Peirce's Theory of Signs

First published Fri Oct 13, 2006; substantive revision Mon Nov 15, 2010

Peirce's Sign Theory, or Semiotic, is an account of signification, representation, reference and meaning. Although sign theories have a long history, Peirce's accounts are distinctive and innovative for their breadth and complexity, and for capturing the importance of interpretation to signification. For Peirce, developing a thoroughgoing theory of signs was a central philosophical and intellectual preoccupation. The importance of semiotic for Peirce is wide ranging. As he himself said, “[…] it has never been in my power to study anything,—mathematics, ethics, metaphysics, gravitation, thermodynamics, optics, chemistry, comparative anatomy, astronomy, psychology, phonetics, economics, the history of science, whist, men and women, wine, metrology, except as a study of semiotic” (SS 1977, 85–6). Peirce also treated sign theory as central to his work on logic, as the medium for inquiry and the process of scientific discovery, and even as one possible means for 'proving' his pragmatism. Its importance in Peirce's philosophy, then, cannot be overestimated.

Across the course of his intellectual life, Peirce continually returned to and developed his ideas about signs and semiotic and there are three broadly delineable accounts: a concise Early Account from the 1860s; a complete and relatively neat Interim Account developed through the 1880s and 1890s and presented in 1903; and his speculative, rambling, and incomplete Final Account developed between 1906 and 1910. The following entry examines these three accounts, and traces the changes that led Peirce to develop earlier accounts and generate new, more complex, sign theories. However, despite these changes, Peirce's ideas on the basic structure of signs and signification remain largely uniform throughout his developments. Consequently, it is useful to begin with an account of the basic structure of signs according to Peirce.

1. Basic Sign Structure

In one of his many definitions of a sign, Peirce writes:

I define a sign as anything which is so determined by something else, called its Object, and so determines an effect upon a person, which effect I call its interpretant, that the later is thereby mediately determined by the former. (EP2, 478)

What we see here is Peirce's basic claim that signs consist of three inter-related parts: a sign, an object, and an interpretant. For the sake of simplicity, we can think of the sign as the signifier, for example, a written word, an utterance, smoke as a sign for fire etc. The object, on the other hand, is best thought of as whatever is signified, for example, the object to which the written or uttered word attaches, or the fire signified by the smoke. The interpretant, the most innovative and distinctive feature of Peirce's account, is best thought of as the understanding that we have of the sign/object relation. The importance of the interpretant for Peirce is that signification is not a simple dyadic relationship between sign and object: a sign signifies only in being interpreted. This makes the interpretant central to the content of the sign, in that, the meaning of a sign is manifest in the interpretation that it generates in sign users. Things are, however, slightly more complex than this and we shall look at these three elements in more detail.

1.1 The Signifying Element of Signs

The very first thing to note is that there are some potential terminological difficulties here. We appear to be saying that there are three elements of a sign, one of which is the sign. This is confusing and does not fully capture Peirce's idea. Strictly speaking, for Peirce, we are interested in the signifying element, and it is not the sign as a whole that signifies. In speaking of the sign as the signifying element, then, he is more properly speaking of the sign refined to those elements most crucial to its functioning as a signifier. Peirce uses numerous terms for the signifying element including “sign”, “representamen”, “representation”, and “ground”. Here we shall refer to that element of the sign responsible for signification as the “sign-vehicle”.

Peirce's idea that a sign does not signify in all respects and has some particular signifying element is perhaps best made clear with an example. Consider, for instance, a molehill in my lawn taken as a sign of moles. Not every characteristic of the molehill plays a part in signifying the presence of moles. The color of the molehill plays a secondary role since it will vary according to the soil from which it is composed. Similarly, the sizes of molehills vary according to the size of the mole that makes them, so again, this feature is not primary in the molehill's ability to signify. What is central here is the causal connection that exists between the type of mound in my lawn and moles: since moles make molehills, molehills signify moles. Consequently, primary to the molehill's ability to signify the mole is the brute physical connection between it and a mole. This is the sign-vehicle of the sign. For Peirce, then, it is only some element of a sign that enables it to signify its object, and when speaking of the signifying element of the sign, or rather, the sign-vehicle, it is this qualified sign that he means.

1.2 The Object

Just as with the sign, not every characteristic of the object is relevant to signification: only certain features of an object enable a sign to signify it. For Peirce, the relationship between the object of a sign and the sign that represents it is one of determination: the object determines the sign. Peirce's notion of determination is by no means clear and it is open to interpretation, but for our purposes, it is perhaps best understood as the placing of constraints or conditions on succesful signification by the object, rather than the object causing or generating the sign. The idea is that the object imposes certain parameters that a sign must fall within if it is to represent that object. However, only certain characteristics of an object are relevant to this process of determination. To see this in terms of an example, consider again the case of the molehill.

The sign is the molehill, and the object of this sign is the mole. The mole determines the sign, in as much as, if the molehill is to succeed as a sign for the mole it must show the physical presence of the mole. If it fails to do this, it fails to be a sign of that object. Other signs for this object, apart from the molehill, might include the presence of mole droppings, or a particular pattern of ground subsidence on my lawns, but all such signs are constrained by the need to show the physical presence of the mole. Clearly, not everything about the mole is relevant to this constraining process: the mole might be a conventional black color or an albino, it might be male or female, it might be young or old. None of these features, however, are essential to the constraints placed upon the sign. Rather, the causal connection between it and the mole is the characteristic that it imposes upon its sign, and it is this connection that the sign must represent if it is to succeed in signifying the mole.

1.3 The Interpretant

Although there are many features of the interpretant that bear further comment, here we shall mention just two. First, although we have characterized the interpretant as the understanding we reach of some sign/object relation, it is perhaps more properly thought of as the translation or development of the original sign. The idea is that the interpretant provides a translation of the sign, allowing us a more complex understanding of the sign's object. Indeed, Liszka (1996) and Savan (1988) both emphasize the need to treat interpretants as translations, with Savan even suggesting Peirce should have called it the translatant (Savan 1988, 41). Second, just as with the sign/object relation, Peirce believes the sign/interpretant relation to be one of determination: the sign determines an interpretant. Further, this determination is not determination in any causal sense, rather, the sign determines an interpretant by using certain features of the way the sign signifies its object to generate and shape our understanding. So, the way that smoke generates or determines an interpretant sign of its object, fire, is by focusing our attention upon the physical connection between smoke and fire.

For Peirce, then, any instance of signification contains a sign-vehicle, an object and interpretant. Moreover, the object determines the sign by placing constraints which any sign must meet if it is to signify the object. Consequently, the sign signifies its object only in virtue of some of its features. Additionally, the sign determines an interpretant by focusing our understanding on certain features of the signifying relation between sign and object. This enables us to understand the object of the sign more fully.

Although this is a general picture of Peirce's ideas about sign structure, and certain features are more or less present, or given greater or lesser emphasis at various points in Peirce's development of his theory of signs, this triadic structure and the relation between the elements is present in all of Peirce's accounts. In what follows, we shall see three of Peirce's attempts at giving a full account of signs and signification, the corresponding sign typologies, look at the transitions between these accounts, and examine some of the issues that arise from them.

2.Peirce's Early Account: 1867–8.

Peirce's earliest significant attempt at an account of signs comes in his 1867 paper “On A New List of Categories” (W2 .49–58). In that account, we find the same basic sign structure outlined above: any sign, or representation as Peirce calls it at this early stage, will have a sign-vehicle, an object, and an interpretant. An important difference here though is how he thinks of the relation between signs and interpretants. In particular, Peirce thought that whilst our interpreting the signifying relation between sign and object relied upon understanding the basis of signification in any given case, he also thought that the generated interpretant itself functioned as a further, more developed sign of the object in question. And of course, as a further sign, it will also signify that object through some features, which again, we must interpret, and generate a further interpretant. As will be obvious, this leads to an infinite chain of signs. If any sign must generate an interpretant in order to be a sign, and any sign is itself the interpretant of some further sign, then clearly, there must be an infinity of signs both proceeding and preceding from any given instance of signification. Some scholars (for example, (Short 2004) and (Short 2007)) think that infinite semiosis is a characteristic only of Peirce's early account. Others, (Liszka 1996, Savan 1988) treat infinite semiosis as present in all of Peirce's accounts. We shall return to the issue of infinite semiosis in the early account below. First, we shall look at the types of sign to which Peirce's early account gives rise.

Peirce thought that “representations” generate further interpretants in one of three possible ways. First, via “a mere community in some quality” (W2 .56). These he calls likenesses, but they are more familiarly known as icons. Second, those “whose relation to their objects consists in a correspondence in fact” (W2 .56) are termed indices. And finally, those “whose relation to their objects is an imputed character” (W2. 56) are called symbols. Put simply, if we come to interpret a sign as standing for its object in virtue of some shared quality, then the sign is an icon. Peirce's early examples of icons are portraits and noted similarities between the letters p and b (W2. 53–4). If on the other hand, our interpretation comes in virtue of some brute, existential fact, causal connections say, then the sign is an index. Early examples include the weathercock, and the relationship between the murderer and his victim (W2. 53–4). And finally, if we generate an interpretant in virtue of some observed general or conventional connection between sign and object, then the sign is a symbol. Early examples include the words “homme” and “man” sharing a reference. (W2. 53–4).

This, then, is the very first outing for Peirce's famous division of signs into Icons, Indexes, and Symbols. Although Peirce's precise thoughts about the nature of this division were to change at various points in his development of sign theory, the division nonetheless remains throughout his work. There are, however, some important features to this early account that mark it out from the later developments. We shall look at two of these features here: the importance of thought-signs; and infinite semiosis.

2.1 Thought-Signs

An interesting feature of Peirce's early account is that he is keen to associate signs with cognition. In particular, Peirce claims that all thought is in signs (W2. 213). We can see this from Peirce's early idea that every interpretant is itself a further sign of the signified object. Since interpretants are the interpreting thoughts we have of signifying relations, and these interpreting thoughts are themselves signs, it seems to be a straight-forward consequence that all thoughts are signs, or as Peirce calls them “thought-signs”. One interesting consequence of this is that in the early account, Peirce is quick to dismiss the importance and relevance of icons and indices.

The objects of the understanding, considered as representations, are symbols, that is, signs which are at least potentially general. But the rules of logic hold good of any symbols, of those which are written or spoken as well as those which are thought. They have no immediate application to likeness [icons] or indices, because no arguments can be constructed of these alone, but do apply to all symbols. (W2. 56)

This gives Peirce's early account of signs a rather narrow scope; it is concerned primarily with the general and conventional signs of which our language and cognition consist. The reason for this narrow focus is simple: for Peirce, since symbols are “potentially general” and fall under the remit of general rules, they are a fit subject of study for his primary focus, logic. This early account, then, focuses mainly on general and conventional signs, those signs identified by Peirce as symbols. Icons and indices, although noted at this early stage, are considered of secondary philosophical importance. As we shall see later, this narrow focus is something that Peirce was later to revise.

2.2 Infinite Semiosis

As previously noted, part and parcel of Peirce's early account of signs is that an infinity of further signs both proceed and precede from any given sign. This is a consequence of the way Peirce thinks of the elements of signs at this early stage and seems to stem from his idea that interpretants are to count as further signs, and signs are interpretants of earlier signs. Since any sign must determine an interpretant in order to count as a sign, and interpretants are themselves signs, infinite chains of signs seem to become conceptually necessary.

To see this, imagine a chain of signs with either a first or a last sign. The final sign that terminates the semiotic process will have no interpretant; if it did, that interpretant would function as a further sign and generate a further interpretant, and the final sign would, in fact, not terminate the process. However, since any sign must determine an interpretant to count as a sign, the final sign would not be a sign unless it had an interpretant. Similarly, a first sign could not be the interpretant of a preceding sign. If it were, that previous sign would be the first sign. However, since any sign must be an interpretant of a previous sign, a first sign would not be a sign unless it was also an interpretant of a previous sign. The problem is that if we allow a final sign with no interpretant, or a first sign which is not the interpretant or some earlier sign, then we have failed signs in the semiotic process. This affects the rest of the semiotic chain causing something like a collapse of dominoes. For example, if the final sign fails to be a sign in virtue of generating no interpretant, then since that failed sign is supposed to act as the interpretant of the previous sign and function as a further sign in its own right, it has also failed to be an interpretant. The consequence of this is that the previous sign has failed to generate a proper interpretant and so failed to be a sign. The consequence of this is that…and so on. The alternative is not to countenance terminating signs. And obviously, if we cannot end the semiotic process then signs continue generating signs ad infinitum.

Peirce was both aware and untroubled by infinite semiosis. In part, this is due to the anti-Cartesian project carried out in Peirce's work in the 1860s. A significant part of this project for Peirce is the denial of intuitions, something that Peirce took as a key assumption of Cartesian philosophical method. Given that Peirce defines “intuition” as “a cognition not determined by a previous cognition of the same object” (W2. 193), it seems clear that the infinite procession of thought-signs generated by earlier thought-signs and in turn generating further thought-signs is part and parcel of the denial of intuitions. However, in later developments to his sign theory, despite never explicitly relinquishing infinite semiosis, many of the concepts that lead to it are replaced or revised, and the concept becomes less prominent in Peirce's work.

3. The Interim Account: 1903

In 1903, Peirce gave a series of lectures at Harvard, and at The Lowell Institute. Part of these lectures was an account of signs. However, the 1903 account of signs showed considerable developments to the early account of the 1860s. First, where the early account suggested three classes of sign, the 1903 account suggests ten classes of sign. Second, where the account the 1860s treats the general sign, or symbol, as the main focus of sign theory, the 1903 account counts many more sign types as within the focus of philosophy and logic. Third, Peirce dropped the claim that an infinite chain of signs precedes any given sign (see Short 2004, 221–2).

These changes seem to be a consequence of developments in symbolic logic made by Peirce and his Johns Hopkins student, Oscar Mitchell, in the early 1880s. As is well known, during this time, and independently of Frege, Peirce and Mitchell developed quantification theory (see Peirce (1883), and (W5. 162–191)). An essential part of this development was the inclusion of singular propositions and individual variables for objects that cannot be picked out be definite descriptions. Peirce treated these non-general signs as indices, which in turn led him to identify the index as an essential part of logic. This made his earlier account of signs seem underdeveloped. (See, for instance, Short (2004, 219–222), Hookway (2000, 127–131), and Murphey (1961, 299–300)). This appears to have led Peirce to take signs other than the symbol more seriously. In particular, it led Peirce to realize that some symbolic signs had distinctly indexical (that is non-general) features. Similarly, symbols with heavily iconic features, especially in mathematics (see Hookway 1985 Ch 6), were more important than he thought. What this meant, of course, was that the account of the 1860s was now woefully inadequate to the task of capturing the range of signs and signification that Peirce thought important for philosophy and logic.

Peirce's 1903 account of signs, then, is notable for its broader scope, relative neatness, and completeness. In it Peirce returns to the basic sign structure we gave above and by paying close attention to those elements of signs and the various interactions between them gives what seems to be an extensive account of signification, and an exhaustive typology of signs far beyond the range of his early account of the 1860s. To understand Peirce's 1903 account, we must return to the three elements of signification, namely, the sign-vehicle, the object, and the interpretant and see how Peirce thinks their function in signification leads to an exhaustive classification of sign types.

3.1 Sign-Vehicles

Recall that Peirce thought signs signify their objects not through all their features, but in virtue of some particular feature. By 1903, for reasons related to his work on phenomenology, Peirce thought the central features of sign-vehicles could be divided into three broad areas, and consequently, that signs could be classified accordingly. This division depends upon whether sign-vehicles signify in virtue of qualities, existential facts, or conventions and laws. Further, signs with these sign-vehicles are classified as qualisigns, sinsigns, and legisigns respectively.

Examples of signs whose sign-vehicle relies upon a quality are difficult to imagine, but a particularly clear example, used by David Savan, is this:

[…] I use a color chip to identify the color of some paint I want to buy. The color chip is perhaps made of cardboard, rectangular, resting on a wooden table etc., etc. But it is only the color of the chip that is essential to it as a sign of the color of the paint. (Savan 1988, 20)

There are many elements to the colored chip as a sign, but it is only its color that matters to its ability to signify. Any sign whose sign-vehicle relies, as with this example, on simple abstracted qualities is called a qualisign.

An example of a sign whose sign-vehicle uses existential facts is smoke as a sign for fire; the causal relation between the fire and smoke allows the smoke to act as a signifier. Other cases are the molehill example used earlier, and temperature as a sign for a fever. Any sign whose sign-vehicle relies upon existential connections with its object is named, by Peirce, a sinsign.

And finally, the third kind of sign is one whose crucial signifying element is primarily due to convention, habit or law. Typical examples would be traffic lights as sign of priority, and the signifying capability of words; these sign-vehicles signify in virtue of the conventions surrounding their use. Peirce calls signs whose sign-vehicles function in this way legisigns.

3.2 Objects

Just as Peirce thought signs could be classified according to whether their sign-vehicles function in virtue of qualities, existential facts, or conventions and laws, he thought signs were similarly classifiable according to how their object functioned in signification. Recall that, for Peirce, objects “determine” their signs. That is to say, the nature of the object constrains the nature of the sign in terms of what successful signification requires. Again, Peirce thought the nature of these constraints fell into three broad classes: qualitative, existential or physical, and conventional and law-like. Further, if the constraints of successful signification require that the sign reflect qualitative features of the object, then the sign is an icon. If the constraints of successful signification require that the sign utilize some existential or physical connection between it and its object, then the sign is an index. And finally, if successful signification of the object requires that the sign utilize some convention, habit, or social rule or law that connects it with its object, then the sign is a symbol.

This is a trichotomy with which we are already familiar from the early account, and indeed, the examples of icons, indices, and symbols are largely the same as before: icons are portraits and paintings, indices are natural and causal signs, symbols are words and so on. There are, however, additional instances, for example, icons include diagrams used in geometrical reasoning, indices include pointing fingers and proper names, and symbols including broad speech acts like assertion and judgment, all of which suggests a considerable broadening of this trichotomy. It is well worth noting, though, that by 1903 Peirce was aware that it would be hard, if not impossible, to find any pure instances of icons and indices. Rather, he began to suspect that icons and indices were always partly symbolic or conventional. To try to capture this, Peirce experimented with some additional terminology and types of icon and index. These he called the hypo-icon (see CP2 .276 1903) and the sub-index (see CP 2.330 1903) respectively. We shall not explore these signs further here (see (Goudge 1965) and (Atkin 2005) for more on Peirce's view of indices, and (Legg 2008) for more on icons), but it is worth noting that by 1903, the simple icon/index/symbol trichotomy was something of an abstraction, and Peirce was aware that any single sign may display some combination of iconic, indexical and symbolic characteristics.

3.3 Interpretants

As with the sign-vehicle and the object, Peirce thought we could classify signs in terms of their relation with their interpretant. Again, he identifies three categories according to which feature of the relationship with its object a sign uses in generating an interpretant. Further, as with the classification of the sign in terms of the sign-vehicle and the object, Peirce identifies qualities, existential facts, or conventional features as the basis for classifying the sign in terms of its interpretant.

If the sign determines an interpretant by focusing our understanding of the sign upon the qualitative features it employs in signifying its object, then the sign is classified as a rheme. Examples are not straightforward, but one way of understanding rhemes, is to think of them as unsaturated predicates like, “— is a dog”, “— is happy”, “— loves —” or “— gives—to —”, and so on. Whenever we understand a sign in terms of qualities it suggests its object may have, we generate an interpretant that qualifies its sign as a rheme. If, on the other hand, a sign determines an interpretant by focusing our understanding of the sign upon the existential features it employs in signifying an object, then the sign is a dicent. We can think of dicents is as saturated predicates, or propositions, like “Fido is a dog”, “Larry is happy”, “Fido loves Larry”, “Larry gives food to Fido”, and so on. And finally, if a sign determines an interpretant by focusing our understanding on some conventional or law-like features employed in signifying the object, then the sign is a delome, or as Peirce most frequently, but confusingly, calls them, arguments. Further, just as we can think of a rheme as an unsaturated predicate, and a dicent as a proposition, we can think of the delome as an argument or rule of inference. Our ability to understand a sign in terms of its place in some pattern of reasoning and system of signs enables us to derive information from it (by deductive reasoning) or make conjectures about it (by inductive and abductive reasoning). So, whenever we come to understand a sign as focusing our attention upon some conventional feature of its relationship with object, that is, enabling us to understand the sign as part of a rule governed system of knowledge and signs etc., we have an interpretant that qualifies a sign as a delome (or argument).

3.4 The Ten Classes of Signs

Peirce believed that the three elements, and the respective classifications they imposed upon signs, could be combined to give a complete list of sign types. That is, since a sign has a sign-vehicle it can be classified as either a qualisign, a sinsign, or legisign. Additionally, since that sign has an object it can be classified as either an icon, an index, or a symbol. And finally, since that sign will also determine an interpretant it can be classified as either a rheme, a dicent, or a delome. Each sign is then classifiable as some combination of each of its three elements, that is, as either one of the three types of sign-vehicle, plus one of the three types of object, plus one of the three types of interpretant. Initially, this seems to yield twenty-seven possible classificatory combinations, but, because of certain of Peirce's phenomenological theories, there are restrictions on how we can combine the different elements that mean there are, in fact, only ten types of sign. (For more on the relation between Peirce's phenomenological categories, and his sign typology, see (Lizska 1996) and (Savan 1988))

The rules for the permissible combinations are actually quite simple so long as we bear two things in mind. First, types of each element are classifiable as either a quality, an existential fact, or a convention. That is, across the three elements of a sign, there are three types deriving from qualities (the qualisign, the icon, and the rheme), three deriving from existential facts, (the sinsign, the index, and the dicent), and three deriving from conventions (the legisign, the symbol, and the delome). Second, the classification of the interpretant depends upon the classification of the object, which in turn depends upon the classification of the sign-vehicle. The rules that determine permissible classifications, then, are that if an element is classified as a quality, then its dependent element may only be a classified as a quality. If an element is classified as an existential fact, then its dependent element may be classified as either an existential fact, or a quality. And if an element is classified as a convention, then its dependent element may be classified as either a convention, an existential fact, or a quality. This leaves us with ten permissible combinations between a sign-vehicle, object and interpretant, and so ten possible kinds of signs. They look something like this:

INTERPRETANT OBJECT SIGN-VEHICLE EXAMPLES (from CP2.254—263 1903)
Rheme Icon Qualisign “A feeling of red”
Rheme Icon Sinsign; “An Individual Diagram”
Rheme Index Sinsign “A spontaneous cry”
Dicent Index Sinsign “A Weather Cock”
Rheme Icon Legisign “A diagram [type]”
Rheme Index Legisign “A demonstrative pronoun”
Dicent Index Legisign “A street cry”
Rheme Symbol Legisign “A common noun”
Dicent Symbol Legisign “Ordinary proposition”
Delome Symbol Legisign “An argument”

These ten types of sign are simply called after the combination of their elements: an ordinary proposition is a dicentic-symbolic-legisign, a spontaneous cry a rhematic-indexical-sinsign, and so on.

Despite its apparent completeness and complexity, however, Peirce was soon to begin rethinking his 1903 account of signs and over the final years of his life, he introduced further complexities and nuances.

4. The Final Account: 1906–10

During the last part of his life the majority of Peirce's philosophical output concerned semiotic, and he developed his account of signs far beyond the 1903 theory. There seem to be two reasons for this. First, Peirce was geographically and intellectually isolated and his main outlet was correspondence with the English woman, Lady Victoria Welby. Welby wrote on various philosophical topics and shared Peirce's interests in signs and meaning. This seems to have given Peirce a willing and sympathetic audience for his developing ideas on signs. The second reason seems to have been his growing appreciation of the connections between the semiotic process and the process of inquiry. Peirce always thought of his philosophy in a systematic and architectonic way. However, around 1902, an application for funding to the Carnegie Institute saw him express more clearly the connections between different aspects of his philosophy. The application failed, but Peirce had returned to thinking about the place of sign theory in his broader philosophy. In particular, he came to see sign theory more clearly as part of the logic of scientific discovery, that is, as central to his account of inquiry. We shall not review Peirce's account of inquiry here, but as an end directed process leading from doubt-prone to doubt-proof beliefs, Peirce began to see a similar end-directedness running through the semiotic process. This kind of thinking lead Peirce to reassess his account of signs and sign structure: the connection between the process of inquiry and sign chains led Peirce to notice subtleties and nuances that had previously been transparent to him. In particular, it led him to see chains of signs as tending towards a definite but idealized end rather than progressing ad infinitum. Since at the idealized end of inquiry we have a complete understanding of some object, there need be no further interpretant of that object; our understanding cannot be developed any further. (See Ransdell (1977) and Short (2004) and (2007) for more on the connections between Peirce's later account and the end-directed process of inquiry. Indeed, Short (2007) represents the fullest and best developed account of 'telic' interpretations of Peirce's semiotic to date).

4.1 Dividing The Object

The first effect of Peirce's greater appreciation of the parallels between inquiry and his sign theory is a distinction between the object of the sign as it we understand at some given point in the semiotic process, and the object of the sign as it stands at the end of that process. The former he calls the immediate object, and the later he calls the dynamic object. A neat way of capturing this distinction is as the different objects arising from the “two answers to the question: what object does this sign refer to? One is the answer that could be given when the sign was used; and the other is the one we could give when our scientific knowledge is complete”. (Hookway 1985, 139).

4.1.1 The Dynamic Object

The dynamic object is, in some senses, the object that generates a chain of signs. The aim of a sign chain is to arrive at a full understanding of an object and so assimilate that object into the system of signs. Using slightly more simplistic terms, Ransdell (1977, 169) describes the dynamic object as the “object as it really is”, and Hookway (1985, 139) describes it as “the object as it is known to be [at the end of inquiry]”. Indeed, Hookway's description shows an acute awareness of the connection between the dynamic object and the process of inquiry in Peirce's later sign theory. An example, from Liszka (1996, 23), captures Peirce's idea quite clearly: taking a petroleum tank half full with fuel, a variety of signs for this half-full state are available. Perhaps there is a fuel gauge attached to the tank, or perhaps the tank makes a distinctive sound when we strike it and so on. But, despite these various signs, the object underlying them all is the actual level of fuel in the petroleum tank; this is the dynamic object.

4.1.2 The Immediate Object

Ransdell (1977, 169) describes the immediate object as “what we, at any time, suppose the object to be”, and Hookway (1985, 139) describes it as “the object at the time it is first used and interpreted”. The immediate object, then, is not some additional object distinct from the dynamic object but is merely some informationally incomplete facsimile of the dynamic object generated at some interim stage in a chain of signs. Returning to the petroleum tank example, when we strike the tank, the tone that it emits (which functions as the sign-vehicle) represents to us that the tank is not full (but it does not tell us the precise level of fuel). The immediate object, then, is a less-than-full-tank.

Clearly, the immediate and dynamic objects of a sign are intimately linked and Peirce consistently describes and introduces the two together. (See, (CP 4. 536 (1896)). However, the connection between the two is most clear when we consider the connections between sign chains and inquiry. The dynamic object is, as we have suggested, the goal and end point that drives the semiotic process, and the immediate object is our grasp of that object at any point in that process. Ransdell, for instance, says:

[T]he immediate object is the object as it appears at any point in the inquiry or semiotic process. The [dynamic] object, however, is the object as it really is. These must be distinguished, first, because the immediate object may involve some erroneous interpretation and thus be to that extent falsely representative of the object as it really is, and, second, because it may fail to include something that is true of the real object. In other words, the immediate object is simply what we at any time suppose the real object to be. (Ransdell 1977, 169)

Put this way, it is clear how Peirce's growing concern to capture the parallels between semiosis and the process of inquiry leads him to identify two objects for the sign.

4.2 Dividing the Interpretant

Just as with the object(s) of the sign, the parallels between semiotic and inquiry result in a similar division of interpretants. As a chain of signs moves towards a final end there are different interpretants playing different but important roles. Peirce identifies three different ways in which we grasp the way a sign stands for an object. He calls these three types of interpretant, the immediate interpretant, the dynamic interpretant and the final interpretant and describes them like this.

The [Dynamic] Interpretant is whatever interpretation any mind actually makes of a sign. […]The Final Interpretant does not consist in the way in which any mind does act but in the way in which every mind would act. That is, it consists in a truth which might be expressed in a conditional proposition of this type: “If so and so were to happen to any mind this sign would determine that mind to such and such conduct.” […] The Immediate Interpretant consists in the Quality of the Impression that a sign is fit to produce, not to any actual reaction. […] [I]f there be any fourth kind of Interpretant on the same footing as those three, there must be a dreadful rupture of my mental retina, for I can't see it at all. (CP8 .315 1909).

We shall examine each of these in turn, but to get a clearer understanding of the three interpretants it is helpful to look, very briefly, at Peirce's three grades of clarity, or understanding since Peirce took these to inform his division of interpretants.

In his 1878 paper, “How To Make Our Ideas Clear” (W3, 257–275) Peirce introduces three grades of clarity, or levels of understanding. In this paper, he introduces his famous pragmatic maxim as a development of rationalist notions of “clear and distinct ideas”. Combining his pragmatic maxim with notions of clarity from Descartes and Leibniz, Peirce identifies three grades of understanding. The first grade of clarity is to have an unreflective grasp of some concept in everyday experience. The second grade of clarity is to have, or be capable of providing, a general definition of that concept. The third grade of clarity, though, comes from Peirce's famous statement of the pragmatic maxim:

Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of these effects is the whole of our conception of the object. (W3, 266)

A full understanding of some concept, then, involves familiarity with it in day-to-day encounters, the ability to offer some general definition of it, and knowing what effects to expect from holding that concept to be true.

Although these grades of clarity are part of Peirce's pragmatism, his greater understanding of the interconnectedness of his thought led him to realize that they were also crucial to his work on semiotic. In particular, he saw the three grades of clarity or understanding as reflected in his notion of the interpretant and of course felt that the interpretant also had three grades or divisions. Peirce himself says:

In the Second Part of my [“How To Make Our Ideas Clear”], I made three grades of clearness of Interpretation. The first was such Familiarity as gave a person familiarity with a sign and readiness in using it or interpreting it. In his consciousness he seemed to himself to be quite at home with the Sign. […] The second was Logical Analysis [and is equivalent to] Lady Welby's Sense. The third was Pragmatistic Analysis [and is] identified with the Final Interpretant. (CP8 .185 (1909)).

Here, then, Peirce identifies the first grade of clarity with the dynamic interpretant, the second grade with the immediate interpretant, and the third grade with the final interpretant.

4.2.1 The Immediate Interpretant

As its identification with the second grade of clarity suggests, the immediate interpretant is a general definitional understanding of the relationship between the sign and dynamic object. In an extended example, where the dynamic object is the weather on a stormy day, Peirce describes the immediate interpretant as “the schema in [our] imagination, i.e. the vague Image of what there is in common to the different images of a stormy day” (CP8 .314 (1907)). The immediate interpretant, then, is something like recognition of the syntax of the sign and the more general features of its meaning. Indeed, Peirce seems to take the immediate interpretant to be “all that is explicit in the sign apart from its context and circumstances of utterance” (CP5 .473 (1907)). Also instructive is David Savan's description of the immediate interpretant as the:

explicit content of the sign which would enable a person to say whether or not the sign was applicable to anything concerning which that person had sufficient acquaintance. It is the total unanalyzed impression which the sign might be expected to produce, prior to any critical reflection upon it. (Savan 1988, 53).

In terms of an example where ordinary sentences are the signs, the immediate interpretant will involve something like our recognition of grammatical categories, syntactic structures and conventional rules of use. For instance, without knowing anything about its context of utterance, we can surmise certain things about the sentence, “we don't want to hurt him, do we?”. We know it is a question, we know it concerns doing harm to some person, a male, and so on. These things are part of the immediate interpretant of the sign.

4.2.2 The Dynamic Interpretant

The second type of interpretant that any sign must have is the dynamic interpretant. This is our understanding of the sign/dynamic object relationship at some actual instance in the chain of signs. Peirce describes the dynamic interpretant as the “effect actually produced on the mind” (CP8 .343 (1908)), or as the “actual effect which the sign, as a sign, really determines” (CP4 .536 (1906)). The dynamic interpretant, then, is the understanding we reach, or which the sign determines, at any particular semiotic stage.

To continue with linguistic examples, we know that the dynamic interpretant is the actual interpretation we make, or understanding we reach, in the first instance of interpretation. For instance, when you say to me whilst pointing at some cowardly woman we know, “I saw her duck under the table”, the dynamic interpretant is my understanding that you are the utterer, that I am the addressee, and that you saw our cowardly acquaintance hide beneath a table.

There is also an interesting connection between the dynamic interpretant and the immediate object. As the understanding we actually reach at any particular point in the sign chain, the dynamic interpretant represents an incomplete understanding, or interpretation, of the dynamic object. More important, though, is that the immediate object of some sign in a sign chain consists of the actual interpretations made previously, that is, it consists of the dynamic interpretants from earlier stages in the sign chain. As Ransdell (1977, 169) puts it, the “immediate object is, in other words, the funded result of all interpretation prior to the interpretation of the given sign”. The dynamic interpretant then, is the actual interpretation or understanding we make at some point in the semiotic process, and also constitutes, along with previous dynamic interpretants, the immediate object, or partial understanding we have of the dynamic object at any particular point in the semiotic process.

4.2.3 The Final Interpretant

Peirce describes the final interpretant as, “that which would finally be decided to be the true interpretation if consideration of the matter were carried so far that an ultimate opinion were reached” (CP8 .184 (1909)). Elsewhere he describes it as the “effect that would be produced on the mind by the sign after sufficient development of thought” (CP8 .343 (1908)). The final interpretant, then, seems to be what our understanding of the dynamic object would be at the end of inquiry, that is, if we had a reached a true understanding of the dynamic object. Peirce's notion of inquiry is clearly central here. As Hookway points out, we might best define the final interpretant as the understanding:

which would be reached if a process of enriching the interpretant through scientific enquiry were to proceed indefinitely. It incorporates a complete and true conception of the objects of the sign; it is the interpretant we should all agree on in the long run. (Hookway 1985, 139).

As an example, consider again the kinds of utterance that we have already looked at. In such a case as your uttering, “I saw her duck under the table”, the final interpretant would be the understanding where there is “no latitude of interpretation at all” (CP5 .447 (1905)), that is, where the meanings of the words, the identity of the agents involved and so on, are absolutely determinate. So, the final interpretant of your utterance of “I saw her duck under the table” is my coming to a determinate understanding of what you mean. We can envisage how this would come about, by my asking a variety of questions, like “are you using ‘duck’ as a verb or a noun?”, or even “are you talking to me?” and developing a series of dynamic interpretants that get us closer and closer to the final interpretant.

Just as the dynamic interpretant has clear connections with other elements of Peirce's semiotic, so too does the final interpretant. As should be clear, from the connections that emerge from the notion of inquiry, the final interpretant interacts strongly with the dynamic object. The final interpretant, then, is important to our understanding of the dynamic object in a couple of ways. First, it is the point where our grasp of the dynamic object would be complete and, according to Ransdell (1977, 169–170), is where the immediate object and the dynamic object coincide. This represents the full assimilation or integration of the dynamic object into our system of signs. Second, the final interpretant functions as an exemplar or normative standard by which we can judge our actual interpretative responses to the sign. As David Savan puts it, “Peirce's intention was to identify the third type of interpretant as providing a norm or standard by which particular stages (Dynamical Interpretants) of an historical process may be judged.” (Savan 1988, 62).

4.3 Issues with the Final Account

This identification of the six elements of a sign is the clearest and least controversial part of Peirce's final sign theories. Most of what we know about Peirce's final account is gleaned from letters, partially worked out manuscripts and other miscellaneous items. Consequently, there is much to the final account that is still unclear, unsatisfactory, incomplete, and controversial. In this final section, we shall look at two of the most interesting issues surrounding the final account: Peirce's projected Final Classification of sixty-six signs; and what appears to be his identification of additional interpretants.

4.3.1 The Final Classification

Just as the Early and Interim Accounts include a corresponding classification of sign types, Peirce's final account holds similar typological ambitions. Peirce states explicitly that there are sixty-six classes of sign in his final typology. (See EP2. 481). Strictly speaking, the six elements that we have detailed yield only twenty eight sign types, but we are interested in Peirce's very final typology. He believes that we can obtain these sixty-six classes, rather in the manner of the 1903 typology, by identifying ten elements of signs and signification, each of which has three qualifying classes, and then working out their permissible combinations. These ten elements include the six sign elements identified above, plus four other elements that focus on the relation between signs, objects and interpretants. The ten elements and their respective sign types, taken from Peirce's 1908 letters to Lady Welby (EP2 483–491), then, are as follows:

  1. In respect of the Sign itself (what we have been calling the Sign-Vehicle), a sign may be either a (i) Potisign (ii) Actisign or (iii) a Famisign.
    (By the time of the final accounts, Peirce was experimenting with terminology so these types are perhaps more familiar as Qualisigns, Sinsigns and Legisigns).
  2. In respect of the Immediate Object, a sign may be either i) Descriptive (ii) Designative or (iii) a Copulant.
  3. In respect of the Dynamic Object, a sign may be either (i) Abstractive (ii) Concretive or (iii) Collective.
  4. In respect of relation between the Sign and the Dynamic Object, a sign may be either, (i) an Icon (ii) an Index or (iii) a Symbol.
  5. In respect of the Immediate Interpretant, a sign may be either (i) Ejaculative, (ii) Imperative or (iii) Significative.
  6. In respect of the Dynamic Interpretant, a sign may be either (i) Sympathetic (ii) Shocking or (iii) Usual.
  7. In respect of the relationship between the Sign and Dynamic Interpretant, a sign may be either (i) Suggestive (ii) Imperative or (iii) Indicative.
  8. In respect of the Final Interpretant, a sign may be either, (i) Gratiffic (ii) Action Producing or iii) Self-Control Producing.
  9. In respect of the relation between the Sign and the Final Interpretant, a sign may be either a (i) Seme (ii) Pheme or (iii) a Delome.
  10. In respect of the relation between the Sign, Dynamic Object and Final Interpretant, a sign may be either (i) an Assurance of Instinct (ii) an Assurance of Experienceor (iii) an Assurance of Form.

The reason that Peirce believes these ten elements will yield sixty-six classes is clear enough, the same combinatorial considerations given for the interim typology (outlined above in 3.4) apply here. However, the precise manner and order in which these elements interact will determine what the sixty-six classes of signs will look like in the final typology. Unfortunately, these ten divisions and their classes represent a baffling array of under-explained terminology, and there is little to indicate precisely how we should set about the task of combining them. Even though we may be confident on the number of signs in the final typology, other details are sketchy and underdeveloped, and there still exists no fully satisfactory account of the sixty-six classes. As Nathan Houser points out, “a sound and detailed extension of Peirce's analysis of signs to his full set of ten divisions and sixty-six classes is perhaps the most pressing problem for Peircian semiotics”. (Houser 1992, 502).

There is, of course, good work on the final typology (see (Burks and Weiss 1949), (Sanders 1970), (Savan 1988), (Jappy 1989), (Muller 1994), and (Farias and Queiroz 2003) for the best of this work), but ultimately, it is not clear that any account will overcome the problems posed by the incomplete and cursory nature of the final account. Indeed, it is not clear that Peirce himself was fully at ease with his final typology and how its elements should hang together. As he himself said:

The ten divisions appear to me to be all Trichotomies; but it is possible that none of them are properly so. Of these ten Trichotomies, I have a clear apprehension of some, an unsatisfactory and doubtful notion of others, and a tolerable but not thoroughly tried conception of others. (EP2. 483)

4.3.2 Additional Interpretants

As is common with all of Peirce's work in philosophy, various changes in terminology and subtleties with accompanying neologisms occur from one piece of work to the next. His work on interpretants is no different. At various points in his final accounts of signs, Peirce describes the division of interpretants as being: immediate, dynamic and final; or as emotional, energetic, and logical; or as naïve, rogate and normal; or as intentional, effective and communicational; or even destinate, effective and explicit. As Liszka (1990, 20) notes, “the received view in Peirce scholarship suggests that the divisions of interpretant into immediate, dynamic, and final are archetypal, all other divisions being relatively synonymous with these categories.” There are, however, some dissenters from this view.

In discussing the interpretant, Peirce describes one of the trichotomies above as follows:

In all cases [the Interpretant] includes feelings; for there must, at least, be a sense of comprehending the meaning of the sign. If it includes more than mere feeling, it must evoke some kind of effort. It may include something besides, which, for the present, may be vaguely called “thought”. I term these three kinds of interpretant the “emotional”, the “energetic”, and the “logical” interpretants. (EP2. 409)

For some scholars, this describes a division distinct from the immediate/dynamic/final trichotomy. Fitzgerald (1966, 78) claims that since emotional, energetic and logical interpretants are actual effects, they must be seen as three sub-types of the dynamic interpretant. This is because dynamic interpretants are described by Peirce as the effect actually produced on the mind. Short (1981, 1996, and 2004) thinks that each of the immediate, dynamic and final interpretants may be further sub-divided into emotional, energetic and logical. In particular, Short thinks that the immediate/dynamic/final trichotomy describes the interpretant at some stage of an end-directed semiotic process, whereas the emotional/energetic/logical trichotomy describes the types of interpretant possible at any given stage.

There are simple textual reasons that count against Fitzgerald's claims. For instance, Peirce describes the dynamic interpretant as deriving its character from action (CP8 .315 (1904)), but later says, “action cannot be a logical interpretant” (CP5 .491 (1906)). This seems to make the two inconsistent. (See Liszka (1990, 21) for more on the problems with Fitzgerald's claim). Moreover, this inconsistency seems to suggest a problem for Short's view since his account also suggests that the dynamic interpretant should include the logical interpretant as a subdivision (Short 1981, 213). Short, however, claims textual support for his own view from instances where Peirce mentions the emotional/energetic/logical trichotomy alongside the apparently separate claim that signs have three interpretants. (Short sites (CP8 .333 (1904)) and (CP4 .536 (1906)). Short takes this as suggesting that the two should be treated as different and distinct trichotomies. (Short 2004, 235).

How far the textual evidence on the matter will prove decisive is unclear, especially given the fragmentary nature of Peirce's final work on signs. However, one or two things militate in favor of the “received view”. First, Peirce is notorious for experimenting with terminology, especially when trying to pin down his own ideas, or describe the same phenomenon from different angles. Second, it is unclear why trichotomies like the intentional/effectual/communicational should count as terminological experiments whilst the emotional/energetic/logical counts as a distinct division. And finally, there is little provision in Peirce's projected sixty-six classes of signs for the kind of additional classifications imposed by further subdivisions of the interpretant. (For more on this discussion see, (Liszka 1990 and 1996), (Fitzgerald 1966), (Lalor 1997), (Short 1981, 1996, and 2004)).

Bibliography

Primary Literature

  • Peirce, C.S., 1883. Studies in Logic, by Members of The Johns Hopkins University. Ed. Charles S. Peirce. Boston: Little Brown.
  • ––– 1931–36. The Collected Papers. Volumes 1–6. Eds. Charles Hartshorne and Paul Weiss. Cambridge M.A.: Harvard University Press.
  • ––– 1958. The Collected Papers. Volumes 7 & 8. Ed. Arthur Burks. Cambridge M.A.: Harvard University Press.
  • ––– 1977. Semiotics and Significs. Ed Charles Hardwick. Bloomington I.N.: Indiana University Press.
  • ––– 1982- The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition. Volumes 1–6. And 8. Eds. Peirce Edition Project. Bloomington I.N: Indiana University Press.
  • ––– 1998. The Essential Peirce. Volume 2. Eds. Peirce edition Project. Bloomington I.N.: Indiana University Press.

(A note on references to Peirce's work: All references to The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition Volumes 1–6, take the form W n. m. where n and m indicate volume and page number respectively. All references to The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce Volumes 1 – 8, take the form CP n. m where n and m indicate volume and paragraph number respectively. All references to Semiotics and Significs take the form SS followed by page numbers. All references to The Essential Peirce EP n. m where n and m refer to volume and page number respectively.)

Secondary Literature

  • Atkin, A., 2005. “Peirce On The Index and Indexical Reference”. Transactions of The Charles S. Peirce Society. 41 (1), 161–188.
  • Burks, A and Weiss, P., 1945. “Peirce's Sixty-Six Signs”. Journal of Philosophy. 42: 383–388.
  • Farias, P. and Queiroz, J., 2003. “On diagrams for Peirce's 10, 28, and 66 classes of signs”. Semiotica. 147 (1/4): 165–184.
  • Fitzgerald, J., 1966. Peirce's Theory of Signs as a Foundation for Pragmatism. The Hague: Mouton.
  • Goudge, T., 1965. “Peirce's Index”.Transactions of Charles S. Peirce Society. 1(2), 52–70.
  • Hookway, C.J., 1985. Peirce. London: Routledge.
  • ––– 2000. Truth, Rationality and Pragmatism: Themes from Peirce. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Houser, N., 1992. “On Peirce's theory of Propositions: A response to Hilpinen”. Transactions of Charles S. Peirce Society. 28 (3), 489–504.
  • Jappy, A., 1989. “Peirce's Sixty-Six Signs Revisited”, in Semiotics and Pragmatics. Gerard Deledalle (ed). p143–153. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Lalor, B., 1997. “The Classification of Peirce's Interpretants”. Semiotica. 114 (1/2): 31–40.
  • Legg, C., 2008. “The Problem of the Essential Icon”.American Philosophical Quarterly. 45(3), 207–232.
  • Liszka, J., 1990. “Peirce's Interpretant”. Transactions of Charles S. Peirce Society. 26 (1), 17–62.
  • ––– 1996. A General Introduction to the Semeiotic of Charles S. Peirce. Bloomington I.N: Indiana University Press.
  • Müller, R., 1994. “On the principles of construction and the order of Peirce's trichotomies of signs”. Transactions of Charles S. Peirce Society. 30 (1), 135–153.
  • Murphey, M., 1961. The Development of Peirce's Philosophy. Cambridge M.A.: Harvard University Press.
  • Ransdell, J., 1977. “Some Leading Ideas in Peirce's Semiotic”. Semiotica. 19, 157–178.
  • Sanders, G., 1970. “Peirce sixty-six signs?”. Transactions of Charles S. Peirce Society. 6 (1), 3–16.
  • Savan, D., 1988. An Introduction to C.S. Peirce's Full System of Semeiotic. Toronto: Toronto Semiotic Circle.
  • Short, T.L., 1981. “Semiosis and Intentionality”. Transactions of Charles Sanders Peirce Society. 17 (2), 197–223.
  • ––– 1996. “Interpreting Peirce's Interpretant: A Response to Lalor, Liszka, and Meyers”. Transactions of Charles S. Peirce Society. 32 (4), 488–541.
  • ––– 2004. “The Development of Peirce's Theory of Signs” in, The Cambridge Companion To Peirce. Cheryl Misak (ed). 214–240. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • ––– 2007. Peirce's Theory of Signs. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Copyright © 2010 by
Albert Atkin <albert.atkin@mq.edu.au>

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