Moral Arguments for the Existence of God

First published Thu Jun 12, 2014

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by C. Stephen Evans replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Moral arguments for God's existence form a diverse family of arguments that reason from some feature of morality or the moral life to the existence of God, usually understood as a morally good creator of the universe. Moral arguments are both important and interesting. They are interesting because evaluating their soundness requires attention to practically every important philosophical issue dealt with in metaethics. They are important because of their prominence in popular apologetic arguments for religious belief. Evidence for this can be found in the amazing popularity of C. S. Lewis's Mere Christianity (1952), which is almost certainly the best-selling book of apologetics in the twentieth century, and which begins with a moral argument for God's existence. Many ordinary people regard religion as in some way providing a basis or foundation for morality. This fact might seem to favor religious arguments for morality rather than moral arguments for religious belief, but if someone believes that morality is in some way “objective” or “real,” and that this moral reality requires explanation, moral arguments for God's reality naturally suggest themselves. The apparent connection between morality and religion appears to many people to support the claim that moral truths require a religious foundation, or can best be explained by God's existence, or some qualities or actions of God.

After some general comments about theistic arguments and a brief history of moral arguments, this essay will discuss several different forms of the moral argument. A major distinction is that between moral arguments that are theoretical in nature and practical or pragmatic arguments. The former are best thought of as arguments that begin with alleged moral facts and argue that God is necessary to explain those facts, or at least that God provides a better explanation of them than secular accounts can offer. The latter typically begin with claims about some good or end that morality requires and argue that this end is not attainable unless God exists. Whether this distinction is hard and fast will be one of the questions to be discussed, as some argue that practical arguments by themselves cannot be the basis of rational belief. To meet such concerns practical arguments may have to include a theoretical dimension as well.

1. The Goals of Theistic Arguments

Before attempting to explain and assess moral arguments for the existence of God, it would be helpful to have some perspective on the goals of arguments for God's existence. (I shall generically term arguments for God's existence “theistic arguments.”) Of course views about this are diverse, but most contemporary proponents of such arguments do not see theistic arguments as attempted “proofs,” in the sense that they are supposed to provide valid arguments with premises that no reasonable person could deny. Such a standard of achievement would clearly be setting the bar for success very high, and proponents of theistic arguments rightly note that philosophical arguments for interesting conclusions in any field outside of formal logic hardly ever reach such a standard. More reasonable questions to ask about theistic arguments would seem to be the following: Are there valid arguments for the conclusion that God exists that have premises that are known or reasonably believed by some people? Are the premises of such arguments more reasonable than their denials, at least for some reasonable people? Arguments that met these standards could have value in making belief in God reasonable for some people, or even giving some people knowledge of God's existence, even if it turns out that some of the premises of the arguments can be reasonably denied by other people, and thus that the arguments fail as proofs.

It is of course possible that an argument for God's existence could provide some evidence for God's existence, in the sense that the argument increases the probability or plausibility of the claim that God exists, even if the argument does not provide enough support by itself for full-fledged belief that God exists. A proponent of the moral argument who viewed the argument in this way might in that case regard the argument as part of a cumulative case for theism, and hold that the moral argument must be supplemented by other possible arguments, such as the “fine-tuning” argument from the physical constants of the universe, or an argument from religious experience. A non-believer might even concede some version of a theistic argument has some evidential force, but claim that the overall balance of evidence does not support belief.

A major issue that cannot be settled here concerns the question of where the burden of proof lies with respect to theistic arguments. Many secular philosophers follow Antony Flew (1976) in holding that there is a “presumption of atheism.” Believing in God is like believing in the Loch Ness Monster or leprechauns, something that reasonable people do not do without sufficient evidence. If such evidence is lacking, the proper stance is atheism rather than agnosticism.

This “presumption of atheism” has been challenged in a number of ways. Alvin Plantinga (2000) has argued that reasonable belief in God does not have to be based on propositional evidence, but can be “properly basic.” On this view, reasonable belief in God can be the outcome of a basic faculty (called the sensus divinitatis by theologian John Calvin) and thus needs no support from arguments at all. In response some would argue that even if theistic belief is not grounded in propositional evidence, it still might require non-propositional evidence (such as experience), so it is not clear that Plantinga's view by itself removes the burden of proof challenge.

A second way to challenge the presumption of atheism is to question an implicit assumption made by those who defend such a presumption, which is that belief in God is epistemologically more risky than unbelief. The assumption might be defended in the following way: One might think that theists and atheists share a belief in many entities: atoms, middle-sized physical objects, animals, and stars, for example. Someone, however, who believes in leprechauns or sea monsters in addition to these commonly accepted objects thereby incurs a burden of proof. Such a person believes in “one additional thing” and thus seems to incur additional epistemological risk. One might think that belief in God is relevantly like belief in a leprechaun or sea monster, and thus that the theist also bears an additional burden of proof. Without good evidence in favor of belief in God the safe option is to refrain from belief.

However, the theist may hold that this account does not accurately represent the situation. Instead, the theist may argue that the debate between atheism and theism is not simply an argument about whether “one more thing” exists in the world. In fact, God is not to be understood as an entity in the world at all; any such entity would by definition not be God. The debate is rather a debate about the character of the universe. The theist believes that every object in the natural world exists because God creates and conserves that object; every finite thing has the character of being dependent on God. The atheist denies this and affirms that the basic entities in the natural world have the character of existing “on their own.” If this is the right way to think about the debate, then it is not obvious that atheism is safer than theism. The debate is not about the existence of one object, but the character of the universe as a whole. Both parties are making claims about the character of everything in the natural world, and both claims seem risky. This point is especially important in dealing with moral arguments for theism, since one of the questions raised by such arguments is the adequacy of a naturalistic worldview in explaining morality. Evidentialists may properly ask about the evidence for theism, but it also seems proper to ask about the evidence for atheism if the atheist is committed to a rival metaphysic such as naturalism.

2. History of Moral Arguments for God's Existence

Something that resembles a moral argument for God's existence, or at least an argument from value, can be found in the fourth of Thomas Aquinas's “Five Ways” (Aquinas 1265–1274, I, 1, 3). Aquinas there begins with the claim that among beings who possess such qualities as “good, true, and noble” there are gradations. Presumably he means that some things that are good are better than other good things; perhaps some noble people are nobler than others who are noble. In effect Aquinas is claiming that when we “grade” things in this way we are, at least implicitly, comparing them to some absolute standard. Aquinas believes this standard cannot be merely “ideal” or “hypothetical,” and thus this gradation is only possible if there is some being which has this quality to a “maximum” extent: “so that there is something which is truest, something best, something noblest and, consequently, something which is uttermost being; for those things that are greatest in truth are greatest in being, as it is written in Metaph. Ii.” Aquinas goes on to affirm that this being which provides the standard is also the cause or explanation of the existence of these qualities, and such a cause must be God. Obviously, this argument draws deeply on Platonic and Aristotelian assumptions that are no longer widely held by philosophers. For the argument to be plausible today, such assumptions would have to be defended, or else the argument reformulated in a way that frees it from its original metaphysical home.

Probably the most influential versions of the moral argument for belief in God can be traced to Kant (1788 [1956]), who famously argued that the theoretical arguments for God's existence were unsuccessful, but presented a rational argument for belief in God as a “postulate of practical reason.” Kant held that a rational, moral being must necessarily will “the highest good,” which consists of a world in which people are both morally good and happy, and in which moral virtue is the condition for happiness. The latter condition implies that this end must be sought solely by moral action. However, Kant held that a person cannot rationally will such an end without believing that moral actions can successfully achieve such an end, and this requires a belief that the causal structure of nature is conducive to the achievement of this end by moral means. This is equivalent to belief in God, a moral being who is ultimately responsible for the character of the natural world. Kant's arguments will be discussed later in this article.

Kant-inspired arguments were prominent in the nineteenth century, and continued to be important right up to the middle of the twentieth century. Such arguments can be found, for example, in W. R. Sorley (1918), Hastings Rashdall (1920), and A. E. Taylor (1945/1930). Although Henry Sidgwick was not himself a proponent of a moral argument for God's existence, some have argued that his thought presents the materials for such an argument (see Walls and Baggett 2011). In the nineteenth century John Henry Newman (1870) also made good use of a moral argument in his case for belief in God, developing what could be called an argument from conscience.

In recent philosophy there has been a revival of divine command metaethical theories, which has in turn led to new versions of the moral argument found in such thinkers as Robert Adams (1987), John Hare (1996), and C. Stephen Evans (2010). However, it is important to see that there are versions of the moral argument for God's existence that are completely independent of such a divine command theory, and this possibility can be seen in arguments developed by Angus Ritchie (2012) and Mark Linville (2009). It goes without saying that these renewed arguments have engendered new criticisms as well.

Theoretical moral arguments for God's existence can be understood as variations on the following template:

  1. There are objective moral facts.
  2. God provides the best explanation of the existence of objective moral facts.
  3. Therefore, (probably) God exists.

As we shall see, there are a variety of features of morality that can be appealed to in the first steps of the arguments, as well as a variety of ways in which God might be thought to provide an explanation of those features in the second steps. The use of the somewhat vague phrase “objective moral facts” is intended to allow for this variety. Both types of premises are obviously open to challenge. For example, the first premise of such an argument can be challenged by popular metaethical views that see morality as “subjective,” or “expressive,” rather than something that consists of objective facts, and also by moral sceptics. The second premise can be challenged on the basis of rival explanations of the features of morality, explanations that do not require God. Arguments about the second premise then may require comparison between theistic explanations of morality and these rival views.

It is easy to see then that the proponent of a moral argument has a complex task: She must defend the reality and objectivity of the feature of morality appealed to, but also defend the claim that this feature can be best explained by God. The second part of the task may require not only demonstrating the strengths of a theistic explanation, but pointing out weaknesses in rival secular explanations as well. Both parts of the task are essential, but it is worth noting that the two components cannot be accomplished simultaneously. The theist must defend the reality of morality against subjectivist and nihilistic critics. Assuming that this task has been carried out, the theist must then try to show that morality thus understood requires a theistic explanation.

It is interesting to observe, however, that with respect to both parts of the task, the theist may enlist non-theists as allies. The theist may well make common cause with ethical naturalists as well as ethical non-naturalists in defending moral realism against “projective” theories such as expressivism. However, the theist may also enlist the support of “error theorists” such as J. L. Mackie (1977), and “moral nihilists” such as Friedrich Nietzsche (1887) in arguing that God is necessary for objective morality. Nietzsche, for example, explicitly holds that God does not exist, but also claims that God's non-existence undermines the reality of traditional western morality. The fact that theists can enlist such unlikely allies does not mean the moral argument for God's existence is sound, but it does suggest that the argument is not obviously question-begging, since both premises are sometimes accepted by (different) non-believers.

3. Theoretical Moral Arguments for God's Existence and Divine Command Theories of Moral Obligation

One easily understandable version of a theistic moral argument relies on an analogy between human laws promulgated by nation-states and moral laws. Sovereign states enact laws that make certain acts forbidden or required. If I am a U. S. citizen, and I earn more than a small amount of money I am obligated to file an income tax return each year. I am also forbidden, because of the laws that hold in the United States, to discriminate in hiring on the basis of age or race. Many people believe that there are moral laws that bind individuals in the same way that political laws do. I am obligated by a moral principle not to lie to others, and I am similarly obligated to keep promises that I have made. (Both legal and moral laws may be understood as holding prima facie, so that in some situations a person must violate one law in order to obey a more important one.)

We know how human laws come into existence. They are enacted by legislatures (or absolute monarchs in some countries) who have the authority to pass such laws. How then should the existence of moral laws be explained? It seems plausible to many to hold that they must be similarly grounded in some appropriate moral authority, and the only plausible candidate to fulfill this role is God. Some philosophers have dismissed an argument of this type as “crude,” presumably because its force is so obvious that no special philosophical training is necessary to understand it and see its appeal. The fact that one can understand the argument without much in the way of philosophical skill is not necessarily a defect, however. If one supposes that there is a God, and that God wants humans to know him and relate to him, one would expect God to make his reality known to humans in very obvious ways (See Evans 2010). After all, critics of theistic belief, such as J. L. Schellenberg (1993), have argued that the fact that God's reality is not obvious to those who would like to believe in God is a grave problem. If an awareness of moral obligations is in fact an awareness of God's commands or divine laws, then the ordinary person who is aware of moral obligations does have a kind of awareness of God. Of course such a person might be aware of God's laws without realizing that they are God's laws; she might be aware of God's commands without being aware of them under that description. The religious apologist might view such a person as already having a kind of de re awareness of God, because a moral obligation is simply an expression of God's will.

How can such an awareness be converted into full-fledged belief in God? One way of doing this would be to help the person gain the skills needed to recognize moral laws as what they are, as divine commands or divine laws. If moral laws are experienced, then moral experience could be viewed as a kind of religious experience or at least a proto-religious experience. Perhaps someone who has experience of God in this way does not need a moral argument (or any kind of argument) to have a reasonable belief in God. This may be one instance of the kind of case that Alvin Plantinga (2000) and the “Reformed epistemologists” have in mind when they claim that belief in God can be “properly basic.” It is worth noting then that there could be such a thing as knowledge of God that is rooted in moral experience without that knowledge being the result of a moral argument.

Even if that is the case, however, a moral argument could still play a valuable role. Such an argument might be one way of helping an individual understand that moral obligations are in fact divine commands or laws. Even if it were true that some ordinary people might know that God exists without argument, an argument could be helpful in defending the claim that this is the case. A person might conceivably need an argument for the second level claim that the person knows God without argument.

In any case a divine command metaethical theory provides the material for such an argument. The revival of divine command theories (DCT) of moral obligation is due mainly to the work of Philip Quinn (1979/1978) and Robert Adams (1999). Adams' version of a DCT has been particularly influential and is well-suited for the defense of the claim that moral knowledge can provide knowledge of God. Adams' version of a DCT is an account of moral obligations and it must be distinguished from more general “voluntarist” views of ethics that try to treat other moral properties (such as the good) as dependent on God's will. As explained below, by limiting the theory to obligations, Adams avoids the standard “Euthyphro” objection, which claims that divine command views reduce ethics to arbitrariness.

Adams' account of moral obligations as divine commands rests on a more general social theory of obligations. There are of course many types of obligations: legal obligations, financial obligations, obligations of etiquette, and obligations that hold in virtue of belonging to some club or association, to name just a few. Clearly these obligations are distinct from moral obligations, since in some cases moral obligations can conflict with these other kinds. What is distinctive about obligations in general? They are not reducible simply to normative claims about what a person has a good reason to do. J. S. Mill (1874, 164-165) argued that we can explain normative principles without making any reference to God. He contends that the “feeling of obligation” stems from “something that the internal conscience bears witness to in its own nature,” and thus the moral law, unlike human laws, “does not originate in the will of a legislator or legislature external to the mind.” Doubtless Mill had in mind here such normative logical principles as “it is wrong to believe both ‘p’ and ‘not-p’ at the same time.” Mill argues that such normative principles hold without any requirement for an “authority” to be their ground. Mill's view is plausible, though some theists have argued that metaphysical naturalists have difficulty in explaining any kind of normativity (see Devine 1989, 88–89). However, even if Mill is correct about normativity in general, it does not follow that his view is correct for obligations, which have a special character. An obligation has a special kind of force; we should care about complying with it, and violations of obligations appropriately incur blame (Adams 1999, 235). If I make a logical mistake, I may feel silly or stupid or embarrassed, but I have no reason to feel guilty, unless the mistake reflects some carelessness on my part that itself constitutes a violation of a moral obligation. Adams argues that “facts of obligation are constituted by broadly social requirements.” (ibid, 233) For example, the social role of parenting is partly constituted by the obligations one assumes by becoming a parent, and the social role of citizen is partly constituted by the obligations to obey the laws of the country in which one is a citizen.

All obligations are then constituted by social requirements, according to Adams. However, not all obligations constituted by social requirements are moral obligations. What social relation could be the basis of moral obligations? Adams argues that not just any human social relation will possess the requisite authority: “A morally valid obligation obviously will not be constituted by just any demand sponsored by a system of social relationships that one in fact values. Some such demands have no moral force, and some social systems are downright evil.” (ibid, 242) If a good and loving God exists and has created all humans, then the social relation humans have to God has the right features to explain moral obligations. For if moral obligations stem from God's requirements, they will be objective, but they will also be motivating, since a relation to God would clearly be a great good that humans would have reason to value. Since a proper relation to God is arguably more important than any other social relation, we can also understand why moral obligations trump other kinds of obligations. On this view we can also explain why moral obligations have a transcendent character, which is important because “a genuinely moral conception of obligation must have resources for moral criticism of social systems and their demands.” (ibid, 242–243)

Notice that the DCT Adams defends is ontological rather than semantic: it is a claim that moral obligations are in fact identical with divine commands, not a claim that “moral obligations” has the same meaning as “divine commands.” On his account, the meaning of “moral obligation” is fixed by the role this concept plays in our language. That role includes such facts as these: Moral obligations must be motivating and objective. They also must provide a basis for critical evaluation of other types of obligations, and they must be such that someone who violates a moral obligation is appropriately subject to blame. Adams argues that it is divine commands that best satisfy these desiderata. God's existence thus provides the best explanation of moral obligations. If moral obligations are identical with divine commands (or perhaps if they are grounded in or caused to exist by divine commands) an argument for God's existence from such obligations can easily be constructed:

  1. There are objective moral obligations.
  2. If there are objective moral obligations, there is a God who explains these obligations.
  3. There is a God.

This argument is stated in a deductive form, but it can easily be reworded as a probabilistic “argument to the best explanation,” as follows:

  1. There are objective moral obligations.
  2. God provides the best explanation of the existence of moral obligations.
  3. Probably, God exists.

Obviously, those who do not find a DCT convincing will not think this argument from moral obligation has force. However, Adams anticipates and gives a forceful answer to one common criticism of a DCT. It is often argued that a DCT must fail because of a dilemma parallel to one derived from Plato's Euthyphro. The dilemma for a DCT can be derived from the following question: Assuming that God commands what is right, does he command what is right because it is right? If the proponent of a DCT answers affirmatively, then it appears the quality of rightness must hold antecedently to and thus independently of God's commands. If, however, the proponent denies that God commands what is right because it is right, then God's commands appear arbitrary. Adams' version of a DCT evades this dilemma by holding that God is essentially good and that his commands are necessarily aimed at the good. This allows Adams to claim that God's commands make actions obligatory (or forbidden), while denying that the commands are arbitrary.

Although Adams' version of a DCT successfully meets this “Euthyphro” objection, there are other powerful criticisms that have been mounted against this metaethical theory in the literature. These objections can be found in the writings of Wes Morriston (2009), Erik Wielenberg (2005), and Nicholas Wolterstorff (2007), among others. However, responses to these objections and others have also been given (see Evans 2013, Baggett and Walls, 2011). Clearly this version of a moral argument for God's existence will only be judged powerful by those who find a DCT plausible, and that will certainly be a small minority of philosophers. (Although it is worth noting that no single metaethical theory seems to enjoy widespread support among philosophers, so a DCT is not alone in being a minority view.) Nevertheless, those who do find a DCT powerful will also see moral obligations as providing strong evidence for God's reality.

4. Arguments from Moral Knowledge or Awareness

A variety of arguments have been developed that God is necessary to explain human awareness of moral truth (or moral knowledge, if one believes that this moral awareness amounts to knowledge). Richard Swinburne (2004, 218), for example, argues that there is no “great probability that moral awareness will occur in a Godless universe.” On Swinburne's view, moral truths are either necessary truths or contingent truths that are grounded in necessary truths. For example, it is obviously contingent that “It is wrong to drop an atomic bomb on Hiroshima,” since it is contingent that there exists a city such as Hiroshima. But one might hold that this proposition is true (assuming it is) because of some other truth such as “It is wrong intentionally to kill innocent humans” which does hold universally and is necessarily true. Swinburne does not think that an argument from moral facts as such is powerful. However, the fact that we humans are aware of moral facts is itself surprising and calls for an explanation.

It may be true that creatures who belong to groups that behave altruistically will have some survival advantage over groups that lack such a trait. However, moral beliefs are not required in order to produce such behavior, since it is clear that “there are many species of animals that are naturally inclined to help others of their species, and yet do not have moral beliefs.” (Swinburne 2004, 217) If God exists, he has “significant reason to bring about conscious beings with moral awareness,” since his intended purpose for humans includes making it possible for them freely to choose good over evil, since this will make it possible for them to develop a relation to God. Swinburne does not think that this argument provides very strong evidence for God's existence by itself, but rather that it provides some inductive support for belief in God. It is one of several phenomena which seem more probable in a theistic universe than in a godless universe. As we consider more and more such phenomena, it will be increasingly improbable that “they will all occur.” (ibid, 218) All of these inductive arguments together may then provide substantial support for theistic belief, even if no one of them by itself would be sufficient for rational belief.

Swinburne's version of the argument is quite brief and undeveloped, but the materials for a more developed version of the argument can be found in a well-known and much cited article by Sharon Street (2006). Street's argument, as the title implies, is in no way intended to support a moral argument for theism. To the contrary, her purpose is to defend anti-realist metaethical theories against realist theories that view moral truth as “stance-independent” of human attitudes and emotions. Street presents the moral realist with a dilemma posed by the question as to how our human evaluative beliefs are related to human evolution. It is clear, she believes, that evolution has strongly shaped our evaluative attitudes. The question concerns how those attitudes are related to the objective evaluative truths accepted by the realist. If the realist holds that there is no relation between such truths and our evaluative attitudes, then this implies that “most of our evaluative judgments are off track due to the distorting influence of Darwinian processes.” The other alternative for the realist is to claim that there is a relationship, and thus that is not an accident or miracle that our evaluative beliefs track the objective truths. However, this view, Street claims, is scientifically implausible. Street argues therefore that an evolutionary story about how we came to make the moral judgments we make undermines confidence in the objective truth of those judgments. Street's argument is of course controversial and thinkers such as Erik Wielenberg (2014) have argued against evolutionary debunking arguments. Still, many regard such arguments as problematic for morality, particularly when developed as a “global” argument (Kahane, 2010).

Moral realists such as David Enoch (2011) have attempted to respond to Street's argument, though Enoch acknowledges its force and evidently has some worries about the strength of his reply. However, it is not hard to see that a good deal of the force of Street's argument stems from the assumption that naturalism is true, and therefore that the evolutionary process is one that is unguided. It does appear that in a naturalistic universe we would expect a process of Darwinian evolution to select for a propensity for moral judgments that track survival and not objective moral truths. Mark Linville (2009, 391–446) has developed a detailed argument for the claim that it is difficult for metaphysical naturalists to develop a plausible evolutionary story as to how our moral judgments could have epistemological warrant. However, if we suppose that the evolutionary process has been guided by a God who has as one of his goals the creation of morally significant human creatures capable of enjoying a relation with God, then it would not seem at all accidental or even unlikely that God would ensure that humans have value beliefs that are largely correct.

Some philosophers may believe that the randomness of Darwinian natural selection rules out the possibility of any kind of divine guidance being exercised through such a process. Atheists often seem to think that evolution and God are rival, mutually exclusive hypotheses about the origins of the natural world. What can be explained scientifically needs no religious explanation. However, this is far from obviously true; in fact, if theism is true it is clearly false. From a theistic perspective to think that God and science provide competing explanations fails to grasp the relationship between God and the natural world by conceiving of God as one more cause within that natural world. If God exists at all, God is not an entity within the natural world, but the creator of that natural world, with all of its causal processes. If God exists, God is the reason why there is a natural world and the reason for the existence of the causal processes of the natural world. In principle, therefore, a natural explanation can never preclude a theistic explanation.

But what about the randomness that is a crucial part of the Darwinian story? The atheist might claim that because evolutionary theory posits that the process by which plants and animals have evolved in one that involves random genetic mutations, it cannot be guided, and thus God cannot have used evolutionary means to achieve his ends. However, this argument fails. It depends on an equivocation in what is meant by “random.” When scientists claim that genetic mutations are random, they do not mean that they are uncaused, or even that they are unpredictable from the point of view of biochemistry, but only that the mutations do not happen in response to the adaptational needs of the organism. It is entirely possible for a natural process to include randomness in that sense, even if the whole natural order is itself created and sustained by God. The sense of “randomness” required for evolutionary theory does not imply that the evolutionary process must be unguided. A God who is responsible for the laws of nature and the initial conditions that shape the evolutionary process could certainly ensure that the process achieved certain ends.

Like the other moral arguments for God's existence, the argument from moral knowledge can easily be stated in a propositional form, and I believe Swinburne is right to hold that the argument is best construed as a probabilistic argument that appeals to God as providing a better explanation of moral knowledge than is possible in a naturalistic universe.

  1. Humans possess objective moral knowledge.
  2. Probably, if God does not exist, humans would not possess objective moral knowledge.
  3. Probably, God exists.

There is a kind of argument from moral knowledge also implicit in Angus Ritchie's recent book From Morality to Metaphysics: The Theistic Implications of our Ethical Commitments (2012). Ritchie presses a kind of dilemma on non-theistic accounts of morality. Subjectivist theories such as expressivism can certainly make sense of the fact that we make the ethical judgments we do, but they empty morality of its objective authority. Objectivist theories that take morality seriously, however, have difficulty explaining our capacity to make true moral judgments, unless the process by which humans came to hold these capacities is one that is controlled by a being such as God.

The moral argument from knowledge will not be convincing to anyone who is committed to any form of expressivism or other non-objective metaethical theory, and clearly many philosophers find such views attractive. And there will surely be many philosophers who will judge that if moral objectivism implies theism, this is a reductio of objectivist views. Furthermore, non-theistic moral philosophers, whether naturalists or non-naturalists, have stories to tell about how moral knowledge might be possible. Nevertheless, there are real questions about the plausibility of these stories, and thus, some of those convinced that moral realism is true may judge that moral knowledge provides some support for theistic belief.

5. Arguments from Human Dignity or Worth

Many philosophers find Immanuel Kant's moral philosophy still offers a fruitful approach to ethics. Of the various forms of the “categorical imperative” that Kant offers, the formula that regards human beings as “ends in themselves” is especially attractive: “Act in such a way that you always treat humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, never simply as a means, but always at the same time as an end” (Kant 1785 [1964], 96). Many contemporary moral philosophers influenced by Kant, such as Christine Korsgaard (1996), see Kant as offering a “constructivist” metaethical position. Constructivism is supposed to offer a “third way” between moral realism and subjectivist views of morality. Like subjectivists, constructivists want to see morality as a human creation. However, like moral realists constructivists want to see moral questions as having objective answers. Constructivism is an attempt to develop an objective morality that is free of the metaphysical commitments of moral realism.

It is, however, controversial whether Kant himself was a constructivist in this sense. One reason to question whether this is the right way to read Kant follows from the fact that Kant himself did not see morality as free from metaphysical commitments. For example, Kant thought that it would be impossible for someone who believed that mechanistic determinism was the literal truth about himself to believe that he was a moral agent, since morality requires an autonomy that is incompatible with determinism. To see myself as a creature who has the kind of value Kant calls “dignity” I must not see myself merely as a machine-like product of the physical environment. Hence Kant thought that it was crucial for morality that his Critical Philosophy had shown that the deterministic perspective on humans is simply part of the “phenomenal world” that is the object of scientific knowledge, not the “noumenal reality” that it would be if some kind of scientific realism were the true metaphysical view. When we do science we see ourselves as determined, but science tells us only how the world appears, not how it really is. Recognizing this fact suggests that when Kant posits that humans have this intrinsic value he calls dignity, he is not “constructing” the value humans have, but recognizing the value beings of a certain kind must have. Humans can only have this kind of value if they are a particular kind of creature. Whether Kant himself was a moral realist or not, there are certainly elements in his philosophy that push in a realist direction.

If the claim that human persons have a kind of intrinsic dignity or worth is a true objective principle and if it provides a key foundational principle of morality, it is well worth asking what kinds of metaphysical implications the claim might have. This is the question that Mark Linville (2009, 417–446) pursues in the second moral argument he develops. Linville begins by noting that one could hardly hold that “human persons have intrinsic dignity” could be true if human persons do not exist. Clearly, some metaphysical positions do include a denial of the existence of human persons, such as forms of Absolute Monism which hold that only one Absolute Reality exists. However, it also seems to be the case that some forms of Scientific Naturalism are committed to the denial of “persons as substantive selves that essentially possess a first-person point of view” (See Dennett 2006, 107). Daniel Dennett, for example, holds that persons will not be part of the ultimately true scientific account of things. Dennett holds that to think of humans as persons is simply to adopt a certain “stance” toward them that he calls the “intentional stance,” but it is clear that the kind of picture of humans we get when we think of them in this way does not correspond with their intrinsic metaphysical properties. It is not clear how systems towards which we adopt an “intentional stance” could be truly autonomous and thus have the kind of value Kant believes human persons have.

The argument from human dignity could be put into propositional form as follows:

  1. Human persons have a special kind of intrinsic value that we call dignity.
  2. The only (or best) explanation of the fact that humans possess dignity is that they are created by a supremely good God in God's own image.
  3. Probably there is a supremely good God.

A naturalist may want to challenge premise (2) by finding some other strategy to explain human dignity. Michael Martin (2002), for example, has tried to suggest that moral judgments can be analyzed as the feelings of approval or disapproval of a perfectly impartial and informed observer. Linville (2009) objects that it is not clear how the feelings of such an observer could constitute the intrinsic worth of a person, since one would think that intrinsic properties would be non-relational and mind-independent. In any case, Linville notes that a “Euthyphro” problem lurks for such an ideal observer theory, since one would think that such an observer would judge a person to be intrinsically valuable because the person has intrinsic value.

Another strategy that is pursued by constructivists such as Korsgaard is to link the value ascribed to humans to the capacity for rational reflection. The idea is that insofar as I am committed to rational reflection, I must value myself as having this capacity, and consistently value others who have it as well. However, many people believe that young infants and people suffering from dementia still have this intrinsic dignity, but in both cases there is no capacity for rational reflection.

Some support for this criticism of the attempt to see reason as the basis of the value of humans can be found in Nicholas Wolterstorff's recent work on justice (2007, especially Ch. 8). Wolterstorff in this work defends the claim that there are natural human rights, and that violating such rights is one way of acting unjustly towards a person. Why do humans have such rights? Wolterstorff says these rights are grounded in the basic worth or dignity that humans possess. When I seek to torture or kill an innocent human I am failing to respect this worth. If one asks why we should think humans possess such worth, Wolterstorff argues that the belief that humans have this quality was not only historically produced by Jewish and Christian conceptions of the human person, but even now cannot be defended apart from such a conception. In particular, he argues that attempts to argue that our worth stems from some excellence we possess such as reason will not explain the worth of infants or those with severe brain injuries or dementia.

Does a theistic worldview fare better in explaining the special value of human dignity? In a theistic universe God is himself seen as the supreme good. Indeed, theistic Platonists usually identify God with the Good. If God is himself a person, then this seems to be a commitment to the idea that personhood itself is something that must be intrinsically good. If human persons are made in God's image, as both Judaism and Christianity affirm, then it would seem to follow that humans do have a kind of intrinsic value, just by way of being the kind of creatures they are.

This argument will of course be found unconvincing to many. Some will deny premise (1), either because they reject moral realism as a metaethical stance, or because they reject the normative claim that humans have any kind of special value or dignity. (Maybe they will even think that such a claim is a form of “speciesism.”). Others will find premise (2) suspect. They may be inclined to agree that human persons have a special dignity, but hold that the source of that dignity can be found in such human qualities as rationality. With respect to the status of infants and those suffering from dementia, the critic might bite the bullet and just accept the fact that human dignity does not extend to them, or else argue that the fact that infants and those suffering mental breakdown are part of a species whose members typically possess rationality merits them a special respect, even if they lack this quality as individuals. Others will find premise (2) doubtful because they find the theistic explanation of dignity unclear. Another alternative is to seek a Constructivist account of dignity, perhaps regarding the special status of humans as something we humans decide to extend to each other. Perhaps the strongest non-theistic alternative would be some form of ethical non-naturalism, in which one simply affirms that the claim that persons have a special dignity is an a priori truth requiring no explanation. In effect this is a decision for a non-theistic form of Platonism.

The proponent of the argument may well agree that claims about the special status of humans are true a priori, and thus also opt for some form of Platonism. However, the proponent of the argument will point out that some necessary truths can be explained by other necessary truths. The theist believes that these truths about the special status of humans tell us something about the kind of universe humans find themselves in. To say that humans are created by God is to say that personhood is not an ephemeral or accidental feature of the universe, because at bottom reality itself is personal (Mavrodes 1986).

6. Practical Moral Arguments for Belief in God

As already noted, the most famous and perhaps most influential version of a moral argument for belief in God is found in Immanuel Kant (1788). Kant himself insisted that his argument was not a theoretical argument, but an argument grounded in practical reason. The conclusion of the argument is not “God exists” or “God probably exists” but “I (as a rational, moral agent) ought to believe that God exists.” We shall, however, see that there are some reasons to doubt that practical arguments can be neatly separated from theoretical arguments.

Kant's version of the argument can be stated in different ways, but perhaps the following captures one plausible interpretation of the argument. Morality is grounded in pure practical reason, and the moral agent must act on the basis of maxims that can be rationally endorsed as universal principles. Moral actions are thus not determined by results or consequences but by the maxims on which they are based. However, all actions, including moral actions, necessarily aim at ends. Kant argues that the end that moral actions aim at is the “highest good,” which is a world in which both moral virtue and happiness are maximized, with happiness contingent on virtue. For Kant “ought implies can,” and so if I have an obligation to seek the highest good, then I must believe that it is possible to achieve such an end. However, I must seek the highest good only by acting in accordance with morality; no shortcuts to happiness are permissible. This seems to require that I believe that acting in accordance with morality will be causally efficacious in achieving the highest good. However, it is reasonable to believe that moral actions will be causally efficacious in this way only if the laws of causality are set up in such a way that these laws are conducive to the efficacy of moral action. Certainly both parts of the highest good seem difficult to achieve. We humans have weaknesses in our character that appear difficult if not impossible to overcome by our own efforts. Furthermore, as creatures we have subjective needs that must be satisfied if we are happy, but we have little empirical reason to think that these needs will be satisfied by moral actions even if we succeeded in becoming virtuous. If a person believes that the natural world is simply a non-moral machine with no moral purposiveness then that person would have no reason to believe that moral action could succeed because there is no a priori reason to think moral action will achieve the highest good and little empirical reason to believe this either. Kant thus concludes that a moral agent must “postulate” the existence of God as a rational presupposition of the moral life.

One problem with this argument is that many will deny that morality requires us to seek the highest good in Kant's sense. Even if the Kantian highest good seems reasonable as an ideal, some will object that we have no obligation to achieve such a state, but merely to work towards realizing the closest approximation to such a state that is possible (See Adams 1987, 152). Without divine assistance, perhaps perfect virtue is unachievable, but in that case we cannot be obliged to realize such a state if there is no God. Perhaps we cannot hope that happiness will be properly proportioned to virtue in the actual world if God does not exist, but then our obligation can only be to realize as much happiness as can be attained through moral means. Kant would doubtless reject this criticism, since on his view the ends of morality are given directly to pure practical reason a priori, and we are not at liberty to adjust those ends on the basis of empirical beliefs. However, few contemporary philosophers would share Kant's confident view of reason here, and thus to many the criticism has force. Even Kant admits at one point that full-fledged belief in God is not rationally necessary, since one could conceivably seek the highest good if one merely believes that God's existence is possible (Kant, 1781–1787, 651).

Another way of interpreting Kant's argument puts more stress on the connection between an individual's desire for happiness and the obligation to do what is morally right. Morality requires me to sacrifice my personal happiness if that is necessary to do what is right. Yet it is a psychological fact that humans necessarily desire their own happiness. In such a state it looks as if human moral agents will be torn by what Henry Sidgwick called the “dualism of the practical reason” (1884, 401). Reason both requires humans to seek their own happiness and to sacrifice it. Sidgwick himself noted that only if there is a God can we hope that this dualism will be resolved, so that those who seek to act morally will in the long run also be acting so as to advance their own happiness and well-being. (Interestingly, Sidgwick himself does not endorse this argument, but he clearly sees this problem as part of the appeal of theism.) A contemporary argument similar to this one has been developed by C. Stephen Layman (2002).

The critic of this form of the Kantian argument may reply that Kantian morality sees duty as something that must be done regardless of the consequences, and thus a truly moral person cannot make his or her commitment to morality contingent on the achievement of happiness. From a Kantian point of view, this reply seems right; Kant unequivocally affirms that moral actions must be done for the sake of duty and not from any desire for personal reward. Nevertheless, especially for any philosopher willing to endorse any form of eudaimonism, seeing myself as inevitably sacrificing what I cannot help but desire for the sake of duty does seem problematic. As John Hare affirms, “If we are to endorse wholeheartedly the long-term shape of our lives, we have to see this shape as consistent with our happiness” (1996, 88).

The critic may reply to this by simply accepting the lamentable fact that there is something tragic or even absurd about the human condition. The world may not be the world we wish it was, but that does not give us any reason to believe it is different than it is. If there is a tension between the demands of morality and self-interest, then this may simply be a brute fact that must be faced.

This reply raises an issue that must be faced by all forms of practical or pragmatic arguments for belief. Many philosophers insist that rational belief must be grounded solely in theoretical evidence. The fact that it would be better for me to believe p does not in itself give me any reason to believe p. This criticism is aimed not merely at Kant, but at other practical moral arguments. For example, Robert Adams argues that if humans believe there is no moral order to the universe, then they will become demoralized in their pursuit of morality, which is morally undesirable (1987, 151). The atheist might concede that atheism is (somewhat) demoralizing, but deny that this provides any reason to believe there is a moral order to the universe. Similarly, Linda Zagzebski (1987) argues that morality will not be a rational enterprise unless good actions increase the amount of good in the world. However, given that moral actions often involve the sacrifice of happiness, there is no reason to believe moral action will increase the good unless there is a power transcendent of human activity working on the side of the good. Here the atheist may claim that moral action does increase the good because such actions always increase good character. However, even if that reply fails the atheist may again simply admit that there may be something tragic or absurd about the human condition, and the fact that we may wish things were different is not a reason to believe that they are. So the problem must be faced: Are practical arguments merely rationalized wish-fulfillment?

The theist might respond to this kind of worry in several ways. The first thing to be said is that the fact that a naturalistic view of the universe implies that the universe must be tragic or absurd, if correct, would itself be an important and interesting conclusion. However, apart from this, it makes a great deal of difference how one construes what we might call the background epistemic situation. If one believes that our theoretical evidence favors atheism, then it seems plausible to hold that one ought to maintain a naturalistic view, even if it is practically undesirable that the world have such a character. In that case a practical argument for religious belief could be judged a form of wish-fulfillment. However, this does not seem to be the way those who support such a practical argument see the situation. Kant affirms that the limits of reason established in The Critique of Pure Reason would silence all objections to morality and religion “in Socratic fashion, namely, by the clearest proof of the ignorance of the objectors” (1781, 1787, 30. See also 530–531.) In fact, the situation actually favors theism, since Kant holds that theoretical reason sees value in the concept of God as a regulative ideal, even though God's existence cannot be theoretically affirmed as knowledge. If we appeal to God's will to explain what happens in the natural order, we undermine both science and religion, since in that case we would no longer seek empirical evidence for causality and we would make God into a finite object in the natural world (1781, 1787, 562–563). However, as a regulative ideal, the concept of God is one that theoretical reason finds useful: “The assumption of a supreme intelligence, as the one and only cause of the universe, though in the idea alone, can therefore always benefit reason and can never injure it” (1781, 1787, 560). There is a sense in which theoretical reason itself inclines towards affirmation of God, because it must assume that reality is rationally knowable: “If one wishes to achieve systematic knowledge of the world, he ought to regard it as if it were created by a supreme reason.” (Kant 1786, 298) Although theoretical reason cannot affirm the existence of God, it finds it useful to think of the natural world as having the kinds of characteristics it would have if God did exist. Thus, if rational grounds for belief in God come from practical reason, theoretical reason will raise no objections.

For Kant the argument from practical reason for belief in God is not a form of wish-fulfillment because its ground is not an arbitrary desire or wish but “a real need associated with reason” (Kant, 1786, 296). Human beings are not purely theoretical spectators of the universe, but agents. It is not always rational or even possible to refrain from action, and yet action presupposes beliefs about the way things are (For a good interpretation and defense of this view of Kant on the relation between action and belief, see Wood 1970, 17–25). Thus, in some cases suspension of judgment is not possible. The critic may object that a person may act as if p were true without believing p. However, it is not clear that this advice to distinguish action on the basis of p and belief that p can always be followed. For one thing, it seems empirically the case that one way of acquiring belief that p is simply to begin to act as if p were true. Hence, to begin to act as if p were true is at least to embark upon a course of action that makes belief in p more likely. Second, there may well be a sense of “belief” in which “acting as if p were true” is sufficient to constitute belief. This is obviously the case on pragmatist accounts of belief. But even those who reject a general pragmatic account of belief may well find something like this appealing with respect to religious belief. Many religious believers hold that the best way to measure a person's religious faith is in terms of the person's actions. Thus, a person who is willing to act on the basis of a religious conception, especially if those actions are risky or costly, is truly a religious believer, even if that person is filled with doubt and anxiety. Such a person might well be construed as more truly a believer than a person who smugly “assents” to religious doctrines but is unwilling to act on them.

Perhaps the right way to think of practical moral arguments is not to see them as justifying belief without evidence, but as shifting the amount of evidence seen as necessary. This is the lesson some would draw from the phenomenon of “pragmatic encroachment” that has been much discussed in recent epistemology. Here is an example of pragmatic encroachment:

You: I am about to replace the ceiling fan in the kitchen.
Spouse: Did you turn off the main electrical power to the house?
You: Yes.
Spouse: If you forgot you could electrocute yourself.
You: I better go back and check.
(See McBrayer 2014, Rizzieri 2013).

A plausible interpretation of this scenario is that ordinarily claims such as the one I made, based on memory, are justified, and count as knowledge. However, in this situation, the stakes are raised because my life is at risk, and my knowledge is lost because the pragmatic situation has “encroached” on the normal truth-oriented conditions for knowledge. Pragmatic encroachment is controversial and the idea of such encroachment is rejected by some epistemologists. However, defenders hold that it is reasonable to consider the pragmatic stakes in considering evidence for a belief that underlies significant action (See Fantl and McGrath 2007). If this is correct, then it seems reasonable to consider the pragmatic situation in determining how much evidence is sufficient to justify religious beliefs. In theory the adjustment could go in either direction, depending on what costs are associated with a mistake and on which side those costs lie.

In any case it is not clear that practical moral arguments can always be clearly distinguished from theoretical moral arguments. The reason this is so is that in many cases the practical situation described seems itself to be or involve a kind of evidence for the truth of the belief being justified. Take, for example, Kant's classic argument. One thing Kant's argument does is call to our attention that it would be enormously odd to believe that human beings are moral creatures subject to an objective moral law, but also to believe that the universe that humans inhabit is indifferent to morality. In other words, the existence of human persons understood as moral beings can itself be understood as a piece of evidence about the character of the universe humans find themselves in. Peter Byrne (2013, 1998) has criticized practical arguments on the grounds that they presuppose something like the following proposition: “The world is likely to be organized so as to meet our deepest human needs.” Byrne objects that this premise is likely to be false if there is no God and thus arguments that assume it appear circular. However, it is not clear that only those who already believe in God will find this premise attractive. The reason for this is that humans are themselves part of the natural universe, and it seems a desirable feature of a metaphysical view that it explain (rather than explain away) features of human existence that seem real and important.

It seems likely therefore that any appeal to a practical argument will include some theoretical component as well, even if that component is not always made explicit. Nevertheless, this does not mean that practical arguments do not have some important and distinctive features. For Kant it was important that religious beliefs stem from practical reason. For if religious belief were grounded solely in theoretical reason, then such belief would have to conform to “extrinsic and arbitrary legislation” (Kant 1790, 131). Kant thinks such a religion would be one grounded in “fear and submission,” and thus it is good that religious belief is motivated mainly by a free moral act by which the “final end of our being” is presented to us (1790, 159). For any practical argument makes religious belief existential; the issue is not merely what I believe to be true about the universe but how I shall live my life in that universe.

7. Conclusion

It seems clear that no version of the moral argument constitutes a “proof” of God's existence. Each version contains premises that many reasonable thinkers reject. However, this does not mean the arguments have no force. One might think of each version of the argument as attempting to spell out the “cost” of rejecting the conclusion. Some philosophers will certainly be willing to pay the cost, and indeed have independent reasons for doing so. However, it would certainly be interesting and important if one became convinced that atheism required one to reject moral realism altogether, or to embrace an implausible account of how moral knowledge is acquired. For those who think that some version or versions of the arguments have force, the cumulative case for theistic belief may be raised by such arguments.

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