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The Problem of Perception
Sense-perception—the awareness or apprehension of things by sight, hearing, touch, smell and taste—has long been a preoccupation of philosophers. One pervasive and traditional problem, sometimes called “the problem of perception”, is created by the phenomena of perceptual illusion and hallucination: if these kinds of error are possible, how can perception be what it intuitively seems to be, a direct and immediate access to reality? The present entry is about how these possibilities of error challenge the intelligibility of the phenomenon of perception, and how the major theories of perception in the last century are best understood as responses to this challenge.
- 1. The Problem of Perception
- 2. The Sources of the Problem
- 3. Theories of Perception
- 3.1 The Sense-Datum Theory
- 3.2 The Adverbial Theory
- 3.3 The Intentionalist Theory
- 3.4 The Disjunctivist Theory
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
This entry will focus on a single, central problem of perception: how to reconcile some apparently obvious truths about our experience of the world with the possibility of certain kinds of perceptual error. On an intuitive conception, perceptual experience is (what we shall call) “openness to the world” (see McDowell 1994: 111). But this apparent fact of openness is threatened by the existence of certain actual or possible phenomena—typically known as illusions or hallucinations. Hence philosophical theories of perception need to respond to this threat by giving an account of perception which preserves what they take to be the central, important or essential features of perception.
This problem is not the same as the epistemological problem of how perception can give us knowledge of the external world (see the entry on epistemological problems of perception). For even if one thought that this epistemological problem were solvable by adopting (for example) some reliabilist theory of perceptual warrant, what we are calling here the “problem of perception” will remain. This is because the problem of perception is a kind of paradox or antinomy which arises independently of this epistemological issue. The structure of the problem is simple: perception seems intuitively to be openness to the world, but this fact of openness is threatened by reflection on illusions and hallucinations. Therefore perception, as we ordinarily understand it, seems to be impossible. The arguments which give rise to this problem can be divided into two: the arguments from illusion and from hallucination. In the next subsection we will briefly examine the argument from illusion; in §1.3, the argument from hallucination. (For some classic readings on these arguments, see Moore 1905, 1910; Russell 1912; Price 1932 and Broad 1923; see Swartz 1965 for a good collection of readings; for some fairly recent expositions see Snowdon 1992, Robinson 1994: chapter 2; Smith 2002, chapters 1 and 7.)
An illusion here may be defined, with A.D. Smith, as “any perceptual situation in which a physical object is actually perceived, but in which that object perceptually appears other than it really is” (Smith 2002: 23). For example, a white wall in yellow light can look yellow; a sweet drink can taste sour if one has just eaten something sweeter; a quiet sound can seem loud if it is very close to you; and so on. In these cases it is not necessary that one is deceived into believing that things are other than they are; so illusion in this sense need not involve deception. One can know that one is experiencing an illusion when it is happening.
Many things have been called “the argument from illusion”. But the basic idea (which some trace back to Hume 1748) normally involves the following steps:
- When one is subject to an illusion, it seems to one that something has a quality, F, which the real ordinary object supposedly being perceived does not actually have.
- When it seems to one that something has a quality, F, then there is something of which one is aware which does have this quality.
- Since the real object in question is, by hypothesis, not-F, then it follows that in cases of illusion, either one is not aware of the real object after all, or if one is, one is aware of it only “indirectly” and not in the direct, unmediated way in which we normally take ourselves to be aware of objects.
- There is no non-arbitrary way of distinguishing, from the point of view of the subject of an experience, between the phenomenology of perception and illusion (see e.g., Robinson 1994: 56–7; Smith 2002: 26–27).
- Therefore there is no reason to suppose that even in the case of genuine perception one is directly or immediately aware of ordinary objects.
- Therefore our normal view about what perceiving is—sometimes called “naïve realism” or “direct realism”—is false. So perception cannot be what we normally think it is.
The argument as presented is a negative one. Its conclusion is that the things of which we are perceptually aware are not the ordinary objects in the external world which we naturally take ourselves to be aware of. Of course, many philosophers have moved from this to a further conclusion that since we are always aware of something in perceptual experience, what we are aware of is another kind of object, a “non-ordinary” object (sometimes called a “sense-datum”). In §3.1, we will examine the theories which have proposed some of these further developments of the argument. But first we must make explicit what the assumptions of the basic negative argument are. The intended conclusion of the argument is reached by assuming (a) the existence of illusions in the above sense; (b) the claim that when it seems as if something is F, there is something which is F; and (c) Leibniz's law of the indiscernibility of identicals. Leibniz's Law is relevant because the argument envisages a situation where something has a perceptible property which the ordinary public object does not have. For if object A has a property which object B does not have, then they cannot be identical.
The most controversial assumption in the argument is the claim that when one is perceptually aware of something's having quality F, then there is something of which one is aware which does have this quality. Howard Robinson has usefully labelled this assumption the “Phenomenal Principle”:
If there sensibly appears to a subject to be something which possesses a particular sensible quality then there is something of which the subject is aware which does possess that sensible quality. (1994: 32)
This principle, though not always made explicit, is essential to the argument. For without it, there is little temptation to conclude that in the case of an illusion we are aware of any object at all. However, it may be asked why we should accept this Phenomenal Principle. Many philosophers have taken it to be obvious. H.H. Price, for example, says that “When I say ‘this table appears brown to me’ it is quite plain that I am acquainted with an actual instance of brownness” (Price 1932: 63). Perhaps it will be conceded that if there really is an instance of brownness here, then there must be some object which instantiates brownness. But someone could also resist the step from (i) to (ii) by saying that in the case of an illusion, there is only an appearance of brownness, not an instantiation of it. Some versions of this response will be discussed in §3.3; the Phenomenal Principle itself will be discussed further in §3.1.
A hallucination in this sense is an experience which seems exactly like a perception of a real, mind-independent object, but where there is no mind-independent object of the relevant kind being perceived. Like illusions, hallucinations in this sense do not necessarily involve deception. And nor need they be like the real hallucinations suffered by the mentally ill, drug-users or alcoholics. They are rather supposed to be merely possible events: experiences which are indistinguishable for the subject from a genuine perception of an object. For example, suppose I am now having a visual experience of a snow-covered churchyard. The assumption that hallucinations are possible means that I could have an experience which is subjectively indistinguishable—that is, indistinguishable by the subject, “from the inside”—from a veridical perception of a snow-covered churchyard, but where there is in fact no churchyard which I am perceiving at all.
As with the argument from illusion, the basic idea behind the argument from hallucination has been presented in many ways. Here we shall represent it as follows:
- It seems possible for someone to have an experience—a hallucination—which is subjectively indistinguishable from a genuine perception but where there is no mind-independent object being perceived.
- The perception and the subjectively indistinguishable hallucination are experiences of essentially the same kind.
- Therefore it cannot be that the essence of the perception depends on the objects being experienced, since essentially the same kind of experience can occur in the absence of the objects.
- Therefore the ordinary conception of perceptual experience—which treats experience as dependent on the mind-independent objects around us—cannot be correct.
As with the argument from illusion, the argument as presented here is a negative one, whose aim is to show that our ordinary conception of perception is deeply problematic, if not incoherent: perceptual experience cannot be what we intuitively think it is. (It is essentially this problem which Valberg (1992) calls “the puzzle of experience”.) And as with the argument from illusion, the argument could be developed to defend the conclusion that we are aware of “non-ordinary” objects (e.g., sense-data) in actual cases of real perception. These developments will be discussed below in §3.1. But note at this stage the assumptions behind the argument as presented above: (a) that hallucinations in the relevant sense are possible; and (b) that perceptions and hallucinations are states of mind of essentially the same kind. If we add the extra assumption, (c) that the nature of a perceptual experience must be determined by the nature of the objects experienced, it is easy to see how someone could argue for the further conclusion that we are aware of non-ordinary objects in all perceptual experience. But assumptions (b) and (c) have been challenged, and the theories that challenge them will be discussed in §3.2–3.4.
Note that the problem is expressed as one about the “nature” of an experience. This means its nature from the point of view of the subject having the experience—its phenomenological nature rather than, say, its physiological nature as a brain state (if experiences are brain states at all: for an alternative view, see Noë 2004). The nature of an experience from the subject's point of view is also called the “phenomenal character” of the experience. ‘Phenomenal’ here refers to how things appear or seem. A description of the phenomenal character of an experience is a description of how things seem to the subject when having that experience. It is also a description of what it is like to have an experience.
The problems posed by the arguments from hallucination and illusion are of a similar form. They each involve a conflict between (a) the manifest nature of perception, as it is from the phenomenological point of view and (b) the possibility of certain phenomena which are incompatible with this nature. Hence perception cannot be as it seems; as it is conceived from the phenomenological point of view, perception is impossible. To understand this problem properly, we need to look at claims (a) and (b) in more detail. This will be the task of this section.§2.1 will outline some fundamental phenomenological features of perception, and §2.2 will discuss the problematic phenomena, illusions and hallucinations.
Our ordinary way of thinking of perception has a number of elements. Some of these are embodied in the semantic facts about our perceptual vocabulary, while others cannot be read directly off the semantics but require a more phenomenological treatment. One obvious semantic fact is that the construction “…perceives that p”, where “p” is replaced by a sentence, is factive: if Vladimir perceives that it is snowing, then it is snowing. This, however, settles few of any philosophical issues. (It would not be an adequate response to the argument from hallucination, for example, simply to say that hallucination is not perception since “… perceives that p” is factive. This should be agreed by all sides.) By contrast with “perceives that”, the more theoretical construction “… perceptually experiences that p” is not factive. It is therefore a substantive question how perceptual experience, so understood, relates to the reality of which it is an experience; the rest of this entry is about perceptual experience in this sense.
What are the most general and most uncontroversial characteristics of perceptual experience? In the previous section experience was described as a kind of “openness to the world”. What does this mean? We can distinguish here two ideas: one about the nature of the objects of experience, the other about the relationship between these objects and the phenomenal character of experience.
The first idea is about the nature of the objects of experience. It is part of the ordinary conception of perception that its objects are mind-independent, public objects. Of course, we also perceive the properties of objects, as well as the objects themselves. When I perceive the snow-covered churchyard, I perceive the whiteness of the snow, the brownness of the wall behind, the crumbly texture of the stone… and so on. Whether or not all these properties (e.g., the colours) are in reality mind-independent is not something which this entry will discuss (but see the entry on color).
As we shall see in §3.1, some theories of perception (see for instance, Jackson 1977; Lowe 1992) have ended up defending the claim that when we perceive a mind-independent object, we perceive it by perceiving something mind-dependent. But this is supposed to be a surprising theoretical consequence of an argument, not an obvious fact about the ordinary phenomenon of perception. That this is so can be seen from the fact that all (or almost all) serious theories of perception agree that our perceptual experience seems as if it were an awareness of a mind-independent world. One's awareness of the objects of a perceptual experience does not seem to be an awareness of things which depend on that experience for their existence.
A classic statement of this starting-point for the philosophy of perception is P.F. Strawson's “Perception and its Objects” (1979). Here Strawson claims that “mature sensible experience (in general) presents itself as, in Kantian phrase, an immediate consciousness of the existence of things outside us” (1979: 97). He begins his argument by asking how someone would typically respond to a request for a description of their current visual experience. Strawson says that it is natural to give the following kind of answer: “I see the red light of the setting sun filtering through the black and thickly clustered branches of the elms; I see the dappled deer grazing in groups on the vivid green grass…” (1979: 97). There are two ideas implicit in this answer. One is that the description talks about objects and properties which are, on the face of it, things distinct from this particular experience. The other is that the description is “rich”, describing the nature of the experience in terms of concepts like deer and elms and the setting sun. The description of the experience is not merely in terms of simple shapes and colours; but in terms of the things we encounter in the “lived world” in all their complexity. As Heidegger puts it,
We never … originally and really perceive a throng of sensations, e.g., tones and noises, in the appearance of things…; rather, we hear the storm whistling in the chimney, we hear the three-engine aeroplane, we hear the Mercedes in immediate distinction from the Volkswagen. Much closer to us than any sensations are the things themselves. We hear the door slam in the house, and never hear acoustic sensations or mere sounds. (Heidegger 1977: 156; quoted in Smith 2002: 105)
It may be said that descriptions of experience like this involve a commitment to the existence of things outside the experience; but surely it is possible to describe experience without this commitment? So let us suppose that we ask our imagined perceiver to repeat their description without committing themselves to the existence of things outside their experience, but without falsifying how their experience seems to them. Strawson claims that the best way for them to respond is to say “I had a visual experience such as it would have been natural to describe by saying that I saw…” and then to add the previous description of the trees and the deer etc. We give a description of our experience in terms of the ordinary objects of our world. And we do this even if we are trying not to commit ourselves to the existence of these objects. In M.G.F. Martin's words, “the public, mind-independent objects of perception and their features are not banished from one's attention just because one shifts one's interest from how things are in the environment to how things are experientially” (Martin 2002: 384).
Strawson point outs that this is not a philosophical theory, one that would (for example) refute scepticism about the external world. Rather, it should be a starting point for philosophical reflection on experience (1979: 94). This is why this intuitive datum of consciousness is not supposed to rule out idealist conceptions of perception (such as that defended in Foster 2000). As we shall see in §3.1, idealists say that the objects and properties we perceive are mind-dependent. But this is consistent with saying that they are presented in experience as mind-independent. It is one thing, then, to say that experience presents its objects as mind-independent; it is another to say that they are mind-independent. Many theories of perception hold that the objects and properties we experience when we do perceive actually are the objects and properties out there in the mind-independent world. Tyler Burge, for example, claims that “our perceptual experience represents or is about objects … which are objective. That is to say, their nature (or essential character) is independent of any one person's actions, dispositions or mental phenomena” (Burge 1987: 125). But it is plain that, given the arguments from illusion and hallucination, this claim is something which has to be defended.
The first component of the idea of openness to the world is a claim about how the objects of experience seem. The second component of the idea is a claim about how the phenomenal character of experience is related to those objects. It is part of the ordinary conception of perceptual experience that the phenomenal character of an experience has something to do with the nature of the actual objects perceived. When we reflect upon how the phenomenal character of experience is, and try to “turn inwards” to describe the nature of the experience itself, the best way to do this is to describe the objects of experience and how they seem to us. In J.J. Valberg's words, when we take this kind of reflective attitude to our experience, “all we find is the world”(1992a: 18). Starting from the phenomenological point defended above in §2.1.1, it seems a simple matter to move to the further claim that the way these objects actually are is part of what determines the phenomenal character of an experience.
But this is to move too fast. For what can be said here about experience can also be said about belief: it is widely accepted that if I want to reflect upon the nature of my beliefs, the best way to do this is to describe the object or content of my belief: that is, what it is in the world that my belief is about. The things my beliefs are about can be as ‘bjective’ as the things I perceive. So what is distinctive of the apparent dependence of perceptual experience on its objects?
One answer is that when an object is experienced in perception, it is experienced as “there”, “given” or “present to the mind” in a way in which it is not in belief, thought and many other mental states and events. Perception seems to involve a particular kind of “presence to the mind”. This “presence” goes beyond the mere fact that the objects of perception must exist in order for a perceptual state to be veridical. For the objects of knowledge must exist too, but states of knowledge do not, as such, have presence in the same way as perceptual states—except, of course, in the case when one knows something is there by perceiving it. (Compare here the phenomenon Scott Sturgeon calls “scene immediacy”: 2000, chapter 1.)
So what is this perceptual presence? Consider again the difference between perception and pure thought (i.e., thought which is non-perceptual). The idea that the objects of perception actually are mind-independent does not distinguish perception from pure thought, since in thinking about the mind-independent world my thought too presents mind-independent objects (see, e.g., Searle 1983: 16).Thought, like perception, goes straight out to the world itself. But a difference between them is that in the case of thought, how the actual object of thought is at the moment I am thinking of it does not in any way constrain my thinking of it; but in the case of perception it does. My perception of the churchyard is immediately responsive to how the churchyard is now, as I am perceiving it. But my (non-perceptual) thought need not be: in the middle of winter, I can imagine the churchyard as it is in spring, I can consider it covered in autumn leaves, and I can think of it in all sorts of ways which are not the ways it presently is. I can think of all these things in their absence. This is not available in perception, because perception can only confront what is presently given: in this sense, it seems that you can only see or hear or touch what is there. It is because of this that perception is sometimes said to have an immediacy or vividness which thought lacks: this vividness derives from the fact that perceived objects and their properties are actually given to the perceiver when being perceived, and determine the nature of the experience. (As we shall see in §3.3 and §3.4, these intuitively compelling ideas may have to modified in the light of the problem of perception; the present point is only that they are intuitively compelling.)
Some recent writers on perception have defended a thesis which has become known as the transparency of experience (see Harman 1990; Speaks 2009; Tye 1992, 1995 and 2000; Thau 2002; and for critical discussions of this idea, Martin 2002, Smith 2008, and Stoljar 2004). Transparency is normally defined as the thesis that that reflection on, or introspection of, what it is like to have an experience does not reveal that we are aware of experiences themselves, but only of their mind-independent objects. There are two claims here: (i) introspection reveals awareness of mind-independent objects of experience, and (ii) introspection does not reveal awareness of intrinsic features of experiences themselves (such as “qualia”: see §3.2.1).
The transparency thesis looks rather similar to the idea of openness to the world. But how are these ideas actually related? The first claim of the transparency thesis, (i), has already been discussed above in §2.1.1. But it is not obvious that the second claim, (ii), is a necessary part of the commonsense conception of perception. For we do not have to say that the phenomenal character of one's entire experience is exhausted (or completely determined) by the nature of the actual objects and qualities which are presented in an experience. This claim can be disputed. For example, a scene can look very different when one removes one's glasses: my visual experience of the churchyard then becomes hazy and blurred, the contours of objects become indistinct. But it can be argued that this phenomenal difference in experience need not derive from any apparent or represented difference in the objects of experience. Rather, it seems to be a difference in the way in which those objects are experienced, and therefore introspection seems to reveal an awareness of properties of experiences themselves rather than their objects (although see Tye 2000 for a different understanding of this phenomenon). So there are reasons for thinking that this second part of the transparency thesis, claim (ii), is not part of the commonsense conception of perception. If this is true, then the thesis that perceptual experience is openness to the world is not the same as the transparency thesis.
So far, we have mainly considered visual perception. Does this mean that the problem of perception only concerns the sense of sight? This question demands a more extensive discussion; but the short answer is no. Phenomenologically, the immediate objects of the other senses are also experienced as independent of particular acts of sensing. This is true even of those senses whose immediate objects are not particular physical objects, but (for example) smells and sounds. It is plausible to say that we hear things by hearing sounds; therefore sounds are the direct objects of the sense of hearing. But sounds are not presented in experience as mind-dependent, in the sense that they depend for their existence on particular states or acts of mind. The sound of the coach is something which others can hear (as revealed by my spontaneous unthinking surprise when others cannot or do not hear what I hear). Likewise with smell. The smell of the goulash is not presented as something which is dependent on my smelling of it: it seems to me that others should be able to smell it too. There are metaphysical views that deny any ultimate mind-independent reality to sounds and smells, but these views too are attempts to revise our ordinary way of thinking of these phenomena. According to our ordinary way of thinking, hearing, smell and taste have as their objects sounds, smells and tastes: objects which are independent of the particular states of mind of the person apprehending them. So the mind-independence claim applies to them, mutatis mutandis. (For more on how the problem of perception, somewhat differently construed, arises in the senses other than vision, see Perkins 1983, Smith 2002: 23–25; for sounds, see Nudds 2001, O'Callaghan 2007, Nudds and O'Callaghan 2009; for discussions of the sense of touch, see O'Shaughnessy 1989 and Martin 1992; for the senses in general, see Nudds 2003, Macpherson forthcoming.)
The previous section outlined the initial plausibility of the ordinary conception of perception—“openness to the world”—which is challenged by the arguments from illusion and hallucination. The other large assumption which generates the problem of perception is that illusions and hallucinations are possible. One way to dissolve the problem would be to deny the possibility of these phenomena. To deny that illusions are possible would be to deny that we could have experiences when it appears as if an object has a property which it does not have in reality. This is not a popular way to deal with the problem, as there are plausibly many examples of such experiences. Consider the example mentioned above when an object can in certain conditions of illumination appear to have a colour which is different from its real colour. Assuming for the sake of argument that colours are real properties of objects, this is a clear case where something appears to have a property which it does not really have. (For many other examples, see Perkins 1983; Robinson 1994: 31; Smith 2002: 22–25). Where illusions are concerned, the main issue is not the existence of the phenomena, but their significance.
Hallucinations are a little bit more controversial. Remember that the claim is that it is possible to have an experience as of an object having a certain property, F, even if there is no such object; and such an experience is subjectively indistinguishable—indistinguishable in its phenomenal character from the subject's point of view—from a veridical perception of a real object being F. It is the second clause of this definition which carries the weight in the argument. For it is accepted on all sides that subjects do suffer real hallucinations, for example when under the influence of certain drugs. But it would be hazardous to claim that such experiences must be subjectively indistinguishable from a veridical perception. However, as noted above, this is not necessary for the argument. Since the argument concerns the necessary features of perception, the kinds of hallucination in question need only be possible phenomena. (For more on hallucination, see the essays collected in Macpherson and Platchias, forthcoming.)
“Subjectively indistinguishable” could be understood in a number of ways. It could be understood in terms of the experiences sharing subjective non-intentional qualities or “qualia” (see §3.2.2; and the entry on qualia; also Shoemaker 1990; Loar 2003; Farkas 2006) or in terms of the experiences sharing their “narrow” or non-environment-dependent intentional content (see Davies 1991 and 1992 for a discussion of this idea). But it is important to emphasise that one does not have to accept these substantial theories of experience in order to accept the idea of hallucination; so one cannot reject the possibility of hallucination by objecting to the coherence or plausibility of these theories. All one has to accept is the uncontroversial idea of two experiences being such that a subject could not know, simply in virtue of having the experiences, whether they were having one or the other.
But although the idea of distinct experiences being subjectively indistinguishable is not itself problematic, some philosophers have balked at the idea that any genuine perception could really be subjectively indistinguishable from a hallucination. Some are worried about this idea because they have an “externalist” theory of the intentional content of mental states which entails that hallucinations must be necessarily exceptional; it would not be possible to be a subject who was in a state of perpetual hallucination (see McCulloch 2002, chapter 7). But this idea, whatever its other merits, seems beside the point here. The mere possibility of hallucination does not imply that someone could be hallucinating all the time. The possibility is consistent with a strongly externalist theory of mental content.
Others have questioned the methodology employed when talking about hallucinations. They are sceptical about the empirical facts underlying this talk: do we really know that such mental states could come about? From all we know about real hallucinations—whether the product of drugs, psychosis or dehydration etc.—they are radically different in their phenomenal character from genuine perceptions. So why should we be so confident that it is even possible that there be subjectively indistinguishable perceptions and hallucinations? Austin (1962) played on the fact that there are real phenomenal differences between genuine perceptions and actual delusory and hallucinatory experiences in his dismissal of the arguments from illusion. To say that there could be hallucinations in our sense is akin to the Cartesian fantasy that there could be dreams which are subjectively indistinguishable from real experiences. But, Austin points out, dreaming that one is being presented to the Pope is nothing like really being presented to the Pope (1962: 48—9). And likewise, it might be said, with hallucinations. We do not really know whether there can be such things, so we should not base our philosophical theorising on such shaky empirical and introspective foundations.
As emphasised above, our assumption about hallucinations does not say that there ever actually are any such hallucinations, and nor does it rely in its description of the relevant kind of hallucination on any actual facts about real hallucinations. It just asserts the bare metaphysical possibility of an experience of the kind in question. This seems to be a possibility which resides within our idea of experience. Austin's scepticism, however, could be directed against this bare claim of possibility: how do we really know that experiences like this are possible?
One way to answer this—though certainly not the only way—is to appeal to a broad and uncontroversial empirical fact about experience: that it is the upshot or outcome of a causal process linking the organs of perception with the environment. This claim is not the same as a causal theory of perception, which aims to give an analysis of the concept of perception in causal terms (see Valberg 1992: 24). It is a substantially weaker idea: it is just the assertion of the fact that our experiences are the effects of things going on inside and outside our bodies. If this is so, then we can understand why hallucinations are a possibility. For any causal chain reaching from a cause C1 to effect E, there are intermediate causes C2, C3 etc., such that E could have been brought about even if C1 had not been there but one of the later causes (see the entry on the metaphysics of causation). If this is true of causal processes in general, and perceptual experience is the product of a causal process, then we can see how it is possible that I could have an experience of the churchyard which was brought about by causes “downstream” of the actual cause (the churchyard).
This is a broadly empirical reason for believing in the possibility of hallucination. One could reject this reason by rejecting the empirical claim that experience is the effect of some causal process, or by asserting that there are, in addition to the causal conditions upon experience, non-causal conditions which somehow determine how an experience is. Neither option is very popular. The dominant approaches to the problem of perception accept the possibility of hallucination and illusion, and try instead to see how much of our conception of perception can be defended against the arguments from illusion and hallucination.
In this section we will consider the leading theories of perception of the last hundred years: the sense-datum theory, the adverbial theory, the intentional theory and the disjunctive theory. These theories are understood here as responses to the problem of perception as posed in §1 above. One caveat is necessary: there are a number of theories of perception which are not discussed in this entry in any great detail, either because they are not responses to this specific problem (like the causal theory of Grice 1961 and Lewis 1988) or because they require an entire entry of their own (like the phenomenology of Husserl 1900–1 and Merleau-Ponty 1945; see the entry on phenomenology).
The sense-datum theory holds that when a person has a sensory experience, there is something of which they are aware (see Broad 1923, Moore 1903, 1910). What the subject is aware of is the object of experience. The object of experience is that which is given to the senses, or the sense-datum: this is how the term “sense-datum” was introduced by many writers (e.g., Price 1932: 13). The standard version of the theory takes the argument from illusion to show that a sense-datum, whatever else it may be, cannot be an ordinary physical object. The early sense-datum theorists (like Moore 1914) considered sense-data to be mind-independent, but non-physical objects. Later theories treat sense-data as mind-dependent entities (see Robinson 1994), and this is how the theory is normally understood in the second half of the twentieth century. (It should be noted here that there are sense-data theories (e.g., Jackson 1977) which do not appeal to the argument from illusion in any form. Also, there are other arguments for sense-data, understood as mind-dependent entities, which will not be discussed here: in addition to Jackson 1977, see also Lowe 1992; see also entries on epistemological problems of perception and sense-data.)
The conception of perception which most sense-data theories propose is as a relation to a non-physical object. This relation is the relation of “being given” or “sensing”. The relational conception of perception is sometimes called an “act-object” conception, since it posits a distinction between the mental “act” of sensing, and the “object” which is sensed. It is straightforward to show how this theory deals with the arguments from illusion and hallucination. The sense-datum theory treats all phenomenal properties—properties which determine the phenomenal character of an experience—as properties of the immediate object of experience. So, when in the case of an illusion, an external object appears to have a property which it does not have in reality, the theory says that some other object, a sense-datum, really does have this property. A similar move is made in the case of hallucination. Perceptions and subjectively indistinguishable hallucinations share their phenomenal character. This means that they share their phenomenal properties: the properties which determine what it is like to have an experience of this character. Assuming the Phenomenal Principle, the conclusion is drawn that these properties must be instantiated in an object of the same kind: a sense-datum. So the sense-datum theory retains the claim discussed in §2.1, that experiences depend on their objects; but it denies that these objects are the ordinary, mind-independent objects we normally take ourselves to be experiencing.
The sense-datum theory need not deny that we are presented with objects as if they were ordinary, public, mind-independent objects. But it will insist that this is an error. The things we take ourselves to be aware of are actually sense-data, although this may only be apparent on philosophical reflection. This is an important point, since it shows that the sense-datum theories are not simply refuted (as Harman 1990 seems to argue) by pointing to the phenomenological fact that the objects of experience seem to be the ordinary things around us. A consistent sense-data theorist can accept this fact, but insist that the objects of experience are really sense-data.
The sense-datum theory can say, however, that we are indirectly aware of ordinary objects: that is, aware of them by being aware of sense-data. A sense-datum theorist who says this is known as an indirect realist or representative realist, or as someone who holds a representative theory of perception (see Jackson 1977, Lowe 1992; see also the entry epistemological problems of perception). A theorist who denies that we are aware of mind-independent objects at all, directly or indirectly, but only of sense-data, is known as a phenomenalist or an idealist about perception (see Foster 2000 for a recent defence of this view).
The difference between indirect realism and idealism is not over any specific thesis about perception. The difference between them is over the metaphysical issue of whether there are any mind-independent material objects at all. Idealists, in general, hold that all objects and properties are mental or mind-dependent. There are many forms of idealism, and many arguments for these different forms, and there is no room for an extensive discussion of idealism here (see Crane and Farkas 2004: section 2 for an introduction to the subject; and the entry on idealism). What is important in this context is that idealists and indirect realists can agree about the nature of perception considered in itself, but will normally disagree on grounds independent of the philosophy of perception about whether the mind-dependent sense-data are all there is. Thus Foster (2000) argues for his idealism first by arguing for sense-data as the immediate or direct objects of perceptual experience, and then arguing that idealism gives a better explanation of the reality underlying this appearance, and of our knowledge of it. Hence, idealism and indirect realism are grouped together here as “the sense-datum theory” since they agree about the fundamental issue in the philosophy of perception.
The sense-datum theory was much discussed in the first half of the 20th century. It was widely rejected in the second half of the 20th century, though it still had its occasional champions in this period (for some examples, see Jackson 1977, O'Shaughnessy 1980, Lowe 1992, Robinson 1994). A number of objections have been made to the theory. Some of these objections are objections specifically to the indirect realist version of the sense-datum theory: for example, the claim that the theory gives rise to an unacceptable “veil of perception” between the mind and the world. The idea is that the sense-data “interpose” themselves between perceivers and the mind-independent objects which we normally take ourselves to be perceiving, and therefore leaves our perceptual, cognitive and epistemic access to the world deeply problematic if not impossible. In response to this, the indirect realist can say that sense-data are the medium by which we perceive the mind-independent world, and no more create a “veil of perception” than the fact that we use words to talk about things creates a “veil of words” between us and the things we talk about.
Other objections rest upon controversial doctrines from elsewhere in philosophy: for example, upon Wittgenstein's arguments against the idea of a “private language” (Wittgenstein 1953). On some ways of taking Wittgenstein's arguments, one of their targets is the thesis that mental life involves confronting a realm of “private objects” whose nature is only known to an individual subject. Sense-data are private objects in this sense, since subjects can only be aware of their own sense-data, and can have no direct knowledge or awareness of the sense-data of others. So if Wittgenstein's arguments were sound, then sense-data would be impossible. But the debate here involves many issues from outside the philosophy of perception, and it is not possible to treat it in detail here (see the entry on Ludwig Wittgenstein; and Robinson 1994, chapter 4 for a response to this kind of argument on behalf of the sense-data theory).
A more common objection in contemporary philosophy is to attack the Phenomenal Principle, which forms the basis of the arguments from illusion and hallucination (see Barnes 1944–5; Anscombe 1965). The objection is that the Phenomenal Principle is fallacious, because perception is a form of mental representation and it is not generally true that if a mental state represents that a is F, then there must actually be something which is F. (A version of the principle which replaces “if it sensorily appears to a subject that…” with “if a subject believes…” is clearly false, for example.) If perception is a form of representation, then we can resist the inference from the fact that it seems as if a sensory quality is instantiated, to the conclusion that it really is instantiated: instead we can say that the quality only needs to be represented in the experience. The conclusion is that the arguments from illusion and hallucination fail because the Phenomenal Principle is false.
Defenders of the sense-datum theory can respond that the Phenomenal Principle is not supposed to be a purely logical inference; it is not supposed to be true simply because of the logical form or semantic structure of “aware of” and similar locutions. Rather, it is true because of specific phenomenological facts about perceptual experience. Understood in this way, the intentionalist and the sense-datum theorist are not disagreeing about whether the Phenomenal Principle involves a fallacy, but rather about the nature of perception itself. (For more on this issue, see §3.3 below.)
Another influential objection to sense-data, rarely explicitly stated, but present in the background of much discussion, comes from the prevailing naturalism of contemporary philosophy. Naturalism (or physicalism) says that the world is entirely physical in its nature: everything there is supervenes on the physical, and is governed by physical law. Most sense-data theorists are committed to the claim that sense-data are mind-dependent: objects whose existence depends on the existence of states of mind. If the sense-data theory is to be consistent with naturalism, then it has to explain how an object can be brought into existence by the existence of an experience, and how this is supposed to be governed by physical law. These entities not only seem to be an unnecessary addition to the naturalistic world picture, but from a naturalistic perspective the mechanisms which determine how these entities behave are obscure. Naturalists may concede that there is nothing actually incoherent in the very idea of these objects, but they will insist that their existence is incompatible with other things we have learned from science about the natural world. Many contemporary sense-data theorists, however, will not be moved by this kind of criticism, since they are happy to accept the rejection of naturalism as a consequence of their sense-data theory (see Robinson 1994, Foster 2000).
Some philosophers agree with the Phenomenal Principle that whenever a sensory quality appears to be instantiated then it is instantiated, but deny that this entails the existence of sense-data. Rather, they hold that we should think of these qualities as modifications of the experience itself. Hence when someone has an experience of something brown, something like brownness is instantiated, but in the experience itself, rather in its object. This is not to say that the experience is brown, but rather that the experience is modified in a certain way, the way we can call “perceiving brownly”. The canonical descriptions of perceptual experiences, then, employ adverbial modifications of the perceptual verbs: instead of describing an experience as someone's “visually sensing a brown square”, the theory says that they are “visually sensing brownly and squarely”. This is why this theory is called the “adverbial theory”; but it is important to emphasise that it is more a theory about the phenomenal character of experience itself than it is a semantic analysis of sentences describing experience, or the semantics of perceptual verbs.
Part of the point of the adverbial theory, as defended by Ducasse (1942) and Chisholm (1957) was to do justice to the phenomenology of experience without commitment to what were considered to be the metaphysical excesses of the sense-data theory. Ducasse, in particular, was arguing against Moore's (1903) version of the sense-datum theory which held that sense-data must be capable of existing unsensed. Moore thought this because he was committed to the independence of “act” and “object” in the act-object analysis of perception. And he was committed to this because of his realism: in general, what the mind is confronted with in mental acts must be something independent of the mind. Hence for Moore, sense-data themselves—what the mind is confronted with in the specific case of perception—must be something independent of the mind. Ducasse found this consequence absurd, and therefore rejected the act-object conception of perception. (Notice how different Moore's conception of sense-data is from the conception discussed in the previous section.)
The main advantage of the adverbial theory is that it can acknowledge Price's intuition (quoted in §1.2 above) by saying that when someone has an experience of something brown, something is modified in a certain way—but it can do this without postulating mysterious sense-data. The only entities which the adverbialist needs to acknowledge are subjects of experience, experiences themselves, and ways these experiences are modified. This makes the theory appear less controversial than the sense-data theory: for most participants in this debate will agree that there are experiences; the controversial entities are sense-data.
The adverbial theory explains the phenomenal character of experience in terms of its intrinsic qualities. The intrinsic phenomenal qualities of experience are sometimes called “qualia”; hence the adverbial theory is sometimes seen as a version of the view that experience involves the awareness of qualia . There has been an extensive debate in recent philosophy about qualia; so it will be useful to explain at this stage something of their relevance to the problem of perception.
The Latin word “qualia” is the plural of “quale”, which means quality. In modern philosophy, of course, the word “quality” is used synonymously with “property”; thus Locke's primary qualities are properties of things like their shapes and sizes and so on. But “qualia” has undergone a shift in meaning, so most would no longer say that primary qualities are qualia; rather, the word is reserved for the qualities of experiences (see Crane 2000, and the entry on qualia). Within this usage too, we can distinguish between a broader and a narrower use of the word. When used in the broad way, qualia are simply whatever qualities of a state of mind has which constitute the state of mind's having the phenomenal character it has. In this broad sense, any conscious state of mind has qualia—to have qualia in this sense is just to have phenomenal character. (This is the way the term “qualia” is used in, e.g., Chalmers 1996.) Used in the narrow way, however, qualia are non-intentional, intrinsic properties of experience: properties which have no intentional or representational aspects whatsoever. To use Ned Block's apt metaphor, qualia in this sense are “mental paint” properties (Block 2004).
It is relatively uncontroversial to say that there are qualia in the broad sense; it is simply the same as saying that there are experiences with phenomenal character. It can be misleading, however, to use the term in this way, since it can give rise to the illusion that the existence of qualia is a substantial philosophical thesis when in fact it is something which will be accepted by anyone who believes in phenomenal character. (Hence Dennett's (1991) denial of qualia can seem bewildering if “qualia” is taken in the broad sense.) It is controversial to say that there are qualia in the narrow sense, though, and those who have asserted their existence have therefore provided arguments and thought-experiments to defend this assertion (see Block 1997, Peacocke 1983 chapter 1, Shoemaker 1990). In what follows, “qualia” will be used exclusively in the narrow sense.
The adverbial theory is committed to the view that experiencing something red, for example, involves one's experience being modified in a certain way: experiencing redly. The most natural way to understand this is that the experience is an event, and the modification of it is a property of that event. Since this property is both intrinsic (as opposed to relational or representational) and phenomenal (that is, consciously available) then this way of understanding the adverbial theory is committed to the existence of qualia.
An important objection to the adverbial theory has been proposed by Frank Jackson (1975). Consider someone who senses a brown square and a green triangle simultaneously. The adverbial theory will characterise this state of mind as “sensing brownly and squarely and greenly and triangularly”. But how can it distinguish the state of mind it is describing in this way from that of sensing a brown triangle and a green square? The characterisation fits that state of mind equally well. Obviously, what is wanted is a description according to which the brownness “goes with” the squareness, and the greenness “goes with” the triangularity. But how is the theory to do this without introducing objects of experience—the things which are brown and green respectively—or a visual field with a spatial structure? The challenge is whether the adverbial theory can properly account for the spatial structure and complexity in what is given in visual experience. (See Tye 1984 for an attempt to respond to this challenge.)
A related objection is that the theory cannot adequately account for a very important aspect of the phenomenology of perception: the fact that perception seems to relate us to objects. We saw that this idea is central to the ordinary conception of perceptual experience, and that even in the case of hallucination, experience seems to be the presentation of an object distinct from the state of mind itself. This is what lies behind the idea that in perceptual experience, something is given to the mind, and therefore that experience has an “act-object” structure. Of course, the adverbial theory denies that experience really has this structure, of course; but what account can it give of the appearance of such a structure? The sense-data theory deals with this issue by saying that perception does really have an act-object structure, but revises the commonsense account of the objects of experience by claiming that the immediate objects of experience are really always sense-data. The intentional theory (§3.3) deals with this issue by appealing to the idea of representation: perceptual experience represents an object as being a certain way, and therefore appears to have an act-object structure, even though its real structure is not like this. The question for the adverbial theory is how, on the resources it allows itself, it can account even for the appearance of an act-object structure within experience (see Martin 1998; Crane 2000). This objection really amounts to a challenge to the adverbial theory, rather than a knock-down objection.
The intentional theory of perception treats perceptual experience as a form of intentionality or mental representation (hence it is also sometimes called the representationalist theory of perception). “Intentionality” is a term with its origins in scholastic philosophy (see Crane 1998b), but its current use derives from Brentano (1874), who introduced the term “intentional inexistence” for the “mind's direction upon its objects”. Intentional inexistence, or intentionality, is sometimes explained as the “aboutness” of mental states (see the entries on Franz Brentano, representational theories of consciousness and intentionality). An intentional mental state is normally understood, therefore, as one which is about, or represents, something in the world. Since it is not generally true that when a representation represents something as being F, there has to actually be something which is F, it follows that someone who thinks of perception as a form of representation can reject the Phenomenal Principle (as discussed above: §3.1.2); and this is what an intentional theory of perception says. Illusions and hallucinations, according to the intentionalist, are simply misrepresentations. And while there is an important question of how to understand representation and misrepresentation in general, there is no special problem about perception.
Intentionalism accepts that when perception is veridical or illusory, the things which are perceived are the ordinary mind-independent objects around us. There are no intermediary objects of perception; veridical perception is “direct” perception. But the intentionalist theory of perception denies that the essential phenomenal character of a perceptual experience is essentially determined (wholly or partly) by the real objects which are perceived. This is because it holds that perception and hallucination are states with the same phenomenal character and therefore of the same mental kind; but in the case of hallucination there is no real object being perceived. So the relation to a real object cannot be essential to the perceptual experience. This is in keeping with a standard tradition in the theory of intentionality which treats it as non-relational (the tradition derives from Husserl 1900/1901; for discussion see Zahavi 2003: 13–27). The upshot is that the intentional theory of perception must deny that there is a relation to a real object is of the essence of a perceptual experience (see Crane 2006).
Intentionalists sometimes say (as Tye 1995 does) that the phenomenal character of an experience is entirely determined by the “content” of the experience. But if they hold, as Tye does, that a hallucination can be a state of the same essential kind as a perception, then the content of the experience cannot be the real objects which are perceived (for more on the notion of content, see §3.3.2 below).
There are many kinds of intentionalist theory of perception. Some of the most influential intentional theories are Anscombe (1965), Armstrong (1968), Dretske (1969), Pitcher (1970), Peacocke (1993), Harman (1990), Tye (1992, 1995), Lycan (1996); for more recent accounts, see Byrne (2001) and the entry on the contents of perception. Because of the important place which the intentionalist theory has occupied in recent discussions of perception, this section will be somewhat more detailed than the other sections in this entry.
Within analytic philosophy, the intentionalist theory of perception is a generalisation of an idea presented by G.E.M. Anscombe (1965), and the “belief theories” of D.M. Armstrong (1968) and George Pitcher (1970). (Within the phenomenological tradition intentionality and perception had always been discussed together: see the entry on phenomenology.) Anscombe had drawn attention to the fact that perceptual verbs satisfy the tests for non-extensionality or intensionality (see the entry on intensional transitive verbs). For example, just as ‘Vladimir is thinking about Pegasus’ is an intensional context, so ‘Vladimir has an experience as of a pink elephant in the room’ is an intensional context. In neither case can we infer that there exists something Vladimir is thinking about, or that there is exists something he is experiencing. This is the typical manifestation of intensionality. Anscombe regarded the error of sense-data and “direct realist” theories of perception as the failure to recognise this intensionality.
Armstrong and Pitcher argued that perception is a form of belief. (More precisely, they argued that it is the acquisition of a belief, since an acquisition is a conscious event, as perceiving is; rather than a state or condition, as belief is.) Belief is an intentional state in the sense that it represents the world to be a certain way, and the way it represents the world to be is said to be its intentional content. Perception, it was argued, is similarly a representation of the world, and the way it represents the world to be is likewise its intentional content. The fact that someone can have a perceptual experience that a is F without there being any thing which is F was taken as a reason for saying that perception is just a form of belief-acquisition.
The belief theory of perception (and related theories, like the judgement theory of Craig 1976) is a specific version of the intentional theory. But it is not the most widely accepted version. Everyone will agree that perception does give rise to beliefs about the environment. But this does not mean that perception is simply the acquisition of belief. One obvious reason why it isn't, discussed by Armstrong, is that one can have a perceptual illusion that things are a certain way even when one knows they are not (this phenomenon is sometimes called “the persistence of illusion”). The famous Müller-Lyer illusion presents two lines of equal length as if they were unequal. One can experience this even if one knows (and therefore believes) that the lines are the same length. If perception were simply the acquisition of belief, then this would be a case of explicitly contradictory beliefs: one believes that the lines are the same length and that they are different lengths. But this is surely not the right way to describe this situation. In the situation as described, one does not believe, in any sense, that the lines are different lengths. (Armstrong recognised this, and re-described perception as a “potential belief”; this marks a significant retreat from the original claim). So it is important to emphasis that the intentionalist theory is not committed to the view that perceptual experience is belief; experience can be a sui generis kind of intentional state or event (see Martin 1992–3).
Intentionalists hold that what is in common between perceptions and indistinguishable hallucinations is their intentional content: roughly speaking, how the world is represented as being by the experiences. Many intentionalists hold that the sameness of phenomenal character in perception and hallucination is exhausted or constituted by this sameness in content (see Tye 2000, Byrne 2001). But this latter claim is not essential to intentionalism (see the discussion of intentionalism and qualia below). What is essential is that the intentional content of perception explains (whether wholly or partly) its phenomenal character.
The intentional content of perception is sometimes called “perceptual content” (see the entry on the contents of perception). What is perceptual content? A standard approach to intentionality treats all intentional states as propositional attitudes: states which are ascribed by sentences of the form “S ___ that p” where ‘S’ is to be replaced by a term for a subject, ‘p’ with a sentence, and the ‘___’ with a psychological verb. The distinguishing feature of the propositional attitudes is that their content—how they represent the world to be—is something which is assessable as true or false. Hence the canonical form of ascriptions of perceptual experiences is: “S perceives/experiences that p”. Perception, on this kind of intentionalist view, is a propositional attitude (see Byrne 2001 for a recent defence of this idea).
But intentionalism is not committed to the view that perception is a propositional attitude. For one thing, it is controversial whether all intentional states are propositional attitudes (see Crane 2001: chapter 4). Among the intentional phenomena there are relations like love and hate which do not have propositional content; and there are also non-relational states expressed by the so-called “intensional transitive” verbs like seek, fear, expect (see the entry on intensional transitive verbs). All these states of mind have contents which are not, on the face of it, assessable as true or false. If I am seeking a bottle of inexpensive Burgundy, what I am seeking—the intentional content of my seeking, or the intentional object under a certain mode of presentation—is not something true or false. Some argue that these intentional relations and intentional transitives are analysable or reducible to propositional formulations (see Larson 2003 for an attempt to defend this view of intensional transitives; and Sainsbury 2010 for a less radical defence). But the matter is controversial; and it is especially controversial where perception is concerned. For we have many ways of talking about perception which do not characterise its content in propositional terms: for example, “Vladimir sees a snail on the grass”, “Vladimir notices a snail on the grass”, “Vladimir is watching a snail on the grass” can all be plausibly distinguished from the propositional formulation “Vladimir sees that there is a snail on the grass”. There are those who follow Dretske (1969) in claiming that these semantical distinctions express an important distinction between “epistemic” and “non-epistemic” seeing. However, the view that perceptual content is non-propositional is not the same as the view that it is “non-epistemic” in Dretske's sense. For ascriptions of non-epistemic seeing are intended to be fully extensional in their object positions, but not all non-propositional descriptions of perception need be (for example, some have argued that “Macbeth saw a dagger before him” does not entail “there is a dagger which Macbeth saw”: cf. Anscombe 1965). In any case, the question of whether perception has a propositional content is far from being settled, even for those who think it has intentional content (see McDowell 2008; Crane 2009).
Another debate about the content of perceptual experience– independent of the issue of whether it is propositional—is whether it is singular or general in nature (see Soteriou 2000; and for a more general discussion, see Chalmers 2006). A singular content is one that concerns a particular object, and such that it cannot be the content of a state of mind unless that object exists. Singular contents are also called “object-dependent”. A general content is one whose ability to be the content of any intentional state is not dependent on the existence of any particular object. General contents are also called “object-independent”. Those who think (like Snowdon 1992, McDowell 1994, Brewer 2000) that the content of perceptual experience can be expressed by a sentence containing an irreducible demonstrative pronoun (e.g., of the form “that F is G') will also argue that the content of experience is singular; those who think (like Davies 1992 and McGinn 1989) that the content of experience is general (e.g., of the form, “there is an F which is G”) are committed to its object-independence. It might seem that an intentionalist must say that the content of perception is wholly general. However, Burge (1991) has argued that any genuinely perceptual episode has an irreducibly singular element, even though the episode could share a component of content with a numerically distinct episode. Martin (2002) argues that the availability of this position shows that intentionalism could deny that the content of experience is wholly general.
The issue about whether the content of perceptual experience is singular or general is not simply about whether the existence of the experience entails or presupposes the existence of its object. An example will illustrate this. Suppose for the sake of argument that experience essentially involves the exercise of recognitional capacities, and I have a capacity to recognise the Queen. Let's suppose too that this is a general capacity which presupposes her existence. It is consistent with this to say that I could be in the same intentional state when I am hallucinating the Queen, as when I am perceiving her. Although the capacity might depend for its existence on the Queen's existence, not every exercise of the capacity need depend on the Queen's perceptual presence. The capacity can “misfire”. Hence intentionalism can hold that experiences are the same in the hallucinatory and veridical cases, even though the existence of the involved recognitional capacity presupposes the existence of the object recognised.
The objects of intentional states are sometimes called “intentional objects” (Crane 2001: chapter 1). What are the intentional objects of perceptual experience, according to intentionalists? In the case of veridical perception, the answer is simple: ordinary, mind-independent objects like the churchyard, the snow (etc.) and their properties. But what should be said about the hallucinatory case? Since this case is by definition one in which there is no mind-independent object being perceived, how can we even talk about something being an “object of experience” at all here? As noted above, intentionalists say that experiences are representations; and one can represent what does not exist (see Harman 1990, Tye 1992). This is certainly true; but isn't there any more to be said? For how does a representation of a non-existent churchyard differ from a representation of a non-existent garbage dump, say, when one of those is hallucinated? The states seem to have different objects; but neither of these objects exist (see the entry nonexistent-objects).
One proposal is that the objects of hallucinatory experience are the properties which the hallucinated object is presented as having (Johnston 2004). Another answer, deriving from ideas of the early 20th century phenomenologists, is to say that these hallucinatory states of mind have intentional objects which do not exist (Smith 2002: chapter 9). Intentional objects in this sense are not supposed to be entities or things of any kind. When we talk about perception and its “objects” in this context, we mean the word in the way it occurs in the phrase “object of thought” or “object of attention” and not as it occurs in the phrase “physical object”. So in this context, “object” does not mean “thing”, any more than “object of thought” means “thing of thought” (see Valberg 1992: 22). An intentional object is always an object for a subject, and this is not a way of classifying things in reality. An intentionalist need not be committed to intentional objects in this sense; but if they are not, then they owe an account of the content of hallucinatory experiences.
How does the content of perceptual experience differ from the content of other intentional states? According to some intentionalists, one main difference is that perception has “non-conceptual” content. The basic idea is that perception involves a form of mental representation which is in certain ways less sophisticated than the representation involved in (say) belief. In the case of belief, representation seems to involve concepts, in the sense that having a belief requires the exercise of conceptual capacities. For example, having the belief that the churchyard is covered in snow requires that one have the concept of a churchyard. This is what it means to say that belief has conceptual content: to have the belief with the content that a is F requires that one possess the concept a and the concept F. So to say perception has non-conceptual content is to say the following: to have a perception with the content that a is F does not require that one have the concept of a and the concept F. The idea is that one's perceptual experience can represent the world as being a certain way—the “a is F” way—even if one does not have the concepts that would be involved in believing that a is F. (For a more detailed version of this definition, see Crane 1998a and Cussins 1990; for a different way of understanding the idea of non-conceptual content, see Heck 2000 and Speaks 2005. The idea of non-conceptual content derives from Evans 1982; there are some similar ideas in Dretske 1981; see Gunther 2002 for a collection of articles on this subject. Other support for non-conceptual content can be found in Bermúdez 1997; Peacocke 1992; Crowther 2006; for opposition see Brewer 2000 and McDowell 1994a).
Critics of the intentional theory have argued that it does not adequately distinguish perception from other forms of intentionality, and therefore does not manage to capture what is distinctive about perception itself. (Interestingly, this sort of criticism has also come both from disjunctivists (McDowell 1994; Martin 2002) and from sense-data theorists (for example, Robinson 1994: 164).)
One objection of this kind is that intentionalists can give no account of the qualitative or sensory character of perceptual experience. Experiencing something, unlike thinking about it, has a certain “feel” to it. Yet, the objection runs, intentionalism has no resources to deal with this fact, since it explains perception in terms of representation, and merely representing something need have no particular “feel” whatsoever. Believing that something is the case, for example, or hoping that something is the case, are both forms of mental representation, but neither state of mind has any “feel” or qualitative character to call its own. (Words or images may come to mind when mentally representing something in this way, but it is not obvious that these are essential to the states of mind themselves.) So the challenge to the intentionalist is the following: if there is nothing about representation as such which explains the “feel” of a conscious perception, how is perception supposed to be distinguished from mere thought?
There are a number of ways an intentionalist can respond. One is simply to take it as a basic fact about perceptual intentionality that it has a qualitative or phenomenal character (see Horgan and Kriegel forthcoming). On this view, some intentional states have qualitative character (like perceptions, conscious thoughts or bodily sensations) and some do not (like unconscious beliefs); and this is a brute fact about intentionality which needs no further explanation. After all, this response continues, even those who believe in qualia have to accept that some states of mind have qualia and some do not, and that at some point the distinction between mental states which are conscious/qualitative, and those which are not, just has to be accepted as a brute fact.
Another response is to say that in order to explain the phenomenal character of perceptual experience, we need to treat perception as involving non-intentional qualia as well as intentionality (see Peacocke 1983: chapter 1; Shoemaker 1993; Block 1997). There is, accordingly, a dispute between these intentionalists who accept qualia (like Block and Shoemaker) and those who don't (like Harman 1990 or Tye 1992). The first kind of intentionalist holds that in addition to its intentional properties, perceptual experience also involves qualia; the second kind denies this. Intentionalists of the second kind, like Harman and Tye, have argued that we are never aware of qualia when we introspect our perceptual experiences. In response, the first kind of intentionalist concedes that although it is not immediately obvious from introspection that there are qualia, arguments can be provided based on thought-experiments, which after careful attention to the deliverances of introspection, show that intrinsic qualia are manifest in experience. (See the discussion of “the transparency of experience” in §2.1.3 above; and for a critical discussion see Spener 2003.)
It is not possible to give an exhaustive examination of all these arguments here, but we can take one as representative: the inverted spectrum argument (see the entry on inverted qualia). This argument is based on an ancient speculation: that it is possible that two people's colour experience could vary massively and systematically and that this difference be undetectable from the third person perspective (see Shoemaker 1996). For example, consider two people Alice and Bob, whose colour perceptions are inverted relative to one another. Whenever Alice sees something red, Bob sees something blue and vice versa. Yet Alice and Bob each call all the same things “red”, and arguably believe that all the same things are red (fire engines, poppies etc.). It can further be argued that the representational or intentional content of their belief that fire engines are red is derived from the representational content of their perception that fire engines are red, since this belief is a perceptual belief. What then explains their mental difference? Defenders of qualia say that what explains this is the difference in the qualia of their mental states. Alice and Bob are intentionally or representationally identical—they represent the world in the same way—they differ in the non-representational qualia of their experience. (Intentionalists who deny qualia will dispute this by saying that the difference between Alice and Bob is indeed a representational difference: see Tye 2000 and Hilbert and Kalderon 2000. For more on the inverted spectrum, see Block 2007, Egan 2006, Marcus 2006. For other thought-experiments attempting to establish qualia, see Block 1997, Peacocke 1983).
Others object to intentionalism on the grounds that it cannot do justice to one of the sources of the problem of perception: the apparent fact of openness to the world. Although many intentionalists accept that the objects of experience are all ordinary mind-independent public objects, they do not treat these objects as essential to experience, and therefore, the critics argue, they risk putting the mind “out of touch” with reality. John McDowell (1987), for example, has argued that an intentionalist theory of perception is no better than a sense-data theory in being able to do justice to the intuition of openness, since both theories understand the essence of perception in terms of a state of mind which is not essentially world-involving. McDowell claims that intentionalists thereby lose genuine perceptual intentionality—genuine perceptual content with objects—and are left with “darkness within” and the threat of Cartesian scepticism (see McDowell 1987: 250). Intentionalists typically respond by arguing that the very idea of perception representation as such does not lead to a veil of perception, any more than the very idea of linguistic representation leads to a “veil of words” (see §3.1.2 above, and Millar 1996 for a detailed response).
In general, the intentionalist theory of perception attempts to solve the problem of perception by appealing to the idea of intentionality or representation. Perceptual experience is not really openness to the world, in the sense that it does not essentially involve a relation to its objects. But the intentionalist's claim is that experience, like other forms of intentionality, does involve the appearance of a relation. The criticisms considered here each attack the intentionalist's proposed solution by attacking its account of the phenomenology of experience: the “qualia”-based attack argues that intentionalism ignores the qualitative element in experience, while the “veil of perception” attack argues that intentionalism ignores the importance of the intuition of openness.
The disjunctivist theory of perception holds that the objects of genuine perception are mind-independent; and that the phenomenal character of a genuinely perceptual experience depends upon these objects. It also accepts that illusion and hallucination are possible. But the conjunction of all these views is not inconsistent, according to disjunctivism, because it also denies that genuine perception and a subjectively indistinguishable hallucination are mental states of the same fundamental psychological kind. The disjunctivist therefore rejects what Martin (2004) calls the “common kind assumption” about perception:
whatever fundamental kind of mental event occurs when one is veridically perceiving some scene can occur whether or not one is perceiving.
The disjunctive theory does not deny that there is some true description under which both the perception of a snow-covered churchyard and a subjectively indistinguishable hallucination of a churchyard can fall. It is easy to provide such a true description: both experiences are experiences which are subjectively indistinguishable from a perception of a snow-covered churchyard. Disjunctivists do not deny that such a true description is available. What they deny is that what makes it true that these two experiences are describable in this way is the presence of the same fundamental kind of mental state in the case of perception and hallucination. In the case of the perception, what makes it true that the description applies is that the experience is a perception of the churchyard; in the hallucinatory case, what makes it true that the description applies is that the experience is a hallucination of the churchyard. What the disjunctivist rejects is what J.M. Hinton calls “the doctrine of the ‘experience’ as the common element in a given perception” and an indistinguishable hallucination (Hinton 1973: 71). The most fundamental common description of both states, then, is a merely disjunctive one: the experience is either a genuine perception of a churchyard or a mere hallucination of one. Hence the theory's name.
The theory was first proposed by Hinton (1973) and was later developed by P.F. Snowdon (1979), John McDowell (1982 and 1987) and M.G.F. Martin (2002, 2003a). In an endorsement of the theory, Putnam claims that the distinctive feature of disjunctivism is “that there is nothing literally in common” in perception and hallucination, “that is, no identical quality” (1999: 152). But disjunctivism does not have to say this, and most disjunctivists do not. Disjunctivists may (and do) allow that there is something literally in common between a perception of an X and a hallucination of an X—each state is subjectively indistinguishable from a perception of an X—and to that extent they exhibit a common “quality”. As McDowell says, “the uncontentiously legitimate category of things that are the same across the different cases is the category of how things seem to the subject” (McDowell 1987: 157). But what the members of this category have in common is not that they are all the same kind of experience in any substantial or psychologically significant sense. It is rather that to be a member of this category, a state of mind merely has to satisfy a disjunctive condition of the kind described in the previous paragraph. But a disjunctive condition like this does not specify a fundamental kind of mental state—each disjunct belongs to a more fundamental kind (perception and hallucination respectively).
Disjunctivists need not deny either that there is a common physical state—for example, a brain state—shared by the perceiver and the hallucinator. What they will deny is that the state of perceiving an object is identical with, or supervenes upon, this physical state (though they could accept a more global supervenience thesis of the mental state on the subject's body plus environment). This is because perceiving an object is an essentially relational state, of which the object perceived is a constituent; in other words, the perception is constitutively dependent on the object perceived. In this way, disjunctivism resembles the sense-datum theory, except that the object in question is an ordinary mind-independent object rather than a sense-datum. And in holding that mind-independent objects are directly perceived, disjunctivism resembles the intentionalist theory, except that it denies that the sort of state which constitutes perceiving could be had in the absence of such an object. Whereas the intentionalist sees the properties experienced in all perceptual experience as represented, the disjunctivist sees these properties as instantiated in the objects of perception, and as merely represented in hallucination (see Martin 2002: 392–5 for these claims). Disjunctivists tend to argue that only by seeing properties as instantiated in this way can we do justice to the sense in which perception is the presentation as opposed to the representation of its objects (see the discussion of this contrast by Searle 1983: 45–6 (a non-disjunctivist) and the commentary on this by McDowell 1994).
Disjunctivism achieves this compromise between what is plausible in the sense-datum and intentionalist theories by denying the common kind assumption. But what are the positive reasons for believing in disjunctivism? Since the essential feature of the theory is its denial of the common kind assumption, in looking for support for the theory we should look for arguments against this assumption.
Some defenders of disjunctivism have claimed that there is a relatively simple argument against the common kind assumption. Putnam, for example, has argued that since the common kind is defined by subjective indistinguishability, and since subjective indistinguishability is not transitive, then it cannot define a sufficient condition for the identity of states of mind, since identity is transitive (Putnam 1999: 130). The argument that subjective indistinguishability is not transitive derives from the so-called “phenomenal sorites” argument: the possibility that there could be a series of (say) colour samples, arranged in a sequence such that adjacent pairs were subjectively indistinguishable but that the first and last members of the series were distinguishable. Hence sample 1 could be subjectively indistinguishable from sample 2, and so on; and sample 99 could be subjectively indistinguishable from sample 100, but sample 1 nonetheless be subjectively distinguishable from sample 100. Those who want to defend the common kind assumption need, therefore, to respond to this argument; one way is to follow Graff (2001), and argue that the phenomenal sorites argument is in fact fallacious.
Other disjunctivists do not attack the common kind assumption directly, but rather embrace its rejection as a necessary consequence of accepting other assumptions about perception and experience. McDowell has argued that it is only by accepting disjunctivism that we can give an adequate account of how the mind is genuinely in touch with reality: all other theories give rise to something like the “veil of perception” problem (see §3.1.3, and §3.3.3) and therefore leave open the possibility of a sceptical attack on our knowledge of the external world. The way to avoid this is to reject the idea of experience as constituting the “highest common factor” in perception and hallucination (for a similar motivation, see McCulloch 2003). In response, it could be objected that even if perception were world-involving in the way the disjunctivist says, this would not be an answer to scepticism. For subjects would not be able to tell merely by having an experience whether they were perceiving or not, and therefore sceptical worries could be raised about the subjects' knowledge of their own mental states which are parallel to the original worries about knowledge of the external world.
Taking a different approach, Martin (2002: 421) argues that each of the main theories of perception is an “error theory” of perception (in J.L. Mackie's (1977) sense). That is, each theory convicts common sense of an error about perception: for example, the sense-datum theory convicts common sense of making the erroneous assumption that perception is a direct awareness of mind-independent objects. Against this background, Martin argues that abandoning the common kind assumption is the least revisionary position among all the possible responses to the problem of perception, and thus follows Hinton (1973) in holding the disjunctivist position to be the default starting point for discussions of perception (Martin 2004). In other words, the disjunctivist position best accommodates our pre-theoretical conception of perception—the conception described above as “openness to the world”. This approach can concede that the common kind assumption also has some pre-theoretical, intuitive appeal; but it will insist that rejecting it involves less of a departure from the phenomenological data than rejecting the idea that the fundamental perceptual phenomenon is a relation to a mind-independent world. This idea is a consequence of accepting the common kind assumption. The common kind assumption says that perceptions and hallucinations are states of the same fundamental kind, and hence it follows that this kind of state cannot be a relation to mind-independent objects. This inference is accepted, in one way or another, by the sense-data, adverbial and intentionalist theories. The disjunctivist, by contrast, wishes to preserve the intuition of openness to the world, and therefore denies the common kind assumption.
The striking feature of disjunctivism is its implicit or explicit denial that what is in common between perception and a matching hallucination is of any psychological (or on some views, epistemic) significance. As we saw, disjunctivists will typically say that there is something in common between perception and hallucination—the state of being subjectively indistinguishable from a perception—but they will deny that this is a significant or fundamental kind of mental state. Criticisms of disjunctivism often put pressure on the theory at this point. Hence Sturgeon, for example (1998, 2000, chapter 1), has argued that unlike other theories of perception, disjunctivism cannot account for the apparent fact that both perception and hallucination can be (subjective) reasons for beliefs or actions. For example: I perceive a rabbit and gain the belief that there is a rabbit there; this together with my other attitudes might give me a reason to chase it. Sturgeon argues that the same collections of reasons could be present if I were merely hallucinating a rabbit rather than perceiving one. But how does disjunctivism explain this if it cannot appeal to a common experience which can be a reason in both cases, and thus a state of psychological significance? The background assumption here is that people's intentional actions, we tend to think, are explained by their psychological states. If we identify mental states as the same when (ceteris paribus) they lead to the same action, then we have a reason to count the hallucination as being a state of a significantly similar kind to that of the perception, and this is a reason for believing in the common kind assumption. (This kind of argument is an instance of a more general style of argument against externalism: see Segal 1989.) Disjunctivists may respond that that the assumption of this argument—that the common state always provides a better psychological explanation of the action—is actually not true. On this view, externally individuated relational states—like knowledge and genuine factive perception—sometimes provide better explanations than internalist, intrinsic states (see Williamson 2000: 60–64; see also Yablo 1997).
Other criticisms of disjunctivism focus on what the theory says about the hallucinatory case. One example is the complaint that the disjunctivist has not given an adequate account of what the hallucinatory case is, and to that extent the theory is incomplete. Jonathan Dancy makes this point:
In the standard formulation of the account … the second disjunct is characterized … solely by saying that it is like what it is not. Presumably, however, there may be available a more direct characterization of the second disjunct, and in a totally explicit version of the theory it would indeed be characterized in that better way. The current characterization is just a sort of place-holder, showing what has to be said about the relation between the first and second disjunct. (1995: 425)
In response, disjunctivists can argue that this challenge actually misrepresents their view (see Martin 2004). For part of the point of disjunctivism is to characterise what genuine perception is, and to show how this can be done without assuming a substantial conception of the “common factor” between perception and hallucination: that is, a conception of a common state which can play a significant psychological or explanatory role. But if Dancy's challenge were answered, by giving a positive account of the hallucinatory experience (for example, in terms of qualia), then this would amount to giving a substantial account of the common factor between perception and hallucination. And this is what the disjunctivist says cannot be done; so they should reject this presupposition of Dancy's challenge. (Note that it is not relevant to this that one can give, say, a neuroscientific account of the hallucinatory experience; this should be agreed on all sides. Dancy's challenge is asking for a phenomenological account of the experience.)
In a somewhat different vein, Smith (2002 chapter 8) argues that disjunctivism fails to give any account of the object of a hallucinatory experience, and therefore is committed to the counter-intuitive view that in hallucination one is literally not aware of anything. To this the disjunctivist can respond that this is a tendentious way of expressing their view. Certainly, there is no real thing of which one is aware in a hallucination; so if “x is aware of y” entails that there is some real thing of which x is aware, then it is true that the hallucinating subject is not aware of anything. But this is equally true on an intentionalist account of hallucination. What the disjunctivist should say is that the fact that one is not aware of any real thing does not mean that there is no state of awareness in the hallucinatory case; there is a state of awareness which has an apparent object, and it can be described in being subjectively indistinguishable from a perception of a real such object.
The disjunctivist can reply that all that is essential to the relationshio between hallucination and perception is that the subject who is in a hallucinatory state cannot know by reflection that they are not perceiving (Martin 2004). This defines what is in common between a perception and a hallucination purely in terms of what the subject is in a position to know by reflection on their current mental condition. Siegel (2004) has raised the objection that it is hard to see how this conception of hallucination can be applied to perceiving creatures who are not sophisticated enough to reflect on their own condition. Yet it seems to make sense to suppose that creatures such as dogs can in principle have hallucinations of the relevant kind (for Martin's response, see Martin 2006, and for an alternative conception of hallucination, see Fish 2009).
The disjunctivist thinks of the fundamental phenomenon of perception as being a relation to the objects of perception. The intentionalist, by contrast, sees the fundamental perceptual phenomenon as representation of the world. (For this contrast between relational and representational views of experience, see Campbell 2002; and for a survey of this central theme see Nudds 2009.) But on both views, it is very natural to describe the hallucinatory experience as involving representation, or representational/intentional content, in some sense. For example, it is natural to describe the hallucination of a rabbit as representing that there is a rabbit in one's perceived environment. The content of one's experience might then be expressed by saying “that's a rabbit over there”. If the disjunctivist accepts this description of the hallucinatory case, then critics of disjunctivism can put pressure on the theory by asking why such an intentional content isn't also present in the phenomenologically indistinguishable case? Isn't it ad hoc, the intentionalist will say, for the disjunctivist to accept that there is a content in the one case and not in the other, especially since there seems to be explanatory work done by such a common content? It is around questions like this that the debate between intentionalists and disjunctivists continues. (For more on disjunctivism, see the two anthologies: Haddock and Macpherson 2008, Byrne and Logue 2009, and the entry on the Disjunctive Theory of Perception)
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The 20th century literature on perception is vast and confusing. Any serious attempt to master the literature on the problem of perception should include a reading of Anscombe (1965), Armstrong (1968: chapter 10), Dretske (1969), Jackson (1977), Martin (2002), Moore (1905), Peacocke (1983: chapter 1), Russell (1912), Snowdon (1979–80), Strawson (1979), Tye (1992), Valberg (2002a). Some of these are contained in the very useful collection of essays, contemporary and classic, edited by Noë and Thompson (2002); Dancy (1988) is a useful collection too, although now out of print. Robinson (1994) is a very clear introduction to many of the problems of perception, including a trenchant defence of the sense-data theory. Smith (2002) is a thorough and original, though very readable, attempt to solve the problem of perception (as conceived in this entry). Two recent anthologies which concern intentionalism and disjunctivism respectively are Gendler and Hawthorne (eds.) 2006, and Haddock and Macpherson (eds.) 2008.
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- Illusions Gallery, maintained by David Landrigan (University of Massachusetts Lowell).
- Akiyoshi's Illusion Pages: The Latest Works, maintained by Akiyoshi Kitaoka (Ritsumeikan University).
- Edward Adelson's illusion pages, by Edward Adelson, MIT.
Brentano, Franz | causation: the metaphysics of | color | consciousness | consciousness: and intentionality | consciousness: representational theories of | intensional transitive verbs | intentionality | mental representation | perception: epistemological problems of | perception: the contents of | perception: the disjunctive theory of | phenomenology | qualia | qualia: inverted | sense-data | Wittgenstein, Ludwig
I am very grateful to Tim Bayne, David Chalmers, Katalin Farkas, Mike Martin and Susanna Siegel for their comments on previous versions of this entry.