral problem. How do we move from a common endowment to the ‘disproportionate and unequal Possession of the Earth’ that seems to go along with private property? Unlike some of his predecessors, Locke did not base his resolution of this difficulty on any theory of universal (even tacit) consent. Instead, in the most famous passage of his chapter on property, he gave a moral defense of the legitimacy of unilateral appropriation.

Though the Earth…be common to all Men, yet every Man has a Property in his own Person. This no Body has any Right to but himself. The Labour of his Body, and the Work of his Hands, we may say, are properly his. Whatsoever then he removes out of the State that Nature hath provided, and left it in, he hath mixed his Labour with, and joyned to it something that is his own, and thereby makes it his Property. It being by him removed from the common state Nature placed it in, it hath by this labour something annexed to it, that excludes the common right of other Men. (Locke 1988 [1689], II, para. 27)

The interest of Locke's account lies in the way he combines the structure of a theory of first occupancy with an account of the substantive moral significance of labor. In the hands of writers like Samuel Pufendorf (1991 [1673], p. 84), First Occupancy theory proceeded on the basis that the first human user of a natural resource—a piece of land, for example—is distinguished from all others in that he did not have to displace anyone else in order to take possession. It did not particularly matter how he took possession of it, or what sort of use he made of it: what mattered was that he began acting as its owner without dispossessing anyone else. Now although Locke used the logic of this account, it did matter for him that the land was cultivated or in some other way used productively. (For this reason, he expressed doubts whether indigenous hunters or nomadic peoples could properly be regarded as owners of the land over which they roamed.) This is partly because Locke identified the ownership of labor as something connected substantially to the primal ownership of self. But it was also because he thought the productivity of labor would help answer some of the difficulties which he saw in First Occupancy theory. Though the first occupier does not actually dispossess anyone, still his acquisition may prejudice other's interests of others if there is not, in Locke's words, ‘enough and as good left in common’ for them to enjoy (Locke 1988 [1689], II, para. 27). Locke's answer to this difficulty was to emphasize that appropriation by productive labor actually increased the amount of goods available in society for others (ibid., II, para. 37).

Immanuel Kant's work on property is less well known than Locke's, and is more formal and abstract. Kant began by emphasizing a general connection between property and agency, maintaining that there would be an affront to agency and thus to human personality, if some system were not arrived at which could permit useful objects to be used. He inferred from this that ‘it is a duty of right to act towards others so that what is external (usable) could also become someone's’ (Kant 1991 [1797], p. 74) Though this legitimated unilateral appropriation, it did so only in a provisional way. Since the appropriation of a resource as private property affects everyone else's position (imposing duties on them that they would otherwise not have), it cannot acquire full legitimacy by unilateral action: it must be ratified by an arrangement which respects everyone's interests in this matter. So the force of the principle requiring people to act so that external objects can be used as property also requires them to enter into a civil constitution, which will actually settle who is to be the owner of what on a basis that is fair to all.

G.W.F. Hegel's account of property centers on the contribution property makes to the development of the self, ‘superseding and replacing the subjective phase of personality’ (1967 [1821], para. 41a) and giving some sort of external reality to what would otherwise be the mere idea of individual freedom. These rather obscure formulations were taken up also by the English idealists, most notably by T.H. Green (1941 [1895]), who emphasized the contribution that ownership makes to ethical development, to the growth of the will and a sense of responsibility. But neither of these writers thought of the development of the individual person as the be-all and end-all of property. In both cases it was thought of as a stage in the growth of social responsibility. Both saw the freedom embodied in property as ultimately positive freedom—freedom to choose rationally and responsibly for the wider social good. In Karl Marx's philosophy, Hegel's sense of there being several stages in the growth of positive freedom is framed in terms of stages of social development rather than stages of the growth of individuals (Marx 1972 [1862]). And for Marx, as for Plato, social responsibility in the exercise of private property rights is never enough. The whole trajectory of the development of modern society, says Marx, is towards large-scale cooperative labor. This may be masked by forms of property that treat vast corporations as private owners, but eventually this carapace will be abandoned and collectivist economic relations will emerge and be celebrated as such.

The general merits of private property versus socialism thus became a subject of genuine debate in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. John Stuart Mill, with his characteristic open-mindedness treated communism as a genuine option, and he confronted objections to the collectivist ideal with the suggestion that the inequitable distribution of property in actually existing capitalist societies already partakes of many of these difficulties. He insisted however, that private property be given a fair hearing as well:

If…the choice were to be made between Communism…and the present state of society with all its sufferings and injustices,…all the difficulties, great or small, of Communism would be but as dust in the balance. But to make the comparison applicable, we must compare Communism at its best, with the regime of individual property, not as it is, but as it might be made…The laws of property have never yet conformed to the principles on which the justification of private property rests. (Mill 1994[1848], pp. 14–15)

Mill is surely right, at least so far as the aims of a philosophical discussion of property are concerned. Indeed, one way of looking at the history we have just briefly surveyed is that it is the history of successive attempts to tease out, from the mess of actually-existing maldistribution and exploitation, some sense of the true principles on which the justification of an ideal system of private property would rest, and a sense too of other aspects of moral enterprise which such an institution might serve.

3. Is Property a Philosophical Issue?

What is it about property that engages the interest of philosophers? Why should philosophers be interested in property?

Some have suggested that they need not be. John Rawls argued that questions about the system of ownership are secondary or derivative questions, to be dealt with pragmatically rather than as issues in political philosophy (Rawls 1971, p. 274). Although every society has to decide whether the economy will be organized on the basis of markets and private ownership or on the basis of central collective control, there was little that philosophers could contribute to these debates. Philosophers, Rawls said, are better off discussing the abstract principles of justice that should constrain the establishment of any social institutions, than trying to settle a priori questions of social and economic strategy.

On the other hand, with the growing attention that is being paid in the discipline to public policy generally, it is difficult to deny that questions about property can be posed in terms that are abstract enough for philosophers to address. Though Rawls counsels us to talk about justice rather than property, in fact issues about property are inevitably implicated in some of the issues about justice that have preoccupied political philosophers in recent years. Certain property institutions may be better than others for justice. A system of markets and private property covering all or most of the resources in society will make it very difficult to ensure the steady application of principles like equality, distribution according to need, or even as some have argued—see e.g., Hayek 1976—distribution according to desert. Some have argued that property rights in a market economy ought to be treated as resistant to redistribution and perhaps as insensitive to distributive justice generally except possibly at the moment of their initial allocation (see Nozick, 1974). If we take this view and if we also take distributive issues seriously, we may have to commit ourselves to a compromised or eclectic system rather than a pure market system of private property.

What about the ownership relation itself? Is there any inherent philosophical interest in the nature of a person's relation to material resources? When someone says ‘X is mine’ and X is an action, we see interesting questions about intentionality, free-will, and responsibility, which philosophers will want to pursue. Or when someone says ‘X belongs to person P,’ and X is an event, memory, or experience, there are interesting questions about personal identity. But when X is an apple or a piece of land or an automobile, there does not appear to be any question of an inherent relation between X and P which might arouse our interest.

This was one of David Hume's conclusions. There is nothing natural about private property, wrote Hume. The ‘contrariety’ of our passions and the ‘looseness and easy transition [of material objects] from one person to another’ mean that any situation in which I hold or use a resource is always vulnerable to disruption (Hume 1978 [1739], p. 488). Until possession is stabilized by social rules, there is no secure relation between person and thing. We may think that there ought to be: we may think, for example, that a person has a moral right to something that he has made and that society has an obligation to give legal backing to this moral right. But according to Hume, we have to ask what it is in general for society to set up and enforce rules of this kind, before we can reach any conclusions about the normative significance of the relation between any particular person and any particular thing.

Our property is nothing but those goods, whose constant possession is establish'd by the laws of society; that is, by the laws of justice. Those, therefore, who make use of the words property, or right, or obligation, before they have explain'd the origin of justice, or even make use of them in that explication, are guilty of a very gross fallacy, and can never reason upon any solid foundation. A man's property is some object related to him. This relation is not natural, but moral, and founded on justice. Tis very preposterous, therefore, to imagine, that we can have any idea of property, without fully comprehending the nature of justice, and shewing its origin in the artifice and contrivance of man. The origin of justice explains that of property. The same artifice gives rise to both. (ibid., p. 491)

The view that the issue of property begs questions about the general basis of social organization had already been foreshadowed by Thomas Hobbes. Indeed Hobbes regarded property as the key to political philosophy: ‘[M]y first enquiry was to be from whence it proceeded, that any man should call any thing rather his Owne, th[a]n another mans’ (Hobbes 1983 [1647], pp. 26–7). For Hobbes, property rules were the product of authority—the acknowledged authority of a sovereign, whose commands could guarantee the peace and make it safe for men to embark on social and economic activities that outstripped their ability to protect themselves using their own individual strength. Hume, by contrast, was interested in the possibility that the relevant settlement might emerge as conventions from ordinary human interactions rather than as impositions by an acknowledged figure in authority (Hume 1978 [1739], p. 490).[3]

Still even if we concede that property is the product of social rules, and that normative thinking about the former must be preceded by normative thinking about the latter, there might be facts about the human condition or our agency as embodied beings that provide philosophical premises for an argument that property relations should be established in one way rather than another. Clearly, there is at least one material object with which a person does seem to have an intimate pre-legal relation that would bear some philosophical analysis—namely, that person's body. We are embodied beings and to a certain extent the use and control of our limbs, sensory organs etc. is indispensable for our agency. Were a person to be deprived of this control—were others to have the right to block or manipulate the movements of his physical body—then his agency would be truncated, and he would be incapable of using his powers of intention and action to make something he (and others) could regard as a life for himself. Some modern authors, following John Locke, have tried to think about this in terms of an idea of self-ownership. According to G.A. Cohen (1995) a person owns himself when he has all the control over his own body that a master would have over him were he a slave. Now since a master is entitled to make comprehensive use of his slave for his own profit without owing any account or any contribution to anyone else, it seems to follow from the idea of self-ownership that a person must be allowed to profit equally comprehensively from the control of his own mental and bodily resources. Taking his cue from Nozick (1974) that taxation on earnings is a form of coerced labor (for others or for the state), Cohen concludes that various egalitarian arrangements (like welfare paid for out of taxation) are incompatible with the self-ownership of the rich. We have to choose therefore between principles of equality and principles of self-ownership. Debate on this issue continues: some argue that what we owe to others must be figured out first before there can be any question of owning either our selves, our bodies, or other material resources; while others say that any attempt to make the argument in that order will lead to counter-intuitive results (Nozick 1974, p. 234).

There is a further question whether self-ownership affords a basis for thinking about property in external objects other than my body? John Locke thought that it did (Locke 1988 [1689], II, para. 27). He suggested that when I work on an object or cultivate a piece of land, I project something of my self-owned self into the thing. That something I have worked on embodies a part of me is a common enough sentiment, but it is difficult to give it a analytically precise sense. That an object is shaped the way it is may be an effect of my actions; but actions don't seem to have the trans-temporal endurance to enable us to say that they remain present in the object after the time of their performance. The idea of mixing one's labor seems to be a piece of rhetoric which enhances other arguments for private property rather than an argument in its own right.

Others have speculated about an effect in the opposite direction—not so much the incorporation of the self into the object as the incorporation of the thing into the self (Radin 1982). This was a theme in Hegel's work, where there was a suggestion that owning property helped the individual to ‘supersede the mere subjectivity of personality’ (Hegel [1821] 1991, 73); in plain English, it gave them the opportunity to make concrete the plans and schemes that would otherwise just buzz around inside their heads, and to take responsibility for their intentions as the material they were working on—a home or an sculptor's block of marble—registered the impact of the decisions they had made (see Waldron 1988, pp. 343–89). Even the utilitarian Jeremy Bentham toyed with a version this idea. Though property, he said, depended on positive law, the law of property had an effect on the self that makes redistribution particularly objectionable. Law provided security for our expectations, and when that security came to be focused on a particular object, that object formed part of the structure of one's agency: ‘It is hence that we have the power of forming a general plan of conduct; it is hence that the successive instants which compose the duration of life are not like isolated and independent points, but become continuous parts of a whole’ (Bentham 1931 [1802], p. 111).

4. Genealogies of Property

In our philosophical tradition, arguments about the justification of property have often been presented as genealogies: as stories about the way in which private property might have emerged in a world that was hitherto unacquainted with the institution.

The best known are Lockean stories (Locke 1988 [1689] and Nozick 1974). One begins with a description of a state of nature and an initial premise about land belonging to nobody in particular. And then one tells a story about why it would be sensible for individuals to appropriate land and other resources for their personal use and about the conditions under which such appropriations would be justified. Individuals have needs and they find themselves surrounded with objects capable of satisfying those needs. But each person, X, is vaguely aware that the objects have not been furnished by God or nature for X's use alone; others have a need for them as well. So what is X to do? One thing is clear: if X has to wait for some general meeting of everyone who might be affected by his use of the resources in his vicinity before he is allowed to use them then, as Locke put it, ‘man had starved, notwithstanding the plenty God had given him’ (Locke 1988 [1689], II, para. 28). So the individual goes ahead and takes what he needs (ibid., I, para. 86). He ‘mixes his labor’ with the object he needs, and by doing so he fulfills his fundamental duty of self-preservation, while also increasing the value of the resources he works on for the indirect benefit of others. The first phase of Locke's story involves individuals satisfying their needs out of the common largesse in this virtuous and self-reliant way. The second phase of the story involves their exchanging surplus goods that they have appropriated with one another; rather than saying that such surpluses lapse back into the common heritage, Locke allows individuals to acquire, grow, or make more than they can use so that markets become possible and prosperity general (ibid., II, paras. 46–51). With markets and prosperity, however, comes inequality, avarice and envy, and the third and last stage of Locke's account is the institution of government to protect the property rights that have grown up in this way (ibid., II, paras. 123 ff.) The story assumes that individuals are able to reason through these issues of who is entitled to appropriate and use and exchange goods without the tutelage of government, and that at neither the first stage nor the second stage is any social or political decision-making about property required.

In its most basic aspect, Locke's genealogy has the character of a First Occupancy story. In the first instance, the legitimacy of an individual's appropriation stems largely from the fact that it does not involve the direct expropriation of anyone else: by definition the ‘first occupancy’ is peaceful. There are, of course, strong elements of utilitarian and virtue theory in Locke's account too—the productivity of labor and the privileging of what Locke calls ‘the Industrious and the Rational’ over the ‘Covetousness of the Quarrelsom and Contentious’ (ibid., II, para. 34). But the issue of historical priority is indispensable. Whose use of a given resource came first is crucial, and the order in which goods were subsequently transferred from hand to hand is indispensable for understanding the legitimacy of current entitlements. Robert Nozick (1974) has done more than anyone else to elucidate the form of this kind of ‘historical entitlement’ theory.

Not all genealogies of property have this shape. David Hume tells a completely different sort of story. On his approach, we begin by assuming that since time immemorial, people have been fighting over resources, so that the distribution of de facto possession at any given time is arbitrary, being driven by force, cunning, and luck. Now it is possible that such fighting will continue indefinitely. But it is also possible that it may settle down into a sort of stable equilibrium in which those in possession of significant resources and those tempted to grab resources from others find that the marginal costs of further predatory activity are equal to their marginal gains. Under these conditions, something like a ‘peace dividend’ may be available. Maybe everyone can gain, in terms of the diminution of conflict, the stabilizing of social relations, and the prospects for market exchange, by an agreement not to fight any more over possessions.

I observe, that it will be for my interest to leave another in the possession of his goods, provided he will act in the same manner with regard to me. He is sensible of a like interest in the regulation of his conduct. When this common sense of interest is mutually express'd, and is known to both, it produces a suitable resolution and behaviour… (Hume 1978 [1739], p. 490).

Such a resolution, if it lasts, may amount over time to a ratification of de facto holdings as de jure property. As with Locke's account, the state comes into the picture much later to reinforce conventions of property that emerge informally in this way (ibid., pp. 534 ff.). But notice how much more modest Hume's story is than the Lockean account in the moral claims that it makes (see Waldron 1994). The stability of the emergent distribution has nothing to do with its justice, nor with the moral quality of the actions by which goods were appropriated. It may be fair or unfair, equal or unequal, but the parties already know that they cannot hope for a much better distribution by pitching their own strength yet again against that of others. (See also Buchanan 1975 for a modern version of this approach.)

As an account of the genesis of property, Hume's theory has the advantage over its main rivals of acknowledging that the early eras of human history are eras of conflict largely unregulated by principle and opaque to later moral enquiry. It does not require us to delve into history to ascertain who did what to whom, and what would have happened if they had not. Once a settled pattern of possession emerges, we simply draw an arbitrary line and say, ‘Property entitlements start from here.’ The model has important normative consequences for the present as well. Those who are tempted to question or disrupt an existing distribution of property must recognize that far from ushering in a new era of justice, their best efforts are likely to inaugurate an era of conflict in which all bets are off and in which virtually no planning or cooperation is possible. The weakness of the Humean approach is the obverse of its strength. The moral considerations that it marginalizes actually do matter to us. For example, we would not be happy with a Humean convention ratifying slavery or cannibalism, but for all that Hume shows it may well be a feature of the equilibrium emerging from the age of conflict that some people are in possession of others' bodies. The point is that even if Hume is right that the sentiment of justice is built up out of a convention to respect one another's de facto possessions, that sentiment once established can take on a life of its own, so that it can subsequently be turned against the very equilibrium that engendered it (Waldron 1994).

A third variety of property-story makes the state and the social contract more fundamental than it is in either Locke's or Hume's approach. We are to imagine a period where people try and rely on their own physical and moral initiative to take possession of the resources which they need or want, but in which it become increasingly apparent that institution of reliable property arrangements is going to have to involve a social decision. Eventually property must be based on consent—the consent of everyone affected by decisions about the use and control of a given set of resources. This theory is associated with the normative political philosophy of Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1968 [1762]) and Immanuel Kant (1991 [1797]). As we have seen, the Lockean critique of this sort of approach was always that urgency of material need left no time for social consent. In fact the Rousseau/Kant approach has little difficulty with this point. There can be provisional appropriations made unilaterally (Ryan 1984, p. 80). But every such appropriation is subject in principle to the consent of all and must be offered up for social ratification. In other words, the urgency of immediate need is not taken as a basis of discrediting the review and redistribution of possession by society as a whole if serious distributive anomalies are emerging.

What all this actually yields in the way of a legitimate assignment of resources to individuals is a matter of the distributive principles that survive the test of ratification by the general will. Rawlsian, egalitarian and utilitarian approaches are all imaginable under the auspices of this account. The essence of the Rousseau/Kant approach is that society's deployment of principles like these to evaluate existing distributions is never trumped by the history of entitlements and it is never excluded by the Humean conventions that may have emerged as a cosy equilibrium among those who are actually in possession.

What claims are being made about these stories? Are we to assume that one of them is literally true? Or what are we to infer from their falsity (if they are historically inaccurate)? Does it follow that property is illegitimate? A number of philosophers have suggested recently that a genealogy can make an important contribution to our understanding of a phenomenon even when it is not literally true: Bernard Williams (2002) has suggested this about language and the emergence of truth-telling, following Edward Craig (1990)'s genealogical account of our possession of the concept of knowledge. Robert Nozick has also discussed the value of what he calls ‘potential explanations’—stories that would explain how something happened if certain things were the case (some of which in fact are not the case): ‘To see how in principle, a whole realm could fundamentally be explained greatly increases our understanding of the realm…We learn much by seeing how the state could have arisen, even if it didn't arise that way’ (Nozick 1974, pp. 8–9).

The genealogies we have considered may differ in this regard. The Rousseau/Kant approach helps us understand why private property is inherently a matter of social concern and the Humean approach helps us see the value of property in providing people with a fixed and mutually acknowledged basis on which the rest of social life can be built, whether or not it answers to our independent intuitions of justice. But the Lockean genealogy may explain little or nothing about property entitlements unless it is actually true. As Nozick acknowledges (1974, pp. 151–2), a modern state should not feel morally constrained by property holdings which might have had a Lockean pedigree but in fact do not. In this regard it is interesting that one of the main uses of Lockean theory these days is in defending the property rights of indigenous people—where a literal claim is being made about who had first possession of a set of resources and about the need to rectify the injustices that accompanied their subsequent expropriation (see Waldron 1992).

Finally, we should not forget that not all genealogies set out to flatter the practices or institutions they purport to explain. Karl Marx (1976 [1867]) ‘s account of primitive accumulation and Jean-Jacques Rousseau's non-normative description of the invention of property in the Discourse on the Origins of Inequality (Rousseau 1994 [1755]) are genealogies written more in a Nietzschean spirit of pathology than as part of any quest for justification. Such negative genealogies reminds us of the importance of Mill's observation that in approaching the justification of private property we must remember that, ‘we must leave out of consideration its actual origin in any of the existing nations of Europe’ (Mill 1994 [1848], p. 7).

5. Justification: Liberty and Consequences

The justificatory issue might therefore be confronted directly, without invoking any sort of history or genealogical narrative.

In dealing with the pros and cons of private property as an institution, it has sometimes been suggested that the general justification of private property and the distribution of particular property rights can be treated as separate issues, rather in the way that some philosophers suggested that the general justification of punishment can be separated from the principles governing its distribution (Hart 1968, p. 4; see also Ryan 1984, p. 82 and Waldron 1988, p. 330). In neither case, though, is the separation complete: it holds for some general justifications and not for others. In the theory of punishment, a retributivist will believe that the principles governing punishment in general necessarily also regulate its particular distribution. And there are analogues in the theory of property. Robert Nozick (1974) argued that a theory of historical entitlement, along Lockean lines, provides both a complete justification of the institution and a set of strict criteria that govern its legitimate distribution. Property rights, according to Nozick, constrain the extent to which we are entitled to act on our intuitions and theories about distributive justice. Consequentialist theories, however, may be able to separate the institutional and distributive issues in this way, and some theories of liberty may be able to do this also (though the distribution of liberty is itself something about which most libertarians have firm—and egalitarian!—views). As we assess various distributive arguments, then, it is a good idea to keep in mind the question of whether or not they have direct or indirect distributive implications.

The most common form of justificatory argument is consequentialist: people in general are better off when a given class of resources is governed by a private property regime than by any alternative system. Under private property, it is said, the resources will be more wisely used, or used to satisfy a wider (and perhaps more varied) set of wants than under any alternative system, so that the overall enjoyment that humans derive from a given stock of resources will be increased. The most persuasive argument of this kind is sometimes referred to as ‘the tragedy of the commons’ (Hardin 1968). If everyone is entitled to use a given piece of land, then no one has an incentive to see that crops are planted or that the land is not over-used. Or if anyone does take on this responsibility, they themselves are likely to bear all the costs of doing so (the costs of planting or the costs of their own self-restraint), while any benefits of their prudence will accrue to all subsequent users. And in many cases there will be no benefits, since one individual's planning or restraint will be futile unless others cooperate. So, under a system of common property, each commoner has an incentive to get as much as possible from the land as quickly as possible, since the benefits of doing this are in the short-term concentrated and assured, while the long-term benefits of self-restraint are uncertain and diffused. However, if a piece of hitherto common land is divided into parcels and each parcel is assigned to a particular individual who can control what happens there, then planning and self-restraint will have an opportunity to assert themselves. For now the person who bears the cost of restraint is in a position to reap all the benefits; so that if people are rational and if restraint (or some other form of forward-looking activity) is in fact cost-effective, there will be an overall increase in the amount of utility derived.

Arguments of this sort are familiar and important, but like all consequentialist arguments, they need to be treated with caution. In most private property systems, there are some individuals who own little or nothing, and who are entirely at the mercy of others. So when it is said that ‘people in general’ are better off under private property arrangements, we have to ask ‘Which people? Everyone? The majority? Or just a small class of owners whose prosperity is so great as to offset the consequent immiseration of the others in an aggregative utilitarian calculus?’ John Locke hazarded the suggestion that everyone would be better off. Comparing England, whose commons were swiftly being enclosed by private owners, to pre-colonial America, where the natives continued to enjoy universal common access to land, Locke speculated that ‘a King of a large and fruitful Territory there [i.e. in America] feeds, lodges, and is clad worse than a day Labourer in England.’ (Locke 1988 [1689], II, para. 41) The laborer may not own anything, but his standard of living is higher on account of the employment prospects that are offered in a prosperous privatized economy. Alternatively, the more optimistic of the consequentialists cast their justifications in the language of what we would now call ‘Pareto-improvement’. Maybe the privatization of previously common land does not benefit everybody: but it benefits some and it leaves others no worse off than they were before. The homelessness and immiseration of the poor, on this account, is not a result of private property; it is simply the natural predicament of mankind from which a few energetic appropriators have managed to extricate themselves.

So far we have considered the consequentialist case for private property over common property. The consequentialist case for private property over collective property has more to do with markets than with the need for responsibility and self-restraint in resource use. The argument for markets is that in a complex society there are innumerable decisions to be made about the allocation of particular resources to particular production processes. Is a given ton of coal better used to generate electricity which will in turn be used to refine aluminum for manufacturing cooking pots or aircraft, or to produce steel which can be used to build railway trucks, which may in turn be used to transport either cattle feed or bauxite from one place to another? In most economies there are hundreds of thousands of distinct factors of production, and it has proved impossible for efficient decisions about their allocation to be made by central agencies acting in the name of the community and charged with overseeing the economy as a whole. In actually existing socialist societies, central planning turned out to be a way of ensuring economic paralysis, inefficiency and waste (Mises 1951). In market economies, decisions like these are made on a decentralized basis by thousands of individuals and firms responding to price signals, each seeking to maximize profits from the use of the productive resources under its control, and such a system often works efficiently. Some have speculated that there could be markets without private property (Rawls, 1971, p. 273), but this seems hopeless. Unless individual managers in a market economy are motivated directly or indirectly by considerations of personal profit in their investment and allocation decisions, they cannot be expected to respond efficiently to prices. Such motivation will occur only if the resources are privately owned, so that the loss is theirs (or their employer's) when a market signal is missed and the gain is theirs (or their employer's) when a profitable allocation is secured.

I said earlier that a consequentialist defense is in trouble unless it can show that everyone is better off under a private property system, or at least that no-one is worse off. Now, a society in which all citizens derive significant advantages from the privatization of the economy is perhaps not an impossible ideal. But in every existing private property system there is a class of people who own little or nothing and who are arguably much worse off under that system than they would be under a socialist alternative. A justificatory theory cannot ignore their predicament, if only because it is their predicament that poses the justificatory issue in the first place (Waldron 1993). A hard-line consequentialist may insist that the advantages to those who profit from private ownership outweigh the costs to the underclass. Philosophically, however, this sort of hard line is quite disreputable (Rawls 1971, pp. 22–33; Nozick 1974, pp. 32–3). If we take the individual rather than a notional entity like ‘the social good’ as the focal point of moral justification, then there ought to be something we can say to each individual why the institution we are defending is worthy of her support. Otherwise it is not at all clear why she should be expected to observe its rules (except when we have the power and the numbers to compel her to do so).

Maybe the consequentialist argument can be supplemented with an argument about desert in order to show that there is justice in some people's enjoying the fruits of private property while others languish in poverty. If private property involves the wiser and more efficient use of resources, it is because someone has exercised virtues of prudence, industry, and self-restraint. People who languish in poverty, on this account, do so largely because of their idleness, profligacy or want of initiative. Now, theories like this are easily discredited if they purport to justify the actual distribution of wealth under an existing private property economy (Nozick 1974, pp. 158–9; Hayek 1976). But there is a more modest position which desert theorists can adopt: namely, that private property alone offers a system in which idleness is not rewarded at the expense of industry, a system in which those who take on the burdens of prudence and productivity can expect to reap some reward for their virtue which distinguishes them from those who did not make any such effort (Munzer 1990, pp. 285 ff.).

Many of the alleged market-advantages accrue only if private property is distributed in certain ways. Monopolistic control of the main factors of production by a few individuals or corporations can play havoc with market efficiency; and it can also lead to such great concentrations of private power as to offset any argument for property based on freedom, dissent or democracy. Distributive equity may be crucial also for non-consequentialist arguments. The idea that property-owning promotes virtue is, as we have seen, as old as Aristotle; and even today it is used by civic republicans as an argument against economic collectivism. According to this argument, if most economic resources are owned in common or controlled collectively for everyone's benefit, there is no guarantee that citizen's conditions of life will be such as to promote republican virtue. In a communist or collectivist society, citizens may behave either as passive beneficiaries of the state or irresponsible participants in a tragedy of the commons. If a generation or two grow up with that character then the integrity of the whole society is in danger. These arguments are interesting, but it is worth noting how sensitive they are to the distribution of property (Waldron 1986, pp. 323–42). As T.H. Green observed, a person who owns nothing in a capitalist society ‘might as well, in respect of the ethical purposes which the possession of property should serve, be denied rights of property altogether’ (Green 1941 [1895], p. 219).

Lastly I want to consider justificatory arguments that connect property with liberty. Societies with private property are often described as free societies. Part of what this means is surely that owners are free to use their property as they please; they are not bound by social or political decisions. (And correlatively, the role of government in economic decision-making is minimized.) But that cannot be all that is meant, for it would be equally apposite to describe private property as a system of unfreedom, since it necessarily involves the social exclusion of people from resources that others own. All property systems distribute freedoms and unfreedoms; no system of property can be described without qualification as a system of liberty. Someone may respond that the liberty to use what belongs to another is license not liberty, and so its exclusion should not really count against a private property system in the libertarian calculus. But the price of this maneuver is very high: not only does it commit the libertarian to a moralized conception of freedom of the sort that he usually shies away from (as in case of positive liberty), but it also means that liberty, so defined, can no longer be invoked to support property except in a question-begging way (Cohen 1982).

Two other things might be implied by the libertarian characterization. The first is a point about independence: a person who owns a significant amount of private property—a home, say, and a source of income—has less to fear from the opinion and coercion of others than the citizen of a society in which some other form of property predominates. The former inhabits, in a fairly literal sense, the ‘private sphere’ that liberals have always treasured for individuals—a realm of action in which he need answer to no-one but himself. But like the virtue argument, this version of the libertarian case is also sensitive to distribution: for those who own nothing in a private property economy would seem to be as unfree—by this argument—as anyone would be in a socialist society.

That last point may be too quick, however, for there are other indirect ways in which private property contributes to freedom. Milton Friedman (1962) argues that political liberty is enhanced in a society where the means of intellectual and political production (printing presses, photocopying machines, computers) are controlled by a number of private individuals, firms, and corporations—even if that number is not very large. In a capitalist society, a dissident has the choice of dealing with several people (other than state officials) if he wants to get his message across, and many of them are prepared to make their media available simply on the basis of money, without regard to the message. In a socialist society, by contrast, those who are politically active either have to persuade state agencies to disseminate their views, or risk underground publication. More generally, Friedman argues, a private property society offers those who own nothing a greater variety of ways in which they earn a living—a larger menu of masters, if you like—than they would be offered in a socialist society. In these ways, private property for some may make a positive contribution to freedom—or at least an enhancement of choice—for everyone.

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Aristotle, General Topics: political theory | consequentialism | constitutionalism | contractarianism | economics and economic justice | equality | exploitation | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | Hobbes, Thomas: moral and political philosophy | Hume, David: moral philosophy | justice: distributive | legal rights | liberalism | libertarianism | Locke, John: political philosophy | Marx, Karl | Mill, John Stuart: moral and political philosophy | personal identity: and ethics | Plato: ethics and politics in The Republic | redistribution | republicanism

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