The Disjunctive Theory of Perception

First published Fri Jul 10, 2009; substantive revision Tue Apr 1, 2014

Perceptual experiences are often divided into the following three broad categories: veridical perceptions, illusions, and hallucinations. For example, when one has a visual experience as of a red object, it may be that one is really seeing an object and its red colour (veridical perception), that one is seeing a green object (illusion), or that one is not seeing an object at all (hallucination). Many maintain that the same account should be given of the nature of the conscious experience that occurs in each of these three cases. Those who hold a disjunctive theory of perception deny this. Disjunctivists typically reject the claim that the same kind of experience is common to all three cases because they hold views about the nature of veridical perception that are inconsistent with it.

Disjunctivists are often naïve realists, who hold that when one perceives the world, the mind-independent objects of perception, such as tables and trees, are constituents of one's experience. In other cases, such as hallucinations, it seems out of the question that such objects are constituents of one's experience. It follows that on a naïve realist view, the veridical perceptions and hallucinations in question have a different nature: the former have mind-independent objects as constituents, and the latter do not.

1. Introduction

Disjunctivists and their opponents agree that veridical perceptions, illusions and hallucinations have something in common, in so far as they agree that such mental events should be grouped together as being perceptual experiences. They also agree that there are differences to be marked between them, hence the different labels for them. However, they disagree when it comes to specifying what these commonalities and differences consist in. What distinguishes the disjunctivist theory is its rejection of a ‘common kind claim’—the claim that the conscious perceptual experiences that are involved in cases of veridical perception, illusion and hallucination have the same nature. If one accepts that the same kind of conscious experience occurs in all three cases, then this imposes a constraint on the account one can give of the kind of conscious event that occurs when one veridically perceives the world. Disjunctivists deny that our accounts of veridical perception should be constrained in this way. So the disjunctivist view of perceptual experience can be regarded as a negative thesis—the rejection of a common kind claim—that is adopted in defence of a positive view of veridical perception.

Those who hold a disjunctive theory of perception do not deny that it is possible to have a hallucination of an F that is subjectively indistinguishible from a veridical perception of an F. That is, they do not deny that it is possible for one to have a hallucination such that one cannot tell through introspection alone that it is not a veridical perception of an F. So associated with the disjunctivist's metaphysical stance, namely the rejection of the common kind claim, is an epistemological proposal that emphasises limitations on a subject's capacity to tell what kind of experience he is undergoing on the basis of introspection alone. For example, J.M. Hinton, an early proponent of the disjunctive theory, acknowledges that both a hallucination of an F and a veridical perception of an F can appear, from the inside, to be a veridical perception of an F. However, he holds that it is a mistake to assume that this appearance is to be explained by the thesis that these experiences share a common nature that is manifest to one when has the experiences.

Hinton is generally credited with being the first to demarcate clearly the disjunctivist stance, and the fact that the disjunctive theory of perception is so named is due to his way of framing the view. Hinton (1967 and 1973) argued that we should understand a statement about how things sensorily appear to a subject to be equivalent to a disjunctive statement that either one is veridically perceiving such and such or one is suffering an illusion (or hallucination); and such statements are not to be regarded as making a report about a distinctive mental event or state that is common to these disjoint situations. (For discussion of the historical significance of Hinton, see Snowdon 2008). The disjunctive approach to perceptual experience was later developed by Paul Snowdon (1980–81), John McDowell (1982), and M.G.F. Martin (2002), among others.

2. Varieties of Disjunctivism

There are some significant differences between some of the views that fall under the disjunctivist label. Disjunctivists are united in their rejection of a common kind claim, and they generally adopt this stance because they hold views about the nature of veridical perception that they take to be inconsistent with it. However, not all disjunctivists are in agreement over the account that should be given of veridical perception, and not all disjunctivists are in agreement over the question of the accounts that should be given of hallucinations and illusions. The different disjunctivist proposals about illusion and hallucination are discussed in section 5. This section focuses on some of the main differences between the accounts that disjunctivists offer of the relevant features that they claim veridical perceptions have, and which they claim hallucinations lack.

The fact that there are some significant differences between some of the views that fall under the disjunctivist label can introduce complications when it comes to trying to formulate more precisely a distinctively disjunctivist commitment that is common to all of them. So first (in section 2.1) some further remarks are in order concerning some of the different ways in which disjunctivism in general has been formulated in the literature. When it comes to assessing arguments that are presented as being either for or against disjunctivism it is obviously going to be important to be sensitive to the question of which formulation of disjunctivism is in play. Given that many who adopt a disjunctivist position do so in defence of a particular account of veridical perception, it will also be important to assess which disjunctivist commitment, if any, is actually entailed by their view of the nature of veridical perception.

2.1 Ways of Formulating Disjunctivism

2.1.1 Fundamental Kind Disjunctivism

Disjunctivists maintain that veridical perceptions and hallucinations are mental events (or states) of different kinds. However, we need further clarification of what this claim amounts to, for there is an understanding of this claim that it may be open to a non-disjunctivist to accept as well. For example, the non-disjunctivist can accept that the terms ‘veridical perception’ and ‘hallucination’ mark useful distinctions between perceptual experiences that may, in certain contexts, be of explanatory significance. So the non-disjunctivist may agree that there is a sense in which veridical perceptions and hallucinations can be thought of as perceptual experiences of different kinds. For similar reasons the disjunctivist can agree that there is a sense in which veridical perceptions and hallucinations can be thought of as experiences of the same kind. For disjunctivists do not in general deny that veridical perceptions and hallucinations can have anything in common.

One formulation of disjunctivism invokes the notion of a fundamental kind. (This formulation is principally due to Martin, but see also Snowdon 2005a, p. 136). According to this formulation, the disjunctivist is committed to denying that veridical perceptions, illusions and hallucinations are conscious events of the same fundamental kind. The assumption here is that for mental events, there is a most specific answer to the question, ‘What is it?’ that tells us what essentially the mental event is, and thereby specifies its fundamental kind. On this formulation, the disjunctivist is committed to denying that whatever fundamental kind of conscious event occurs when one is veridically perceiving the world, that kind of event can occur whether or not one is veridically perceiving. Let us call a view of this sort fundamental kind disjunctivism.

While those who advocate this form of disjunctivism reject a common kind claim, namely the claim that veridical perceptions and hallucinations are mental events of the same fundamental kind, they may allow that veridical perceptions and hallucinations have something in common. So they may allow that there is a kind K that veridical perceptions and hallucinations can both instantiate. However, what they deny is that such a kind K is the fundamental kind of conscious event occurring when a subject veridically perceives the world.

Not all accept the metaphysical assumption that mental events (or states) have a ‘fundamental’ kind. A disjunctive theory of perception is often adopted in defence of a particular account of veridical perception, such as naïve realism, and Byrne and Logue (2008) question whether any controversial claim about fundamental kinds is needed in order to defend a naïve realist view of veridical perception. They suggest that one may hold a naïve realist view according to which mind-independent objects, such as tables and trees, are constituents of the experience one has when one veridically perceives the world, without being committed to a further claim about what the essence of such episodes consists in. They also note that naïve realism is often motivated by phenomenological considerations, and they question whether introspective reflection on the phenomenology of the experience one has when one veridically perceives the world puts one in a position to learn anything about the essence of the experience one is having.

2.1.2 The ‘Distinct Mental Feature’ Formulation

Those who reject the metaphysical assumption that mental events (or states) have a ‘fundamental’ kind may instead formulate their disjunctivist stance in terms of the claim that the differences between the kind of mental event that occurs when one veridically perceives the world and the kind of mental event that occurs when one hallucinates are due to differences in mental features of the events in question. The thought here is that the fact that there is a respect in which two mental events (or states) are different may not be due to the fact that they differ in some mental respect, and while we might type mental events and states in a variety of different ways, for a variety of different purposes, we can distinguish a way of classifying such events and states that focuses solely on their mental features. For example, although there may be a context in which it suits our purposes to group together the beliefs of a subject that are true, it is not generally thought that a belief's being true is a mental feature of that state.

According to this alternative way of formulating disjunctivism, the disjunctivist holds that veridical perceptions and hallucinations differ mentally in some significant respect—i.e., there are certain mental features that veridical perceptions have that hallucinations cannot have. So the disjunctivist rejects the claim that the differences between a case of veridical perception and a case of hallucination can simply be due to differences in the extra-mental states of affairs that obtain in those situations. Note, however, that this formulation of the disjunctivist commitment leaves open the possibility that veridical perceptions and hallucinations can have at least some mental features in common. There is a sense, then, in which it thereby leaves open the possibility that there can be a common mental element to veridical perception and hallucination. Byrne and Logue (2008 and 2009) apply the label ‘moderate’ to a view that accepts the claim that veridical perception and hallucination are different in significant mental respects, despite having a common mental element.

2.1.3 The ‘No-Common-Mental-Element’ Formulation

Byrne and Logue (2008) propose that the label ‘metaphysical disjunctivism’ be reserved for an account of perceptual experience that commits to the claim there is no common mental element to veridical perception and hallucination. According to Byrne and Logue, those who deny that veridical perceptions and hallucinations are mental events of the same fundamental kind (see section 2.1) are not thereby committed to ‘metaphysical disjunctivism’, as Byrne and Logue use this label. For as they point out, those who reject the claim that veridical perceptions and hallucinations are mental events of the same fundamental kind need not deny that there is a common mental element to veridical perception and hallucination. So it is worth bearing in mind the particular use to which Byrne and Logue put the label ‘metaphysical disjunctivism’, as others would naturally characterise fundamental kind disjunctivism as a metaphysical disjunctivist thesis.

As we've seen, the issue of how precisely to formulate a distinctively disjunctivist commitment is not uncontroversial. For now we can at least say that the minimal commitment of a view that can be labelled a disjunctivist theory of perception is that veridical perceptions and hallucinations differ mentally in some significant respect—i.e., there are certain mental features that veridical perceptions have that hallucinations cannot have. So we can mark some of the differences between views that fall under the disjunctivist label by invoking the notion of ‘disjunctivism about X’, where X is the relevant mental feature that it is claimed differs in cases of veridical perception and hallucination. This procedure is adopted in the following two sections. If the disjunctivist about X makes the additional claim that the particular mental feature, X, that is unique to the case of veridical perception is essential to the fundamental kind of mental event it is, then they will also be a fundamental kind disjunctivist. Furthermore, if they deny that there is a common mental element to veridical perception and hallucination they will satisfy the ‘no-common-mental-element’ formulation of disjunctivism, otherwise they will hold a view the sort of view that Byrne and Logue label ‘moderate’.

2.2 Disjunctivism about Intentional Content

According to an intentionalist account of perceptual experience, our perceptual experiences are mental events (or states) with intentional contents that represent the world as being a certain way. The disjunctivist who accepts this general approach to perceptual experience may hold that a veridical perception has an intentional content that a hallucination cannot have. For example this sort of disjunctivist may hold that the intentional content of a veridical perception is constitutively dependent on mind-independent objects, while the intentional content of a hallucination is not.

One route to this view proceeds through the claims that a veridical perception of the world is a perceptual state with an intentional content containing demonstrative elements that refer to the mind-independent items in the environment that are perceived, and that truth-evaluable intentional contents with demonstrative elements that successfully refer are object-dependent. On this view, a particular experience E that is a veridical perception of a particular mind-independent object O will have an intentional content with a demonstrative element that successfully refers to O, and a distinct particular experience E* will have an intentional content with the same veridicality conditions only if its intentional content contains a demonstrative element that also refers to O. If E* is a hallucination it will not have an intentional content with a demonstrative element that successfully refers to O, so it will not have an intentional content with the same veridicality conditions as E. Suppose we now add the following assumption: If two experiences have intentional contents which differ in their veridicality conditions, then this is not just a respect in which these mental events differ, it is also amounts to a difference in their mental kinds. We can now derive the conclusion that veridical perceptions and hallucinations are experiences of different mental kinds. This last assumption needs to be made explicit, as it is not agreed upon by all (e.g., Burge 1993, 2005 and 2010). Note that acceptance of the assumption would also commit one to the following claim: If E* is a veridical perception of numerically distinct object O*, then E and E* are to be regarded as experiences of different mental kinds even if O and O* are perceptually indiscernible to the subject who perceives them.

Someone who holds this sort of view may claim that it is possible for a veridical perception and a hallucination to have the same phenomenal character. For they may claim that it is possible for experiences to have the same phenomenal character despite the fact that they do not have the same intentional content. According to the terminology that Byrne and Logue adopt (see section 2.1.2) this would make the view a moderate one. Someone adopting the moderate approach might claim that hallucinations have an existentially quantified intentional content and veridical perceptions also have a layer of content that is existential. They might then hold that this layer of existential content, which is present in experience whether or not one is veridically perceiving the world, provides a common mental factor for veridical and hallucinatory experiences.

Tye (2007) favours a different ‘moderate’ approach. He holds that veridical perceptions have object-dependent singular intentional contents that hallucinations cannot have, and he holds that veridical perceptions and hallucinations can have the same phenomenal character. However, he rejects the claim that there is a layer of existential content that provides a common mental factor for veridical and hallucinatory experiences. According to Tye, veridical perceptions and hallucinations have intentional contents that represent clusters of properties. In the case of veridical perception the cluster of properties is represented within a content that is singular and object-dependent, whereas in the case of hallucination the cluster of properties is represented within a content that is ‘gappy’. Tye's suggestion is that veridical perceptions and hallucinations have contents with a common structure, and this structure may be conceived as having a slot in it for an object. In the case of veridical perception the slot is filled by the object perceived, and in the case of hallucination the slot is empty, and hence the content is ‘gappy’. Tye claims that the phenomenal character of a given visual experience is the cluster of properties represented by that experience. And he claims that this is why veridical perceptions and hallucinations can have the same phenomenal character.

2.3 Disjunctivism about Phenomenal Character

Some disjunctivists claim that veridical perceptions have a phenomenal character that hallucinations cannot possess. For example, according to one version of naïve realism (what we might call ‘naïve realism about phenomenal character’), when one veridically perceives the world, the mind-independent items perceived, such as tables and trees and the properties they manifest to one when perceived, partly constitute one's conscious experience, and hence determine its phenomenal character. This sort of naïve realist view is primarily motivated by phenomenological considerations. The suggestion is that this view best articulates how sensory experience seems to us to be through introspective reflection. According to those who propose this form of naïve realism one cannot provide an adequate account of the phenomenal character of veridical perception by simply appealing to the idea that such experience has an intentional content that represents the world as being a certain way, even if one holds that the intentional content in question is object-dependent; nor can one provide an adequate account of the phenomenal character of veridical perception by simply adding to this the claim that experience possesses further non-representational properties that it could possess independently of whether any mind-independent objects are being perceived. The naïve realist about phenomenal character instead claims that the right account of the phenomenal character of veridical perception should appeal to the idea that such experience relates to the mind-independent items perceived in a non-representational manner. (The motivations for this view are discussed in section 3.3).

Since this naïve realist account of phenomenal character cannot be applied to hallucination, those who propose it are committed to the claim that the kind of phenomenally conscious experience that occurs when one veridically perceives the world does not occur when one is hallucinating. These naïve realists can accept that veridical perceptions of numerically distinct objects can have the same phenomenal character, but they deny that veridical perceptions and hallucinations have the same phenomenal character. They must then say that hallucinations that are subjectively indistinguishible from veridical perceptions do not have the kind of phenomenal character that introspective reflection suggests. Some disjunctivists allow that some hallucinations that are subjectively indistinguishible from veridical perceptions have no phenomenal character (e.g., Fish 2008 and 2009; and see also Sturgeon 2006 and 2008), but this is not a commitment of all disjunctivists about phenomenal character. (For further discussion, see section 5.1)

2.4 Epistemological Disjunctivism

Some disjunctivist views are primarily motivated by epistemological considerations, rather than phenomenological ones. According to one approach what is fundamental to the nature of a veridical perception is the fact that it belongs to an epistemically distinguished class of perceptual experiences. Those advocating this form of disjunctivism place emphasis on the idea that when one veridically perceives the world one has a distinctive form of epistemic contact with the mind-independent world, and one's experience provides one with grounds for making knowledgeable perceptual judgements about the mind-independent world that would be lacking if one were merely hallucinating. On this view it is a mistake to assume that the epistemic grounds that a veridical perception can provide one with for making judgements about the world are no better than the epistemic grounds that are available to one when one has a subjectively indistinguishible hallucination. Moreover, according to this view, the epistemic difference between a veridical perception and a subjectively indistinguishible hallucination is not to be explained by simply citing factors that are external to the subjective experiential state one is in when one veridically perceives the world. Rather, the epistemic difference is due to the fact that the kind of subjective experiential state one is in when one veridically perceives the world is not the same as the kind of subjective experiential state one is in when one has a subjectively indistinguishible hallucination.

Byrne and Logue (2008) and Snowdon (2005a) argue that that this sort of epistemologically motivated view need not preclude the idea that it is possible to identify a perceptual state that is common to veridical perception and hallucination. The suggestion is that one can accept the claim that there is an epistemically distinguished category of experiential state that can only obtain when one veridically perceives the world, and yet one can consistently maintain that it is also possible to identify a kind of perceptual state, of which some positive account can be given, which can obtain whether one is veridically perceiving the world, or merely having a subjectively indistinguishible hallucination. One can therefore be an epistemological disjunctivist without accepting metaphysical disjunctivism. However, note that if one holds that the epistemological feature that is present in the case of veridical perception and lacking in the case of hallucination is fundamental to the kind of mental state it is, then this would make one a fundamental kind disjunctivist. (See section 2.1.1)

John McDowell is an epistemological disjunctivist and some have suggested that the view he espouses does not commit him to metaphysical disjunctivism. (For discussion of this claim see Snowdon 2005a, Byrne and Logue 2008, and Haddock and McPherson 2008b). Millar (2007 and 2008) explicitly endorses the claim that we should accept a form of epistemological disjunctivism about perceptual knowledge without being committed to metaphysical disjunctivism. (For more general discussion of epistemological disjunctivism, see Pritchard 2012).

3. Arguments for Disjunctivism

3.1 Hinton's Argument for Disjunctivism as the Default View

When J.M. Hinton first introduced discussion of the disjunctive view of experience his primary concern was to identify and undermine what he took to be a substantive assumption in much philosophical theorising about perception. His target was the assumption that veridical perception and subjectively indistinguishible hallucination have the same intrinsic nature. In particular, his target was the assumption that the fact that a hallucination can be subjectively indistinguishible from a veridical perception is to be explained by the thesis that these experiences share a common nature that is manifest to one when has the experiences. Hinton does not try to prove directly that this ‘common element’ assumption is false. Instead, he tries to argue that it is unwarranted, and that his alternative, disjunctivist approach to perceptual experience should be our default view. M.G.F. Martin has also argued that the disjunctive account of experience should be our default view. Martin's argument to this effect is discussed in section 3.3. This section focuses on Hinton's version of the argument.

Hinton (1967 and 1973) develops his disjunctivist view by focusing on the kinds of reports we make about an experience we are undergoing when we are remaining neutral on the question of whether that experience is a veridical perception, an illusion, or a hallucination. For example, when making a report about one's experience in this neutral way one might say ‘I seem to see an F’, which can be true whether or not one is actually seeing an F, or one might make a claim about what appears to one to be the case. Hinton thinks that those who accept the common element assumption will hold that these ‘Neutral Experience Reports’ are used to pick out the intrinsic properties of one's experience, which are manifest to one simply in virtue of having the experience, and which the experience could possess whether or not one actually perceives anything. Hinton's alternative proposal is that these Neutral Experience Reports are equivalent to disjunctive statements of the form ‘I see an F, or I'm having that illusion’. Hinton labels such disjunctive statements ‘Perception-Illusion disjunctions’. Hinton argues that in order to substantiate their common element assumption, his opponents need to show that our Neutral Experience Reports are not equivalent to these Perception-Illusion disjunctions, and he tries to argue that this is a challenge that his opponents cannot meet.

The fact that Hinton chooses to focus on the reports we make about our experiences, may be a reflection of the fact that his primary concern is to question an assumption about those properties of experience that we should be in a position to make reports about simply in virtue of having the experience. (“You want a predicate whose applicability to what is happening in or to me is made clear to me by the very fact of that thing's happening”, Hinton 1967, 224.) We might then understand Hinton as taking his opponent to be committed to the claims that (a) perceptions and subjectively indistinguishible hallucinations have such properties in common, (b) it is the fact that perceptions and hallucinations have such properties in common that explains their being subjectively indistinguishible, and (c) these are the properties we are picking out when we make Neutral Experience Reports. He may then be seen as trying to undermine the assumption that (a) and (b) are correct by throwing into doubt our entitlement to (c).

For Hinton, an important feature of his Perception-Illusion Disjunctions is that they do not report what is happening to the subject, as distinct from saying, non-committally, that one of a number of things is happening. Hinton claims that these disjunctive claims do not give a “definite answer” to the question ‘what happened to the subject?’ or as he sometimes puts it, they do not give the “what-it-is of the event” in question. This is why Hinton thinks that substantiating the relevant common element assumption requires showing that our Neutral Experience Reports are not equivalent to his disjunctive statements. According to the thought expressed in (c) above, our Neutral Experience Reports are committal in a way that these disjunctive statements are not. So the idea here seems to be that if our Neutral Experience Reports are equivalent to Hinton's Perception-Illusion disjunctions, then assumption (c), above, is thereby undermined.

One way of defending a common element view against this line of argument might be to defend the claim that one can accept (a) and (b) without being committed to (c). Alternatively one might object that an adequate defence of (a) and (b) need not simply depend on establishing (c). (See Snowdon 2008).

Furthermore, one might question what Hinton has in mind in his use of the term ‘equivalent’ when he says that his opponent needs to show that our Neutral Experience Reports are not equivalent to his Perception-Illusion disjunctions. For Hinton denies that he is suggesting that his Perception-Illusion disjunctions provide us with a conceptual analysis of our Neutral Experience Reports. Snowdon (2008) suggests that the most obvious reading of ‘equivalent’ in this context is the following: ‘P’ is equivalent to ‘Q’ if and only if it is a priori that necessarily (P if and only if Q). Snowdon then poses the following problem for Hinton's argument. The fact that a statement is disjunctive does not on its own mean that it cannot be equivalent, in the relevant sense, to a non-disjunctive statement, which, as a consequence of being non-disjunctive, may well count as saying what sort of thing is happening. Snowdon offers a mathematical example in support of this claim. ‘X wrote down a number which is either 2 or an uneven prime number’ is equivalent, in the relevant sense, to ‘X wrote down a prime number’.

The problem this poses for Hinton is that it suggests that he may be wrong to assume that his opponent needs to show that our Neutral Experience Reports are not equivalent to his Perception-Illusion disjunctions. For even if they were equivalent to the Perception-Illusion disjunctions, this might not in itself show that such reports don't pick out a common element to perception and illusion / hallucination and give a definite answer to the question ‘what is happening?’

Snowdon suggests that despite this, what Hinton does achieve, in his various discussions of these issues, is to put pressure on the assumption that there is anything in the use we make of our ordinary Neutral Experience Reports that thereby commits us to the common element view—i.e., the view that Hinton is attempting to target. Suppose we accept that Hinton does achieve what Snowdon suggests. Consistent with this, one might also hold that there is nothing in the use we make of our ordinary Neutral Experience Reports that thereby commits us to a denial of the common element view. One might think that a denial of the common element view is at least as committal as its affirmation, for it involves a substantive metaphysical claim about the nature of perceptual experience. So why should we think that the burden of proof lies with the common element theorists to establish their view?

At points it looks as though Hinton thinks that an extra commitment incurred by the common element theorist is an epistemic one. For example, Hinton considers the following objection that might be raised against his disjunctive approach: “If A-ing [i.e., seeing an O] and B-ing [i.e., having that illusion] did not have a worn-on-the-sleeve property in common, how could you take one for the other?” To which Hinton's reply is, “Why should it just not seem that they had properties in common? Seeing a flash of light and having the illusion seem, but only seem, to have in common the property ‘when x occurs a flash of light occurs’” (1967, 225). The implication here seems to be that Hinton is taking his opponent to be making a substantive epistemic assumption—that our inability to discern through introspection any differences between a hallucination and a perception must ultimately be explained by our positive ability to discern through introspection that they are events of the same kind. (For a critique of this assumption, see also Putman 1999).

3.2 McDowell's Epistemological Argument

McDowell's disjunctive conception of perceptual experience is primarily motivated by epistemological concerns. He appeals to a disjunctive conception of perceptual experience in offering a proposal as to how we should resist a “tempting” line of argument that has an epistemological conclusion. The conclusion of the tempting argument is that when one genuinely perceives the world, the epistemic grounds one has for one's world-directed judgements can be no better than those available to one when one hallucinates. (See McDowell 1982, 1987, 1994, 2008, 2010, and 2013. See Putnam 1999 for an endorsement of McDowell's approach).

The tempting line of argument that McDowell is concerned to resist starts by proposing that since hallucinations can be subjectively indistinguishible from genuine perceptions, the differences between your genuine perceptions and your hallucinations must be external to how things are with you subjectively. An epistemic claim is then made: Matters external to how things are with you subjectively cannot intelligibly contribute, even in part, to your epistemic standing on some question. For such matters will be beyond your ken, and matters beyond your ken cannot make any difference to your epistemic standing. The conclusion that is then drawn is that when you genuinely perceive the world your epistemic grounds for making world-directed perceptual judgements are the same as, an hence no better than, those available to you when you have a subjectively indistinguishible hallucination.

In responding to this line of argument, McDowell appeals to a disjunctive conception of perceptual experience in order to block the move from the claim that (i) hallucinations can be subjectively indistinguishible from genuine perceptions, to the claim that (ii) the differences between a genuine perception and a hallucination must be “blankly external to one's subjectivity” (McDowell 1982). This is then supposed to provide us with a way of resisting the argument's conclusion—i.e., the claim that the experiences involved in genuine perception and hallucination do not differ in their epistemic significance. According to the disjunctive conception of experience that McDowell proposes, we can accept that what is common to a genuine perception and a subjectively indistinguishible hallucination is the fact that the subject's experience is such that it appears to him that some environmental fact obtains. However, we should also accept that an appearance that such-and-such is the case can be either a mere appearance or the fact that such-and-such is the case making itself perceptually manifest to someone, and on McDowell's view, when a fact is made perceptually manifest to one, the obtaining of the fact is not “blankly external to one's subjectivity”. So the obtaining of the fact can contribute to one's epistemic standing.

A standard line of objection against McDowell's disjunctivist proposal is that the epistemological considerations he invokes do not adequately support the disjunctive account of experience that he recommends. The general claim behind this line of objection is that an adequate account of the epistemological role of perceptual experience need not involve any appeal to disjunctivism. As there are many different accounts of the epistemological role of perceptual experience, there are many different forms that this line of objection can take.

For instance, according to one widely held view, the perceptual judgements one makes when one is having a perfect hallucination can be justified and have the same justificatory status as the perceptual judgements one makes when one genuinely perceives the world. According to this view, there is a sense, then, in which the conclusion of the tempting line of argument that McDowell considers is true: when you genuinely perceive the world your epistemic grounds for making world-directed perceptual judgements are the same as, an hence no better than, those available to you when you have a subjectively indistinguishible hallucination. However, those who accept this claim may deny that this puts into jeopardy the common sense idea that when we do succeed in perceiving the world we usually do acquire non-inferential, world-directed, perceptual knowledge. For they may claim the epistemic difference between a veridical perception and hallucination is not to be explained by appealing to some difference in the justificatory status of the judgements that such experiences give rise to. The epistemic difference is, rather, to be explained by appealing to the fact that when one perceives the world some further conditions required for perceptual knowledge will usually be met.

Taking this line might be one way of resisting an epistemic assumption made in the “tempting” line of argument that McDowell considers, namely the assumption that matters external to how things are with you subjectively cannot intelligibly contribute, even in part, to your epistemic standing on some question. An alternative way of resisting this epistemic assumption is to accept a view according to which matters external to how things are with you subjectively can contribute to the justificatory status of your beliefs. (For an example of this approach to justification, see Goldman 1979).

According to another line of objection, one that is more sympathetic to McDowell's general epistemological outlook, one can resist the tempting line of argument in a way that closely parallels McDowell's proposal, but without being committed to a disjunctive view of appearances. Williamson (2000) proposes a view of this kind. According to this view, when one genuinely perceives the world and sees that such and such is the case, one is in a factive mental state of knowing that such and such is the case. This factive mental state can only obtain when one is veridically perceiving the world, and it cannot obtain when one is hallucinating. Furthermore, this factive mental state is not to be given a conjunctive analysis. It is not to be regarded as being in a state that can be conjunctively analysed in terms of having an experience that such and such is the case, plus some further, extra-mental conditions that are ‘blankly external to one's subjectivity’. So the proponent of this view agrees with McDowell that when one sees that such and such is the case one is in a distinctive kind of mental state that cannot be conjunctively analysed. However, the proponent of this view rejects McDowell's claim that one should give a disjunctive account of appearances. For accepting that one cannot give a conjunctive analysis of seeing that such and such is case is compatible with saying that its appearing to one that such and such is the case is a mental state common to genuine perception and hallucination, where such a state is not to be given a disjunctive characterisation. (For further discussion of this line of objection, see section 4.3)

A further criticism that has been levelled against McDowell's proposal is that his disjunctive account of experience fails to bring with it the epistemic benefits that he advertises it as having. McDowell has suggested that in showing how the disjunctive account he recommends allows us to resist the tempting line of argument that he considers, he has shown us how to “remove a prop” upon which a certain line of sceptical argument depends. (In particular, see McDowell 2008). Against McDowell, Wright (2002, 2008) argues that disjunctivism provides us with nothing to address mainstream perceptual scepticism. Wright claims that the traditional Cartesian sceptical argument does not rely on the impossibility of direct perceptual acquaintance with the world. It allows that you may be having a perceptual experience that involves a fact in the world making itself perceptual manifest to you. What it attempts to undermine is the idea that anything other than agnosticism as to whether or not you are perceiving is warranted, even in this situation. (See also Conee 2007).

In response to this criticism, McDowell has said that in accepting his disjunctive account of experience we need not pretend to have an argument that can prove that we are not being deceived using premises we can affirm without begging the question against the sceptic. What the disjunctive account does achieve, though, is to show we can resist sceptical arguments that appeal to the “highest common factor” conception of experience—that conception of experience according to which genuine perceptions and subjectively indistinguishible hallucinations do not differ in their epistemological significance. For the disjunctive account of experience blocks the inference from subjective indistinguishability to the highest common factor conception. According to McDowell's diagnosis, the move from subjective indistinguishability to the highest common factor conception depends upon an illegitimate view of self-knowledge. (For a similar proposal see Williamson 2000). And McDowell argues that this illegitimate view of self-knowledge itself makes unintelligible a characteristic of experience that the sceptical argument does not usually question—that our perceptual experience at least purports to reveal how things are in the objective world.

So an important element of McDowell's disjunctive approach is his opposition to a certain view of self-knowledge. (See especially McDowell 1987). According to the view he opposes, although your ability to tell how things are in the world by looking is fallible, your ability to tell how things are with you subjectively is infallible, in the following sense: the truth about how things are with you subjectively is infallibly accessible to your capacity to acquire knowledge on such matters.This picture of self-knowledge is incompatible with the disjunctive account of experience that McDowell recommends. According to that disjunctive account when you have an experience, you can know, independently of whether you know that you are hallucinating, that it appears to you that such and such is the case. However, its appearing to you that a such and such is the case can be either a situation in which a fact in the environment is being made perceptually manifest to you, or a situation that involves a mere appearance, and you cannot know which disjunct obtains independently of knowing whether you are hallucinating. According to McDowell, when a fact is made perceptually manifest to you, the obtaining of the fact is not “blankly external to your subjectivity”. The resultant view is incompatible with the claim that all of the truths about how things are with you subjectively are infallibly accessible to you. For if all of the truths about things are with you subjectively were infallibly accessible to you, your capacity to know whether or not you were hallucinating would also be infallible.

For discussion of McDowell's disjunctivism, see Neta 2008, Pritchard 2008, Sedivy 2008, Borgaard 2011 and Haddock 2011. For further discussion of McDowell's disjunctivism and comparison with Austin 1962, see Thau 2004. For discussion of epistemological disjunctivism in general, see Pritchard 2012.

3.3 Martin's Phenomenological Argument

Martin argues for a naïve realist account of the kind of experience one has when one genuinely perceives the world. According to this naïve realist account, when one genuinely perceives the world one is directly aware of mind-independent objects and their features. Furthermore, according to this view, when one perceives the world, the actual objects of perception, the external things such as trees, and tables, which one can perceive, and the properties they manifest to one when perceived, partly constitute one's conscious experience, and hence determine its phenomenal character. (See Martin's discussion of naïve realism in his 1997, 1998, 2002, 2004, and 2006). Since one is not aware of mind-independent objects and their features when one hallucinates, the naïve realist cannot offer the same account of the phenomenal character of hallucinations. The naïve realist is committed, then, to the claim that the kind of phenomenally conscious episode that occurs when one perceives the world is not one that could be occurring were one hallucinating. So in order to preserve his naïve realist account of the phenomenal character of genuine perceptions, Martin advocates a disjunctive account of perceptual experience. According to Martin, genuine perceptions and introspectively indiscriminible hallucinations are not mental events of the same fundamental kind.

Martin's naïve realist account of genuine perception is motivated by phenomenological considerations. He argues that naïve realism best articulates how sensory experience seems to us to be through introspective reflection. If introspective reflection supports a naïve realist account of the phenomenal character of genuine perceptions, then presumably introspective reflection should lend the same support to a naïve realist account of the phenomenal character of hallucinations that are introspectively indiscriminible from genuine perceptions. Since the naïve realist account of phenomenal character cannot be applied to hallucinations, the naïve realist must then say that hallucinations that are introspectively indiscriminible from genuine perceptions do not have the phenomenal character that introspective reflection suggests—they do not have the phenomenal character that they introspectively seem to us to have. However, if Martin is right in his claim that introspective reflection supports naïve realism, then if we reject naïve realism, we will have to accept that all perceptual experiences, whether genuine perceptions or hallucinations, fail to have the phenomenal character that introspective reflection suggests.

As Martin sees it, then, the dialectical position is this: the disjunctivist naïve realist allows that at least some of our perceptual experiences really do have the phenomenal character that they introspectively seem to have—namely the genuine perceptions—whereas the opponent of naïve realism needs to deny that any of our perceptual experiences really do have the phenomenal character that they introspectively seem to have. So Martin advocates the disjunctivist naïve realist view as the best error theory concerning perceptual experience and the introspection of experience.

The claim that when one genuinely perceives the world one is directly aware of mind-independent objects and their features is not distinctive of the naïve realist account. For example, someone who holds an intentionalist account of experience can also accept this claim. According to this view our perceptual experiences are mental states with intentional contents that represent the world as being a certain way, and when one has an experience with a veridical content, in the right circumstances, one is directly aware of mind-independent objects in one's environment. (Advocates of such intentionalist accounts of experience include Searle (1983), Harman (1990), Tye (1992, 1995, and 2000), Burge (1993 and 2010), Dretske (1995), Byrne (2001), and Pautz (2010)). Many have argued that this sort of theory can adequately accommodate the phenomenological aspects of experience that a naïve realist might point to—e.g., the apparent presence to mind of mind-independent objects and their features—without being committed to the idea that hallucinations fail to have the phenomenal character that they introspectively seem to have.

Martin (2002) compares and contrasts the intentionalist and naïve realist accounts of these phenomenological aspects of perceptual experience and argues that introspective reflection on the nature of sensory imagination—in particular, visualising— gives us reason to support the naïve realist account over the intentionalist one. Martin's argument for this claim has the following structure: (i) He compares and contrasts the naïve realist and intentionalist accounts of certain aspects of the phenomenology of perceptual experience—their transparency and immediacy. (ii) He argues for a thesis about visualising—the ‘dependency thesis’, which states that to visualise an F is to imagine a visual experience of an F. (For an influential discussion of this idea, see Williams 1973. For an endorsement of the view, see Peacocke 1985 and Vendler 1984.) (iii) He argues that the truth of the dependency thesis should lead the intentionalist and the naïve realist to make different predictions about the phenomenology of visualising, given their different accounts of the transparency and immediacy of perceptual experience. So, he claims, the phenomenology of visualising can be regarded as a test of these competing views. (iv) He argues that the phenomenology of our episodes of visualising favours the naïve realist account.

The particular phenomenological aspects of perceptual experience—transparency and immediacy—that the naïve realist and the intentionalist try to accommodate in different ways, are the following. Transparency: When one attends to what it is like for one to have a visual experience it seems to one as though one does so through attending to mind-independent objects in one's environment and their features. Immediacy: Furthermore, our perceptual experiences are non-neutral about the actual presence of the mind-independent objects and features in our environment they are directed upon. They appear to have a coercive power and authority over our beliefs. Even if one believes that one is hallucinating, the phenomenal immediacy of the experience—its non-neutrality about the actual presence of mind-independent objects and features in our environment—is not thereby extinguished. Intentionalists can explain the transparency and immediacy of perceptual experience in terms of the idea that (a) perceptual experiences are mental states with intentional contents that represent the mind-independent world as being a certain way (hence transparency); and in terms of the idea that (b) such states play a distinctive kind of functional role in our mental economy (hence immediacy). This is not the account offered by the naïve realist. For the naïve realist, one's experience relates to the world in a non-representational manner. According to the naïve realist, the transparency and immediacy of genuine perceptions are explained in terms of the idea that mind-independent objects and their features are constituents of one's perceptual experience that determine, at least in part, the phenomenal character of that experience. The phenomenal transparency and immediacy of a hallucination is explained derivatively—in terms of its being introspectively indiscriminible from something it is not—a mental event with the phenomenal character of a genuine perception.

On the face of it, the intentionalist appears to be able to accommodate adequately the transparency and immediacy of experience without committing to the idea that hallucinations fail to have the phenomenal character that introspective reflection suggests. This might lead one to favour the intentionalist view. However, Martin argues that reflecting on the phenomenology of visualising gives us reason to think otherwise.

Martin argues that in order to capture adequately the respect in which the phenomenology of visualising an F has some correspondence with the phenomenology of having a visual experience of an F, we should accept the dependency thesis—the thesis that to visualise an F is to imagine a visual experience of an F. He then argues that the truth of the dependency thesis should lead the intentionalist and the naïve realist to make different predictions about the phenomenology of visualising. Martin argues that if the dependency thesis is correct, then the intentionalist should hold that when we visualise, we imagine a mental state (i.e., a visual experience) that represents the world to be a certain way and that has a distinctive kind of functional role. We may, as part of our imaginative project, suppose that the imagined situation contains the objects and features represented by the imagined visual experience, but, argues Martin, the intentionalist should predict that (a) when one visualises something, e.g., an apple, the imagistic character of one's visualising should itself be neutral with respect to whether or not one is imagining a scene that contains an apple, and (b) something other than the putative object of experience (i.e., the apple) should be available to introspection. The representational properties of the experience one is imagining should be revealed to one as such.

According to Martin, as the naïve realist offers a rather different account of the phenomenal transparency and immediacy of visual experience, the naïve realist should make rather different predictions about the phenomenology of visualising. According to the naïve realist, a visual experience of an apple seems to its subject to be constitutively dependent on the presence of the apple. So given the truth of the dependency thesis, the naïve realist should predict that when one visualises an apple, the imagistic character of one's visualising won't be neutral with respect to whether or not one is imagining a scene that contains an apple. It should be committal on the presence of an apple in the imagined scene. Martin claims that the actual phenomenology of visualising is more in keeping with what the naïve realist predicts. He argues that as introspective reflection best supports the naïve realist prediction, we can either deny naïve realism and hold that none of our perceptual experiences have the phenomenal character that introspective reflections suggests, or we can accept a naïve realist account of genuine perceptions and hold that only some of our perceptual experiences fail to have the phenomenal character that introspective reflection suggests. This latter position, according to Martin, is the least revisionary option.

One line of objection against Martin's argument targets the dependency thesis. For example, Noordhof (2002) and Burge (2005) question the plausibility of a claim that appears to be a commitment of the dependency thesis: that in visualising an object one must be imagining a perceptual experience of the object, despite the fact that imagining the experience may have been no part of your imaginative project. Some opponents of the dependency thesis have argued that the correspondences between visual experience and visualising are to be accounted for by the fact that there are similarities in the representational contents of these episodes. (See Noordhof 2002 and Currie and Ravenscroft 2002).

An alternative response to the argument may be to accept the dependency thesis, but to question whether introspective reflection really does support the claim that the imagistic character of visualising an apple is itself non-neutral with respect to whether the imagined scene contains an apple. It might be held instead that the phenomenology of an episode of visualising does not speak to such matters independently of the question of what suppositions the subject is making in engaging in his imaginative project. (See Burge 2005). Alternatively, one might raise a more general scepticism about the reliability of appeals to introspection in supporting claims about the real nature of perceptual experiences. (See Spener 2003). Some may hold that since we must allow that hallucinations do not have the sort of phenomenal character that introspective reflection suggests, there is little additional cost in allowing that veridical perceptions also fail to have the phenomenal character that introspective reflection suggests. (For critical discussion of Martin's argument, see also Dorsch 2010).

3.4 Martin's Argument from Epistemic Modesty

According to Martin, properly understood, disjunctivism offers us an epistemological perspective on how we should conceive of debates about perceptual experience. Martin suggests that the key to the disjunctive approach lies not in its appeal to paraphrasing claims about experience in disjunctive form, but rather in its appeal to the epistemic notion of indiscriminability in explicating the claims we make about perceptual experience. (For detailed discussion of the notion of discriminability, see Williamson 1990). Martin suggests that what is distinctive of the disjunctive approach is the ‘modesty’ of the claims it makes about what one can know about one's perceptual experiences. In contrast, the alternatives to the disjunctive approach are ‘immodest’ in their assumptions about our epistemic powers. The alternatives to the disjunctive approach that Martin appears to have in mind here are those versions of the common element view that hold that (a) there are phenomenal properties that are common to perceptions, illusions, and hallucinations, and (b) the possession of such properties is both necessary and sufficient for an event to be a conscious perceptual experience.

Martin's argument for the claim that the alternatives to the disjunctive approach incur greater epistemic burdens primarily focuses on our understanding of the notion of a perfect hallucination. Sceptical arguments often introduce talk of ‘perfect hallucinations’. On one understanding such talk is taken to be introducing the notion of a conscious mental event that is not a genuine perception but which is introspectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception of the world. An assumption often made is that such an experience would have the same phenomenal properties as some possible genuine perception. But from the fact that a conscious mental event is introspectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception, does it follow that must have the same phenomenal properties as a genuine perception?

Suppose we answer that this does not follow—i.e., we accept that it may be possible, in principle, for there to occur a conscious mental event that is introspectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception, but which does not have the same phenomenal properties as a genuine perception. Should we say that such events count as perceptual experiences? If one denies that such mental events should be regarded as perceptual experiences, then, Martin suggests, one owes some kind of justification for this denial, for this stance on what is required for a mental event to be a perceptual experience will seem, from a common sense perspective, to be too restrictive. On the other hand, if one holds that such mental events should be regarded as perceptual experiences, then this suggests that our most inclusive notion of what it is for something to be a perceptual experience is an epistemic one—that of being introspectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception—which does not involve the further metaphysical assumption that perceptual experiences which aren't genuine perceptions must have the same phenomenal properties as genuine perceptions.

Now suppose instead that we say that if a conscious mental event is introspectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception it has the same phenomenal properties as a genuine perception. According to Martin this would be to embrace a substantive epistemic principle. For in adopting this stance one would be committed to the epistemic claim that in the case of any conscious mental event that lacks the phenomenal properties of a genuine perception, the fact that it lacks the relevant phenomenal properties will be something that is knowable through introspection. According to such a view, it is not just that the phenomenal properties that determine an event as an experience are held to be introspectively detectible and recognisible as such when present. It must also be the case that the absence of such properties, when they are absent, is equally detectible through introspection.

According to Martin, given that this approach to perceptual experience needs to rely on this epistemic assumption, it carries more theoretical burdens than does the more “modest” disjunctivist approach. For when it comes to characterizing the notion of perceptual experience in general, the disjunctive approach emphasizes the limits of our powers of discrimination, rather than appealing to a substantive condition that an event must meet to be an experience, and in addition ascribing to us cognitive powers to recognize the presence of this substantive condition. So, according to Martin, the burden is really on the common element theorist, either to show that the extra epistemic commitment is one we should accept, or alternatively, to justify the claim that those conscious mental events that are introspectively indiscriminible from genuine perceptions but which lack the phenomenal properties of genuine perceptions should not be regarded as a perceptual experiences. This argument does not purport to show that the common element view is wrong, but rather to show that the default position should be that of the disjunctivist.

Various objections have been raised against Martin's proposal. Some object to Martin's suggestion that being subjectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception is a sufficient condition for being a perceptual experience. Siegel (2004 and 2008), Hawthorne and Kovakovich (2006), Smith (2008), and Byrne and Logue (2008) push this line of objection. In effect, such objectors may be seen as attempting to meet one of Martin's challenges by offering reason to think that our notion of perceptual experience is, after all, more restrictive than the epistemically characterised one he proposes. Siegel objects that a cognitively unsophisticated creature, such as a dog, will be incapable of introspectively discriminating the experiences they have. So we cannot appeal to the notion of subjective indiscriminability in our account of what makes it the case that the dog has a perceptual experience of an F. Byrne and Logue (2008) and Smith (2008) object that even in the case of a cognitively sophisticated subject we should not rule out the possibility of the occurrence of a conscious mental event that is not a perceptual experience, but which is subjectively indiscriminible from a veridical perception. For example, it might be argued that we should deny that episodes of perceptual imagining (e.g., visualising) are perceptual experiences, and we should allow that it may be possible for an episode of visualising to be subjectively indiscriminible from a veridical perception. One might think that just such episodes occur when one is dreaming. (Martin's response to some of these objections will be discussed in section 5.1)

If one does allow that conscious mental events of different kinds (e.g., perceptual experiences and perceptual imaginings) can be introspectively indiscriminible, then it seems that one's defence of the claim that perfect hallucinations and genuine perceptions are events of the same fundamental kind cannot simply appeal to the fact that they are introspectively indiscriminible. One might, nonetheless, think that there is introspective support for the claim that genuine perceptions have phenomenal properties which are such that (i) an event's possession of them is independent of the conditions of perception, and (ii) an event's possession of them is sufficient to account for the fact that the event is introspectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception. One might then simply define ‘perfect hallucinations’ as those experiences that are not genuine perceptions, but which have the same phenomenal properties as genuine perceptions. (See section 3.3 for discussion of Martin's positive argument for Naïve Realism, which can be seen as an attempt to challenge such claims).

According to another line of objection, Martin is wrong to propose that being introspectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception is a necessary condition for being a conscious perceptual experience. For although being introspectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception may be a condition satisfied by all genuine perceptions and perfect hallucinations had by subjects capable of making introspective judgements about their perceptual experiences, it is not a condition that need be satisfied by other perceptual experiences. For instance, Siegel (2004) argues that experiences as of impossible scenes—e.g., experiences as of certain Escher scenes—do not satisfy this condition.

Siegel (2004) also suggests that, properly understood, the epistemic burden incurred by the common element theorist is not so great after all, as it leaves open the possibility that subjects may make all kinds of mistakes about the kinds of experiences they are having. One's view on whether or not the epistemic commitment that is being attributed to the common element theorist by Martin is excessively burdensome may depend, in part, on how one understands the notion of introspective indiscriminability in play in his argument. This may also affect how plausible one finds the claim that being introspectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception is necessary and sufficient for being a perceptual experience. Martin's views on these issues are discussed further in section 5.1.

3.5 Campbell's Argument from Demonstrative Reference

John Campbell (2002a, 2002b, 2005, 2011) has argued that there is an important connection between the nature of the conscious perceptual experience that occurs when we veridically perceive the world and our ability to think demonstratively about the mind-independent objects that we perceive. He argues that only a ‘relational view of experience’ can adequately acknowledge the role of conscious experience in making it possible for us to think demonstratively about the categorical properties of the mind-independent objects we perceive, and this relational view of experience commits him to a form of disjunctivism about perception.

According to this relational view of experience, when you veridically perceive the world the mind-independent objects and properties you perceive are constituents of your conscious experience—the qualitative character of the conscious experience you undergo is constituted by the qualitative characters of the mind-independent items you perceive. This kind of experience cannot occur when you hallucinate—veridical perceptions and hallucinations are experiences of different conscious kinds—hence the commitment to disjunctivism. More precisely, according to the relational view of experience that Campbell endorses, we are not to think of perceptual consciousness of an object as a two-place relation between a person and an object, but rather as a three-place relation between a person, a standpoint, and an object. Campbell suggests that we need to factor in the notion of a ‘standpoint’ as our experience of objects is always in some sense partial. You always experience an object from a standpoint, and you can experience one and the same object from different standpoints.

Campbell argues that an adequate account of the nature of our conscious experience of objects should accommodate the fact that such conscious experience performs a significant explanatory role. According to Campbell, such conscious experience provides us with knowledge of what our perceptual demonstrative terms, like ‘this’ and ‘that’, refer to. Furthermore, according to Campbell, the knowledge of the semantic value of the demonstrative that such conscious experience provides us with, justifies and causes the pattern of use we make of that demonstrative in our reasoning. The relevant patterns of reasoning we engage in reflect our conception of the object referred to as mind-independent. So, Campbell argues, our conscious experience of objects has a role to play in explaining what provides us with our conception of the objects of perception as mind-independent. Campbell argues that it is only the relational view of experience that can adequately acknowledge the way in which conscious experience plays this explanatory role, so competing accounts of experience should be rejected.

Note that the explanatory role that Campbell is suggesting that our conscious experience of objects is supposed to play isn't simply that of justifying, or providing warrant for, our beliefs and judgements that employ perceptual demonstratives. His claim is rather that such experience has a role to play in justifying the patterns of use we make of the demonstrative in reasoning that we engage in—where such reasoning reflects our grasp of the criteria of identity of the object referred to, which in turn reflects our grasp of the object as being mind-independent. According to Campbell, this pattern of use is justified by appeal to the semantic value of the demonstrative. Our conscious experience of the object to which the demonstrative refers provides us with a form of knowledge of the semantic value of the demonstrative, and thereby plays a role in justifying the use we make of the demonstrative in our reasoning.

Campbell argues that one cannot adequately acknowledge the way in which conscious experience plays this explanatory role if one holds a view of experience according to which an experience is a mental state or event with an intentional content that represents the world as being a certain way. For such a view of experience at best presupposes what is to be explained. It presupposes what is to be explained if the content of such a representational state is conceptual, and it doesn't have the resources to play the relevant explanatory role if its representational content is non-conceptual. What's required, argues Campbell, is a conception of experience as something less than conceptual representation of the object of experience, but which nonetheless has the resources to explain how experience of an object can provide one with a form of knowledge of the semantic value of a demonstrative that refers to it. Campbell argues that the only adequate contender is the relational view, for according to the relational view one's conscious experience in the veridical case acquaints one with a mind-independent object and its categorical properties. This confrontation with, this awareness of, the mind-independent object referred to is what provides one with the relevant form of knowledge of the semantic value of the demonstrative that allows experience to play its explanatory role.

As Campbell himself points out, his argument presses very hard the idea that experience of objects has this explanatory role to play. Some issues of contention here are the following: (a) Whether an account of the nature of conscious experience really does have a role to play when it comes to an explanation of the fact that we have a conception of objects in the world as mind-independent. (b) If the nature of conscious experience does have such an explanatory role to play, whether it is the one that Campbell identifies—i.e., that of causing and justifying the use we make of demonstrative terms that refer to the mind-independent objects we perceive. (c) Whether the relational view of experience really does have the resources to play the explanatory role that Campbell assigns to it. (For criticism of Campbell's argument, see Burge 2005, Rey 2005, and Cassam 2011).

3.6 Further Motivations for Disjunctivism

This section briefly summarises some further considerations that have been appealed to in motivating disjunctive accounts of perceptual experience.

Some have argued that a genuine perception of the world is a perceptual state with an intentional content containing demonstrative elements that refer to the items perceived. (See Brewer 2000, Burge 1993, and Tye 2007. For objections to this idea see Davies 1992 and McGinn 1982). Acceptance of this view, together with two further assumptions, can lead to the conclusion that the kind of experience that occurs when one perceives the world isn't one that can occur when one hallucinates, which in turn can motivate a disjunctive approach to perceptual experience in general. The two further assumptions are the following. (a) Truth-evaluable intentional contents with demonstrative elements that successfully refer are object-dependent, and (b) experiences are of the same mental kind only if they have the same truth-evaluable contents. (The latter claim is endorsed by Evans 1981, 1982 and McDowell 1984. For criticisms of this claim see Burge 1983, 1993, 2005, 2010, and Martin 2003).

Brewer advocated a view of this form in his book Perception and Reason. In his more recent work on perceptual experience he has proposed an alternative view of genuine perception, but which also commits to disjunctivism about perceptual experience. (See Brewer 2004, 2006, 2008, 2011). In this work Brewer is concerned to identify and defend the account of experience that he thinks is most conducive to our common sense ‘empirical realist’ world-view—the view that the tables, trees, people and animals etc, that we sense, are as they are independently of anyone's thought or experience of them. Brewer argues that the ‘Object View’ of experience, which he contrasts with the ‘Content View’, is the most promising such account. According to this ‘object view’, perception is an acquaintance with mind-independent empirical things whose basic natures and perceptible qualities constitute what it is like to be presented with them in this way.

One significant recent source of motivation for disjunctivism (common to the views proposed by Martin, Campbell and Brewer) is the suggestion that we should moving away from representationalist accounts of the way in which our minds are intentionally directed upon the mind-independent world when we perceive it. Influential in this regard is Charles Travis's work on perception. Travis (2004 and 2013), who cites Austin's Sense and Sensibilia as an important influence, argues that perception is not representational. He offers a critique of a representationalist view that is committed to the following claims: (i) Experiences have representational contents and can be true / false—veridical /non-veridical; (ii) the representational content of an experience is something that the subject can take at face value, and accept, or decline; (iii) the experience having this content isn't a matter of the subject taking / judging things to be a certain way; and (iv) the way our experience represents things to be is something we can appreciate and recognize. According to Travis's alternative view of perception our senses confront us with what is there, they bring our surroundings into view, but there is nothing in a perceptual experience to make it count as having some one representational content as opposed to countless others. In making out, or trying to make out what it is that we are confronted with, we may go wrong, and make false judgements, but when we are misled in this way, this is not because our senses non-veridically represent to us that the world is a certain way. On the assumption that we are not confronted with the mind-independent world when we hallucinate, this sort of view naturally leads to a disjunctivist view of perceptual experience.

4. Objections to Disjunctivism

Some of the objections raised against disjunctive theories are directed at the specific arguments proposed in support of different versions of disjunctivism. For discussion of objections to the arguments proposed by Hinton and McDowell, see sections 3.1, and 3.2; and for objections to arguments proposed by Martin see sections 3.3 and 3.4. For objections to disjunctivist accounts of hallucination, see section 5. This section discusses arguments aimed at a more general level, against the disjunctivist's denial that veridical perceptions, illusions and hallucinations are mental events of the same fundamental kind, and in favour of the view that there is common element to veridical perception, illusion and hallucination.

4.1 The Explanatory Power of the Common Kind Claim

Sturgeon (1998) offers a number of reasons for thinking that our default view should be the thesis that there is a common factor to veridical perceptions, illusions and hallucinations—i.e., the thesis that they all involve perceptual states of the same basic kind—rather than the disjunctivist view.

Sturgeon points to a number of features that can be common to veridical perceptions, illusions, and hallucinations. Among the features he points to are the following: (i) veridical perceptions, illusions and hallucinations can produce similar behavioural effects. For example, in general, if it sensibly appears to you as though a rock is flying towards you, you will duck, irrespective of whether the experience you are having is a veridical perception, an illusion, or a hallucination. (ii) If, on the basis of that experience, you believe that a rock is flying towards you, and you act on that belief and duck, there is a sense in which your belief and action are rational, irrespective of whether that experience is a veridical perception, an illusion, or a hallucination. (iii) If you have an experience as of a rock flying towards you, you can know what it's like to see a rock flying towards you, irrespective of whether that experience is a veridical perception, an illusion, or a hallucination. (iv) Veridical perceptions, illusions and hallucinations can be introspectively indistinguishible.

Sturgeon suggests that the most obvious explanation of the fact that these experiences share these features is the proposal they all involve mental states of the same kind. So this should be our default view until we are given reason to be persuaded otherwise.

The disjunctivist may try to explain the fact that illusions and hallucinations can have the same kinds of behavioural effects as veridical perceptions by simply appealing to the fact that such experiences can be subjectively indistinguishible from veridical perceptions. Since the difference between a hallucination and a veridical perception may be something that a subject is unable to detect through introspection, the hallucination will naturally give rise to effects that are similar to those of the veridical perception. The subject will respond to such a hallucination in the same kind of way in which he would respond to a veridical perception. And there is a sense in which this response can be regarded as rational.

However, the disjunctivist who denies that a hallucination can have the same phenomenal character as a veridical perception will be put under pressure to offer some positive explanation of the fact that a hallucination can seem to have the same phenomenal character as a veridical perception, and in particular, to offer some explanation of how it is that a subject can come to know what it is like to have a veridical perception of an F through simply having a hallucination of an F, given that the hallucination does not actually possess the what-it-is-like properties of the veridical perception. As Hellie (2007) notes, while not everything is the way it appears, there is a strong intuition that the phenomenal domain is distinctive—if an experience appears to have a certain phenomenal property, then it has that property as phenomenal character. The tenability of the form of disjunctivism that denies that veridical perceptions and hallucinations can have the same phenomenal character will depend on whether this epistemic assumption can plausibly be denied (see the discussion of this point in section 3.4), and whether the disjunctivist can make a satisfactory case for thinking that veridical perceptions appear to have a phenomenal character that hallucinations could not possess (see section 3.3).

4.2 The Causal Argument Against Disjunctivism

An influential argument against disjunctivism is the causal argument, first proposed by Howard Robinson. (See Robinson 1985 and 1994). The simplest version of the argument appeals to the following two claims: (i) It is theoretically possible, by activating some brain processes involved when a subject genuinely perceives the world, to cause a hallucination subjectively indistinguishible from that perception—a ‘causally matching’ hallucination. (ii) It is necessary to give the same account of the experiences involved in genuine perception and hallucination when they have the same neural causes. So we should accept that the kind of experience that occurs when a subject perceives the world is one the subject could be having if he were hallucinating.

The general principle behind this second claim is ‘same proximate cause, same immediate effect’. It is likely that the disjunctivist will simply reject this principle. The disjunctivist may insist that in a case of genuine perception, even if the objects of perception are distal causes of the subject's experience, they are also figure non-causally as essential constituents of it. So the occurrence of the relevant brain processes won't be sufficient to produce the kind of mental event involved in perception, unless further non-causal conditions necessary for the occurrence of that kind of mental effect also obtain. At this point, the disjunctivist and his opponent may simply disagree as to whether there are any psychological effects that have significant non-causal constitutive conditions attached. And this connects with familiar debates as to the tenability of externalist views in the philosophy of mind. (For further discussion of the causal argument see Langsam 1997, Snowdon 2005b, and Martin 2004).

4.3 Neither Conjunctivism Nor Disjunctivism

There is another version of the causal argument that can be used to put pressure on the disjunctivist to accept that there is a common element to veridical perception and causally matching hallucination. (See Johnston 2004 and Martin 2004). The proponent of this argument may allow for the possibility that there are non-causal constitutive conditions necessary for the occurrence of certain kinds of mental events, where such constitutive conditions may include the presence in the environment of appropriate candidate objects of perception. So this version of the causal argument can accommodate the disjunctivist's claim that there are significant non-causal conditions necessary for the occurrence of the kind of experience that occurs when one veridically perceives the world. What this version of the causal argument relies upon is, rather, the claim that there are no such significant non-causal conditions necessary for the occurrence of the kind experience that occurs when one hallucinates. The proponent of this modified causal argument claims that there are no non-causal conditions necessary for the occurrence of the kind of experience that occurs when one hallucinates that cannot also obtain when one veridically perceives the world. So whatever kind of experience occurs when you have a causally matching hallucination of an F will also be produced when you have a veridical perception of an F. So there is, after all, a common element to veridical perception and causally matching hallucination.

Can the disjunctivist respond by saying that there is a non-causal constitutive condition necessary for the kind experience that occurs when one hallucinates—namely the absence of an appropriate candidate object of perception in the subject's environment? A problem with this response is that it relies on characterising the kind of psychological effect involved in hallucination in terms of what it is not, namely a veridical perception, and it is plausible to demand that it should be possible to provide some positive account of the kind of psychological effect involved when one hallucinates.

This version of the causal argument does not rely on the general principle ‘same proximate cause, same immediate effect’, so a proponent of the argument may allow that there is a kind of mental event that occurs when one perceives the world which doesn't occur when one hallucinates. Moreover, a proponent of the argument may also allow that there is an explanatory role to be played by the kind of mental event that only occurs when one perceives the world, which cannot be performed by appealing to the kind of mental event that is common to perception and illusion, plus some further non-mental conditions. (For this idea see Peacocke 1993 and Williamson 2000). However, the argument does put pressure on the disjunctivist to accept that there is a certain kind of mental event common to perception and hallucination—one that we should be able to give a positive, non-disjunctive account of. (See Burge 2005, 2010 and 2011 for arguments to the effect that a denial of this claim is empirically untenable and incompatible with the methodology of vision science). It suggests that if one simply wants to claim that genuine perceptions are mental events of a kind that cannot occur when one hallucinates, one should not be concerned to argue for a disjunctive account of perceptual experience. One's concern should simply be to oppose a conjunctive account of genuine perception. (For this line of criticism see Williamson 2000 and Johnston 2004).

One may be able to accept that a veridical perception and a hallucination differ mentally, while also accepting that they have a common mental core. Mark Johnston offers an account of hallucination along these lines. He proposes that there is a respect in which the objects of hallucination and the objects of seeing are akin. According to Johnston, the objects of a subject's hallucination are complexes of sensible qualities and relations that are not instantiated in the scene before him, whereas the objects of veridical perception are spatio-temporal particulars instantiating such complexes. On this view, there is, then, a common mental core to veridical perception and hallucination. In both cases one is aware of a ‘sensible profile’—a complex of qualities and relations.

The disjunctivist is generally willing to concede that perceptions and subjectively indistinguishible hallucinations have something in common. So why should they not accept that what is common to perception and hallucination is the occurrence of a certain kind of mental event whose nature is one that we can give a positive, non-disjunctive account of?

Martin argues that the naïve realist disjunctivist should deny that it is possible to give a positive, non-derivative account of the kind of phenomenal event that occurs when one hallucinates. (This is to oppose the suggestion made in Dancy 1995. See Martin 1997, 2004 and 2006. For discussion see Nudds 2009.). For if the naïve realist does offer a positive, non-derivative account of the kind phenomenal event that occurs when one hallucinates, and he also accepts that this kind of event also occurs when one perceives the world, then he will be under pressure to explain why the occurrence of this kind of event doesn't screen off the explanatory role that he assigns to his naïve realist account of the phenomenal character of genuine perception. (For critical discussion of this objection, see Hellie 2013). Martin's response to the argument is to say that the naïve realist should affirm that in the case of a causally matching hallucination, there is no more to the phenomenal character of such an experience than that of being introspectively indiscriminible from a certain genuine perception. In the case of the causally matching hallucination its subjective character is exhausted by its possession of the negative epistemic property—that of being introspectively indiscriminible from a veridical perception.

It might now be objected that this disjunctivist response still introduces a common element to veridical perception and causally matching hallucination that screens off the explanatory role that the naïve realist assigns to his distinctive account of the phenomenal character of veridical perception. Both a veridical perception of an F and a causally matching hallucination possess the negative epistemic property of being introspectively indiscriminible from a veridical perception of an F. So why doesn't this screen off any explanatory role that the naïve realist might assign to the phenomenal properties that he claims only a veridical perception can possess? Martin's response is to suggest that the property of being indiscriminible from an F has an explanatory potential which is dependent on the explanatory potential of being an F. So the property of actually being a veridical perception, and having the phenomenal properties that only a veridical perception can possess, can still be regarded as having a crucial explanatory role to play.

However, this response still leaves the naïve realist in the position of having to deny that it is possible to provide a positive account of the phenomenal character of a causally matching hallucination. Many have argued that this claim is ultimately untenable. So the modified causal argument can be seen as part of an attempt to force the naïve realist disjunctivist into an untenable position with respect to causally matching hallucinations.

5. Disjunctivist Accounts of Hallucination and Illusion

This section is concerned with what disjunctivists say about the following: the nature of the kind of mental event that occurs when one hallucinates, the nature of the kind of mental event that occurs when has a perceptual illusion, and what the differences between such events might be.

5.1. Hallucination

Some disjunctivists say relatively little about the nature of hallucination (e.g., McDowell, Campbell and Brewer). For example, McDowell characterises hallucinatory experience as a “mere appearance” that such and such is the case, which seems to leave open whether a more positive account can potentially be given. Dancy (1995) suggests that the disjunctivist should offer a more direct characterization of the kind of experience that occurs when one hallucinates, rather than simply characterising it solely by saying that it is like what it is not. He suggests that in a fully explicit version of the disjunctive theory hallucination would be characterised in a direct, positive way.

The disjunctivist who allows that veridical perceptions and hallucinations can have the same phenomenal character may take up this suggestion. This disjunctivist may be able to provide some positive account of the phenomenal character that veridical perception and hallucination can share, while allowing that there are certain mental properties distinctive of veridical perception (e.g., its possessing an object-dependent intentional content.) However, for reasons explained in the previous section, Martin argues that the disjunctivist who is a naïve realist about the phenomenal character of veridical perception (and so who holds that veridical perceptions have phenomenal properties that hallucinations cannot possess) should reject Dancy's proposal. Martin commits to the claim that in the case of certain hallucinations (i.e., those which have the same kind of proximate cause as veridical perceptions), there is no more to their phenomenal character than that of being introspectively indiscriminible from a veridical perception.

This particular claim has drawn a great deal of criticism. Siegel (2004) argues that Martin's account fails to accommodate the different kinds of hallucinations that can be experienced by a creature who lacks the conceptual capacities to make introspective judgements about its experience. E.g., suppose a dog is having a hallucination. Due to conceptual incapacities the dog is not in position to know that he is not perceiving a tomato, so for the dog this experience is introspectively indiscriminible from a perception of a tomato. However, from this fact alone it does not follow that the dog is having a hallucination of a tomato.

Siegel (2004) also argues that Martin's account fails to capture the fact that our hallucinations are phenomenally conscious, for a state that is not phenomenally conscious can satisfy the description of being introspectively indiscriminible from a genuine perception. Furthermore, she argues (in Siegel 2008) that Martin's account cannot adequately explain certain effects of hallucinations—i.e., what grounds one's positive knowledge of the kind of experience one is and isn't having. Along related lines, Sturgeon (1998) suggests that the disjunctivist who denies that it is possible to provide a positive account of the phenomenal character of a hallucination does not have the resources to explain adequately how it is that having a hallucination of an F can provide one with positive knowledge concerning what it is like to veridically perceive an F. (See also Pautz 2010 and 2011). Johnston (2004) argues that the disjunctivist offers no satisfactory explanation of the fact that hallucination can provide us with original de re knowledge of quality (e.g., the fact that a hallucination as of a red object can provide its subject with de re knowledge of the quality of redness).

Martin (2006) attempts to defend his account of hallucination against his critics, by (a) focusing on the issue of how we should understand the notion of indiscriminability in play in his talk of ‘introspective indiscriminability’, and (b) focusing on the question of the model of introspection we should adopt when our concern is with the way in which we introspect our phenomenally conscious mental states. Both aspects of Martin's defence of his view have been contested.

Martin suggests that the notion of indiscriminability that the disjunctivist should appeal to is an ‘impersonal’, ‘objective’ one. He compares the way in which we can talk of objects being visible or invisible. He suggests that in certain contexts, when we say that something is invisible, we may not be talking about the way a given individual, or group of individuals, is such that they cannot succeed in seeing the object. We may rather be talking about what vision can and cannot discern. Furthermore, in asking what vision can reveal to us, we can ask in terms of how vision actually is, or ways in which vision could be. The most extreme claim of invisibility would be concerned with the latter notion. The suggestion seems to be that we should not think that such ‘impersonal’, ‘objective’ talk of invisibility need be reducible to claims about what a given subject, group of subjects, or ideal subject would or would not see. So similarly, we should not take the impersonal, objective talk of introspective indiscriminability as reducible to claims about what a given subject, group of subjects, or ideal subject would or would not come to know through introspection.

Martin notes an objection that this comparison with sight might give rise to. When two objects are impersonally indiscriminible through sight, we tend to think that the objects in question must share a property—an appearance—that is detectible through vision. The fact that two visible objects cannot be told apart by sight suggests that there is something in common between them that sight does detect. So we might also think that if two experiences are introspectively indiscriminible, these experiences must share a property—a phenomenal property—that introspection is tracking. Martin's response to this objection is to reject a model of introspection that he thinks lies behind it. Martin suggests that in a case in which two objects are impersonally visually indiscriminible, we are led to posit a common appearance the objects share that vision can discern, because we think of sight as a mode of coming to be aware of a realm independent of it. So, according to Martin, the same story will apply to the case of introspection only if we suppose that when one introspects the phenomenal character of one's experience one is detecting features of some realm that is independent of one's introspective access to it. Martin argues that if one adopts this model of introspection then one will either have to allow that it is possible for one's experience to have a real phenomenal nature rather different from the one it introspectively seems to have, which remains inaccessible to introspection, or one will have to accept that introspection involves the use of a “super-mechanism”, which tracks the phenomenal character of one's experience in a such a way that it cannot fail, or can only fail when it is knowable that it has.

On Martin's recommended alternative, a subject's introspective perspective on her experience coincides with, and is not independent of, her experiential perspective on the world. There is no way of specifying a mechanism of introspection such that there could be a way in which it goes wrong, not because the faculty of introspection is a “super-mechanism”, but rather because there is no mechanism of introspection.

According to Martin, if we think of introspective awareness of experience in the wrong way, the negative epistemic condition (that of being introspectively indiscriminible from a veridical perception) is read only as a condition on one's cognitive awareness, and not as a condition on experience itself. And Martin thinks that this lies behind many of the objections to his account. In response, Martin tries to argue that read in the right way introspective indiscriminability guarantees that phenomenal consciousness is present. For according to Martin, the disjunctivist should stress the connection between phenomenal consciousness and having a point of view, or perspective on the world. So the negative epistemological condition when correctly interpreted will specify not just a subject's cognitive response to their circumstances, but rather their perspective on the world (which the introspective perspective coincides with), and this will be sufficient for there to be something it is like for them to be so.

Fish (2008 and 2009) proposes a rather different disjunctivist account of hallucination. Fish offers what he calls a minimal, but positive, story about hallucination. According to Fish, a mental state that may be intrinsically quite different from a veridical perception might come to be mistaken for a veridical perception and therein acquire the status of hallucination. Fish thinks that the demand for a more substantial intrinsic characterisation of hallucination is misguided, but that the following positive story can be told. The indistinguishability of hallucination from veridical perception is grounded in the similarity of their effects. A hallucination of an x is a mental state that, whilst not being a veridical perception of an x, nevertheless comes to have effects that are sufficiently similar to those a veridical perception would have had. If the subject is conceptually sophisticated these effects will include higher-order beliefs about seeing an x, or seeming to see an x. If the subject is not sophisticated enough to have such beliefs at all, the effects will be solely behavioural.

This account allows that hallucinations may have no phenomenal character, and even in those cases in which the mental state does have phenomenal character, the phenomenal character it has may well not account for the particular content of the hallucination. (For the suggestion that the disjunctivist should accept this consequence, see Sturgeon 2006 and 2008. For criticism of Fish's account, see Siegel 2008).

5.2 Illusion

Different disjunctivists group together perceptions, illusions and hallucinations in different ways when offering their disjunctive characterisations of perceptual experience. At points it looks as though Hinton is suggesting that illusions can be grouped together with veridical perceptions. For in certain places he says that his Perception-Illusion disjunctions permit a description of what is seen in terms of how the thing looks, thereby allowing the following kind of Perception-Illusion disjunction: ‘S sees something which looks blue or is having that illusion’ (1973, 61). In other places he says things that suggest that the illusion of an object appearing blue should not be grouped together with veridical perception, for he says that an experience as of blue is equivalent to the mere disjunction ‘Either I actually see an optical object that is blue in colour, or I am in some situation… that is to me like that one’ (1967b, 12). Snowdon groups together perceptions and illusions in his disjunctive characterisation of experience: ‘Either (there is something which looks to S to be F) or (it is to S as if there is something which looks to S to be F)’. In contrast, McDowell, in his appeal to the idea of facts being made perceptually manifest, appears to group together illusions and hallucinations: an appearance that such-and-such is the case can be ‘either a mere appearance or the fact that such-and-such is the case making itself perceptually manifest to someone’.

The differences in the ways these philosophers formulate their particular disjunctive characterisations may in part reflect their different particular interests in appealing to a disjunctive account of experience. For example, Snowdon's primary concern is to block an argument about what is required for the perception of objects (see section 6.1), whereas McDowell is concerned to defend an account of experience that safeguards the distinctive epistemological role of genuine perception in providing us with propositional knowledge. It is not clear that McDowell needs to deny that there are a number of facts made perceptually manifest to you when you suffer an illusion, in which case he might allow that it is possible to group together veridical perceptions and illusions as cases in which certain facts are made manifest to their subject.

Similar considerations may apply in the case of experiences that we might describe as partial hallucinations—cases in which a subject hallucinates an object while veridically perceiving other aspects of his environment. For example a subject might veridically perceive a table in front of him while hallucinating a pink rat on top of it. One question that can be asked of McDowell's disjunctivism is whether, according to it, we should treat such cases as ones in which the fact that there is a table in front of the subject is made perceptually manifest to him, despite the fact that he is hallucinating a pink rat.

Martin (2004) offers a sketch of how a naïve realist might develop an account of partial hallucination. He suggests that rather than focusing on experiences per se, we can focus on the various aspects of an experience—“the different entities that one can experience and the ways in which they can appear to one” (2004, 81). We can then explain those aspects of a partial hallucination that are not genuinely perceptual in terms of “that aspect of experience's indiscriminability from the corresponding aspect of a perceptual awareness of that element” (2004, 81). Martin also appeals to this idea in offering a suggestion as to what the disjunctivist should say about the experience of impossible scenes. His suggestion is that the disjunctivist should explain such experiences not by direct appeal to the idea of veridical perception of the impossible scene, but rather by explaining how an experience with each of the constituent elements is indiscriminible in that respect from a perception of that element. (For criticism of this proposal see Siegel 2004). One concern with this proposal is whether there may be some problem for the disjunctivist in thinking of such experiences as having a sort of hybrid nature, given that the disjunctivists think that perceptions and hallucinations are mental events with such different natures. (For an argument for the claim that accommodating certain illusions poses significant difficulties for the disjunctivist, see Smith 2010).

A further question to be asked in this context is whether the disjunctivist should treat all cases of illusion as equivalent to cases of partial hallucination. For example, if a subject perceives a green object that looks to him to be blue, should the disjunctivist say that the subject is perceiving the object but hallucinating the blueness it seems to possess? Brewer (2008) offers a disjunctivist account of certain illusions that he thinks need not be treated as cases of partial hallucination (e.g., the Mueller-Lyer illusion). According to Brewer, such illusions are simply cases in which the direct object of experience has visually relevant similarities with paradigms of a kind of which it is not in fact an instance. The fact that the direct object of perception looks F, but isn't, is explained in terms of the idea that the object may intelligibly be taken to be F, when seen from the point of view in question, in the relevant circumstances of perception, in virtue of its relevant similarities with certain paradigm Fs. In the case of certain illusions, when an object looks to be a certain way that it isn't, a disjunctivist might place emphasis on the idea that this misleading appearance is publicly observable; for instance, it might be the sort of thing one is able to photograph. The disjunctivist might then say that in such cases we can ascribe to the seen object a publicly observable feature—a ‘look’ or ‘appearance property’ that the object has. When one sees the object one may be visually aware of this appearance property—its having the look of an F. And one's awareness of this appearance property may intelligibly mislead one into mistakenly judging the object to be F.

6. Disjunctivism and the Causal Theory of Perception

Some philosophers associated with the disjunctive theory of perception are simply concerned to argue that certain common element claims lack adequate justification, thereby leaving us free to resist arguments about perception that depend upon such claims in their premises. For example, Paul Snowdon, one of the philosophers most associated with disjunctivism, appeals to the possibility of a disjunctive approach to perceptual experience in order to undermine an argument for a thesis about our concept of perception. According to the thesis that Snowdon aims to challenge it is a conceptual requirement that, necessarily, if S (a subject) sees O (an object) then O is causally responsible for an experience undergone by (or had by) S. This thesis has been labeled the Causal Theory of Perception (henceforth it will be referred to as the CTP).

H.P. Grice (1961) originally propounded the main argument for the CTP. (Other advocates of the theory include Pears (1976) and Strawson (1974)). Grice's argument takes the following general form. We are asked to consider cases in which a subject is having an experience appropriate for seeing an object of a certain kind—e.g., the subject is having an experience such that it seems to him as if there is a clock in front of him. There is in fact a clock in front of the subject, however, the subject fails to see the clock, for the subject's experience is a hallucination—perhaps induced by a neuroscientist stimulating his visual cortex. It is argued that such cases are indeed conceivable, and that in such cases the best explanation of the subject's failure to see the object before him is the absence of an appropriate causal connection between the object and his experience. Hence the CTP is justified.

According to Snowdon (1980, 1990, 1998, 2011), the plausibility of this argument rests on a conception of perceptual experience that is wedded to a common element assumption—in particular, the assumption that the kind of experience one has when one genuinely perceives the world is one whose intrinsic nature is independent of the kinds of objects perceived. On this conception of experience, experiences are amongst the events, the intrinsic natures of which are independent of anything outside the subject. According to this view, the ‘looks’ sentences that are true in cases of hallucination and in genuine perception are made true by (or are true in virtue of) exactly the same kind of occurrence in both cases. Once this conception of perceptual experience is in play, we might then ask after the extra-mental conditions required for seeing objects in our environment. The Gricean thought experiments suggest that simply having an experience that matches your surrounding environment will not, in itself, be sufficient for seeing objects in your environment. So the temptation then is to think that an appropriate causal connection between your experience and those objects is necessary for you to see them. The motivation for the CTP is therefore undermined, according to Snowdon, unless it can be shown that it is part of our concept of perception that the common element claim assumed in the argument is correct.

Following Hinton's lead, Snowdon argues that from the fact that ‘looks’ sentences are true in cases of hallucination and in veridical perception, and are not ambiguous, it does not follow that they are made true by (or are true in virtue of) exactly the same kind of occurrence in both cases, for they may instead have disjunctive fulfillment conditions. According to the disjunctive theory Snowdon considers, the claim that ‘It looks to S as of there is an F’ should be treated as being true in virtue of two distinct sorts of states of affairs: Either (there is something which looks to S to be F) or (it is to S as if there is something which looks to S to be F). This disjunctive theory allows that the two cases (perception and hallucination), which are described in the same way, might be of a quite different nature. In particular it allows that the kind of experience a subject has when she genuinely perceives the world is such that its intrinsic nature is not independent of the kinds of objects perceived. For Snowdon, the availability of this disjunctive approach to perceptual experience undermines the argument for the CTP, unless proponents of the argument can say something which is legitimately conceptual and which shows that this disjunctive approach must be wrong. (So note that according to Snowdon, an assertion of the disjunctive theory is not actually needed for a rejection of the Gricean argument for the CTP.)

For defence of the causalist approach against disjunctivism, see Lowe 2008. For a defence of the claim that disjunctivism is compatible with the CTP, see Child 1992, 1994 and 2011.

7. Conclusion

As we have seen, there are a variety of different disjunctivist views, often motivated by quite different concerns, and the disagreements that these disjunctivists have with their opponents are relevant to a number of debates in the philosophy of perception and epistemology—debates about the metaphysics and phenomenology of perceptual experience, our concept of perception, the epistemological role of perceptual experience, and self-knowledge. Many of the disjunctivist views and arguments that have been outlined here have been proposed relatively recently, and the debates they have inspired seem set to continue. In a further recent development disjunctive theories of perception have inspired similar disjunctive approaches in the philosophy of action—concerning both the ontology of action and a subject's reasons for performing actions. (For discussion of disjunctive approaches to action see Haddock and McPherson 2008b, Ruben 2008, Hornsby 2008 and Dancy 2008.)

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Acknowledgments

The author would like to thank David Chalmers for his comments on earlier drafts, which helped to improve the present entry.

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Matthew Soteriou <m.j.soteriou@warwick.ac.uk>

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