Charles Sanders Peirce
Charles Sanders Peirce (1839–1914) was the founder of American pragmatism (later called by Peirce “pragmaticism” in order to differentiate his views from others being labelled “pragmatism”), a theorist of logic, language, communication, and the general theory of signs (which was often called by Peirce “semeiotic”), an extraordinarily prolific mathematical logician and general mathematician, and a developer of an evolutionary, psycho-physically monistic metaphysical system. A practicing chemist and geodesist by profession, he nevertheless considered scientific philosophy, and especially logic, to be his vocation. In the course of his polymathic researches, he wrote voluminously on an exceedingly wide range of topics, ranging from mathematics, mathematical logic, physics, geodesy, spectroscopy, and astronomy, on the one hand, to psychology, anthropology, history, and economics, on the other.
- 1. Brief Biography
- 2. Difficulty of Access to Peirce's Writings
- 3. Deduction, Induction, and Abduction
- 4. Pragmatism, Pragmaticism, and the Scientific Method
- 5. Anti-determinism, Tychism, and Evolutionism
- 6. Synechism, the Continuum, Infinites, and Infinitesimals
- 7. Probability, Verisimilitude, and Plausibility
- 8. Psycho-physical Monism and Anti-nominalism
- 9. Triadism and the Universal Categories
- 10. Mind and Semeiotic
- 11. Semeiotic and Logic
- 12. The Classification of the Sciences
- 13. Logic
- 14. Peirce's Reduction Thesis
- 15. Contemporary Practical Application of Peirce's Ideas
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Charles Sanders Peirce was born on September 10, 1839 in Cambridge, Massachusetts, and he died on April 19, 1914 in Milford, Pennsylvania. His writings extend from about 1857 until near his death, a period of approximately 57 years. His published works run to about 12,000 printed pages and his known unpublished manuscripts run to about 80,000 handwritten pages. The topics on which he wrote have an immense range, from mathematics and the physical sciences at one extreme, to economics, psychology, and other social sciences at the other extreme.
Peirce's father Benjamin Peirce was Professor of Mathematics at Harvard University and was one of the founders of the U. S. Coast and Geodetic Survey as well as one of the founders of the Smithsonian Institution. The department of mathematics at Harvard was essentially built by Benjamin. From his father, Charles Sanders Peirce received most of the substance of his early education as well as a good deal of intellectual encouragement and stimulation. Benjamin's didactic technique mostly took the form of setting interesting problems for his son and checking Charles's solutions to them. In this challenging instructional atmosphere Charles acquired his lifelong habit of thinking through philosophical and scientific problems entirely on his own. To this habit, perhaps, is to be attributed Charles Peirce's considerable originality.
Peirce graduated from Harvard in 1859 and received the bachelor of science degree in chemistry in 1863. For thirty-two years, from 1859 until late 1891, he was employed by the U. S. Coast and Geodetic Survey, mainly surveying and carrying out geodetic investigations. The latter task involved making measurements of the intensity of the earth's gravitational field by means of using swinging pendulums, which were often of his own design. For over thirty years, then, Peirce was involved in practical and theoretical problems associated with making scientific measurements. This involvement was crucial in his ultimately coming to reject scientific determinism, as we shall see.
From 1879 until 1884, Peirce maintained a second job teaching logic in the Department of Mathematics at Johns Hopkins University. During that period the Department of Mathematics was headed by the famous mathematician J. J. Sylvester. This job suddenly evaporated for reasons that are apparently connected with the fact that Peirce's second wife was a Gypsy, and was a Gypsy moreover with whom Peirce had allegedly cohabited before marriage. The Johns Hopkins position was Peirce's only academic employment, and after losing it Peirce worked thereafter only for the U. S. Coast and Geodetic Survey. This employment was terminated in late 1891 ultimately because of funding objections generated in Congress. Thereafter, Peirce eked out a living doing intellectual odd-jobs (such as translating) and carrying out consulting work (mainly in chemical engineering and analysis). For the remainder of his life Peirce was often in dire financial straits, and sometimes he managed to survive only because of the charity of friends, for example that of his old friend William James.
Peirce was amazingly precocious and began to study logic seriously at a very early age. According to noted Peirce scholar Max Fisch in his “Introduction” to Volume 1 of The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, p. xviii, Peirce's introduction to and first immersion in the study of logic came in 1851 within a week or two of his turning 12 years of age. Remembering the occasion in 1910, in his “Note on the Doctrine of Chances,” in Collected Papers of Charles S. Peirce, Volume II, p. 408, Peirce himself remembered the crucial event as having occurred in 1852, when he was 13 years old. Regardless of his exact age, at the time of the event Charles encountered and then over a period of at most a few days studied and absorbed a standard textbook of the time on logic by Bishop Richard Whately. Having become fascinated by logic, he began to think of all issues as problems in logic. During his freshman year at college (Harvard), in 1855, when he was 16 years old, he began private study of philosophy in general, starting with Schiller's Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Man and continuing with Kant's Critique of Pure Reason. After three years of intense study of Kant, Peirce concluded that Kant's system was vitiated by what he called its “puerile logic,” and about the age of 19 he formed the fixed intention of devoting his life to study of and research in logic. It was, however, impossible at that time to earn a living as a research logician, and Peirce described himself at the time of his graduation from Harvard in 1859, just short of his 20th birthday, as wondering “what I would do in life.” Within two years, however, he had resolved the problem. During those two years he had worked as an Aid on the Coast Survey, in Maine and Louisiana, then had returned to Cambridge and studied natural history and natural philosophy at Harvard. He said of himself that in 1861 he “No longer wondered what I would do in life but defined my object.” Apparently, his adoption of the profession of chemistry and his practice of geodesy allowed Charles both to support himself and to continue to engage in researches on logic. From the early 1860's until his death in 1914 his output in logic was voluminous and extraordinarily varied. One of his logical systems became the basis for Ernst Schroeder's great three-volume treatise on logic, the Vorlesungen ueber die Algebra der Logik, and Peirce became widely regarded as the greatest logician of his day. By all who are familiar with his work he is considered one of the greatest logicians who ever lived.
Despite Peirce's early and deep disagreements with Kant's position, Peirce continued to respect and read the first Critique throughout his life. His own ultimate philosophical position even has much in common with the transcendental idealism of Kant, though the common elements do not include Kant's a priori methodology or Kant's insistence on the Euclidean nature of space or its subjective status. Like Kant, Peirce even developed a set of ultimate categories (more on which later). It might be added here that Peirce's later philosophy has even more in common with the objective idealism of Hegel than it does with the transcendentalism of Kant.
Peirce's extensive publications are scattered among various publication media, and have been difficult to collect. Shortly after his death in 1914, his widow Juliette sold his unpublished manuscripts to the Department of Philosophy at Harvard University. Initially they were under the care of Josiah Royce, but after Royce's death in 1916, and especially after the end of the First World War, the papers were poorly cared for. Many of them were misplaced, lost, given away, scrambled, and the like. Carolyn Eisele, one of several genuine heroes in the great effort to locate and assemble Peirce's writings, discovered a lost trunk full of Peirce's papers and manuscripts only in the mid-1950s; the trunk had been secreted, apparently for decades, in an unlit, obscure part of the basement in Harvard's Widener Library.
In the 1930's volumes of The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce began to appear, with Charles Hartshorne, Paul Weiss, and Arthur Burks as their editors. For almost three decades these volumes, and various collections of entries culled from them were the only generally available source for Peirce's thoughts. Unfortunately, many of the entries in the Collected Papers are not integral pieces of Peirce's own design, but rather stretches of writing that were cobbled together by the editors at their own discretion (sometimes one might almost say “whim”) from different Peircean sources. Often a single entry will consist of patches of writing from very different periods of Peirce's intellectual life, and these patches might even be in tension or outright contradiction with each other. Such entries in the Collected Papers make very difficult reading if one tries to regard them as consistent, sustained passages of argument. They also tend to give the reader a false picture of Peirce as unsystematic, desultory, and unable to complete a train of thought. In general, even though Peirce is often obscure and even at his best is seldom easy to read, the Collected Papers make Peirce's thinking look much more obscure than it really is.
The only sensible and intelligent way to publish the works of someone like Peirce, who wrote voluminously and over such a long period of time (57 years), is to arrange the publication chronologically and to employ extremely careful editing. In such a fashion, the entire set of Peircean works can be presented, as Peirce conceived them and in their natural temporal setting and order. Finally, in the 1980s, there began to appear such a chronological and meticulously edited edition of carefully selected works of Peirce: this is the Writings of Charles S. Peirce: a Chronological Edition, edited by The Peirce Edition Project of the Indiana University-Purdue University at Indianapolis. Although the Chronological Edition has been fettered from time to time by lack of proper funding, the Chronological Edition has succeeded in covering extremely well in its first eight volumes the major writings from 1857 to 1892. (At the present time, June 2010, Volume 7 is still awaiting publication, even though Volume 8, covering writings from 1890 to 1892 already has been published.) This impressive achievement is finally making it possible to assess the real Peirce, instead of a chopped-up and then re-pasted-together picture of Peirce. In particular the Chronological Edition has made it possible to see the development of Peirce's thinking from its earliest stages to its later developments. Questions long vexed in Peirce scholarship are finally beginning to be debated usefully by Peirce scholars: whether there is genuine systematic unity in Peirce's thought, whether his ideas changed or remained the same over time, in what particulars his thought did change and why, when exactly certain notions were first conceived by Peirce, whether there were definite “periods” in Peirce's intellectual development, and what exactly Peirce meant by some of his more obscure notions such as his universal categories (on which see below). Continued funding for the Peirce Edition Project is obviously a crucial priority in the ongoing effort to bring to public light the thoughts of this extremely important American philosopher.
In addition to the Chronological Edition of the Peirce Edition Project, other venues for editing and publishing Peirce's work are regularly found, and there are several excellent editions of particular lectures, lecture-series, chains of correspondence, and the like. Just four such editions will be mentioned here. First, there is the edition of Peirce's Cambridge Conferences Lectures of 1898, edited by Kenneth Laine Ketner and with a forward by Hilary Putnam, entitled Reasoning and the Logic of Things. Second, there is the edition of Peirce's Harvard Lectures on Pragmatism of 1903, edited by Patricia Ann Turrisi, entitled Pragmatism as a Principle and Method of Right Thinking. Third, there is the four-volume edition of Peirce's mathematical writings edited by Carolyn Eisele, entitled The New Elements of Mathematics by Charles S. Peirce. Fourth, there is the two-part edition of Peirce's writings on the history and logic of science edited by Carolyn Eisele, entitled Historical Perspectives on Peirce's Logic of Science: A History of Science.
Prior to about 1865, thinkers on logic commonly had divided arguments into two subclasses: the class of deductive arguments (a.k.a. necessary inferences) and the class of inductive arguments (a.k.a. probable inferences). About this time, Peirce began to hold that there were two utterly distinct classes of probable inferences, which he referred to as inductive inferences and abductive inferences (which he also called hypotheses and retroductive inferences). Peirce reached this conclusion by entertaining what would happen if one were to interchange propositions in the syllogism AAA-1 (Barbara): All Ms are Ps; all Ss are Ms; therefore, all Ss are Ps. This valid syllogism Peirce accepted as representative of deduction. But he also seemed typically to regard it in connection with a problem of in connection with drawing conclusions on the basis of taking samples. For let us regard being an M as being a member of a population of some sort, say being a ball of the population of balls in some particular urn. Let us regard P as being some property a member of this population can have, say being red. And, finally, let us regard being an S as being a member of a random sample taken from this population. Then our syllogism in Barbara becomes: All balls in this urn are red; all balls in this particular random sample are taken from this urn; therefore, all balls in this particular random sample are red. Peirce regarded the major premise here as being the Rule, the minor premise as being the particular Case, and the conclusion as being the Result of the argument. The argument is a piece of deduction. In this example the argument is also an argument from population to random sample that is also a necessary inference.
But now let us see what happens if we form a new argument by interchanging the conclusion (the Result) with the major premise (the Rule). The resultant argument becomes: All Ss are Ps (Result); all Ss are Ms (Case); therefore, all Ms are Ps (Rule). This is the invalid syllogism AAA-3. But let us now construe it as pertaining to drawing conclusions on the basis of taking samples. The argument then becomes: All balls in this particular random sample are red; all balls in this particular random sample are taken from this urn; therefore, all balls in this urn are red. What we have here is an argument from sample to population. This sort of argument is what Peirce understood to be the core meaning of induction. That is to say, for Peirce, induction in the most basic sense is argument from random sample to population. It should be clear that inductive inference is not necessary inference: it might well turn out that the claims stated in the premises are true even though the claim made in the conclusion is false.
Let us now go further and see what happens if, from the deduction AAA-1, we form a new argument by interchanging the conclusion (the Result) with the minor premise (the Case). The resultant argument becomes: All Ms are Ps (Rule); all Ss are Ps (Result); therefore, all Ss are Ms (Case). This is the invalid syllogism AAA-2. But let us now regard it as pertaining to drawing conclusions on the basis of taking samples. The argument then becomes: All balls in this urn are red; all balls in this particular random sample are red; therefore, all balls in this particular random sample are taken from this urn. What we have here is nothing at all like an argument from population to sample or an argument from sample to population: rather, it is a form of probable argument entirely different from both deduction and induction. It has the air of conjecture or “educated guess” about it. This new type of argument Peirce called hypothesis (also, retroduction, and also, abduction). It should be clear that abduction is never necessary inference
There is no need to consider the variant of AAA-1 that is obtained by interchanging the Rule and the Case in AAA-1. The resultant argument is of the form AAA-4, which is exactly the same argument as AAA-1 with interchanged premises. So it is simply deduction over again.
Peirce's thinking about deduction, induction, and abduction can be seen also from examples he gives of arguments that are similar to the syllogisms he discusses, but retain the universal affirmative judgment only for the Case, using a definite percentage between 0% and 100% for both the Rule and the Result.
Corresponding to AAA-1 (deduction) we have the following argument: X% of Ms are Ps (Rule); all Ss are Ms (Case); therefore, X% of Ss are Ps (Result). Construing this argument, as we did before, as applying to drawing balls from urns, the argument becomes: X% of the balls in this urn are red; all the balls in this random sample are taken from this urn; therefore, X% of the balls in this random sample are red. Peirce still regards this argument as being a deduction, even though it is not—as the argument AAA-1 is—a necesary inference. He calls such an argument a “statistical deduction” or a “probabilistic deduction proper.”
Corresponding to AAA-3 (induction) we have the following argument: X% of Ss are Ps (Result); all Ss are Ms (Case); therefore, X% of Ms are Ps (Rule). Construing this argument as applying to drawing balls from urns, the argument becomes: X% of the balls in this random sample are red; all the balls in this random sample are taken from this urn; therefore, X% of the balls in this urn are red. Here we still have an argument whose essence is the logical transition from a random sample to the population from which the sample is taken. The inference is made by virtue of what Hans Reichenbach called “the straight rule”: the proportion of a trait found in the sample is attributed also to the population.
Corresponding to AAA-2 (abduction) we have the following argument: X% of Ms are Ps (Rule); X% of Ss are Ps (Result); therefore, all Ss are Ms (Case). Construing this argument as applying to drawing balls from urns, the argument becomes: X% of the balls in this urn are red; X% of the balls in this random sample are red; therefore, all the balls in this random sample are taken from this urn. Again here we have the character of an educated guess or inference to a plausible explanation.
Over many years Peirce modified his views on the three types of arguments, sometimes changing his views but mostly extending them by expanding his commentary upon the original trichotomy. Occasionally he swerved between one view and another concerning which larger class of arguments a particular instance or sub-type of argument belonged to. For example, he seemed to have some hesitation about whether arguments from analogy should be construed as inductions (arguments from a sample of the properties of things to a population of the properties of things) or abductions (conjectures made on the basis of sufficient similarity, which notion might not easily be analyzed in terms of sets of properties).
The most important extension Peirce made of his earliest views on what deduction, induction, and abduction involved was to integrate the three argument forms into his view of the systematic procedure for seeking truth that he called the “scientific method.” As so integrated, deduction, induction, and abduction are not simply argument forms any more: they are three phases of the methodology of science, as Peirce conceived this methodology. In fact, in Peirce's most mature philosophy he virtually (perhaps totally and literally) equates the trichotomy with the three phases he discerns in the scientific method. Scientific method begins with abduction or hypothesis: because of some perhaps surprising or puzzling phenomenon, a conjecture or hypothesis is made about what actually is going on. This hypothesis should be such as to explain the surprising phenomenon, such as to render the phenomenon more or less a matter of course if the hypothesis should be true. Scientific method then proceeds to the stage of deduction: by means of necessary inferences, conclusions are drawn from the provisionally-adopted hypothesis about the obtaining of phenomena other than the surprising one that originally gave rise to the hypothesis. Conclusions are reached, that is to say, about other phenomena that must obtain if the hypothesis should actually be true. These other phenomena must be such that experimental tests can be performed whose results tell us whether the further phenomena do obtain or do not obtain. Finally, scientific method proceeds to the stage of induction: experiments are actually carried out in order to test the provisionally-adopted hypothesis by ascertaining whether the deduced results do or do not obtain. At this point scientific method enters one or the other of two “feedback loops.” If the deduced consequences do obtain, then we loop back to the deduction stage, deducing still further consequences of our hypothesis and experimentally testing for them again. But, if the deduced consequences do not obtain, then we loop back to the abduction stage and come up with some new hypothesis that explains both our original surprising phenomenon and any new phenomena we have uncovered in the course of testing our first, and now failed, hypothesis. Then we pass on to the deduction stage, as before. The entire procedure of hypothesis-testing, and not merely that part of it that consists of arguing from sample to population, is called induction in Peirce's later philosophy.
An important part of Peirce's full conception of scientific method is what he called the “economics (or: economy) of research.” The idea is that, because research is difficult, research labor-time is valuable and should not be wasted. Both in the creation of hypotheses to be tested and in the experiments chosen to test these hypotheses, we should act so as to get the very most cognitive bang for the buck, so to say. The object is to proceed at every stage so as to maximize the reduction in indeterminacy of our beliefs. Peirce had an elaborate, mathematical theory of some aspects of the economy of research, and he published several complex papers on this topic. The following section of the present article contains further information on Peirce's notion of the economy of research.
Probably Peirce's best-known works are the first two articles in a series of six that originally were collectively entitled Illustrations of the Logic of Science and published in Popular Science Monthly from November 1877 through August 1878. The first is entitled “The Fixation of Belief” and the second is entitled “How to Make Our Ideas Clear.” In the first of these papers Peirce defended, in a manner consistent with not accepting naive realism, the superiority of the scientific method over other methods of overcoming doubt and “fixing belief.” In the second of these papers Peirce defended a “pragmatic” notion of clear concepts.
Perhaps the single most important fact to keep in mind in trying to understand Peirce's philosophy concerning clarity and the proper method of fixing belief is that all his life Peirce was a practicing physical scientist: already mentioned is the fact that he worked as a physical scientist for 32 years in his job with the United States Coast and Geodetic Survey. As Peirce understood the topics of philosophy and logic, philosophy and logic were themselves also sciences, although not physical sciences. Moreover, he understood philosophy to be the philosophy of science, and he understood logic to be the logic of science (where the word “science” has a sense that is best captured by the German word Wissenschaft).
It is in this light that his specifications of the nature of pragmatism are to be understood. It is also in this light that his later calling of his views “pragmaticism,” in order to distinguish his own scientific philosophy from other conceptions and theories that were trafficked under the title “pragmatism,” is to be understood. When he said that the whole meaning of a (clear) conception consists in the entire set of its practical consequences, he had in mind that a meaningful conception must have some sort of experiential “cash value,” must somehow be capable of being related to some sort of collection of possible empirical observations under specifiable conditions. Peirce insisted that the entire meaning of a meaningful conception consisted in the totality of such specifications of possible observations. For example, Peirce tended to spell out the meaning of dispositional properties such as “hard” or “heavy” by using the same sort of counterfactual constructions as, say, Karl Hempel would use. Peirce was not a simple operationalist in his philosophy of science; nor was he a simple verificationist in his epistemology: he believed in the reality of abstractions, and in many ways his thinking about universals resembles that of the medieval realists in metaphysics. Nevertheless, despite his metaphysical leanings, Peirce's views bear a strong family resemblance to operationalism and verificationism. In regard to physical concepts in particular, his views are quite close to those of, say, Einstein, who held that the whole meaning of a physical concept is determined by an exact method of measuring it.
The previous point must be tempered with the fact that Peirce increasingly became a philosopher with broad and deep sympathies for both transcendental idealism and absolute idealism. His Kantian affinities are simpler and easier to understand than his Hegelian leanings. Having rejected a great deal in Kant, Peirce nevertheless shared with Charles Renouvier the view that Kant's (quasi-)concept of the Ding an sich can play no role whatsoever in philosophy or in science other than the role that Kant ultimately assigned to it, viz. the role of a Grenzbegriff: a boundary-concept, or, perhaps a bit more accurately, a limiting concept. A supposed “reality” that is “outside” of every logical possibility of empirical or logical interaction with “it” can play no direct role in the sciences. Science can deal only with phenomena, that is to say, only with what can “appear” somehow in experience. All scientific concepts must somehow be traceable back to phenomenological roots. Thus, even when Peirce calls himself a “realist” or is called by others a “realist,” it must be kept in mind that Peirce was always a realist of the Kantian “empirical” sort and not a Kantian “transcendental realist.” His realism is similar to what Hilary Putnam has called “internal realism.” (As was said, Peirce was also a realist in quite another sense of he word: he was a realist or an anti-nominalist in the medieval sense.)
Peirce's Hegelianism, to which he increasingly admitted as he approached his most mature philosophy, is more difficult to understand than his Kantianism, partly because it is everywhere intimately tied to his entire late theory of signs (semeiotic) and sign use (semeiosis), as well as to his evolutionism and to his rather puzzling doctrine of mind. There are at least four major components of his Hegelian idealism. First, for Peirce the world of appearances, which he calls “the phaneron,” is a world consisting entirely of signs. Signs are qualities, relations, features, items, events, states, regularities, habits, laws, and so on that have meanings, significances, or interpretations. Second, a sign is one term in a threesome of terms that are indissolubly connected with each other by a crucial triadic relation that Peirce calls “the sign relation.” The sign itself (also called the representamen) is the term in the sign relation that is ordinarily said to represent or mean something. The other two terms in this relation are called the object and the interpretant. The object is what would ordinarily would be said to be the “thing” meant or signified or represented by the sign, what the sign is a sign of. The interpretant of a sign is said by Peirce to be that to which the sign represents the object. What exactly Peirce means by the interpretant is difficult to pin down. It is something like a mind, a mental act, a mental state, or a feature or quality of mind; at all events the interpretant is something ineliminably mental. Third, the interpretant of a sign, by virtue of the very definition Peirce gives of the sign-relation, must itself be a sign, and a sign moreover of the very same object that is (or: was) represented by the (original) sign. In effect, then, the interpretant is a second signifier of the object, only one that now has an overtly mental status. But, merely in being a sign of the original object, this second sign must itself have (Peirce uses the word “determine”) an interpretant, which then in turn is a new, third sign of the object, and again is one with an overtly mental status. And so on. Thus, if there is any sign at all of any object, then there is an infinite sequence of signs of that same object. So, everything in the phaneron, because it is a sign, begins an infinite sequence of mental interpretants of an object.
But now, there is a fourth component of Peirce's idealism: Peirce makes everything in the phaneron evolutionary. The whole system evolves. Three figures from the history of culture loomed exceedingly large in the intellectual development of Peirce and in the cultural atmosphere of the period in which Peirce was most active: Hegel in philosophy, Lyell in geology, and Darwin (along with Alfred Russel Wallace) in biology. These thinkers, of course, all have a single theme in common: evolution. Hegel described an evolution of ideas, Lyell an evolution of geological structures, and Darwin an evolution of biological species and varieties. Peirce absorbed it all. Peirce's entire thinking, early on and later, is permeated with the evolutionary idea, which he extended generally, that is to say, beyond the confines of any particular subject matter. For Peirce, the entire universe and everything in it is an evolutionary product. Indeed, he conceived that even the most firmly entrenched of nature's habits (for example, even those habits that are typically called “natural laws”) have themselves evolved, and accordingly can and should be subjects of philosophical and scientific inquiry. One can sensibly seek, in Peirce's view, evolutionary explanations of the existence of particular natural laws. For Peirce, then, the entire phaneron (the world of appearances), as well as all the ongoing processes of its interpretation through mental significations, has evolved and is evolving.
Now, no one familiar with Hegel can escape the obvious comparison: we have in Peirce an essentially idealist theory that is similar to the idealism that Hegel puts forward in the Phaenomenologie des Geistes. Furthermore, both Hegel and Peirce make the whole evolutionary interpretation of the evolving phaneron to be a process that is said to be logical, the “action” of logic itself. Of course there are differences between the two philosophers. For example, what exactly Hegel's logic is has been shrouded in mystery for every Hegelian after Hegel himself (and some philosophers, for example Popper, would say for every Hegelian including Hegel). By contrast Peirce's logic is reasonably clear, and he takes great pains to work it out in intricate detail; basically Peirce's logic is the whole logical apparatus of the physical and social sciences.
One implication of the unending nature of the interpretation of appearances through infinite sequences of signs is that Peirce cannot be any type of epistemological foundationalist or believer in absolute or apodeictic knowledge. He must be, and is, an anti-foundationalist and a fallibilist. From his earliest to his latest writings Peirce opposed and attacked all forms of epistemological foundationalism and in particular all forms of Cartesianism and a priorism. Philosophy must begin wherever it happens to be at the moment, he thought, and not at some supposed ideal foundation, especially not in some world of “private references.” The only important thing in thinking scientifically to apply the scientific method itself. This method he held to be essentially public and reproducible in its activities, as well as self-correcting in the following sense: No matter where different researchers may begin, as long as they follow the scientific method, their results will eventually converge toward the same outcome. (The pragmatic, or pragmaticistic, conception of meaning implies that two theories with exactly the same empirical content must have, despite superficial appearances, the same meaning.) This ideal point of convergence is what Peirce means by “the truth,” and “reality” is simply what is meant by “the truth.” That these Peircean notions of reality and truth are inherently idealist rather than naively realist in character should require no special pleading.
Connected with Peirce's anti-foundationalism is his insistence on the fallibility of particular achievements in science. Although the scientific method will eventually converge to something as a limit, nevertheless at any temporal point in the process of scientific inquiry we are only at a provisional stage of it and cannot ascertain how far off we may be from the limit to which we are somehow converging. This insistence on the fallibilism of human inquiry is connected with several other important themes of Peirce's philosophy. His evolutionism has already been discussed: fallibilism is obviously connected with the fact that science is not shooting at a fixed target but rather one that is always moving. What Peirce calls his “tychism,” which is his anti-deterministic insistence that there is objective chance in the world, is also intimately connected to his fallibilism. (Tychism will be discussed below.) Despite Peirce's insistence on fallibilism, he is far from being an epistemological pessimist or sceptic: indeed, he is quite the opposite. He tends to hold that every genuine question (that is, every question whose possible answers have empirical content) can be answered in principle, or at least should not be assumed to be unanswerable. For this reason, one his most important dicta, which he called his first principle of reason, is “Do not block the way of inquiry!”
For Peirce, as we saw, the scientific method involves three phases or stages: abduction (making conjectures or creating hypotheses), deduction (inferring what should be the case if the hypotheses are the case), and induction (the testing of hypotheses). The process of going through the stages should also be carried out with concern for the economy of research. Peirce's understanding of scientific method, then, is not very different from the standard idea of scientific method (which, indeed, perhaps itself derived historically from the ideas of William Whewell and Peirce) as being the method of constructing hypotheses, deriving consequences from these hypotheses, and then experimentally testing these hypotheses (guided always by the economics of research). Also, as was said above, Peirce increasingly came to understand his three types of logical inference as being phases or stages of the scientific method. For example, as Peirce came to extend and generalize his notion of abduction, abduction became defined as inference to and provisional acceptance of an explanatory hypothesis for the purpose of testing it. Abduction is not always inference to the best explanation, but it is always inference to some explanation or at least to something that clarifies or makes routine some information that has previously been “surprising,” in the sense that we would not have routinely expected it, given our then-current state of knowledge. Deduction came to mean for Peirce the drawing of conclusions as to what observable phenomena should be expected if the hypothesis is correct. Induction came for him to mean the entire process of experimentation and interpretation performed in the service of hypothesis testing.
A few further comments are perhaps in order in connection with Peirce's idea of the economy (or: the economics) of research. Concern for the economy of research is a crucial and ineliminable part of Peirce's idea of the scientific method. He understood that science is essentially a human and social enterprise and that it always operates in some given historical, social, and economic context. In such a context some problems are crucial and paramount and must be attended-to immediately, while other problems are trivial or frivolous or at least can be put off until later. He understood that in the real context of science some experiments may be vitally important while others may be insignificant. Peirce also understood that the economic resources of the scientist (time, money, ability to exert effort, etc.) are always scarce, even though all the while the “great ocean of truth,” which lies undiscovered before us, is infinite. All resources for carrying out research, such as personnel, person-hours, and apparatus, are quite costly; accordingly, it is wasteful, indeed irrational, to squander them. Peirce proposed, therefore, that careful consideration be paid to the problem of how to obtain the biggest epistemological “bang for the buck.” In effect, the economics of research is a cost/benefit analysis in connection with states of knowledge. Although this idea has been insufficiently explored by Peirce scholars, Peirce himself regarded it as central to the scientific method and to the idea of rational behavior. It is connected with what he called “speculative rhetoric” or “methodeutic” (which will be discussed below).
Against powerful currents of determinism that derived from the Enlightenment philosophy of the eighteenth century, Peirce urged that there was not the slightest scientific evidence for determinism and that in fact there was considerable scientific evidence against it. Always by the words “science” and “scientific” Peirce understood reference to actual practice by scientists in the laboratory and the field, and not reference to entries in scientific textbooks. In attacking determinism, therefore, Peirce appealed to the evidence of the actual phenomena in laboratories and fields. Here, what is obtained as the actual observations (e.g. measurements) does not fit neatly into some one point or simple function. If we take, for example, a thousand measurements of some physical quantity, even a simple one such as length or thickness, no matter how carefully we may do so, we will not obtain the same result a thousand times. Rather, what we get is a distribution (often, but not always and certainly not necessarily, something akin to a normal or Gaussian distribution) of hundreds of different results. Again, if we measure the value of some variable that we assume to depend on some given parameter, and if we let the parameter vary while we take successive measurements, the result in general will not be a smooth function (for example, a straight line or an ellipse); rather, it will typically be a “jagged” result, to which we can at best fit a smooth function by using some clever method (for example, fitting a regression line by the method of least-squares). Naively, we might imagine that the variation and relative inexactness of our measurements will become less pronounced and obtrusive the more refined and microscopic are our measurement tools and procedures. Peirce, the practicing scientist, knew better. What actually happens, if anything, is that our variations get relatively greater the finer is our instrumentation and the more delicate our procedures. (Obviously, Peirce would not have been the least surprised by the results obtained from measurements at the quantum level.)
What the directly measured facts of scientific practice seem to tell us, then, is that, although the universe displays varying degrees of habit (that is to say, of partial, varying, approximate, and statistical regularity), the universe does not display deterministic law. It does not directly show anything like total, exact, non-statistical regularity. Moreover, the habits that nature does display always appear in varying degrees of entrenchment or “congealing.” At one end of the spectrum, we have the nearly law-like behavior of larger physical objects like boulders and planets; but at the other end of the spectrum, we see in human processes of imagination and thought an almost pure freedom and spontaneity; and in the quantum world of the very small we see the results of almost pure chance.
The immediate, “raw” result, then, of scientific observation through measurement is that not everything is exactly fixed by exact law (even if everything should be constrained to some degree by habit). In his earliest thinking about the significance of this fact, Peirce opined that natural law pervaded the world but that certain facets of reality were just outside the reach or grasp of law. In his later thinking, however, Peirce came to understand this fact as meaning that reality in its entirety was lawless and that pure spontaneity had an objective status in the phaneron. Peirce called his doctrine that chance has an objective status in the universe “tychism,” a word taken from the Greek word for “chance” or “luck” or “what the gods happen to choose to lay on one.” Tychism is a fundamental doctrinal part of Peirce's mature view, and reference to his tychism provides an added reason for Peirce's insisting on the irreducible fallibilism of inquiry. For nature is not a static world of unswerving law but rather a dynamic and dicey world of evolved and continually evolving habits that directly exhibit considerable spontaneity. (Peirce would have embraced quantum indeterminacy.)
One possible path along which nature evolves and acquires its habits was explored by Peirce using statistical analysis in situations of experimental trials in which the probabilities of outcomes in later trials are not independent of actual outcomes in earlier trials, situations of so-called “non-Bernoullian trials.” Peirce showed that, if we posit a certain primal habit in nature, viz. the tendency however slight to take on habits however tiny, then the result in the long run is often a high degree of regularity and great macroscopic exactness. For this reason, Peirce suggested that in the remote past nature was considerably more spontaneous than it has now become, and that in general and as a whole all the habits that nature has come to exhibit have evolved. Just as ideas, geological formations, and biological species have evolved, natural habit has evolved.
In this evolutionary notion of nature and natural law we have an added support of Peirce's insistence on the inherent fallibilism of scientific inquiry. Nature may simply change, even in its most entrenched fundamentals. Thus, even if scientists were at one point in time to have conceptions and hypotheses about nature that survived every attempt to falsify them, this fact alone would not ensure that at some later point in time these same conceptions and hypotheses would remain accurate or even pertinent.
An especially intriguing and curious twist in Peirce's evolutionism is that in Peirce's view evolution involves what he calls its “agapeism.” Peirce speaks of evolutionary love. According to Peirce, the most fundamental engine of the evolutionary process is not struggle, strife, greed, or competition. Rather it is nurturing love, in which an entity is prepared to sacrifice its own perfection for the sake of the wellbeing of its neighbor. This doctrine had a social significance for Peirce, who apparently had the intention of arguing against the morally repugnant but extremely popular socio-economic Darwinism of the late nineteenth century. The doctrine also had for Peirce a cosmic significance, which Peirce associated with the doctrine of the Gospel of John and with the mystical ideas of Swedenborg and Henry James. In Part IV of the third of Peirce's six papers in Popular Science Monthly, entitled “The Doctrine of Chances,” Peirce even argued that simply being logical presupposes the ethics of self-sacrifice: “He who would not sacrifice his own soul to save the whole world, is, as it seems to me, illogical in all his inferences, collectively.” To social Darwinism, and to the related sort of thinking that constituted for Herbert Spencer and others a supposed justification for the more rapacious practices of unbridled capitalism, Peirce referred in disgust as “The Gospel of Greed.”
Along with Richard Dedekind and Georg Cantor, Peirce was one of the first scientific thinkers to argue in favor of the existence of actually infinite collections, and to maintain that the paradoxes that Bernard Bolzano had associated with the idea of infinite collections were not really contradictions at all. His criterion of the difference between finite and infinite collections was that the so-called “syllogism of transposed quantity,” which had been introduced by Augustus de Morgan, constituted a deductively valid argument only when applied to finite sets; as applied to infinite sets it was invalid. The syllogism of transposed quantity runs as follows. We have a binary relation R defined on a set S, such that the following two premises are true of the relation (where the quantifications are taken over the set S). First, for all x there is a y such that Rxy. Second, for all x, y, z, Rxz and Ryz implies that x = y. The conclusion (of the syllogism of transposed quantity) is that for all x there exists a y such that Ryx. One of Peirce's favorite examples helps elucidate the idea, even if it perhaps be not perfectly politically correct: Every Texan kills some Texan; no Texan is killed by more than one Texan; therefore every Texan is killed by some Texan. The argument's conclusion follows validly only if the set of Texans is finite.
If by Rxy in the syllogism of transposed quantity we take f(x) = y, where the function is defined on and has values in the set S, then the second premise of the syllogism of transposed quantity says that f is a one-one function. The conclusion says that every member of S is the image under f of some member of S. Thus the syllogism of transposed quantity says that no one-one function can map the set S to a proper subset of itself. This assertion holds, of course, only if S is a finite set. So, as it turns out, Peirce's definition of the difference between finite and infinite sets is virtually equivalent to the standard one, which is found in Section 5 of Richard Dedekind's Was Sind und Was Sollen die Zahlen?, to the effect that an infinite set is one that can be placed into a one-to-one correspondence with a proper subset of itself. Peirce claimed on various occasions to have reached his definition of the difference between finite and infinite collections at least six years before Dedekind reached his own definition.
Peirce held that the continuity of space, time, ideation, feeling, and perception is an irreducible deliverance of science, and that an adequate conception of such continua is an extremely important part of all the sciences. The doctrine of the continuity of nature he called “synechism,” a word deriving from the Greek preposition that means “(together) with.” In mid-1892, somewhat under the influence of reading Cantor's works, Peirce defined a (linear) continuum to be a linearly-ordered infinite set C such that (1) for any two distinct members of C there exists a third member of C that is strictly between these; and (2) every countably infinite subset of C that has an upper (lower) bound in C has a least upper bound (greatest lower bound) in C. The first property he called “Kanticity” and the second “Aristotelicity.” (Today we would likely call these properties “density” and “closedness,” respectively.) The second condition has the corollary that a continuum contains all its limit points, and sometimes Peirce used this property in conjunction with “Kanticity” to define a continuum.
Toward the end of the nineteenth century, however, Peirce began to hold that Kanticity and Aristotelicity, even when conjoined, were insufficient to define adequately the notion of a continuum. He maintained that he had framed an updated conception of continua by somewhat loosening his attachment to Cantor's ideas. He began to write in ways that, at least at first glance, seem close to falling into Cantor's Paradox; Peirce, however, tried to avoid outright contradiction by means of embracing some sort of non-standard idea about the identity of points on a line. For example, in Lecture 3 of his Cambridge Conferences Lectures of 1898, published as Reasoning and the Logic of Things, Peirce says that if a line is cut into two portions, the point at which the cut takes place actually becomes two points. What Peirce's new approach is, in mathematical detail, and whether or not it contains hidden but real contradictions, is a problem that has not yet been solved by researchers into Peirce's logic and mathematics.
Connected with his new conception of the continuum is Peirce's increasingly frequent and sometimes pugnacious defenses of the doctrine of the reality of infinitesimal quantities. The doctrine was not newly taken up by Peirce late in the nineteenth century; indeed, he had held the doctrine for some time, and it had been the doctrine of his father Benjamin. He considered it superior to the newer doctrine of limits for providing a foundation for the differential and integral calculus. What was new was that Peirce began to see the doctrine of infinitesimals as the key to his updated doctrine of the continuum. Thus, adding to his long-standing defense of infinitely large magnitudes (Peirce often used the word “multitudes.”), Peirce began vigorously to defend infinitely small magnitudes, infinitesimal magnitudes. Many examples of such defenses can be found. Carolyn Eisele collected a number of such examples in her edited work The New Elements of Mathematics by Charles S. Peirce. See, for example, Volume 2, pages 169–170, where Peirce says “My personal opinion is that there is positive evidence of the real existence of infinitesimals; and that the admission of them would considerably simplify the introduction to the calculus.” See also Volume 3, Part 1, pages 121–124, 125–127, 128–131, and 742–750. By the end of the nineteenth century Peirce's view about infinitesimals was so rare and remarkable that Josiah Royce remarked, in a footnote of his “Supplementary Essay” for The World and the Individual, First Series, that outside of Italy Peirce was virtually the only mathematical philosopher who believed in infinitesimals. (See footnote 2, page 562 of this work by Royce.)
Not only did Peirce defend infinitesimals. He furthermore claimed that he had proved the consistency of introducing infinitesimals into the system of real numbers in such a way as to form a new system in which there were infinitely many entities that were not equal to zero and yet were all smaller than any real number r that is not equal to zero, no matter how small r might be. To use modern terminology, Peirce was claiming to have shown the existence of ordered fields that were non-Archimedean. It was these non-Archimedean fields that Peirce now wanted to call genuine continua. Additionally, Peirce wanted to use his notion infinitesimal quantities and his revised concept of the continuum in order to justify the traditional pre-Gaussian definitions and underpinnings of the differential calculus.
Peirce also made a number of remarks that suggest, in connection with the foregoing enterprise, that he had a novel conception of the topology of points in a continuum. All these remarks he connected with his previous defenses of infinite sets. For these reasons some Peirce scholars, and in particular the great Peirce scholar Carolyn Eisele, have suggested that his ideas were an anticipation of Abraham Robinson's non-standard analysis of 1964. Whether this actually be so or not, however, is at the present time far from clear. Peirce certainly says many things that are quite suggestive of the construction of non-standard models of the theory of ordered fields by means of using equivalence classes of countably infinite Cartesian Products of the standard real numbers and then applying Loś's Theorem. However, no commentator up to now has provided anything even remotely resembling a careful and detailed exposition of Peirce's thinking in this area. Unfortunately, most of Peirce's published writing and public talks on this topic were designed for audiences that were extremely unsophisticated mathematically (a fact that he lamented). For that reason most of what Peirce said on the topic is picturesque and intriguing, but extremely obscure. The entire analysis of Peirce's notion of an infinitesimal, as well as the exact bearing this notion has on his concept of a real continuum and on his idea of the topology of the points of a continuum, still awaits meticulous mathematical discussion.
Given Peirce's tychism and his view that statistical information is often the best information we can have about phenomena, it should not be surprising that Peirce devoted close attention to the analysis of situations in which perfect exactness and perfect certitude were unattainable. It is only to be expected that he would devote a great deal of attention, for example, to probability theory. Indeed, Peirce did so from the dates of even his earliest thinking. Not only, for example, did he extensively employ the concept of probability, but also he offered a pragmaticistic account of the notion of probability itself. Yet it would be a huge mistake to think that Peirce's philosophizing about situations of imperfection of exactness and certitude were confined merely to the theory of probability.
Rather, from the outset of his thinking about the matters, in about 1863, his attention was directed to the broadest sorts of issues connected with statistical inference. And, as his thinking progressed, Peirce came ever more clearly to see that there are three distinct and mutually incommensurable measures of imperfection of certitude. Only one was probability. The other two he called “verisimilitude” (or “likelihood”) and “plausibility”. Each of the three measures was associated with one of his types of argument. Probability he associated with deduction. Verisimilitude he associated with induction. And plausibility he associated with abduction. Let us look more closely at each of these three distinct measures of uncertainty.
By the time Peirce wrote on probability, the concept and its calculus were well over two hundred years old. The probability calculus itself had become more or less standardized by Peirce's time, and indeed Peirce's own axioms for the calculus are more or less the same that Kolmogoroff gives for his “elementary theory of probability.” By contrast with the calculus, the philosophical theory of the meaning of probability was hotly disputed. Two sides to the dispute existed. There were the subjectivists, or “conceptualists,” as Peirce designated them. These believed that probability was a measure of the strength of belief actually accorded to a proposition or a measure of the degree of rational belief that ought to be accorded to a proposition. Among the defenders of this sort of view, Augustus de Morgan and Adolphe Quetelet were major figures. And there were the objectivists, or “materialists,” as Peirce designated them. These believed that probability was a measure of the relative frequency with which an event of some specific sort repeatedly happened. John Venn was a major defender of this sort of view. Pierre Simon Laplace had spoken sometimes in a subjectivist way, sometimes in an objectivist way; but his arguments basically depended on a subjectivist interpretation of probability.
Peirce vigorously attacked the subjectivist view of de Morgan and others to the effect that probability is merely a measure of our level of confidence or strength of belief. He allowed that the logarithm of the odds of an event might be used to assess the degree of rational belief that should be accorded to an event, but only provided that the odds of the event were determined by the objective relative frequency of the event. In other words, Peirce suggested that any justifiable use of subjectivism in connection with probability theory must ultimately rest on quantities obtained by means of an objectivist understanding of probability.
Rather than holding that probability is a measure of degree of confidence or belief, then, Peirce adopted an objectivist notion of probability that he explicitly likened to the doctrine of John Venn. Indeed, he even held that probability is actually a notion with clear empirical content and that there are clear empirical procedures for ascertaining that content. First, he held, that that to which a probability is assigned, insofar as the notion of probability is used scientifically, is not a proposition or an event or a state; nor is it a type of event or state. Rather, what is assigned a probability is an argument, an argument having premisses (Peirce insisted on this spelling rather than the spelling “premises.”) and a conclusion. Peirce's view in this regard is virtually indistinguishable from the view of Kolmogoroff that all probabilities are conditional probabilities. Second, Peirce held that, in order to ascertain the probability of a particular argument, the observer notes all occasions on which all of its premisses are true, case by case, just as they come under observation. For each of these occasions the observer notes whether the conclusion is true or not. The observer keeps a running tally, the ongoing ratio whose numerator is the number of occasions so far observed on which the conclusion as well as the premisses are true and whose denominator is the number of occasions so far observed on which the premisses are true irrespective of whether or not the conclusion is also true. At each observation the observer computes this ratio, which obviously encompasses all the observer's past observations of occasions on which the premisses are true. The probability of the argument in question is defined by Peirce to be the limit of the crucial ratio as the number of observations tends to grow infinitely large (if this limit exists).
Peirce's earliest account of the meaning of probability, then, is a version of what is called the “long run relative frequency view” of probability. Late in his philosophical career, about 1910, Peirce found fault with his earliest views on account of their failure to make clear just how the occasions of observation are to be chosen. He also emphasized that probability judgments are judgments about what he called “would-be's.” For this reason Peirce is often considered to be the originator of the sort of “propensity view” of probability that is associated with Karl Popper. One should not, however, think that viewing Peirce as a propensity theorist is in conflict with viewing him as some sort of long term relative frequency theorist. Rather, Peirce's view seems to be that the propensity in question, when its sense is spelled out in accord with the pragmatic (or: pragmaticistic) theory of meaning, is a dispositional property that manifests itself in the set of concrete facts that amount to a certain long term relative frequency tending toward a certain limit as the number of appropriate occasions of observation increases indefinitely.
There is an interesting connection between Peirce's tychism, his view that there is objective spontaneity in the universe, and the foregoing account of probability. For Peirce understood the universe of appearances as a logical process, somewhat in the same manner that Hegel understood the universe of appearances as the phenomenology of spirit. He tended to consider a given state of the universe as being a given set of premisses, so to say, of a possible inference. Then a subsequent state of the universe could be seen as being the conclusion of an actual inference. Thus Peirce tended to see the universe of appearances as bringing itself into being by a process that is ultimately logical. The world, as it were, evolves by abducing, deducing, and inducing itself. It is in some sense Hegel's “Thought thinking thought.”
Along with his attack on a subjectivist account of probability, Peirce also attacked the use of what came to be called the method of “inverse probabilities” as a way of solving the problem of induction. In the process, he also excoriated the theoretical work, in this connection, of de Morgan and Adolphe Quetelet (the Belgian criminologist and early user of statistical analysis in sociology). Induction, as we have seen, Peirce counted as an inference from sample to population. The method of inverse probabilities offers itself as a way of calculating the (conditional) probability that a population has a trait in a certain proportion given that a sample drawn from that population has the trait in that proportion. It proposes to calculate this conditional probability by applying the so-called “Bayes's Theorem” in order to express it in terms of the (inverse conditional) probability that the sample has the trait in the crucial proportion given that the population has the trait in the crucial proportion. In the expression of the first conditional probability in terms of the second conditional probability, however, there occur certain quantities, known as the “Bayesian prior probabilities.” What Peirce pointed out is that there is no way to assign any quantities in a rational fashion to the requisite Bayesian prior probabilities. The appearance that one does have a reason for assigning particular quantities results only from an illicit substitution of subjective probabilities for the needed objectivist probabilities. What the user of the method of inverse probabilities does is to equate complete lack of information about something with the claim that all possibilities must have equal probabilities. This equation was called “the principle of insufficient reason” in the nineteenth century; John Maynard Keynes later named it “the principle of indifference.” This principle is, however, completely irrational without a dependence on a subjectivist account of probability. What we need, however, is objective probabilities, and so we have no reason for assigning any particular values to the Bayesian prior probabilities. Only “if universes were as plenty as blackberries,” wrote Peirce, would the analysis of de Morgan and Quetelet make any sense.
In rejecting Bayesianism and the method of inverse probabilities, Peirce argued that in fact no probability at all can be assigned to inductive arguments. Instead of probability, a different measure of imperfection of certitude must be assigned to inductive arguments: verisimilitude or likelihood. In explaining this notion Peirce offered an account of hypothesis-testing that is equivalent to standard statistical hypothesis-testing. In effect we get an account of confidence intervals and choices of statistical significance for rejecting null hypotheses. Such ideas became standard only in the twentieth century as a result of the work of R. A. Fisher, Jerzy Neyman, and others. But already by 1878, in his paper “The Probabilitiy of Induction,” Peirce had worked out the whole matter. (This topic has been discussed expertly by Deborah Mayo, who also has shown that the error-correction implicit in statistical hypothesis-testing is intimately affiliated with Peirce's notion of science as self-correcting and convergent to “the truth.”)
Peirce's accounts of his third type of deviance from perfect certitude, namely plausibility, are much sketchier than his accounts of probability and verisimilitude. Unlike the other two forms of uncertainty, which can be spelled out mathematically with great precision, plausibility seems to be capable of only a qualitative account, even though plausibility does seem to comes in greater and lesser degree. The question of the plausibility of a claim arises, apparently, only in contexts in which one is seeking to adduce an explanatory hypothesis for some actual fact that is surprising. The key point is that the hypothesis must be plausible in order to taken seriously. If we were, for example, to come upon a lump of ice in the middle of a desert, we might plausibly say that perhaps someone put it there, or perhaps a freak storm had left a great hailstone. But we would not plausibly say that it had been thrown off a flying saucer that previously had swooped through. It should be obvious that the notion of plausibility is a difficult one, which strongly invites further analysis but which is not easy to analyze in technical detail.
Peirce held that science suggests that the universe has evolved from a condition of maximum freedom and spontaneity into its present condition, in which it has taken on a number of habits, sometimes more entrenched habits and sometimes less entrenched ones. With pure freedom and spontaneity Peirce tended to associate mind, and with firmly entrenched habits he tended to associate matter (or, more generally, the physical). Matter he tended to regard as “congealed” mind, and mind he tended to regard as “effete” matter. Thus he tended to see the universe as the end-product-so-far of a process in which mind has acquired habits and has “congealed” (this is the very word Peirce used) into matter.
This notion of all things as being evolved psycho-physical unities of some sort places Peirce well within the sphere of what might be called “the grand old-fashioned metaphysicians,” along with such thinkers as Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, Spinoza, Leibniz, Hegel, Schopenhauer, Whitehead, et al. Some contemporary philosophers might be inclined to reject Peirce out of hand upon discovering this fact. Others might find his notion of psycho-physical unities not so very offputting or indeed even attractive. What is crucial is that Peirce argued that mind pervades all of nature in varying degrees: it is not found merely in the most advanced animal species.
This pan-psychistic view, combined with his synechism, meant for Peirce that mind is extended in some sort of continuum throughout the universe. Peirce tended to think of ideas as existing in mind in somewhat the same way as physical forms exist in physically extended things. He even spoke of ideas as “spreading” out through the same continuum in which mind is extended. This set of conceptions is part of what Peirce regarded as (his own version of) Scotistic realism, which he sharply contrasted with nominalism. He tended to blame what he regarded as the errors of much of the philosophy of his contemporaries as owing to its nominalistic disregard for the objective existence of form.
Merely to say that Peirce was extremely fond of placing things into groups of three, of trichotomies, and of triadic relations, would fail miserably to do justice to the overwhelming obtrusiveness in his philosophy of the number three. Indeed, he made the most fundamental categories of all “things” of any sort whatsoever the categories of “Firstness,” “Secondness,” and “Thirdness,” and he often described “things” as being “firsts” or “seconds” or “thirds.” For example, with regard to the trichotomy “possibility,” “actuality,” and “necessity,” possibility he called a first, actuality he called a second, and necessity he called a third. Again: quality was a first, fact was a second, and habit (or rule or law) was a third. Again: entity was a first, relation was a second, and representation was a third. Again: rheme (by which Peirce meant a relation of arbitrary adicity or arity) was a first, proposition was a second, and argument was a third. The list goes on and on. Let us refer to Peirce's penchant for describing things in terms of trichotomies and triadic relations as Peirce's “triadism.”
If Peirce had a general technical rationale for his triadism, Peirce scholars have not yet made it abundantly clear what this rationale might be. He seemed to base his triadism on what he called “phaneroscopy,” by which word he meant the mere observation of phenomenal appearances. He regularly commented that the phenomena in the phaneron just do fall into three groups and that they just do display irreducibly triadic relations. He seemed to regard this matter as simply open for verification by direct inspection.
Although there are many examples of phenomena that do seem more or less naturally to divide into three groups, Peirce seems to have been driven by something more than mere examples in his insistence on applying his categories to almost everything imaginable. Perhaps it was the influence of Kant, whose twelve categories divide into four groups of three each. Perhaps it was the triadic structure of the stages of thought as described by Hegel. Perhaps it was even the triune commitments of orthodox Christianity (to which Peirce, at least in some contexts and during some swings of mood, seemed to subscribe). Certainly involved was Peirce's commitment to the ineliminability of mind in nature, for Peirce closely associated the activities of mind with the aforementioned triadic relation that he called the “sign” relation. (More on this topic appears below.) Also involved was Peirce's so-called “reduction thesis” in logic (on which more will given below), to which Peirce had concluded as early as 1870.
It is difficult to imagine even the most fervently devout of the passionate admirers of Peirce, of which there are many, saying that his account (or, more accurately, his various accounts) of the three universal categories is (or are) absolutely clear and compelling. Yet, in almost everything Peirce wrote from the time the categories were first introduced, Peirce's firsts, seconds, and thirds found a place. Giving their exact and general analysis and providing an exact and general account of their rationale, if there be such, constitute chief problems in Peirce scholarship.
Connected with Peirce's insistence on the ubiquity of mind in the cosmos is the importance he attached to what he called “semeiotic,” the theory of signs in the most general sense. Although a few points concerning this subject were made earlier in this article, some further discussion is in order. What Peircean meant by “semeiotic” is almost totally different from what has come to be called “semiotics,” and which hails not so much from Peirce as from Ferdinand de Saussure and Charles W. Morris. Even though Peircean semeiotic and semiotics are often confused, it is important not to do so. Peircean semeiotic derives ultimately from the theory of signs of Duns Scotus and its later development by John of St. Thomas (John Poinsot). In Peirce's theory the sign relation is a triadic relation that is a special species of the genus: the representing relation. Whenever the representing relation has an instance, we find one thing (the “object”) being represented by (or: in) another thing (the “representamen”) and being represented to (or: in) a third thing (the “interpretant.”) Moreover, the object is represented by the representamen in such a way that the interpretant is thereby “determined” to be also a representamen of the object to yet another interpretant. That is to say, the interpretant stands in the representing relation to the same object represented by the original representamen, and thus the interpretant represents the object (either again or further) to yet another interpretant. Obviously, Peirce's complicated definition entails that we have an infinite sequence of representamens of an object whenever we have any one representamen of it.
The sign relation is the special species of the representing relation that obtains whenever the first interpretant (and consequently each member of the whole infinite sequence of interpretants) has a status that is mental, i.e. (roughly) is a cognition of a mind. In any instance of the sign relation an object is signified by a sign to a mind. One of Peirce's central tasks was that of analyzing all possible kinds of signs. For this purpose he introduced various distinction among signs, and discussed various ways of classifying them.
One set of distinctions among signs was introduced by Peirce in the early stages of his analysis. The distinctions in this set turn on whether the particular instance of the sign relation is “degenerate” or “non-degenerate.” The notion of “degeneracy” here is the standard mathematical notion, and as applied to sign theory non-degeneracy means simply that the triadic relation cannot be analyzed as a logical conjunction of any combination of dyadic relations and monadic relations. More exactly, a particular instance of the obtaining of the sign relation is degenerate if and only if the fact that a sign s means an object o to an interpretant i can be analyzed into a conjunction of facts of the form P(s) & Q(o) & R(i) & T(s,o) & U(o,i) & W(i,s) (where not all the conjuncts have to be present). Either an obtaining of the sign relation is non-degenerate, in which case it falls into one class; or it is degenerate in various possible ways (depending on which of the conjuncts are omitted and which retained), in which cases it falls into various other classes. Other distinctions regarding signs were introduced later by Peirce. Some of them will be discussed very briefly in the following section of this article.
Peirce's settled opinion was that logic in the broadest sense is to be equated with semeiotic (the general theory of signs), and that logic in a much narrower sense (which he typically called “logical critic”) is one of three major divisions or parts of semeiotic. Thus, in his later writings, he divided semeiotic into speculative grammar, logical critic, and speculative rhetoric (also called “methodeutic”). Peirce's word “speculative” is his Latinate version of the Greek-derived word “theoretical,” and should be understood to mean exactly what the word “theoretical” means. Peirce's tripartite division of semeiotic is not to be confused with Charles W. Morris's division: syntax, semantics, and pragmatics (although there may be some commonalities in the two trichotomies).
By speculative grammar Peirce understood the analysis of the kinds of signs there are and the ways that they can be combined significantly. For example, under this heading he introduced three trichotomies of signs and argued for the real possibility of only certain kinds of signs. Signs are qualisigns, sinsigns, or legisigns, accordingly as they are mere qualities, individual events and states, or habits (or laws), respectively. Signs are icons, indices (also called “semes”), or symbols (sometimes called “tokens”), accordingly as they derive their significance from resemblance to their objects, a real relation (for example, of causation) with their objects, or are connected only by convention to their objects, respectively. Signs are rhematic signs (also called “sumisigns” and “rhemes”), dicisigns (also called “quasi-propositions”), or arguments (also called “suadisigns”), accordingly as they are predicational/relational in character, propositional in character, or argumentative in character. Because the three trichotomies are independent of each other, together they yield the abstract possibility that there are 27 distinct kinds of signs. Peirce argued, however, that 17 of these are logically impossible, so that finally only 10 kinds of signs are genuinely possible. In terms of these 10 kinds of signs, Peirce endeavored to construct a theory of all possible natural and conventional signs, whether simple or complex.
What Peirce meant by “logical critic” is pretty much logic in the ordinary, accepted sense of “logic” from Aristotle's logic to present-day mathematical logic. As might be expected, a crucial concern of logical critic is to characterize the difference between correct and incorrect reasoning. Peirce achieved extraordinarily extensive and deep results in this area, and a few of his accomplishments in this area will be discussed below.
By “speculative rhetoric” or “methodeutic” Peirce understood all inquiry into the principles of the effective use of signs for producing valuable courses of research and giving valuable expositions. Methodeutic studies the methods that researchers should use in investigating, giving expositions of, and creating applications of the truth. Peirce also understood, under the heading of speculative rhetoric, the analysis of communicational interactions and strategies, and their bearing on the evaluation of inferences. Peirce's important topic of the economy of research is closely affiliated with his idea of speculative rhetoric. The idea of methodeutic may overlap to some small extent with Morris's notion of “pragmatics,” but the spirit of Peirce's notion is much more extensive than that of Morris's notion. Moreover, Peirce handled the notion of indexical reference under the heading of speculative grammar and not under the heading of speculative rhetoric, whereas the topic certainly belongs to Morris's pragmatics. There clearly exist connections between Peirce's speculative rhetoric, on the one hand, and the attention paid by twentieth-century philosophers such as Ludwig Wittgenstein and J. L. Austin to matters having to do with language as a set of various social practices. Unfortunately, however, little attention has been paid by Peirce scholars to the relations between Peirce's thinking and familiar twentieth-century notions such as Wittgenstein's language-games and Austin's speech-acts.
Speculative rhetoric, however, has attracted considerable philosophical attention in recent years, especially among Finnish Peirce scholars centering about the University of Helsinki. These have noted that there are extensive affiliations between Peirce's discussions of the communicational and dialogical aspects of semeiotic, on the one hand, and the many and varied “game-theoretical” approaches to logic that have been for some time of interest to Finnish philosophers (as well as many others), on the other hand. Various proposals for game-theoretic semantical approaches to logic have been developed and applied to Peirce's logic, as well as being used to understand Peircean points.
Peirce maintained a considerable interest in the topic of classification or taxonomy in general, and he considered biology and geology the foremost sciences to have made progress in developing genuinely useful systems of classification for things. In his own theory of classification, he seemed to regard some sort of cluster analysis as holding the key to creating really useful classifications. He regularly strove to create a classification of all the sciences that would be as useful to logic as the taxonomies of the biologists and geologists were to these scientists. Of special interest in this regard is the fact that he considered the relation of similarity to be a triadic relation, rather than a dyadic relation. Thus, for Peirce taxonomies and taxonomic trees are only one sort of classificatory system, albeit the most highly-developed one. He would not be in the least surprised to find that the topic of constructing “ontologies” is in vogue among computer scientists, and he would applaud endeavors to construct ontologies. He would not find in the least alien many contemporary analytic discussions of the notion of similarity; he would be right at home among them.
As with many of Peirce's classificatory divisions, his classification of the sciences is a taxonomy whose tree is trinary. For example he classifies all the sciences into those of discovery, review, and practicality. Sciences of discovery he divides into mathematics, philosophy, and what he calls “idioscopy” (by which he seems to mean the class of all the particular or special sciences like physics, psychology, and so forth). Mathematics he divides into mathematics of logic, of discrete series, and of continua and pseudo-continua. Philosophy he divides into phenomenology, normative science, and metaphysics. Normative science he divides into aesthetics, ethics, and logic. And so on and on. Very occasionally there is found a binary division: for example, he divides idioscopy into the physical sciences and the psychical (or human) sciences. But, hardly surprisingly given his penchant for triads, most of his divisions are into threes.
Peirce scholars have found the topic of Peirce's classification of the sciences a fertile ground for assertions about what is most basic in all thinking, in Peirce's view. Whether or not such assertions run afoul of Peirce's anti-foundationalism is itself a topic for further study.
In the extensiveness and originality of his contributions to mathematical logic, Peirce is almost without equal. His writings and original ideas are so numerous that there is no way to do them justice in a small article such as the present one. Accordingly, only a few of his vast achievements will be mentioned here.
Peirce's special strength lay not so much in theorem-proving as rather in the invention and developmental elaboration of novel systems of logical syntax and fundamental logical concepts. He invented dozens of different systems of logical syntax, including a syntax based on a generalization of de Morgan's relative product operation, an algebraic syntax that mirrored Boolean algebra to some extent, a quantifier-and-variable syntax that (except for its specific symbols) is identical to the much later Russell-Whitehead syntax. He even invented two systems of graphical two-dimensional syntax. The first, the so-called “entitative graphs,” is based on disjunction and negation. A version of the entitative graphs later appeared in G. Spencer Brown's Laws of Form, without anything remotely like proper citation of Peirce. A second, and better, system of graphical two-dimensional syntax followed: the so-called “existential graphs.” This system is based on conjunction and negation. Even though the syntax is two dimensional, the surface it actually requires in its most general form is a torus of finite genus. So, the system of existential graphs actually requires three dimensions for its representations, although the third dimension in which the torus is embedded can usually be represented in two dimensions by the use of pictorial devices that Peirce called “fornices” or “tunnel-bridges” and by the use of identificational devices that Peirce called “selectives.” The existential graphs are essentially a syntax for logic that uses the whole mathematical apparatus of topological graph theory. There are three parts of it: alpha (for propositional logic), beta (for quantificational logic with identity but without functions), and gamma (for modal logic and meta-logic).
In 1870 Peirce published a long paper “Description of a Notation for the Logic of Relatives” in which he introduced for the first time in history, two years before Frege's Begriffschrift a complete syntax for the logic of relations of arbitrary adicity (or: arity). In this paper the notion of the variable (though not under the name “variable”) was invented, and Peirce provided devices for negating, for combining relations (basically by building upon de Morgan's relative product and relative sum), and for quantifying existentially and universally. By 1883, along with his student O. H. Mitchell, Peirce had developed a full syntax for quantificational logic that was only a very little different (as was mentioned just above) from the standard Russell-Whitehead syntax, which did not appear until 1910 (with no adequate citations of Peirce).
Peirce introduced the material-conditional operator into logic, developed the Sheffer stroke and dagger operators 40 years before Sheffer, and developed a full logical system based only on the stroke function. As Garret Birkhoff notes in his Lattice Theory it was in fact Peirce who invented the concept of a lattice (around 1883). (Quite possibly, it is Peirce's lattice theory that holds the key to his technical theory of infinitesimals and the continuum.)
During his years teaching at Johns Hopkins University, Peirce began to research the four-color map conjecture, to work on the graphical mathematics of de Morgan's associate A. B. Kempe, and to develop extensive connections between logic. algebra, and topology, especially topological graph theory. Ultimately these researches bore fruit in his existential graphs, but his writings in this area also contain a considerable number of other valuable ideas and results. He hinted that he had made great progress in the theory of provability and unprovability by exploring the connections between logic and topology.
Peirce's so-called “Reduction Thesis” is the thesis that all relations, relations of arbitrary adicity, may be constructed from triadic relations alone, whereas monadic and dyadic relations alone are not sufficient to allow the construction of even a single “non-degenerate” (that is: non-Cartesian-factorable) triadic relation. Although the germ of his argument for the Reduction Thesis lay in his 1870 paper “Description of a Notation for the Logic of Relatives,” the Thesis was for over a century doubted by many, especially after the publication of a proof by Willard Van Orman Quine that all relations could be constructed exclusively from dyadic ones. As it turns out, both Peirce and Quine were correct: the issue entirely depends on exactly what constructive resources are to be allowed to be used in building relations out of other relations. (Obviously, the more extensive and powerful are the constructive resources, the more likely it is that all relations can be constructed from dyadic ones alone by using them.) An exact exposition and proof of Peirce's Reduction Thesis was finally accomplished in 1988 (Burch 1991), and it makes clear that Peirce's constructive resources are to be understood to include only negation, a generalization of de Morgan's relative product operation, and the use of a particular triadic relation that Peirce called “the teridentity relation” and that we might today write as x = y = z.
Peirce felt that the teridentity relation was in some way more primitive logically and thus more fundamental than the usual dyadic identity relation x = y, which he derived from two instances of the triadic identity relation by two applications of the relative product operation of de Morgan. Peirce also felt that de Morgan's relative product operation was logically a more primitive and fundamental operation than, say, the Boolean product or the Boolean sum. The full philosophical import of his Reduction Thesis, and the philosophical importance of his triadism insofar as this triadism rests on his Reduction Thesis, cannot be ascertained without a prior understanding of his non-typical theory of identity and his special view of the fundamental nature of the relative product operation.
Currently, considerable interest is being taken in Peirce's ideas by researchers wholly outside the arena of academic philosophy. The interest comes from industry, business, technology, intelligence organizations, and the military; and it has resulted in the existence of a substantial number of agencies, institutes, businesses, and laboratories in which ongoing research into and development of Peircean concepts are being vigorously undertaken.
This interest arose, originally, in two ways. First, some thirty years ago in the former Soviet Union interest in Peirce and Karl Popper had led logicians and computer scientists like Victor Konstantinovich Finn and Dmitri Pospelov to try to find ways in which computer programs could generate Peircean hypotheses (Popperian “conjectures”) in “semeiotic” contexts (non-numerical or qualitative contexts). Under the guide in particular of Finn's intelligent systems laboratory in VINITI-RAN (the All-Russian Institute of Scientific and Technical Information of the Russian Academy of Sciences), elaborate techniques for automatic generation of hypotheses were found and were extensively utilized for many practical purposes. Finn called his approach to hypothesis generation the “JSM Method of Automatic Hypothesis Generation” (so named for similarities to John Stuart Mill's methods for identifying causes). Among the purposes for which the JSM Method has proved fruitful are sociological prediction, pharmacological discovery, and the analysis of processes of industrial production. Interest in Finn's work, and through it in the practical application of Peirce's philosophy, has spread to France, Germany, Denmark, Finnland, and ultimately the United States.
Second, as the limits of expert systems and production rule programming in the area of artificial intelligence became increasingly clear to computer scientists, they began to search for methods beyond those that depended merely on imitating experts. One promising line of research has been to automate phases of (Peirce's concept of) the scientific method, complete with techniques for hypothesis generation and making assessments of the costs and benefits of exploring hypotheses. In some areas of research added impetus has been provided by the similarity of Peircean techniques to techniques that have already proven useful. For example, in the field of automated multi-track radar, the similarity of Peircean scientific method to the so-called “Kalman filter” has been noted by many systems analysts. Again, those interested in military command-and-control often note the similarity of Peircean scientific method to the classic OODA loop (“observe, orient, decide, act”) of command-and-control-theory. The aerospace industry, especially in France and the United States, is currently investigating Peircean ideas in connection with avionics systems that monitor aircraft “health.”
Almost simultaneously with Finn's development of Automatic Generation of Hypotheses, German mathematicians Rudolf Wille and Bernhardt Ganter were developing an aspect of Galois Theory and lattice theory (the latter being, as was said, Peirce's invention) that came to be known as “Formal Concept Analysis.” Interestingly enough, even though the two groups of researchers initially were working completely independently of each other, the mathematical apparatus of Finn's Automatic Generation of Hypotheses is at its core the very same apparatus as that of Wille's and Ganter's Formal Concept Analysis. For obvious reasons, then, there has now grown up an extensive cooperation between the German researchers and the Russian researchers, principally through the writings and intermediary work of Sergei Kuznetsov, who has been working both with the German group and with the Russian group.
The heart of both sets of ideas is the notion of clustering items by similarity. The algorithms for clustering into formal concepts are the same as the algorithms for preliminary groupings by similarity for the purpose of automatically generating hypotheses. As it turns out, and as Kuznetsov has shown, these algorithms are equivalent in their effect to algorithms for finding the maximal complete subgraphs of arbitrary graphs. This fact has proved extremely useful in recent years, since the latter algorithms are the core of what has come to be known as “Social Network Analysis.” And Social Network Analysis has become a major intellectual tool in the world's battles against criminal organizations and terrorist networks. So all three sets of ideas have become matters of crucial practical importance and even urgency in contemporary affairs.
Such practical applications of Peircean ideas may seem surprising to many philosophers whose minds are rooted strictly in the academic world. The applications, however, most certainly would not have surprised Peirce in the least. Indeed, given his lifelong ideas and goals as a scientist-philosopher, he probably would have found the current practical importance of his ideas entirely to be expected.
- Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, 8 vols. Edited by Charles Hartshorne, Paul Weiss, and Arthur W. Burks (Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts, 1931–1958; vols. 1–6 edited by Charles Harteshorne and Paul Weiss, 1931–1935; vols. 7–8 edited by Arthur W. Burks, 1958).
- The Essential Peirce, 2 vols. Edited by Nathan Houser, Christian Kloesel, and the Peirce Edition Project (Indiana University Press, Bloomington, Indiana, 1992, 1998).
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- Burch, Robert, 1991, A Peircean Reduction Thesis: Foundations of Toplogical Logic, Lubbock, TX: Texas Tech University Press.
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- Royce, Josiah, 1959, The World and the Individual, First Series, New York: Dover.
- Thayer, H. S., 1973, Meaning and Action: A Critical Exposition of American Pragmatism, Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
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Aristotle, General Topics: logic | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | James, William | Kant, Immanuel | logic: classical | panpsychism | Peirce, Benjamin | Peirce, Charles Sanders: logic | Popper, Karl | Russell, Bertrand | universals: the medieval problem of | Whewell, William | Whitehead, Alfred North