The Phenomenology of the Munich and Göttingen Circles

First published Mon Aug 3, 2015

In the first decades of the twentieth century, the members of the so-called “Munich and Göttingen circles” of phenomenology made important contributions to the philosophy of mind, the philosophy of language, the philosophy of action, epistemology, social philosophy, the philosophy of values and ontology. Some of the most prominent members of these circles are (in alphabetical order): Theodor Conrad, Hedwig Conrad-Martius, Johannes Daubert, August Gallinger, Moritz Geiger, Roman Ingarden, Herbert Leyendecker, Paul Linke, Alexander Pfänder, Adolf Reinach, Hermann Ritzel, Wilhelm Schapp, Kurt Stavenhagen, and Edith Stein. The ideas of these authors were influenced by such thinkers as Henri Bergson, Bernard Bolzano, Franz Brentano, Theodor Lipps, Anton Marty, Alexius Meinong, and—to an even more significant degree—by the work of Edmund Husserl.

Some of the most original insights provided by what has also been characterized as “early phenomenology” concern the notion of intentionality, i.e., the feature of some mental states by means of which they are directed to objects and states of affairs. Several members of the Munich and Göttingen circles claimed that there are radically different kinds of intentional acts and states, which cannot be reduced to a unitary genus. For instance, it was argued that the act of perceiving a state of affairs and the act of meaning it with a linguistic expression are not of the same genus and that both acts are further distinct from informing someone about this state of affairs or from enjoying it. Moreover, some of these authors maintained that all these acts or experiences assume different shapes if they are performed by an individual or by a collective subject.

Early phenomenologists understood the investigation of mental experiences as part of a general theory of objects or ontology, and their contributions thereto share some common traits. In particular, it was usually assumed that objects and facts exist independently of anyone’s beliefs, mental states or conceptual schemes and that they instantiate essential properties. The two main categories of phenomenological ontology, to which several members of both circles devoted extensive research, are that of objects and states of affairs.

1. The Munich and Göttingen Circles of Phenomenology: A Brief History

At the turn of the twentieth century, psychology was a discipline on the rise, and the relation between philosophy and psychology was intensely debated. Among other issues, the debate concerned whether psychology is a philosophical discipline or, the other way around, whether philosophy is based on psychology. Of importance for this debate, e.g., is the nature of ethical, metaphysical and logical concepts: are these concepts merely psychological? And are they about merely psychological entities? Since these concepts are usually held to be constitutive of the corresponding laws of ethics, metaphysics and logic, claiming that these concepts are psychological would imply that such laws are in the end psychological laws.

Generally, positions advocating that logical concepts are psychological have been labeled as “psychologism” (cf. Kusch 2011) or even more specifically as “logical psychologism” (Mohanty 1982, §2). For instance, according to psychologism, the logical law of the excluded middle has to be interpreted in terms of a psychological law, which states that it is impossible for a subject to judge at the same time that \(p\) and that non-\(p\). Psychologism has been contested by a competing approach: within the “anti-psychologist” strand, there are different views as to how logical concepts and laws have to be positively defined; still they do all agree on the negative insight that logic does not depend, in any sense, on psychology.

It is against this background that Theodor Lipps founded the Akademischer Verein für Psychologie or Academic Society for Psychology in Munich, most likely in 1895. Lipps was both a philosopher and a trained psychologist, and he helped to shape the Department of Philosophy in Munich, where he was professor from 1894, by focusing on psychology and its philosophical implications. Although Lipps would redefine his initial views over the years, by the end of the nineteenth century, he seemed to endorse the psychologistic approach, promoting a form of psychology that he at times qualified as “descriptive” (1903, 5). Lipps understood descriptive psychology as a discipline that, by means of inner perception, describes, compares, systematizes, etc. (1903, 5) mental contents (basically, mental states and acts such as sensations, perceptions, judgments, etc.). Inner perception, Lipps maintained, is able to grasp these contents with evidence.

Following Lipps’s investigations, as well as the general interest in philosophical psychology of that period, the meetings of the Akademischer Verein dealt with different issues at the intersection of philosophy and psychology. Topics discussed in the first years encompassed themes such as “the sensations and the contents of consciousness as objects of psychology” (1895), “the theory of feelings and striving” (1895–1896), “the definition of psychology” (1896), etc. (cf. Schuhmann 2000, 19f). The senior figures of the circle were Alexander Pfänder, Max Ettlinger and Johannes Daubert, who—together with Lipps himself—were among the first to give talks during the circle’s initial meetings. These talks were then intensely discussed by a rapidly growing community of young students who continued to be attracted to the circle in the decades after its foundation. These students, many of whom became scholars in their own right, included (in alphabetical order): Maximilian Beck, Alfred Brunswig, Theodor Conrad (nephew of Theodor Lipps), Aloys Fischer, August Gallinger, Moritz Geiger, Dietrich von Hildebrand, Paul Linke, Karl Loewenstein-Freudenberg, Adolf Reinach, Hermann Ritzel, Herman Schmalenbach, Otto Selz, Gerda Walther and Czesław Znamierowski (cf. Avé-Lallemant 1975a, Smid 1982). It should be noted that Max Scheler, Privatdozent in Munich from 1906, also took part in these meetings, starting in 1907. Although Scheler’s philosophical development represents a sui generis case within the history of phenomenology, his thought deeply influenced the members of the Munich and, later on, Göttingen circles.

Tradition credits Daubert with bringing Edmund Husserl’s work to the attention of the group in Munich. It was in 1902 (cf. Schuhmann 2002, Smid 1985, 269) that Daubert began to discuss some of the theses from the Logical Investigations (1900–01, henceforth: LI) during the meetings of the Verein. This two-volume work follows Husserl’s first book of 1891 (Philosophy of Arithmetic. Psychological and Logical Investigations) and is the result of almost ten years of research. In the LI, Husserl attempted to square the different positions that inspired his thinking in that period, such as the logical realism advocated by authors like Bernard Bolzano, Hermann Lotze and Gottlob Frege, and the philosophical psychology in particular of Franz Brentano and Carl Stumpf. In 1901, after the publication of the LI, Husserl was appointed Extraordinary Professor at the University of Göttingen.

In 1903, Daubert visited Husserl in Göttingen. This was the first personal contact between Husserl and a member of the Munich circle and has been called “easily the most important single event in the history of the Munich Phenomenological Circle” (Spiegelberg 1982, 169). As a consequence of this meeting, Husserl was invited to give a lecture in Munich in May 1904, after which the LI became one of the main references for the members of the Munich circle.

The LI were not received without substantial criticism, but some of the elements that, on the early phenomenological reading of this work, were especially appreciated in Husserl’s arguments were its anti-psychologism and the systematic basis it provided for what could be qualified as an “objectivist” approach to philosophical problems (according to which ontology, logic, ethics and aesthetics are about entities with an ontological status of their own, cf. Conrad 1954, 81; also Geiger speaks of a “turning to the object (Wendung zum Objekt)” in the LI, cf. Geiger 1933, 13). Husserl dedicated extensive effort in the first volume of the LI, i.e., in the Prolegomena to Pure Logic, to demonstrating that the laws of logic and ontology are not psychological. Mental acts, he argued, are intentional, i.e., they are directed towards objects, but these objects are not mere contents of consciousness and, hence, they have a structure of their own and follow specific laws of their own. In Husserl’s view, this provides evidence for the autonomy and independence of metaphysics and logic from psychology. At the same time, the Prolegomena questions what it means to say that mental experiences are intentionally directed towards objects and asks for a clarification of the relationship between logic and psychology. The second volume of the book (Investigations in Phenomenology and Theory of Knowledge) attempts to provide a solution to these and other questions by presenting an articulated theory of intentionality.

In 1905, Daubert and Reinach began to attend Husserl’s lectures in Göttingen. This initiated a trend that culminated in what has been described as an “invasion” from Munich (Schapp 1959, 20f): in 1906, several students of Lipps left Munich to study under Husserl. The first were Moritz Geiger, Alfred Schwenninger and Fritz Weinmann, but many others followed: most notably, Conrad in 1907 and von Hildebrand in 1909. Göttingen became thus home to a steadily and rapidly growing community composed not only of researchers from Munich, but also of those who gathered around Husserl and decided to study under him. The list includes such names as Winthrop Bell, Rudolf Clemens, Hedwig Conrad-Martius, Fritz Frankfurter, Siegfried Hamburger, Erich Heinrich, Jan Hering, Heinrich Hoffman, Roman Ingarden, Alexandre Koyré, Hans Lipps, Dietrich Mahnke, Helmuth Plessner, Wilhelm Schapp, Kurt Stavenhagen, Edith Stein and Alfred von Sybel (cf. Avé Lallemant 1988, Sepp 1988).

This group of young scholars gave itself an institutional form when Conrad and von Sybel founded the Göttingen Philosophische Gesellschaft in 1907. Arguably, the center of this new circle of phenomenology was Adolf Reinach, who taught at the university of Göttingen as a lecturer after having received his venia legendi in 1909. Reinach’s philosophical and didactic skills were so admired that several members referred to him as their true teacher in phenomenology (cf. Conrad-Martius 1921, Ingarden 1968, 408f, Stein 1965, 195, von Hildebrand 1975, 78).

The period that extended from 1906 to the end of the First World War was very fruitful in the history of phenomenology. Important dissertations were submitted and defended (e.g. Conrad in 1908, Conrad-Martius in 1912, von Hildebrand in 1912, and Stein in 1917). In addition, in 1911, Pfänder edited the important Lipps-Festschrift with the title Munich Philosophical Essays, which contains influential articles by Conrad, Geiger, Reinach and Pfänder himself. Just two years later, in 1913, the first volume of the Yearbook for Philosophy and Phenomenological Research appeared: Geiger, Pfänder, Reinach and Scheler were its co-editors, together with Husserl. This volume probably marks the peak in the philosophical production of the two circles, for it presents classics such as the first part of Pfänder’s On the Psychology of Sentiments, Geiger’s Contributions to the Phenomenology of Aesthetic Enjoyment, the first part of Scheler’s Formalism in Ethics and Non-Formal Ethics of Values and Reinach’s The Apriori Foundations of the Civil Law.

This volume also includes Husserl’s Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, in which he places transcendental philosophy at the core of his research agenda in terms that are clearer than those he has used up to this point. Husserl’s transcendental phenomenology has many facets, but one idea seems particularly significant: this is the idea of a necessary correlation between reality and consciousness (cf. Zahavi 2008, 361). To put this in Husserl’s own words: “[a]n object existing in itself is never one with which consciousness or the Ego pertaining to consciousness has nothing to do” (Hua III/1, Eng. trans. 106). Husserl’s transcendentalism is still a matter of debate today: questions concerning the relation between Husserl’s Ideas and his previous works (especially the LI) or the exact location of his transcendentalism between the two poles of idealism and realism have not yet found a definite answer in the secondary literature.

In the Munich and Göttingen circles, Husserl’s Ideas was intensely discussed. Parts of its research program were pursued further, with Hering and Ingarden, for instance, attempting to develop Husserl’s theory of essences. Generally, however, this work provoked what could be seen as a mirror image reaction, for they provided the young phenomenologists with an opportunity to renew their commitment to a robust form of metaphysical realism, which they perceived as being incompatible with Husserl’s transcendentalism. Reality, it was claimed, exists independently of subjectivity (whether this is intended empirically or transcendentally). The clash between these two different approaches to phenomenology has also been labeled “the realism-idealism controversy” (Ingarden 1929, Avé-Lallemant 1975b) and turned out to be one of the most decisive issues in the history of the phenomenological movement. To mention just one of the most important consequences of this controversy, Husserl cited Pfänder’s refusal of transcendentalism (shared, as he writes, by “the phenomenologists of the Munich and Göttingen tradition”) as the main reason for preferring Martin Heidegger as his successor for the professorship in Freiburg in 1928 (cf. Husserl 1994, 180f).

The tragedy of the Great War not only led to an abrupt stop in the scientific production of the two circles, but also contributed to the dissolution of the Munich and, in particular, Göttingen groups. Several of its members died at the front: Reinach fell in 1917, and his fate was shared by, among others, Clemens, Frankfurter and Ritzel. In 1916, when Husserl moved to Freiburg to take over Heinrich Rickert’s position as chair of philosophy, the two circles’ “tradition of phenomenology” remained active mainly in Munich and Bergzabern (a small city in Rhineland-Palatinate), where the Conrads had an estate and regularly hosted discussions in which Hering, Koyré, Lipps, Stein, and von Sybel took part (cf. Feldes 2008). It was in Munich, however, that the future of this approach to phenomenology seemed most secure, thanks to its presence at that university, where Pfänder became full professor in 1929 and Gallinger and von Hildebrand taught as Privatdozenten. The rise of Nazism in Germany, however, put an end to this group, as well. Due to his opposition to the regime, von Hildebrand had to flee to the United States. Gallinger, who was of Jewish origin, left Germany for Sweden. Geiger (full professor in Göttingen from 1923) was forced to retire in 1933. And Stein died in Auschwitz in 1942.

Although it could be argued that the Munich and Göttingen seasons of phenomenology ended in those years, some of its members (e.g., Conrad-Martius, von Hildebrand, Ingarden, and Stavenhagen) continued to publish and remained active even after the Second World War. Their ideas have also directly influenced other authors, including Friedrich Bassenge, Nicolai Hartmann, Aurel Kolnai, José Ortega y Gasset, Herbert Spiegelberg, and Karol Wojtyła.

2. Philosophy of Mind

Some of the most interesting contributions developed within the Munich and Göttingen circles of phenomenology concern philosophy of mind and, in particular, the theory of intentionality. These contributions generally converge on the idea that there are many primitive kinds of of-ness or about-ness, which are radically different from each other. This idea can be claimed to conflict with Husserl’s theory of intentionality as presented in his Logical Investigations: on a possible interpretation of this theory, there are several kinds of “objectifying” acts (like thinking, perceiving, and imagining) that must, however, all be qualified as intentional in exactly the same sense, since they all instantiate the very same essence (they are “species” of the genus of “intention,” cf. Hua XIX 380f, 432f, 625f.)

The assumption of radically different kinds of intentionality first arises in connection with an important distinction drawn by early phenomenologists between the act of “meaning” something and presentation, i.e., acts like perceptions or imaginations (cf. section 2.1 below). But it is also at work when phenomenologists address and describe other types of acts—and especially social acts and intentional actions (cf. 2.2) and collective acts (2.3). As we will see in the following sections, all these kinds of acts are held to be irreducible or primitive and, in any case, not explainable by merely referring to other kinds of experiences. This idea leads early phenomenologists to a multi-faceted and articulated view about intentionality: in many ways, phenomenological insights on how the mind refers to the world, on what it means to do things with words or on what it means to share an experience seem to have anticipated contemporary debates on these issues.

2.1 Theory of Intentionality

Within early phenomenology, the notion of thinking is generally associated (if not simply identified) with that of Meinen (literally: “to mean,” hereafter “meaning something” or “meaning act,” cf. Mulligan 2011) as a specific kind of intentional act, which fundamentally differs from presentation. It can be argued that early phenomenologists share a basic understanding of this concept, which remains constant despite the different nuances it assumes over time. As it has been shown (cf. Mulligan 2011, 2012), the reflection on meaning acts accompanies the entire history of the two circles. This section illustrates some of the key passages in the phenomenological theorizing about the act of meaning something and its relation to presentation.

2.1.1 Meaning Acts and Presentations

This section focuses on three main claims that might be argued to be at the core of phenomenlogical theorizing about meaning acts: (i) to mean something is to mean something which is intuitively absent (i.e., which is not seen or imagined); (ii) to mean something and to present something are not species of a common genus and, therefore, they cannot “fuse” (i.e., presentations cannot “fulfil” meaning acts); and (iii) to mean something is a conceptual act, whereas to present—i.e., to perceive or imagine—something is non-conceptual. All these claims are developed by different phenomenologists, by drawing on the contributions of their colleagues, and could be argued to mutually support each other.

Alexander Pfänder is most likely the first who, in his habilitation of 1899 (published 1900), discusses the notion of meaning something and characterizes this act as essentially non-intuitive. In this work, which is mainly devoted to the experience of willing, by “meaning something,” Pfänder understands a particular kind of mental act towards a content which is not present to the mind. Any description of willing, Pfänder argues, requires a preliminary description of meaning acts. Indeed, willing always presupposes a meaning act in the sense that, when one wants something, one is directed towards something that is not (yet) present. For instance, if you want to eat a pizza, you have to be able to mean eating the pizza, although, at the very moment in which the corresponding will occurs, this event is absent (or, according to a possible interpretation, it is not believed to be present, cf. Uemura/Yaegashi 2012).

To be sure, in this early work, Pfänder still classifies meaning something as a kind of presentation (Vorstellung): roughly, to mean something is to present a (representing) content that symbolically refers to another (represented) content that itself is not present in sensation, whereby the two contents are in a similarity or depictive relation (1900, 25ff, cf. also Fischer 1905). Pfänder’s position, however, rapidly evolves in the following years. As early as 1898, at a talk at the Verein, he recognizes that presentations are always intuitive (anschaulich), whereas the directedness towards an absent correlate does not bear intuitive content. Pfänder presents the example of someone attending a lecture (1898, 61): if the auditor understands the speaker, then she is directed towards the same objects about which the speaker is talking. That is, the auditor is not—or not only—directed towards the sounds emitted by the speaker (these being intuitive contents). Rather, she is directed towards the referent of these words. The referent, however, is not given intuitively or, at least, is not required to be intuitively given.

In his later work, Pfänder develops this position by increasingly stressing the differences between presenting and meaning something (cf. 1911, 135). Eventually, he comes to consider the latter experience as an act of its own kind and no longer as a kind of presentation (cf. 1913, 19): The concept of a non-intuitive presentation is thus held to be a genuine contradiction in terms (cf. 1921, 140, 1933, 21f), and meaning acts, being defined by a lack of intuitive content, are described as referring to an object only in a linguistic way (cf. 1973, 153). This is why such acts could also be addressed under the label of “thinking” or, at least, as one kind of thinking among others (such as questioning, conjecturing, assuming, inferring, etc., cf. 1921, 145f, 1933, 21).

Pfänder’s early positions provide the basis for a series of arguments that, in his 1911 paper On the Theory of Negative Judgment, Reinach develops to illustrate that meaning something is an act of its own kind that is fundamentally different from presentation. Reinach seems to understand the notion of meaning something as being very close to—if not simply interchangeable (but see Mulligan 2011, 266 for a different interpretation) with—that of thought (cf. 1908a, 339f, 1913a, 419). Note, however, that this broad sense of “thinking” is contrasted with a narrower one according to which only ideal objects like numbers are said to be “thought” (cf. 1911a, 104). Reinach also operates with a broad notion of presentation (Vorstellung), which encompasses all acts that have an intuitive access to their objects: they include imaginations, sensual and categorial perceptions, presentifications (i.e., the act of making “present” a past object), etc. (1911a, 101).

According to Reinach, there are a number of properties that characterize acts of meaning, but not that of presenting (1911a, 102ff). One of the most important is the following: whilst presentations are not linguistic (1911a, 104), meaning something is a linguistic act, for it always bears what Reinach calls “linguistic clothing.” This is conducive to the idea that, whereas presentations are defined in terms of experiences that give intuitive access to the object, meaning acts are “blind” (1911a, 119): if one means an object, no intuitive aspect of the object becomes present simply due to the fact of this object having been meant. That makes meaning acts non-extended in time or even “temporally punctual.” By contrast, the objects of presentations are intuitively present, i.e., they stay “in front of” the subject as in perception, imagination, presentification, etc., and therefore can stretch in time. All this aligns with Pfänder’s view about meaning acts, but Reinach develops an additional argument that turns out to be crucial for the understanding of this kind of act.

After distinguishing these two types of experiences, Reinach questions whether this distinction boils down to the one introduced by Husserl in his Logical Investigations between acts lacking intuitive content and acts that are intuitively fulfilled. Roughly, Husserl’s idea is that objectifying acts either have to be described as intuitions (Anschauungen) because they bear intuitive content—in the case of perceptions, this content, also qualified as “real [reell],” is saliently made of sensations (Empfindungen, later also labeled as hyle—for the development of this notion cf. Taipale 2014, 27ff). Or they lack such content, and then they have to be qualified as thinking acts (in the sense of “meaning-intentions” or “significations”). Husserl makes the point that objectifying acts can be more or less intuitively fulfilled, meaning that the intuitive content typically comes in degrees: if the act has a maximum of intuitive content, then one faces a so-called “pure intuition,” in which “no part, no side, no property of its object fails to be intuitively presented […], none is merely indirectly co-meant [mitgemeint]” (Hua XIX 611, Eng. trans. mod., 236). By contrast, if the act is empty, then it is a signitive presentation (or a thinking act). In addition, if an intuition and a thinking act are directed to the same object in the same sense, they can “fuse,” to the effect that the intuition can be said to intuitively fulfill the empty act. Note that this view seems to imply that, since the presence of intuitive content is not essential for the act to be an objectifying act, every such act either is a signification or is always co-constituted by a signification. (It should not go unmentioned that, contrary to his initial position in the LI, Husserl changes his mind about this issue; in later works, he stresses that intuitions are not co-constituted by thinking acts, cf. Hua XVI §17, Hua XX/I, 85–98 and Melle 2002.)

On his end, Reinach accepts that, first, a presentation can be more or less intuitively fulfilled, but he also stresses (1911a, 105) that the act’s component, which is fulfilled by the intuitive content, is not a meaning act. In addition, Reinach accepts that the subject can simultaneously present an object and mean this very same object. However, he maintains that in this case the meaning act remains vis à vis the presentation, as it were; the acts do not relate to each other in any intrinsic way: “this identity of reference point of the two acts cannot sanction the identification of the acts themselves, i.e. by allowing the dissolution of the punctual act of meaning within [sic] the stretched-out act of presentation” (1911a, 103, Eng. 324). In other words, Reinach maintains that, although the objectual correlates of both acts can coincide, meaning acts cannot enter a relation of fulfillment with presentations (or with intuitions in Husserl’s sense), i.e., they cannot fuse (1911a, 106, on this, also cf. Salice 2012).

The reason for rejecting the claim that meaning something and presentation can enter a relation of fulfillment becomes obvious if one considers how Reinach qualifies meaning acts: being “blind,” these acts simply cannot have intuitive content. They can only be accompanied by such contents, but these contents “do not ‘exhibit’ or ‘present’ anything—for of course in the sphere of meaning there is absolutely nothing to hand which is presented” (1911a, 106 Eng. 328; cf. also Gallinger 1914, 36 who applies this idea to the investigation of memory). Thus, intuitive contents are not and cannot be immanent in meaning acts and, if these acts did have such contents, they would not be meaning acts, but presentations (in 1908a, 339 this argument is developed in explicit contrast to Husserl). Indeed, while meaning acts are always “empty” (or, more precisely, they do not show anything like the dichotomy of emptiness/fullness), it is “very questionable whether there exist absolutely intuition-free presentations” (1911a, 106, Eng. 329).

From this view, one could conclude that, although presentations and meaning acts, are both directed to objects and states of affairs, their directedness is not of the same kind: if it were of the same kind, meaning acts and presentation could fuse. To put this differently, the “of-ness” of presentations and perceptions does not coincide with the intentionality of intentions or meaning acts—and, as we will see below, one additional way to flesh out this point is that the latter form of directedness, not the former, is conceptual. This distinction is terminologically fixed by Conrad, who in his 1911 essay, Perception and Presentation (An Essential Comparison), pushes Reinach’s view further and reserves the expression, “Intentionalität,” to the directedness of meaning acts (1911, 64 fn) by qualifying presentations as the consciousness of an object or of a thing, i.e., a pure passive “having” of the object (for this notion cf. also Pfänder 1911, 167f; on the idea of “rezeptives Haben” cf. Reinach 1911, 102, von Hildebrand 1916, 85, Karelitzki 1914, 35, among others).

This approach to the intentionality of meaning acts, however, raises a question: if these acts are “blind” in the sense that the objects they refer to are intuitively absent, how does their intentionality work? We have already seen that to mean or to intend something is to mean it via linguistic signs (cf. also Conrad 1910, Schmücker 1956); this idea is further investigated by Herman Ritzel in his dissertation of 1914 (published 1916). What makes Ritzel’s proposal particularly interesting is that he justifies the distinction between meaning acts and presentations in an original way, which seems to anticipate the debate on the theory of direct reference and on rigid designators. Ritzel accepts Reinach’s argument that presentations require the intuitive presence of the object, whereas meaning something does not (1916, 35), but he complements this view by claiming that meaning acts and presentation differ because the kinds of objects towards which they are directed differ. Whereas presenting directly points at objects, meaning points at concepts, and it is by means of concepts that meaning acts can be said to refer to objects (1916, 48f).

One interesting point Ritzel makes is that, when it comes to meaning acts pointing at “empirical concepts” (an expression he takes from Kant to express concepts based on sensorial experience, cf. KdrV A50 B74, 1916, 22), semantic reference works in the same way in which, on John Stuart Mill’s view, proper names denote individuals: just as proper names directly refer to individuals, so, Ritzel writes, do “[empirical concepts] denote [nennen] their object directly [in direkter Weise]” (1916, 17). More precisely, what both cases have in common is that meanings of proper names or of terms of empirical concepts change if the objects they denote change. That is, the content of an empirical concept is identical with the kind the concept refers to (and not, e.g., with some set of properties of the objects at issue). In contrast to the traditional view, in these cases, it is not the intension (the content) of a concept that determines its extension, but rather the extension that determines the intension.

2.1.2 Stances and Perceptions

The views illustrated in the previous section seem to support a statement made by Conrad in his last publication according to which Husserl’s students in Göttingen rejected Husserl’s claim that intentionality is the essential characteristic of perception and presentation (cf. 1968, 3). Indeed, despite the differences in the details, the general idea that intentionality is not a genus but a property that characterizes only a specific kind of experience (i.e., acts of meaning something) seems to have been a matter of communis opinio, given that authors like Geiger (1911, 125, 139), Stavenhagen (1925, 164f, 1933, 38), or Brunswig (1910, 64f) mention the idea without needing to justify it. Other advocates of this view are von Hildebrand and Linke, both of whom enrich the debate in an original way.

Von Hildebrand elaborates upon the idea of intentional acts or intention (Intention) as developed in early phenomenology by arguing in The Idea of Moral Action of 1912 (published 1916) that stances or position-takings (Stellungnahmen) are also intentions. By “stances” von Hildebrand mainly means affective and conative experiences in which the subject actively takes a given position towards an object or a state of affairs (e.g., she emotively responds towards the value of an object or she wants to bring about a given state of affairs). By building on ideas that in particular Pfänder, Reinach and Scheler developed about emotions (on emotions in early phenomenology, s. Vendrell Ferran 2008; on Scheler’s account, cf. Mulligan 2008a), von Hildebrand sharply distinguishes between so-called cognitions (Kenntnisnahmen) and stances: like Conrad, he also characterizes cognitions as the “consciousness of an object” (cf. von Hildebrand 1916, 14ff), meaning that perceptions and presentations are experiences that can be said to be of an object, but in which their subject remains passive.

By contrast, the subject is spontaneously or actively directed towards a correlate when he or she has an intention (Intention). What characterizes these experiences is their spontaneity and the “ideal relation” they enter into with their correlates (1916, 13). What is particularly interesting about von Hildebrand’s point is that stances are also spontaneous or active experiences in the sense that, when one emotionally responds to the value of an object, the subject is acting spontaneously by entering into an ideal relation with values (cf. 1916, 14ff, 75): the subject instantiates the kind of stance that is ideally required by the value itself (1916, 39f). This insight seems to be illustrated by the possibility of a subject’s grasping a value, say, the beauty of an artwork, by, nonetheless, remaining nonplussed or passive towards it (cf. 1916, 76): in this case, the specific act of cognition that, according to von Hildebrand, provides access to values (and that he labels “value-taking [Wertnehmen],” cf. 1916, 78ff; on this notion, cf. Mulligan 2010, 235f) does not trigger an emotive and active response to it. Von Hildebrand’s position is also worthy of mention because it appears to represent the way in which many other phenomenologists understood the relation between emotions as affective responses that already presuppose the grasping of values (cf. Brunswig 1911, 47, Reinach 1912/13, 295ff, Scheler 1913/16, 267ff).

So far, we have mainly dealt with meaning acts, but how do early phenomenologists describe presentations and, especially, perceptions? An interesting contribution is provided by Linke (cf. 1929): when tackling the notion of perception, Linke denies that perceiving consists in conceptually grasping (or in apprehending) sensations. In particular, he refuses the explanation of perception proposed by Husserl in the LI (cf. also Rollinger 2000). As we saw in 2.1.1, Husserl argues that perceptions (and intuitions more generally speaking) can “fuse” with thinking acts—this is made possible by the structure of these acts and, in particular, by the fact that their structure includes so-called “apprehensional” matter (Auffassungsmaterie): if a perception and a thinking act are structured in such a way as to include matter of the same kind, then these two matters can be brought to “coincidence.” Since the matter of thinking acts is characterized by Husserl as conceptual (Hua XIX 105f), it seems plausible to argue that, in order for this matter to be brought to coincidence with perceptual matter, the latter must also be conceptual. Accordingly, to perceive something would thus mean to apprehend or even to “interpret” (interpretieren) intuitive content (sensations or Empfindungen, cf. 2.1.1) by means of conceptual content. However, Husserl himself seems to refuse this interpretation at times (cf. Hua XIX 550f), making the content of intuitions a debated topic not only in the secondary literature (cf. Hopp 2008, Mulligan 2005), but also in early phenomenology, as we will soon see. Such debate also anticipates many of the themes that, from Fred Dretske onwards (cf. his 1969), are discussed under the labels “conceptual” and “non-conceptual content.”

Against this background, Linke maintains that perception consists of recognizing conceptual forms, but these, he argues, already lie in—or structure—the object of perception (Linke 1929, 169, 220f). Accordingly, Linke’s theory of perception seems to be on par with that of his colleagues in Göttingen: even if perceptions are about objects, they are not intentional in the sense that, for them to be directed towards an object, they need to bear apprehensional (or conceptual) matter. But, now, if perception does not rest upon the apprehension (Auffassung) of sensations, how can the difference between perceptions and sensations be accounted for? To be sure, early phenomenologists seem to be rather suspicious of the very notion of sensation. Some of them denied its existence: Daubert, for example, held that sensations are a sort of theoretical entity that does not actually exist, but whose existence can be assumed for heuristic purposes in order to explain how perception works (s. Fréchette 2012). The idea that sensations are not real parts of perception seems to be typical for many other members of the two circles (and prominently for Scheler, cf. 1925, 285): indeed, according to Schapp the members of the Munich circle “did not believe anymore in the sensation as constituent of perception” (Schapp 1959, 21; cf. Ingarden 1968, 419).

Others endorsed the view that sensations are of or about objects: Linke, for example, argued that sensations are intentional experiences (1929, 164ff). Other phenomenologists also distinguished between the experience of sensing and its content. So did Conrad-Martius (1916, 442), von Hildebrand (1916, 74), Pfänder (1904, 212f) and Reinach (1913a, 378).

2.1.3 The Relation between Meaning Acts and Presentations

Although the two circles seem, in general, to have agreed with the thesis that a subject can be directed towards objects in fundamentally distinct ways, one of which is active, spontaneous, linguistic and conceptual, whereas the other is passive, non-linguistic and non-conceptual, this position nevertheless also attracted objections and criticism. Some early phenomenologists refused parts of its implications, while others refused the thesis altogether.

Karelitzki, for instance, sides with Reinach and Conrad when it comes to distinguishing meaning from presentation, but he rejects their cardinal point that meaning is always blind, i.e., that it can never get sight of the object (1914, 33f). Karelitzki argues that, although meaning is generally blind, it does not have to be so: he presents an example in which someone asks the question “what do you mean with…?” and the one asked gives a characterization of what was meant, hence bringing the meaning act step by step closer to what Karelitzki calls the “essence” of the meant object (1914, 36).

Other voices within the groups maintained—very much in line with Husserl’s work—that intentions (be they thoughts or intuitions) can constitutively be fulfilled by intuitive material. This idea is advocated by Schapp (1910), Hofmann (1913) and Leyendecker (1913), who apply it to the phenomenology of perception, and by Heinrich, who presupposes it in his work on concepts (1909). Indeed, in early works, Schapp holds that, within perception, sensual givenness and ideas (or concepts) can only be separated conceptually, but not factually: without ideas, we cannot perceive things (1910, 133f). Although Hofmann was critical towards the existence of sensations (the first chapter of his 1913 essay is a critique of this notion), he nonetheless puts Husserl’s concept of apprehension at the core of perception: perception is apprehension, even though the apprehended contents are still not sensations, but are already structured “sight or visual things” (Sehdinge), cf. Hofmann 1913, 82 (on the notion of Sehding, cf. Casati 1994). Leyendecker investigated the phenomenon of cognitive penetrability and how perception is permeable to thinking, by analyzing different perceptual scenarios like those of “overlooking” something (1913, 12ff) and of selective perception (1913, 48ff), as well as figures such as the Rhombille tiling (1913, 87) and different kinds of illusions (cf. 1913, 127ff).

Importantly, the debate about thought, presentation and their relation was not confined to the perimeters of phenomenology, but had close ties to the tradition of thought-psychology, or Denkpsychologie, which was strongly represented in Munich by some of its main figures, namely, Oswald Külpe, Karl Bühler and Otto Selz (who was also a member of the Verein in Munich) and supported by neoscholastic philosophers like Clemens Baeumker and Joseph Geyser (many phenomenological dissertations arose from this cooperation). One of the basic ideas of thought psychology, i.e., the existence of non-depictive or non intuitive acts (also classified as the “situation of consciousness”, “meaning awareness”, or “thoughts”, cf. Kusch 1999, 21–30), which can neither be reduced to other experiences nor, most notably, to presentations or sensations, could arguably be identified as one of the motives for this reciprocal interest.

2.2 Social Acts and Intentional Actions

In early phenomenology, the notion of social acts (soziale Akte) comprises, roughly, all those acts that today are widely known as “speech acts.” These acts, which include promises, orders, bets, and apologies, must secure their uptake in order to be successfully or happily performed. (Term and concept of “social act” as “social operation of the mind” can be found in Thomas Reid, cf. Schuhmann/Smith 1990. Reid was not unknown within the two circles of phenomenology, cf. Peters 1909, but there is no solid evidence that early phenomenologists adopted this idea from Reid, cf. Mulligan 1987, 33f n 5.) Although the history of philosophy has generally associated speech act theory with the names John L. Austin or John Searle, the two circles of phenomenology already provided a comprehensive theory of such acts. One main difference between the two approaches is that the tradition inaugurated by Austin generally understands speech acts as conventional or ritual actions (cf. Austin 1962, 14), whereas phenomenology—as we will see below—describes social acts as a kind of mental act or experience (cf. Smith 1990).

The first steps towards such a theory are established by Pfänder in his reflections on the act of ordering someone to do something and the logic of imperatives (1909), as well as by Daubert in his tentative theory of questions of 1911/12 (cf. Schuhmann/Smith 1987). It is plausible to assume that Reinach—who in 1913 presented the most advanced and articulated theory of such acts within phenomenology—developed his position in close dialogue with both Pfänder and Daubert (cf. Schuhmann 2004b, Smith 1990).

In his Imperativenlehre, Pfänder pursues the idea of developing a deontic logic, i.e., a logic for those propositions that have the form “subject s should (should not) be/do x.” Accordingly, his interest is primarily in orders qua ideal objects and not in orders qua acts. There is a close link between these two notions, though. Just as ideal thoughts or propositions are types or species of thinking acts (cf. 1921, 7f), so might ideal orders be described as types of orders. For instance, one and the same order can be given by different persons in the sense that their acts instantiate the same type. Based on this type-token relation, it is possible to read the phenomenological structure of orders-qua-acts from the ideal structure of orders-qua-types. There are two insights that one can derive from doing so. The first is that, as Pfänder stresses, acts of ordering are sui generis experiences, given that they are instances of distinct ideal types. The second insight is that the structure of ideal orders might require an addressor (1909, 307) and an addressee (1909, 301). This suggests that Pfänder also recognized the existence of ordering acts that are addressed by someone to someone else. Even though Pfänder indicates in some passages that the addressor has to understand the order and that both addressor and addressee have to enter into a social relation of some sort (cf. 1909, 298, 301, 313), he did not provide a systematic treatment of all the conditions that have to be fulfilled for an act of order to be happily realized.

Similar conclusions can be drawn from Daubert’s reflections about questions during the same period (cf. Schuhmann/Smith 1987). Daubert, too, distinguished the questioning act from its ideal meaning or from the question in an ideal sense but, in contrast to Pfänder’s sparse indications about acts of orders, he described the experience of questioning in more detail. This act coincides neither with intellectual states like uncertainty, doubt or conjecture, nor with volitional stances like the wish or the desire to know something. Questions can be motivated by all these experiences, but they cannot be reduced to them. For instance, questions are temporally punctual acts, whereas the aforementioned phenomena are state-like experiences.

Daubert’s insightful point about speech acts is that a question can be realized in two different ways: one can pose an inner question, as when—in order to draw some conclusion \(q\) or not-\(q\)—one wonders whether \(p\) is the case. Or, one can direct one’s question to someone else, in which case we have an instance of a “directed question (Anfrage)”. When the question is directed to someone else, Daubert contends, the act has to be uttered externally in order to give the addressee the possibility of apprehending the question. This is a decisive step towards the recognition of social acts as a distinct class of acts, and it can be argued that Daubert’s intuition contains the idea of social acts “in germ” (cf. Schuhmann/Smith 1987, 375).

Reinach develops Daubert’s idea from its initial germination when he claims that a question that does not have to be uttered is not a question at all. Of course, there are erotetic experiences that can be realized internally, but such experiences are not questions; rather, they are erotetic attitudes (Fragehaltungen, cf. Reinach 1912/13, 281f and Pfänder 1911, 180f), which do not even need to be linguistically “clothed”. The main difference between such attitudes and genuine acts of questioning is that the latter have to be uttered externally. And this is because, again by necessity, questions require be heard by their addressees in order to be happily performed. As such, they are in-need-of-being-heard (“vernehmungsbedürftig”). This is an essential property not only of questions, but of a whole group of acts encompassing promises, orders, bets, communications, etc. (cf. Mulligan 1987): all acts which are in need of being heard are social acts.

Social acts are a basic kind of intentional act. The requirement of uptake as an “essential” property has to be understood in its exact sense: without this property, the corresponding experiences would not be of the kind that they are. As such, it is not possible to trace back experiences that are in-need-of-being-heard to experiences that do not exhibit this property. Take the act of communicating or informing (Mitteilen) as an example: at first glance, Reinach describes it as though communicating were just asserting. Assertion is construed as a complex act constituted by two parts: an act of meaning, which is accompanied by a conviction (1911a, 107). In this sense, to assert a state of affairs is to mean it with the concomitant conviction that it subsists. Communication has the same constituents of assertion: when one (honestly) informs someone of a given state of affairs, one means it only insofar as one is also convinced of its subsistence. Still, communication is irreducible to assertion (which is an inner act) because, unlike assertion, communication is in need of being heard. Communication presupposes that someone who is able to hear the act must be there: since the act can be heard only if it assumes a “body” (cf. Reinach 1913b, 160), the act has to be uttered. Another difference between inner and social acts is the capacity, which several social acts have, to generate social effects, i.e., to produce social entities. For instance, it belongs to the essence of a promise to produce a claim and an obligation once the act is successfully realized. By contrast, the mere assertion that I am willing to do something does not bring me under the obligation to do so.

Reinach’s insights about speech acts are further developed by von Hildebrand, who extends the domain of “social” experiences. In addition to linguistic acts, von Hildebrand argues that there are a number of stances that specifically address other persons and must be understood by their targets. Mainly, these are the stances of love and hate (in their manifold forms) towards another person. For instance, if one loves someone else, there is a sense in which the emotion could be assessed as successful if the lover manages to let the loved one know of his or her love (if the lover spiritually “touches” the loved one, von Hildebrand 1930, 28f). This appears to be so because, if the addressee is emotionally touched by the expressed love, then he or she can respond to the social stance and can reciprocate the love of which she is the target.

The results of Reinach’s investigations about social acts are further developed by Schapp and Stein. Both explore some of the legal implications of Reinach’s theory. In the first volume of his The New Science of Law (1930), Schapp focuses on the idea that social acts generate social entities and, in particular, on the view that promises generate claims and obligations. This insight is employed to shed light on the notion of contracts and on the relations between contracts and values. First, Schapp recognizes several forms of contracts and argues that they can be described as more or less complex forms of promises. More interestingly, he also investigates the relations into which promises and contracts enter with values. For instance, in an agreement of sale, what is paid (or what is given) and what one gets bear values that the two counterparts evaluate before deciding to enter into the agreement, i.e., to promise something.

In her An Investigation Concerning the State (1925), Stein argues that states are collective persons, which are sovereign and which are posited by free acts of “foundation” (Staatsgründung, 1925, 30). In this sense, states are social entities generated by such acts. Further, she argues that a state’s legislative power is exerted by means of acts of enactments (Bestimmungen). Indeed, Reinach devoted large parts of his monograph to the description of the social act of enacting and its function in bringing positive law into existence. Although Stein seems to confound Reinach’s notion of enactment with that of an order (cf. Schuhmann 2004c), she explicitly addresses a point which Reinach left unsolved: Reinach did not discuss the authority a person must have in order to be able to produce effective enactments. Stein argues that enactments are acts carried out in the name of a state: it is via the state’s sovereignty that the enactments performed by individuals receive the authority they must have in order to be effective.

Phenomenological accounts of social acts often contain elements of a theory of action. On the one hand, an action is what is generally promised, ordered or apologized for. On the other, social acts themselves share characteristics that are typical of intentional actions; Schapp, e.g., points out that to conclude a contract (i.e. to realize a peculiar promise) is an intentional action (i.e. an action led by volitional experiences) in the sense that it can be the result of a process of deliberation (1930, 2f).

Intentional actions are yet another long-standing research topic in early phenomenology. They are mainly investigated in several works by Pfänder (1900, 1911, 1913/1916), von Hildebrand (1916), Scheler (1913/16, 141ff), Reinach (1912/13), and Reiner (1927). Generally, these authors agree that the phenomenon of intentional action has to be analyzed into at least two distinct parts. On the one hand, we have the will, conceived of as another stance of the volitional kind in addition to wishing, striving, etc. The will can lead to a decision (Entschluss) or a deliberation (Vorsatz) and may be the result or the effect of previous experiences (such as premeditation, cf. Reinach 1912/13, or the feeling of a value, cf. von Hildebrand 1916). These experiences can be said to “motivate” the decision, where motivation is understood as a peculiar form of causation, namely, as mental causation (cf. Pfänder 1911, Stein 1922). On the other hand, the will may lead to “acts of realization (Realisierungsakte)” that accompany and affect bodily movements (Scheler 1913/16, 142, von Hildebrand 1916, 26). This is a distinct act, which can also be characterized as “trying”—once one decides to do something, one also tries to do it.

2.3 Collective Intentionality

Phenomenological investigation into social acts already pointed out that such acts can be performed not only by an individual, but also collectively: not only can orders be given to a group, but they can also be performed by a group (Pfänder 1909, 312; Reinach classifies these cases as one of the several modifications that social acts can undergo, cf. his 1913b, 164f). In general, phenomenological investigations into collective intentionality presuppose that, if one wants to know what a group is and how a group is created or constituted, one has to look at what may be called the “internal” or “subjective” conditions that the group’s members have to fulfill. Questions related to collective intentionality are discussed mainly in the works of von Hildebrand, Stein and Walther. Their positions are developed in close relation to the work of Scheler, who provided influential insights into the nature of groups (cf. 1913/16, 1923), and anticipate many aspects of more recent debates about “social ontology” (for some of these aspects, cf. Mulligan 2001, Schmid 2012, Schmid/Schweikard 2013).

Walther, for instance, argues that a group arises if some psychological conditions are fulfilled. Roughly, these are: the members must first share a common background or habitus (a concept she adopts from, among others, Pfänder, cf. his 1913/1916) in which the existence of others is taken for granted—somehow, the others “are in me” already. Other conditions concern cognitive relations between the group’s members. In particular, to form a community, two or more individuals must share the same intentional experience, which is directed towards the same object; they must empathize with the experience of the counterpart, and they must reciprocally “unify” (where “reciprocal unification [Wechseleinigung]” can be defined as a positive intentional feeling of togetherness, cf. León and Zahavi 2015). In addition, the individuals have to empathize with each act of unification again. One could ask, however, whether this cognitive architecture of interlocked experiences is both a necessary and sufficient condition for the existence of a group and of collective intentionality (Schmid 2012, 132–138, León and Zahavi 2015).

An ontologically more robust position, according to which collective intentionality cannot be reduced to I-intentionality plus some cognitive relations, was proposed by Stein. In her treatise, Individual and Community (1922), Stein also advocates the idea that the constitution of a group has to be explained by means of clarifying the subjective or internal conditions that the group’s members have to fulfill (Stein 1922, 216f). Against this background, she develops a fine-grained account of the experiences that lay the foundation for the existence of groups by classifying three different kinds of groups: the mass, the community and the society (this classification is broadly adopted from Scheler, cf 1913/16, 529ff, who substantially modified an earlier taxonomy proposed by Ferdinand Tönnies in 1887). Whereas the mass develops out of mere emotional contagion (1922, 219ff), community and society presuppose more complex forms of sociality. In particular, the community is characterized by its members sharing a “collective life (Gemeinschaftsleben).” By this concept, Stein intends a primitive form of intentionality where at least two subjects are directed together towards one and the same object. This kind of intentionality should be distinguished from the one in which two subjects direct their intentional acts to each other (cf. Stein 1922, 120ff, 244—empathy would be an instance of this form of intentionality, cf. Stein 1917, Scheler 1912) and which could be called an “I-Thou intentional relation” (von Hildebrand 1930, 32) in contrast to “collective” intentionality proper (s. also De Vecchi 2014).

According to Stein, the difference between associations and communities lies in the way in which the members consider themselves: in associations, the members see themselves as objects; in communities, they see themselves as subjects or persons (1925, 2). That is, societies exist only to reach a common goal and are founded by the free acts of their members, whereas communities arise spontaneously, and their members are in solidarity with one another. To exist, societies require communities, but not vice versa. Interestingly, communities might also develop into collective persons (Gesamtpersonen), which can be seen as the “ideal limit” of community, i.e. as a community in which, ideally, all the members see themselves as fully responsible for the entire community (1922, 249f).

The notion of collective person is adopted by Stein from Scheler, from whom she also draws on for other aspects of her theory. Scheler insisted with assiduity on the role that shared experiences, and, especially, shared feelings, play in the constitution of groups (cf. Scheler 1913/16, 529ff, 1923). In particular, communities, Scheler contends, are groups whose members co-experience the same mental states: such collective experiences give rise to a single stream of consciousness, whose subject is the community itself (1913/16, 530). He also advocates the idea that every person is, in addition to being an individual person, also “a member of a comprehensive collective person”: thanks to the existence of persons, collective persons could be said to exist actually, not only ideally (1913/16, 523ff).

The idea that communities are persons was contested by von Hildebrand in his Metaphysics of Community of 1930 (written in collaboration with Hamburger, cf. A. Hildebrand 2000, 227). On the one hand, in his work, von Hildebrand sides with the other phenomenologists in arguing that there are different kinds of social groups. So, e.g., associations are mere artifacts, communities of love or friendships presuppose strong social relations based on reciprocal feelings, and life spheres [Lebenskreise] arise “spontaneously” without any plan or design. On the other hand, von Hildebrand disputes the view that one can account for all of the different kinds of groups by merely referring to their members’ subjective features: this is true for associations, I-Thou communities and primitive life-spheres, but not for communities. With respect to this kind of group, von Hildebrand stresses an external principle of constitution, i.e., what he calls the unifying force (virtus unitiva) that values can exert over individuals. Von Hildebrand’s idea is that individuals are constantly geared to values and that the values toward which they produce a response (Wertantwort) “incorporate” the individuals into themselves (1930, 67ff). Accordingly, the individuals incorporated within the same value are “unified” and form a community (a similar view is advanced by Stavenhagen in 1933). Von Hildebrand does not deny that some further conditions must be fulfilled in order for the community’s members to be aware of being part of a community and that such awareness is required in order for them to intentionally act as a group. Still, as far as the ontological structure of a community is concerned, such conditions do not represent a genuine tie between the individuals. These ties can be recognized, but they are not created all at once when such conditions are satisfied.

3. The Theory of Objects in the Munich and Göttingen Circles

In one of his first publications, Geiger argues that phenomenology has to do with both acts and objects (Geiger 1907, 354). In a sense, this distinction might be misleading, for experiences, too, can be considered as objects of a given kind, namely of a mental kind. Still, Geiger’s statement captures the idea that phenomenological investigations are not confined to the sphere of acts, for they also include the acts’ objectual correlates. That is, phenomenology does not merely coincide with the material ontology or the eidetics of the mental (i.e., with a discipline about the essential properties of mental objects). Rather, this is only one chapter of phenomenology. Phenomenology also provides a general theory of objects, or an ontology. There are at least three interrelated features that broadly characterize the wide range of early phenomenological investigations on ontology. These are: metaphysical realism, ontological pluralism, and essentialism.

3.1 General Features

3.1.1 Metaphysical realism

Early phenomenology generally assumed that the world is made of objects of different kinds and that their existence is intentionality-independent. That is, objects exist independently of a subject that might know them (whether the notion of subject is interpreted as an empirical or as a transcendental I). In addition, it is held that objects have an ontological structure and that such structure is, in principle, fully intelligible. It is intelligible in the sense that, if there is an object, then it is possible to know it and its structure adequately. This is not to say, however, that the ideal inventory of all entities in the world includes only objects existing independently of subjects. Artifacts and social objects like institutional facts (claims, obligations, rights and duties, etc.) exist because there are individuals or communities that create them. Also more volatile entities such as perceptual phenomena (Erscheinungen) partly owe their existence to subjects.

3.1.2 Ontological Pluralism

The second feature is related to the first: the world is made of objects that do not all belong to the same category and, because there are different kinds of objects, there are also different disciplines investigating them. This idea of ontological pluralism is inconsistent with psychologism: psychologism collapses different objectual domains into one, leading to the conclusion that there is one discipline—psychology—in charge of investigating them.

The ontological pluralism advocated by phenomenology also motivates a strong tendency towards anti-reductionism, as well as towards a descriptive approach to ontological questions: all objects must be described as they are—without succumbing to the temptation to reduce them to other kinds of entities (cf. Geiger 1933). Occasionally, such a descriptive tendency seems to suggest that phenomenology has to confine itself to pure descriptions denying the scientific role of definitions: the idea is that definitions have to be avoided because they reduce one concept to other concepts, hence, “betraying” the very essence of the definiendum (cf. Reinach 1914, 535, on the relations between explanation and description, cf. also Brunswig 1905 and Mulligan 2012 §1). This approach has been criticized, even within phenomenology, for it allegedly leads to a form of phenomenology characterized as “picture book phenomenology” (Bilderbuchphänomenologie, cf. Scheler 1913/16, 11, Hering 1939, 370 n 1).

3.1.3 Essentialism

In addition to the previous features, phenomenological ontology was committed to a form of essentialism according to which objects are constituted by an essence. Against this background, any attempt to reduce entities with a given essence to entities with a different one was perceived as a pernicious endeavor. The word “essence (Wesen),” however, is ambiguous (Reinach 1912): on the one hand, it can refer to the so-being of an individual object, i.e. to that which makes an individual the individual it is, e.g. the property of a quill to write finely (cf. Hering 1921, 496f; Hering reserves the term, “essence (Wesen),” for this concept). On the other hand, it can also indicate what or what kind a given object is (Hering uses the word “essentiality (Wesenheit)” to refer to essence in this second sense, cf. 1921, 505ff and Seifert 1996). Essences, especially in the second sense, are taken to—ideally—exist independently of whether they have exemplifications or not. As such, they are described as ideal or atemporal objects. Over the years, this conception would be substantially enriched, e.g., by Geiger’s idea of “dynamic essences” (cf. Geiger 1924), evolving through time and being characteristically instantiated in artworks (e.g., in essences like the tragic).

Within early phenomenology, one finds general agreement in the idea that, since objects instantiate essences, they enter into necessary relations (Hering 1921, Ingarden 1925, Reinach 1911b). So, e.g., it was claimed that certain kinds of facts are necessary (it is a necessary fact, for instance, that promises generate claims and obligations, that colors have extension, that movements have velocity, that tones have pitch and intensity, etc.,) and that these facts are grounded in the essence of promise, of color, of movement, of tone, etc. This highlights an idea that has recently become the focus of an intense debate (cf. Fine 1994a, 1994b, 1995), namely the idea that the concept of necessity is distinct from that of essentiality and that the latter grounds the former (cf. Mulligan 2004).

The necessity grounded in essentiality has to be distinguished from other kinds of necessities, like “empirical” necessity or causality (cf. Reinach 1911b, 85f, where he uses the term “modal” for the necessity grounded in essences and, somehow misleadingly, “material” for “empirical” necessity). Within a judgment, modal necessity applies to the copula (Reinach 1911b, 86) and does not enrich the “content” of the judgment: for instance, the judgment “two multiplied by two is necessarily four” is made true by the same state of affairs which makes the judgment “two multiplied by two is four” true. In other words, by affecting the copula, modal necessity affects the entire state of affairs posited in the judgment, which can hence be characterized as a necessary state of affairs. By contrast, empirical necessity applies to the predicate and enriches it; to say that “\(a\) is necessarily [in the sense of “causally”] related to \(b\)” is to introduce an additional claim over and above what it means to merely say that “\(a\) is related to \(b\)” (Reinach 1911b, 87).

3.2 Objects and States of Affairs

The research into ontology conducted within the two circles was decisively influenced by the views of both Husserl and Alexius Meinong. Indeed, almost all phenomenological investigations into ontology presuppose that objectualities (Gegenständlichkeiten) come in two kinds: objects or states of affairs. States of affairs are the referents of propositional attitudes like assumptions and judgments, and they are distinguished from objects—i.e., what nominal intentional acts refer to. If one carries out an act of assumption or of judgment, one cannot but judge or assume that something is or is not the case. That which is or is not the case is the state of affairs towards which the mental attitude is directed. From a linguistic point of view, objects are the referents of singular terms, be they concrete or abstract. By contrast, states of affairs are the referents or semantic values of declarative sentences as well as of perfect nominals; perfect nominals are linguistic constructions that contain a gerund and can syntactically act as names (e.g., “the rose’s being red,” cf. Vendler 1967, Bennett 1988).

As argued by Husserl in the LI, early phenomenology takes the category of object to be divided into the two sub-categories of real and ideal objects, which are distinguished by reference to their relation to time (cf. Hua XIX 129f). Ideal objects are atemporal; these are usually taken to be either general or individual objects. Properties and essences are general because they can be predicated of several objects. On the contrary, ideal objects, which cannot be predicated, are individual. So, e.g., Reinach takes natural numbers to be ideal and individual for they are not predicated of other entities (1911c, 58; 1914, 539f). Real objects are temporal; this category is traditionally divided into the classes of material and of mental objects.

Over the years, this standard classification was revised: in particular, the increasing attention devoted to social ontology led phenomenology to enrich its table of categories (cf. Salice 2013). First, the notion of real object was no longer confined to the material and the mental: although communities, e.g., are neither mental nor material entities, they are still temporal and, hence, real. Second, the case of abstract entities such as the claims and obligations generated by acts of promising called into question the strong connection hitherto endorsed or presupposed between ideality and temporality: on the one hand, these entities are neither material nor mental; on the other, they are temporal (they come into being at a given time and disappear when the promise is honored). Third, we have already seen that investigations into aesthetics led some phenomenologists to accept the existence of essences that are ideal, but nonetheless temporal or historical (for a similar conception cf. also Husserl’s idea of “bound idealities,” 1938, 321).

Phenomenological investigations of types of objects run parallel to those of states of affairs. The German expression for state of affairs is Sachverhalt (whereas Meinong’s equivalent reads “objective [Objektiv],” cf. Salice 2009): this term, which apparently was introduced by Carl Stumpf in the Brentano School around 1888 (cf. Rojszczak/Smith 2003, 165), has its roots in the theory of law (Smith 1978a) where it is used to express “juridical ‘status’ in the sense of ‘status rerum’ (state or constitution of things)” (cf. Smith 1988, 25). Indeed, this is conducive to how early phenomenologists use the term Sachverhalt: objects or things are held to have a structure and to be related to each other. So, e.g., an object’s being extended, being colored, being related to other objects, etc., are all held to be states of affairs (Sachverhalte). Early phenomenological debate about these entities extends over many years and is rich and multifaceted.

The different positions can be sorted into two more or less well defined competing views. According to the first, states of affairs as such have an ontological status which is intentionality-independent, whereas the second claims that only some restricted classes of states of affairs are intentionality-independent entities, while all others eventually depend on intentionality. Which classes are intentionality-dependent and which are independent remains a matter of debate: for instance, are there non-obtaining states of affairs (e.g. Elvis’s being the president of the US), are there negative states of affairs (e.g. the not being red of the White House) or existential states of affairs (the existence of Barack Obama) or impersonal states of affairs (the state of affairs that it is raining)?

In this debate, Reinach’s theory represents one extreme position (cf. Reinach 1911a): according to him, all judgments or all declarative sentences (whether true or false) refer to states of affairs. That is, all the aforementioned questions receive a positive answer within his theory. True sentences (i.e., those sentences which express true propositions) refer to obtaining states of affairs, false ones to non-obtaining. States of affairs might hence be characterized as truth-makers and the corresponding logical propositions as truth-bearers. Despite his clear remarks on the topic, one will not find in Reinach’s work a full-blown theory of the truth-making relation; such a theory is developed by Pfänder in his Logic of 1921 where he gives an account of truth-making in terms of the principle of sufficient reason (cf. Mulligan 2008b).

In addition, Reinach suggests that states of affairs are either positive or negative, and it is argued that either a positive state of affairs or its negative contradictory obtains (either the being-red of the rose obtains or its not-being red). The principle of the excluded middle is hence claimed to hold for states of affairs and, analogously, other principles traditionally believed to be of a logical nature (and in particular the laws of inference, cf. 1911a, 115) are interpreted by Reinach as being primarily ontological principles, i.e., principles which hold for states of affairs. That is, states of affairs are the primal objects of logic (1911a, 138 n 1), and logic is primarily about states of affairs and only secondarily about truth-bearers (cf. Gardies 1985).

Reinach’s rather cursory but influential description of states of affairs represents the basis for further investigations thereof within phenomenology (for instance, cf. Honecker 1921): in particular, his idea that states of affairs are the bearers of modal properties (and, especially, of possibility and necessity) was investigated further by Gallinger in his The Problem of Objective Possibility of 1912. Gallinger tries to solve a problem which is implicit in Reinach’s position: if all states of affairs either obtain or do not obtain, in what sense can some of them be said to be possible? In order to solve this problem, Gallinger relies on another idea advocated by Reinach: states of affairs are connected to each other, in particular by the connection between grounds (or objective reasons) and consequences. This is a connection which should not be confused with causality (which is held to be a connection between events, processes and states, cf. Reinach 1911b, 87). Accordingly, one state of affairs (e.g., the fact that it is raining) can be the grounds for a consequence (e.g., the fact that the streets are wet).

Gallinger claims that, when one correctly judges that a state of affairs \(p\) is possible, one is not asserting that this state of affairs lies in a third ontological realm between being and non-being (a position advocated, e.g., by Meinong, cf. his 1915). Rather, one is stating that \(p\) is “partially motivated” by a further state of affairs \(q\). That is, there is a further state of affairs \(q\) which is a (merely partial) reason for the subsistence of the first. For \(q\) to be a partial reason for \(p\) means that \(p\) cannot be the case if \(q\) is not the case. In this sense, possibility is seen as a connection or, more precisely, as a negative connection of being (negative Seinsverknüpfung), i.e., as a peculiar connection of grounding or motivation between states of affairs (Gallinger 1912, 92). Gallinger respects Reinach’s principle: possible states of affairs either obtain or do not obtain, but—in addition to their obtaining (or non-obtaining)—they can be said to be possible, if they are partially motivated or partially grounded.

An ontologically more parsimonious counterpart to this first position was developed by Daubert. In his theory of judgment, Daubert draws a distinction between two notions. First, he calls “states of affairs” complex entities which exist independently of intentionality, e.g., the being-red of the rose (cf. Schuhmann/Smith 1987, Schuhmann 2004d). In addition to states of affairs, he also identifies so-called “states of affairs as cognized” (Kenntnisverhalte), which are described as intentionality-dependent entities. (Although using different terminology, Pfänder, too, seems to have had a similar distinction in mind in 1921 when he speaks of “the objects in their objectual state (das Selbstverhalten der Gegenstände)” and of “states of affairs” as entities which are “projected or outlined (entworfen)” by judgment and which are “completely dependent” on judgment, cf. Pfänder 1921, 40f, 253.)

Daubert’s idea is that, within a judgment, an aspect of the state of affairs is selected by the mind and conceptually framed. So, for instance, the expressions “the chairman opens the meeting,” “the chairman is opening the meeting,” “the meeting is being opened by the chairman,” “the opening of the meeting is being conducted by the chairman” and “the chairman has opened the meeting,” (cf. Schuhmann/Smith 1987, 368) point at different “states of affairs as cognized” (Kenntnisverhalte) to which the same state of affairs pertains. The same can be said for expressions such as “a > b” and “b < a”. In the LI, Husserl employs this very same example to argue that the two sentences express different propositional meanings pointing at the same state of affairs (Hua XIX A 48), and Daubert reports having discussed this example with Husserl (cf. Schuhmann 2004d, 206 n 25). This discussion might have inspired Husserl to substitute his previous theory of the LI with his later distinction between states of affairs and situations (Sachlagen, cf. Hua XXVI 97f, Husserl 1938, 285ff), which is analogous to Daubert’s position.

To be sure, Reinach, too, distinguishes between coarse-grained “factual material (Tatbestand)” and fine-grained states of affairs (cf. Smith 1987, 218ff). Yet, contrary to Reinach, Daubert contends that such ontological fragments do not exist without the corresponding judgments. Daubert claims, moreover, that not only do states of affairs as cognized (Kenntnisverhalte) exist in dependence of judgments, but that states of affairs as questioned (Frageverhalte) or states of affairs as ordered (Befehlsverhalte) also exist only in relation to acts of question or of order (Schuhmann 2004b, 91).

This position leaves the question open as to what properties qualify states of affairs and what properties affect intentionality-dependent states of affairs as cognized: for instance, Daubert holds that there are no negative states of affairs, but only negative Kenntnisverhalte (cf. Schuhmann 1987—based on a somewhat similar approach, Ingarden, too, denied the existence of intentionality-independent negative states of affairs, cf. 1964 II/1, Chrudzimski 2010). Analogously, Pfänder (cf. 1921, 72f) argues that, when it comes to giving an account of impersonal judgments, these have impersonal states of affairs as their correlates, but the incompleteness that characterizes such states of affairs has no place at the level of reality, i.e. at the level of “the objects in their objectual state” (a position which, again, is in agreement with Daubert, cf. Schuhmann 1998, 184).

4. Conclusion

Early phenomenologists make up a philosophical tradition that has been almost wholly overlooked by historians of 20th century philosophy. Partly building upon the ideas of Husserl and other philosophers, while nevertheless also developing their own ideas independently, they made contributions to as many fields as the philosophy of mind, the philosophy of psychology, the philosophy of speech acts, epistemology, social philosophy, the philosophy of values and ontology.

Some of their most important contributions are accounts of the distinction between presentations (perceptions and imaginations) and the acts of meaning something with an expression; of affective phenomena, including episodic emotions and long-lasting sentiments; of knowledge as a direct grasp of objects and states of affairs rather than any sort of belief or conviction; of the distinction between attitudes or stances, such as belief and emotions, on the one hand, and knowledge, on the other; of the distinction between motivation and reasons, on the one hand, and mental causality, on the other; of the structure of speech acts such as promises, orders and questions; of collective intentionality and its relation to social facts; and of value, its grasp and our reactions to it. In ontology, they developed theories of states of affairs and an account of modality according to which the most important type of necessity flows from the essences or natures of objects. That their ideas have been consistently overlooked is made even more curious by the fact that they write in clear German and that many of their ideas were rediscovered, beyond phenomenology, during the twentieth century.

Uncovering the full extent of these still rather neglected resources is an ongoing process that promises to impact different strands of philosophical debate and to substantially enrich the received picture of the phenomenological movement.


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Other Internet Resources

  • NASEPblog. Official Blog of The North American Society For Early Phenomenology. It includes a Reading Room with PDFs of important texts from or about Early Phenomenology which are generally difficult to find.
  • Bavarian State Library (Bayerische Staatsbibliothek, English pages). The site provides information about the inheritances (Nachlaässe) of early phenomenologists.
  • Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung (Yearbook for Philosophy and Phenomenological Research), founded in 1912 by Edmund Husserl, hosted at The Open Commons of Phenomenology.


I would like to thank Stefano Besoli, Christian Beyer, Francesca De Vecchi, Nicolas De Warren, Guillaume Frechétte, Kevin Mulligan, Barry Smith, Thomas Szanto, Risto Tiihonen, Genki Uemura, and Dan Zahavi for their helpful comments on previous draft of this entry.

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