The Consistent Histories Approach to Quantum Mechanics

First published Thu Aug 7, 2014

The consistent histories, also known as decoherent histories, approach to quantum interpretation is broadly compatible with standard quantum mechanics as found in textbooks. However, the concept of measurement by which probabilities are introduced in standard quantum theory no longer plays a fundamental role. Instead, all quantum time dependence is probabilistic (stochastic), with probabilities given by the Born rule or its extensions. By requiring that the description of a quantum system be carried out using a well-defined probabilistic sample space (called a “framework”) this approach resolves all the well-known quantum paradoxes of quantum foundations. In particular, quantum mechanics is local and consistent with special relativity. Classical mechanics emerges as a useful approximation to the more fundamental quantum mechanics under suitable conditions. The price to be paid for this is a set of rules for reasoning resembling, but also significantly different from, those which comprise quantum logic. An important philosophical implication is the lack of a single universally-true state of affairs at each instant of time. However, there is a correspondence limit in which the new quantum logic becomes standard logic in the macroscopic world of everyday experience.

In the article that follows the term ‘consistent histories’ will generally be abbreviated to ‘histories’, since the ‘decoherent’ and ‘consistent’ interpretations are very similar; when in doubt insert ‘consistent’ before ‘histories’. The reader is assumed familiar with, and probably a bit confused by and frustrated with, the fundamentals of quantum mechanics found in introductory textbooks.

1. Introduction

The consistent histories interpretation of quantum mechanics was introduced by Griffiths (1984), and discussed by Omnès in a series of papers beginning with (Omnès 1988). The decoherent histories approach that first appeared in Gell-Mann & Hartle (1990) contains similar ideas. The single term “histories” will be employed below, with the understanding that at points where the “consistent” and “decoherent” approaches might be slightly different, the former is intended.

The histories approach extends the calculational methods found in standard textbooks and gives them a microscopic physical interpretation which the textbooks lack. It is not intended as an alternative, but as a fully consistent and clear statement of basic quantum mechanics, “Copenhagen done right”. In particular, measurements are treated in the same way as all other physical processes and play no special role in the interpretation. Thus there is no measurement problem, and under appropriate conditions one can discuss the microscopic properties revealed by measurements.

All the standard quantum paradoxes (double slit, Schrödinger cat, Hardy, three box, etc.) are resolved using the histories approach, or one might better say “tamed”: they are no longer unsolved difficulties casting doubt upon the reliability and completeness of the quantum formalism, but instead they illustrate striking differences between quantum and classical physics. In particular, there is no conflict between quantum theory and relativity: superluminal influences cannot carry information or anything else for the simple reason that they do not exist. In appropriate regimes (large systems, strong decoherence) the laws of classical physics provide a very good approximation, valid for all practical purposes, to the more fundamental and more exact laws of quantum mechanics.

But at what price? The histories approach introduces a variety of concepts that go beyond textbook quantum theory, and these can be summarized under two headings. First, quantum dynamics is treated as stochastic or probabilistic. Not just when measurements are carried out, but always. Born's rule, together with its extensions, is a fundamental axiom of quantum theory. The task of Schrödinger's time-dependent equation is to assist in assigning probabilities. Second, following Sec. III.5 of J. von Neumann (1932), quantum properties, which are what the probabilities refer to, are associated with subspaces of the quantum Hilbert space. But then new logical principles are required to consistently deal with the difference between the quantum Hilbert space and a classical phase space. These principles are related to, but not identical with, those of the quantum logic initiated by Birkhoff & Neumann (1936).

Since textbook quantum mechanics already contains certain rules for calculating probabilities, the first innovation of the histories approach, stochastic dynamics, is not very startling and by itself causes few conceptual difficulties. It is the second innovation, in the domain of logic and ontology, that represents the most radical departure from classical thinking. However, the new quantum logic reduces to the old familiar classical propositional logic in the same domain where classical mechanics is a good approximation to quantum mechanics. That is to say, the old logic is perfectly good for all practical purposes in the same domain where classical mechanics is perfectly good for all practical purposes, and a consistent, fully quantum analysis explains why this is so.

2. Quantum Properties

2.1 Indicators, projectors, negation

A classical mechanical system can be described using a phase space $\Gamma$ with points denoted by $\gamma$. A classical property $P$ is a collection of points $\PC$ from the phase space, and can be conveniently described by an indicator function $P(\gamma)$ which is equal to 1 if $\gamma \in \PC$ and 0 otherwise. It will cause no confusion to use $P$ for both the property and its indicator function. The negation $\lnot P$ of a property $P$ corresponds to the complement $\PC^c$ of the set $\PC$, consisting of points in $\Gamma$ that are not in $\PC$. Its indicator is $I-P$, where the identity indicator $I(\gamma) =1$ for all $\gamma$. For example, the phase space of a one-dimensional harmonic oscillator is the real plane with a point $\gamma = (x,p)$ indicating that the particle is at $x$ and has momentum $p$. The property that its energy

\[ E=p^2/2m + (1/2) m\omega^2 x^2 \label{eqn1} \]

is less than some fixed value $E_r$ corresponds to the set of points contained in the ellipse $E=E_r$ centered at the origin of the $x,p$ plane, and the indicator is the function that is 1 on the points inside (and on the boundary) of the ellipse and 0 outside. Its negation, the property that the energy is greater than $E_r$, corresponds to all the points lying outside this ellipse.

The quantum counterpart of a phase space is a Hilbert space $\HC$: a complex vector space with an inner product. If infinite dimensional it must be complete—Cauchy sequences have limits. But for our purposes finite-dimensional spaces will suffice for discussing the major conceptual difficulties of quantum theory and how the histories approach resolves them. (Some examples use a harmonic oscillator with an infinite dimensional Hilbert space simply because it is relatively simple and familiar.) We use Dirac notation in which an element of $\HC$, a “ket”, is denoted by $\ket{\psi}$, where $\psi$ is a label, and $\inpd{\phi}{\psi}$ denotes the inner product of $\ket{\phi}$ with $\ket{\psi}$. The simplest quantum physical property, the counterpart of a point $\gamma$ in the classical phase space, is a one-dimensional subspace of the Hilbert space, or ray, consisting of all multiples $c\ket{\psi}$ of some nonzero $\ket{\psi}$, with $c$ an arbitrary complex number. The ray uniquely determines and is uniquely determined by the corresponding projector

\[P = [\psi] = \dya{\psi}, \label{eqn2}\]

assuming $\ket{\psi}$ is normalized, $\inp{\psi}=1$. In Dirac notation $\dyad{a}{b}$ is an operator which when applied to an arbitrary ket $\ket{\phi}$ yields the ket $\ket{a}\inpd{b}{\phi}=(\inpd{b}{\phi}) \ket{a}$. The square bracket in \eqref{eqn2} is not standard Dirac notation, but is very convenient and will be used later.

In addition to rays, a Hilbert space of dimension $d$ also contains subspaces of dimension 2, 3, etc., up to $d$ (the entire space). These larger subspaces also represent quantum properties and are the analogues of sets of more than one point in a classical phase space. Each subspace $\PC$ corresponds to a unique projector $P$, a Hermitian operator $P=P^\dagger =P^2$ such that $P\ket{\phi}=\ket{\phi}$ if and only if $\ket{\phi}$ belongs to $\PC$. A quantum projector behaves in many ways like a classical indicator function, e.g., its eigenvalues can only be 0 or 1. Using the same symbol $P$ for the property and the projector should cause no confusion. Following Sec. III.5 of J. von Neumann (1932), we identify the negation $\lnot P$ of a quantum property $P$, subspace $\PC$, with the orthogonal complement $\PC^\perp$ consisting of the kets in $\HC$ which are orthogonal to all the kets in $\PC$. The projector on $\PC^\perp$ is $I-P$, again analogous to the classical case.

Consider the example of a one-dimensional quantum harmonic oscillator. As is well known, its energy $E$ can take on only discrete values $(n+1/2)\hbar\omega$, where $n=0, 1,\ldots$ is any nonnegative integer and $\omega$ is its angular frequency, as in \eqref{eqn1}. We denote the corresponding normalized ket by $\ket{n}$. The projector $[n]=\dya{n}$ then represents the property that the energy is equal to $(n+1/2)\hbar\omega$. The property that the energy is less than or equal to $(N+1/2)\hbar\omega$ for some integer $N$ is given by the projector

\[P = \sum_{n=0}^N [n] = \sum_{n=0}^N\dya{n}, \label{eqn3}\]

while the corresponding sum from $n=N+1$ to $\infty$ represents its negation, $I-P$, the property that $E$ is greater than $(N+1/2)\hbar\omega$.

Despite the close analogy between classical and quantum properties there is actually a profound difference. For a particular classical property $P$, every point $\gamma$ in the phase space lies either inside the set $\PC$, so that the property is true for this $\gamma$, or else it lies in the complementary set $\PC^c$, and the property $P$ is false. However, given a nontrivial (neither 0 nor the entire space) subspace $\PC$ of the quantum Hilbert space $\HC$, there are always kets $\ket{\phi}$ with corresponding rays $\{c\ket{\phi}\}$ which lie neither in $\PC$ nor in $\PC^\perp$. For example, $\ket{\phi} = \ket{N} + \ket{N+1}$ for $P$ given by \eqref{eqn3}. How is one to think about these? That is a key question in quantum foundations.

2.2 Conjunction and Disjunction

The conjunction $P\land Q$, or $P$ AND $Q$, of two classical properties corresponds to the intersection $\PC\cap\QC$ of the sets that represent them on the phase space, and the indicator for this set is the product $P(\gamma)Q(\gamma)$ of the two indicator functions. What about the quantum case? In quantum logic $P\land Q$ is identified with the intersection $\PC\cap\QC$ of the two Hilbert subspaces, which is itself a subspace and thus a quantum property. The histories interpretation identifies $P\land Q$ with the product $PQ$ of the projectors $P$ and $Q$ provided the two projectors commute, that is, provided $PQ=QP$. When and only when this condition is fulfilled is the product $PQ$ itself a projector, and it projects onto the subspace $\PC\cap\QC$, in agreement with quantum logic. However, if $PQ\neq QP$ the conjunction $P\land Q$ is undefined or meaningless in the sense that the histories interpretation assigns it no meaning. In the same way the disjunction $P\lor Q$, the nonexclusive $P$ OR $Q$, is represented by the projector $P+Q-PQ$ when $PQ=QP$, but is otherwise undefined.

The refusal to define the conjunction or disjunction when $PQ\neq QP$ should be thought of as a syntactical rule, analogous to that in ordinary logic that says an expression like $P\land\lor\, Q$ is meaningless because it has not been formed according to the rules used to construct meaningful sentences. In this connection it is important to distinguish “meaningless” from “false”. A proposition which is false is meaningful and its negation is true, whereas the negation of a meaningless statement is equally meaningless. Once the commutativity restriction for meaningful combinations of quantum propositions or properties is in place the usual logical rules apply together with the intuition that goes along with them. This will be further codified using the single framework rule defined in subsection 3.4 below.

2.3 Example of spin half

Let us apply these ideas to a specific example, that of the spin degree of freedom of a spin-half particle, such as an electron or a proton, or a silver atom in its electronic ground state. The operator $S_z$ for the $z$ component of spin angular momentum acts on a 2-dimensional Hilbert space and has eigenvalues $+1/2$ and $-1/2$ in units of $\hbar$. If $\ket{z^+}$ and $\ket{z^-}$ are the corresponding eigenkets, the projectors corresponding to $S_z=\pm 1/2$ are $[z^+] =\dya{z^+}$ and $[z^-] =\dya{z^-}$. The product of these projectors in either order is the zero operator $0$, which is the property that is always false, the quantum counterpart of the empty subset of a classical phase space. Their sum $[z^+] + [z^-] =I$ is the identity operator, the property that is always true. In physical terms, $S_z$ is either positive or negative: it cannot be both ($[z^+]\cdot [z^-] =0$), and it must be one or the other ($[z^+] + [z^-] =I$). This explains the outcome of the Stern-Gerlach experiment.

In the same way the $x$ component $S_x$ of angular momentum can take only two values $+1/2$ or $-1/2$, corresponding to the projectors $[x^+] = \dya{x^+}$ and $[x^-] = \dya{x^-}$ formed from its eigenkets $\ket{x^+}$ and $\ket{x^-}$. Consequently, what was stated in the previous paragraph about $S_z$ can also be said about $S_x$. However—here we arrive at a central feature of the histories interpretation—it is not meaningful to combine discussions of $S_z$ with discussions of $S_x$, because neither $[x^+]$ nor $[x^-]$ commutes with $[z^+]$ or $[z^-]$. There is no way of associating the property “$S_z=+1/2$ AND $S_x=+1/2$” with a subspace of the two-dimensional quantum Hilbert space. One way to see this is that every one-dimensional subspace of this Hilbert space has a physical interpretation: $S_w=+1/2$ for some direction $w$ in space, so there are no possibilities left over which could correspond to “$S_z=+1/2$ AND $S_x=+1/2$”. But might one assign the zero-dimensional subspace, the proposition that is always false, to “$S_z=+1/2$ AND $S_x=+1/2$”? This is the approach of quantum logic. However, taking the negation of this proposition that is always false has the consequence that the proposition “$S_z=-1/2$ OR $S_x=-1/2$” is always true, which to a physicist seems extremely odd.

For a more detailed discussion of the logic associated with the histories approach, see (Griffiths 2014).

3. Quantum Probabilities

Probabilities in the histories interpretation of quantum mechanics are standard Kolmogorov probabilities, not some new invention that, for example, allows negative probabilities. But these standard probabilities must be associated with a well-defined sample space. While this is also true in classical applications of probability theory, in quantum mechanics the penalty for carelessness can be severe: confusion and unresolved paradoxes. The following discussion indicates what steps need to be taken to construct consistent probabilities and stay out of trouble. For more details see Ch. 5 of Griffiths (2002a).

3.1 Probabilistic models

A probabilistic model as used in classical physics and other sciences can be thought of as a triple $(\SC,\EC,\MC)$, a sample space $\SC$, an event algebra $\EC$ and a probability measure $\MC$. When a die is rolled the sample space $\SC$ consists of six mutually exclusive possibilities, one and only one of which actually occurs. The event algebra can be set equal to the collection of all $2^6$ subsets of $\SC$, including the empty set and $\SC$ itself; it forms a Boolean algebra under complements and intersections. Finally, $\MC$ assigns probabilities, real numbers between 0 and 1, to the different sets in $\EC$ according to certain rules. Again we need only consider the simplest situation in which $\SC$ is finite or countable, and a nonnegative number $p_j$ is assigned to each $j\in\SC$ in such a manner that $\sum_j p_j = 1$. The probability for some $E\in \EC$ is then given by the formula

\[\Pr(E) = \sum_{j\in E} p_j. \label{eqn4}\]

Note that the mathematical rules of probability theory do not constrain the choice of the $p_j$, aside from the requirement that they be nonnegative and sum to 1. It is up to the scientist constructing the model to come up with appropriate values, which may be done using a variety of considerations; among them pure guesswork, as well as carefully fitting parameters using results of previous experiments.

3.2 Probabilities in quantum mechanics

The histories interpretation of quantum mechanics employs probability theory in exactly the same way as in the other sciences once a sample space $\SC$ has been specified. A quantum sample space $\SC$ is always a projective decomposition of the identity operator $I$, hereafter referred to as a “projective decomposition” (or “decomposition”), on the quantum Hilbert space $\HC$ used to model the situation of interest. That is to say, a collection $\{P_j\}$ of projectors ($P^{}_j = P_j^\dagger =P_j^2)$ which are mutually orthogonal ($P_jP_k = 0$ for $j\neq k$) and sum to the identity

\[I = \sum_j P_j. \label{eqn5}\]

These projectors represent mutually exclusive properties (implied by orthogonality), one of which is true (implied by the sum equal to $I$) in any given experiment or situation to which the model is being applied.

The event algebra $\EC$ consists of all projectors formed by taking sums of some of the $P_j$ in the collection; i.e., $\sum_j\pi_j P_j$, where each $\pi_j$ is either 0 or 1. This includes the identity operator $I$ and the zero operator 0 along with such things as $P_2$ or $P_1+P_3$. The event algebra is a Boolean algebra in the sense that the complement $I-P$ of any projector and the product $PQ$ of any two projectors belonging to $\EC$ is an element of $\EC$. The term framework can refer to either the sample space or the event algebra constructed from it in this way, since there is a one-to-one correspondence between the two. Quantum theory does not in general specify the probability $p_j$ to be assigned to the projector $P_j$ in $\SC$, apart from the requirement that it be nonnegative, and that the $p_j$ sum to 1 (but see subsection 4.2 concerning time dependence). Thus, for example, to the element $P_1+P_3$ of $\EC$ one assigns the probability $p_1+p_3$. The intuitive interpretation of probabilities introduced in this way is the same as in the other sciences which employ probability theory as long as a single framework is in view. What is distinctly different in the quantum case is the existence of multiple incompatible frameworks; given these consistency requires that one adopt the single framework rule, subsection 3.4.

3.3 Quantum observables

Quantum observables, represented by Hermitian operators, are the counterpart of real-valued functions on a classical phase space. The spectral decomposition

\[A = \sum a_j P_j \label{eqn6}\]

of an observable $A$, where each eigenvalue $a_j$ of $A$ occurs but once in the sum, $j\neq k$ implies $a_j\neq a_k$, associates with $A$ a unique decomposition of the identity of the form \eqref{eqn5}. Thus $A$ takes on or has the value $a_j$ if and only if $P_j$ is true, and the probability that $A$ has the value $a_j$ is given by the probability $p_j$ assigned to $P_j$. Hence measuring $A$ is equivalent to measuring the corresponding decomposition in the sense of determining which of the mutually-exclusive properties $P_j$ is true. (The subject of quantum measurements is taken up below in section 7.) The property that the value of $A$ lies between $a$ and $a'$ corresponds to the sum of the projectors $P_j$ for which the corresponding $a_j$ falls in this interval, which is a projector belong to the corresponding event algebra, and its probability is the sum of the corresponding $p_j$ values.

3.4 Refinement, coarsening, and the single framework rule

A refinement of a sample space is obtained by replacing one or more of its projectors with other projectors which add up to it; conversely a coarsening or coarse graining is obtain by adding together two or more projectors in the projective decomposition and using the sum as one of the elements in a new decomposition. Given the connection between sample spaces and event algebras as defined above, one sees that the event algebra of a refined sample space is larger than the original event algebra: i.e., it contains all the original projectors and others in addition; conversely, a coarsening leads to a new event algebra which is a subset of the old event algebra.

Two quantum sample spaces (projective decompositions) $\{P_j\}$ and $\{Q_k\}$ associated with the same Hilbert space are said to be compatible provided all the projectors in one decomposition commute with all the projectors in the other decomposition: $P_jQ_k = Q_k P_j$ for all $j$ and $k$. Otherwise they are incompatible. Note that all projectors in the two event algebras commute if and only if this is true for the sample spaces, so it makes sense to talk about compatible and incompatible frameworks. When the frameworks are compatible one can combine them. In particular, the coarsest common refinement is given by the sample space or decomposition formed by all nonzero products of the form $P_jQ_k$, and the corresponding event algebra contains all the projectors in the original algebras along with the additional ones constructed from their products.

The single framework rule says that a specific quantum probabilistic model employs just one sample space and its associated event algebra, and in particular two incompatible frameworks cannot be combined. This rule, together with its extension to quantum dynamics, see subsection 4.2, is a central principle of histories quantum mechanics. It provides a guide for quantum reasoning that prevents one from falling into paradoxes; conversely, most quantum paradoxes are constructed by violating the single framework rule in some way.

As an illustration, consider the one-dimensional harmonic oscillator of subsection 2.1 and a sample space

\[\SC_a = \{P,I-P\};\quad P = [0] + [1], \label{eqn7}\]

containing two projectors, where $P$ corresponds to the case $N=1$ in \eqref{eqn3}. The physical interpretation of $P$ is that the energy of the oscillator is no greater than $(3/2)\hbar\omega$, whereas $I-P$ means the energy is at least $(5/2)\hbar\omega$. If $P$ is true it might seem reasonable to conclude that either $n=0$ and the energy is $(1/2)\hbar\omega$, or else $n=1$ and the energy is $(3/2)\hbar\omega$. After all, the energy can only take values $(n+1/2)\hbar\omega$, so does it not follow from the truth of $P$ that $n=0$ or $n=1$? No it does not, and understanding why it does not will expose an important principle of quantum reasoning. The point is that probabilistic reasoning, in quantum mechanics or in other disciplines, does not allow one to make inferences about matters which are outside the scope of discussion, i.e., which are not contained in the event algebra. The event algebra $\EC_a$ corresponding to the sample space $\SC_a$ in \eqref{eqn7} contains $P$ and $I-P$, but does not contain either $[0]$ or $[1]$, the projectors that correspond to the two lowest energy eigenstates. Consequently, this framework does not allow for the statement of a result which might seem intuitively obvious.

A solution is readily at hand. In place of $\SC_a$ use a refinement

\[\SC_b = \{[0],[1],I-P\};\quad P = [0] + [1]. \label{eqn8}\]

Now because $[0]$ and $[1]$ belong to the event algebra $\EC_b$ they can be discussed, and the truth of $P$ indeed implies that either $[0]$ or $[1]$ is true: if the energy is not greater than $(3/2)\hbar\omega$ then it is either $1/2$ or $3/2$ $\hbar\omega$. But is not this insistence that $\SC_b$ be used in place of $\SC_a$ a piece of sophistry irrelevant to the needs of the working scientist? No, not if the scientist's work involves quantum mechanics. To see why, consider an alternative refinement

\[\SC_c = \{[+],[-],I-P\};\quad P = [+] + [-] = [0]+[1] \label{eqn9}\]

of $\SC_a$, where

\[\ket{+} = (\ket{0} + \ket{1})/\sqrt{2},\quad \ket{-} = (\ket{0} - \ket{1})/\sqrt{2}. \label{eqn10}\]

Since the event algebra $\EC_c$ contains $P$ along with $[+]$ and $[-]$, in this framework the truth of $P$ implies that the oscillator is either in the state $[+]$ or the state $[-]$. But neither of these are energy eigenstates, and these projectors do not commute with $[0]$ and $[1]$; the relationship is formally the same as that between eigenstates of $S_x$ and those of $S_z$ for a spin-half particle, subsection 2.3. Consequently, if results using frameworks $\EC_b$ and $\EC_c$ are carelessly combined, it is possible to infer for the oscillator something quite analogous to the meaningless assertions combining properties of $S_x$ and $S_z$. Hence the importance of the single framework rule which prohibits combining $\EC_b$ and $\EC_c$ (equivalently, $\SC_b$ and $\SC_c$).

If $\EC_b$ and $\EC_c$ cannot be combined, which is the correct framework to use in describing a harmonic oscillator? The answer, again a key point in the histories interpretation, which will be discussed in more detail in section 5, and also section 11, is that in the quantum world there is never a single correct framework, there are always many possibilities, something rather strange from the perspective of classical physics. The single framework rule prohibits combining incompatible frameworks; it does not assert that there is just one correct framework to use in modeling a particular physical situation.

One may add that in the early days of quantum theory there was a tendency among the practitioners to think that quantum systems must always be in states of well-defined energy, and this led to various conundrums. Nowadays states which are superpositions of the ground state and an excited state of an atom are produced routinely in quantum optics experiments, and thus analogs of $\EC_c$ can be quite relevant for a quantum description of what goes on in the laboratory.

3.5 Quantum states as pre-probabilities

Once a quantum sample space has been chosen the question arises of how probabilities are to be assigned to the different projectors of which it is composed. As in other applications of probability theory such assignments may represent pure guesswork, or contain parameters which are to be adjusted according to experimental data, or be based upon some other information about the system, such as prior preparation or a later measurement. Information about the preparation of a quantum system is often expressed using a density operator $\rho$, a positive semidefinite operator (Hermitian with nonnegative eigenvalues) with trace (sum of the eigenvalues) equal to 1, used as a pre-probability in the terminology of Sec. 9.4 of Griffiths (2002a), a mathematical object that can be used to generate a probability distribution. In particular if $\{P_j\}$ is a projective decomposition of the identity, a quantum sample space, one assigns a probability

\[p_j = \text{Tr}(\rho P_j) \label{eqn11}\]

to the property $P_j$. Very often $\rho$ is referred to as the “quantum state”, since it is somewhat analogous to a probability distribution, e.g., a “Gibbs state”, in classical statistical mechanics. The name “pre-probability” refers to the fact that $\rho$ can be used to generate many different probability distributions for different choices of the sample space.

Whereas the distinction between quantum properties and quantum states in the sense of pre-probabilities is often evident from the context and the use of different symbols, the case of a “pure state” in which the density operator can be written as a rank one projector or dyad, $\rho =\dya{\psi}$, can lead to confusion in that the same mathematical object can represent either a pre-probability or a property. Indeed, there is a close connection in that if for such a $\rho$ one introduces a sample space $\{[\psi],I-]\psi]\}$, the probability of the property $[\psi]$ is 1, which is to say that if one uses this particular sample space the quantum system certainly has the property $[\psi]$. But if this same $\rho$ is used as a pre-probability for some other sample space, and if one ignores the single framework rule, it is easy to fall into the trap of thinking that $[\psi]$ and some other incompatible property corresponding to a projector that does not commute with $[\psi]$ can both be true, which makes no sense. The best known example of the confusion that results is Schrödinger's infamous dead-and-alive cat, subsection 10.1.

4. Quantum Time Development

4.1 Kinematics

Suppose a coin is tossed three times in succession, with results heads ($H$) or tails ($T$). In the theory of stochastic processes one constructs a sample space $\SC$ containing 8 events, let us call them histories: $HHH$, $HHT$, $HTH$, …. Notice that formally the same sample space is obtained if instead of a coin tossed three times in a row, three different coins are tossed simultaneously. Since in quantum mechanics the Hilbert space of several separate systems is constructed as a tensor product of the individual Hilbert spaces, this suggests that the Hilbert space for a system at a sequence of times, the histories Hilbert space, can be constructed as the tensor product of copies of the Hilbert space for a single time. We write it as

\[\breve \HC = \HC_1\odot\HC_2\cdots\odot\HC_f \label{eqn12}\]

for times $t_1 <t_2 <\cdots < t_f$, where $\odot$ is employed in place of the usual $\otimes$ simply to emphasize that a sequence of times is involved.

A single quantum history will typically correspond to a projector

\[Y^\alpha = P_1^{\alpha_1}\odot P_2^{\alpha_2}\odot\cdots P_f^{\alpha_f}, \label{eqn13}\]

where the superscript $\alpha_m$ labels different possible projectors at time $t_m$, and $\alpha = (\alpha_1,\alpha_2,\ldots\alpha_f)$ is a composite label for the entire history. (Since the square of a projector is the same as the projector, the superscript position is not needed for exponents, and it is convenient to reserve the subscript to indicate the time.) If for each time $t_m$ it is the case that $\sum_{\alpha_m} P_m^{\alpha_m} = I_m$ it follows that $\sum_\alpha Y^\alpha = \breve I$, the identity operator on $\breve\HC$; thus the $\{Y^\alpha\}$ form a projective decomposition of the identity $\breve I$, a quantum sample space or family of histories, one and only one of which will actually occur in any given experimental run. The physical interpretation of \eqref{eqn13} is that the property $P_1^{\alpha_1}$ occurs or is true at time $t_1$, $P_2^{\alpha_2}$ at time $t_2$, and so forth. Indeed, since we live in a quantum world, the “classical” coin-tossing history $THT$ can be written in the form \eqref{eqn13} using appropriate projectors to represent $T$ and $H$. As will be discussed later in section 6, the histories approach employs the same mathematical procedures for both microscopic and macroscopic physics, consistent with the belief of most physicists that quantum theory applies to phenomena of any size.

Several comments are in order. First, the projective decompositions of the identity at different times need not be the same. Thus for a spin half particle one could have the $S_z=\pm 1/2$ decomposition at one time and the $S_x=\pm 1/2$ decomposition at some later time. Indeed, more complicated history-dependent decompositions of $\breve I$ are possible; see the discussion in Sec. 14.4 of Griffiths (2002a). Second, there is no reference to measurements. Events occur or do not occur; whether a measuring apparatus is involved is entirely irrelevant, although histories can be used to discuss what goes on in a measuring process; see section 7. Third, the projectors in a history can be coarse-grained and specify only a small amount of information, e.g., the spin degree of freedom of an atom without reference to its position; they do not and generally will not project onto pure states. Fourth, there is no direct connection between the choice of projectors entering a history and Schrödinger's time-dependent equation, although in appropriate circumstances the latter can be used to assign probabilities to the different histories in a family, as discussed next.

4.2 Dynamics

Classical mechanics yields a deterministic dynamics only in the case of a closed or isolated system, since an exact prediction of the future or past for a system interacting with an unknown environment is not possible. But even if one is interested in the approximate dynamics of an open classical system it helps to start off with the idealization that the environment and the system of interest are parts of a total system which is isolated, and therefore has a dynamics given by Hamilton's equations. Similarly, when constructing the intrinsically stochastic dynamics appropriate to quantum theory it is helpful to begin with a closed or isolated system with well-defined boundary conditions in which Schrödinger's equation has well defined solutions and induces a unitary time development given by a collection of time-evolution operators $T(t',t)$: if $\ket{\psi(t)}$ is any solution to Schrödinger's (time-dependent) equation, then $\ket{\psi(t')} = T(t',t)\ket{\psi(t)}$. In the case of a time-independent Hamiltonian $H$ one has $T(t',t) = \exp[-i(t'-t)H/\hbar]$.

Consider a family $\FC=\{Y^\alpha\}$ of histories of a closed quantum system, for a finite (possibly very large) collection of times $t_1, t_2, \ldots t_f$. Under appropriate conditions one can use $T(t',t)$ to assign probabilities in a consistent way to the histories in $\FC$, using a multi-time generalization of the Born rule. To simplify the exposition we restrict attention to situations in which all histories begin with the same normalized initial pure state $\ket{\Psi_0}$ at a time $t_0 <t_1$, and modify the definition in \eqref{eqn13} so that it reads

\[Y^\alpha = [\Psi_0]\odot P_1^{\alpha_1}\odot P_2^{\alpha_2}\odot\cdots P_f^{\alpha_f}. \label{eqn14}\]

In addition, add an extra history $Y^0=(I-[\Psi_0])\odot I_1\odot I_2\cdots$ so that the sum of all the history projectors together is the identity $\breve I$ on the Hilbert space $\HC_0\odot\HC_1\odot\cdots$. (Here, consistent with the notation used elsewhere in this article, $[\Psi_0]$ denotes the projector $\dya{\Psi_0}$.) Then define a collection of “chain kets” $\ket{\Phi^\alpha}$,

\[\ket{\Phi^\alpha} = P^{\alpha_f}_f T(t_f,t_{f-1}) P^{\alpha_{f-1}}_{f-1} T(t_{f-1},t_{f-2})\cdots P^{\alpha_1}_1 T(t_1,t_0) \ket{\Psi_0}, \label{eqn15}\]

one for each history $\alpha$. Provided the consistency conditions

\[\inpd{\Phi^\alpha}{\Phi^{\alpha'}} = 0 \text{ for } \alpha\neq\alpha', \label{eqn16}\]

are satisfied, where $\alpha$ and $\alpha'$ are considered unequal if $\alpha_m\neq \alpha'_m$ for at least one value of $m$ between 1 and $f$, the history $Y^\alpha$ is assigned the probability

\[\Pr(Y^\alpha) = \inp{\Phi^\alpha}. \label{eqn17}\]

In the case $f=1$ the consistency condition \eqref{eqn16} is automatically satisfied because the projectors at $t_1$ are orthogonal to each other, and the probabilities $\inp{\Phi^\alpha}$ are those given by the usual Born rule. For $f=2$ or more the consistency conditions are not trivial, and when they are satisfied \eqref{eqn17} provides a generalization of the Born rule.[1] Insight into the meaning of the consistency conditions is best obtained by working through examples; a number of these will be found in Chs. 12 and 13 of Griffiths (2002a). Families for which the consistency conditions are satisfied are called consistent families, and it is only for this restricted class that the laws of quantum dynamics for a closed system can be used to assign a meaningful set of probabilities.

Some additional comments. First, two consistent families $\FC_a$ and $\FC_b$ may be such that the (history) projectors in one commute with those in the other, but still the common coarsest refinement does not satisfy the dynamical consistency conditions, in which case they are said to be incommensurate and cannot be combined, at least if one wishes to use the dynamical laws of quantum mechanics to assign them probabilities. Second, measurements play no role in terms of the fundamental mathematical formulation or its physical interpretation. In classical physics there is never any difficulty in imagining events actually occurring inside a closed system, even with no observers or measuring apparatus present. The same is true for quantum physics once one removes “measurement” from its spurious role as an interpretive principle, and instead treats it like any other quantum process, see section 7. Third, the histories approach is time symmetrical in the sense that the rules for assigning probabilities do not single out a particular “direction” or sense of time. (This symmetry is evident in the more complete discussion in Ch. 10 of Griffiths (2002a), which allows more general types of family. That generality has been sacrificed here in the interests of a simpler and more intuitive exposition based on the assumption of a single pure state at the initial time.)

5. Quantum Reasoning

5.1 General principles

The histories interpretation of quantum mechanics, as noted earlier, is probabilistic, and hence the processes of reasoning are those that scientists generally use for probabilistic models. This requires a method of assigning probabilities along with procedures for drawing inferences, usually in the form of conditional probabilities. In both these respects quantum theory resembles other applications of probabilistic reasoning. The main difference is the necessity in the quantum case of paying close attention to the problem of choosing a sample space (which then determines the event algebra) or framework, and then confining the logical reasoning process, from assumptions to conclusions, to a single framework. We have already encountered some applications of this single framework rule, and additional ones are discussed later, but at this point it is useful to summarize some of the basic principles involved, which can be conveniently placed under four headings:

  • (R1) Liberty. The physicist is free to employ as many frameworks as desired when constructing descriptions of a particular quantum system, provided the principle R3 below is strictly observed.
  • (R2) Equality. No framework is more fundamental than any other; in particular, there is no “true” framework, no framework that is “singled out by nature”.
  • (R3) Incompatibility. The single framework rule: incompatible frameworks are never to be combined into a single quantum description. The (probabilistic) reasoning process starting from assumptions (or data) and leading to conclusions must be carried out using a single framework.
  • (R4) Utility. Some frameworks are more useful than others for answering particular questions about a quantum system.

The reasoning process begins with some initial data, which may reflect some knowledge of the system under discussion or may be purely hypothetical. Here “initial” refers to the beginning of a logical argument, not necessarily to the initial state of a quantum system, though the latter is often included in the initial data. These data must then be expressed in appropriate quantum terms as some sort of property or properties, subspaces of an appropriate Hilbert space, which could be a space of histories, all belonging to a single framework or event algebra, principle R3. Generally there will be more than one framework that can contain the initial data, and the physicist is at liberty to choose among these possibilities, R1. However, the types of conclusions which can be drawn using a particular framework (and thus event algebra) will depend upon the framework, and for this reason the physicist's interests can, and in general will, influence the choice of framework. It is utility, R4, which determines this choice; from a fundamental point of view all frameworks are equally good, R2.

The link between initial data and the conclusions one can draw from them will be probabilistic (sometimes with probabilities 0 or 1, hence deterministic). One might be concerned that the flexibility in framework choice provided by R1 and R2 could lead to different results when using different frameworks. However, it is straightforward to show, see Ch. 16 of Griffiths (2002a), that as long as both frameworks contain all the events needed to express the initial data and also those needed for drawing conclusions, the probabilities linking data and conclusions will be identical even if the two frameworks in question are mutually incompatible. This ensures an overall consistency. The discussion of quantum preparation and measurement found in section 7 below will show how principles of quantum reasoning apply to measurements, a topic that has given rise to a lot of confusion.

5.2 Counterfactual reasoning

A counterfactual argument begins by imagining another world which resembles the actual world in certain respects and differs from it in others, and asking the question: “What would be the case if instead of …it were true that …”. For example, “What would the weather be like in Pittsburgh in January if the city were 1000 kilometers closer to the equator?” In general, counterfactual reasoning is not easy to analyze, and this gives rise to difficulties when trying to understand quantum paradoxes stated in counterfactual form. The basic principle governing counterfactual reasoning in the histories approach is the single framework rule, with the requirement that a comparison between the real and the counterfactual world be carried out using the same framework for both. See the discussion in Ch. 19 of Griffiths 2002a and its later application to Hardy's paradox in Ch. 25 for further details; also the exchange betwee Stapp and the author in Stapp (2012) and Griffiths (2012).

6. Classical Physics

The histories approach assumes that the same fundamental quantum mechanical laws apply to systems of any size, from quarks to jaguars to quasars. Classical mechanics is a very good approximation to the more exact quantum laws in appropriate circumstances. The following remarks are based on ideas of Gell-Mann & Hartle (1993, 2007) and Hartle (2011), are broadly consistent with those of Omnès (1999), and are discussed at somewhat greater length in Ch. 26 of Griffiths (2002a).

The first task is to identify suitable quasiclassical frameworks, appropriate choices of projective decompositions of the identity at a single time corresponding to macroscopic properties, together with suitable quantum histories that involve such properties, with results which correspond closely to the time development of classical physics. The desired decompositions will be coarse grained, with individual projectors corresponding to subspaces of enormous dimension (e.g., 10 raised to the power $10^{16}$). In such a situation it is plausible that there are families containing quantum histories having a probability very close to 1, and which exhibit a time development that closely approximates that of classical mechanics.

To be sure, the task of showing that classical laws emerge to a good approximation in this manner is a nontrivial one, and it cannot be claimed that it has been completed. However, the effort expended thus far has not revealed any fundamental difficulty which would undermine this approach. One also expects to find cases in which the relevant quantum probabilities are not close to 0 or 1; in particular in a regime where classical analysis predicts chaos (positive Lyapunov exponents) quantum “fluctuations” are likely to be amplified. But this is also a situation in which the deterministic aspect of classical time development is not to be taken too seriously, due to the sensitive dependence upon initial conditions, so there is no reason to suppose that an appropriate quantum description cannot be constructed, at least in principle.

Understanding the emergence of classical physics from the quantum world does not require a unique quasiclassical framework; there are undoubtedly a large number of different possibilities, any one of which could for the circumstances of interest provide “classical” results within a suitable approximation (further comments on nonuniqueness will be found in subsection 11.3 below). In constructing a quasiclassical description decoherence plays a useful role in the sense that it removes the effects of quantum interference which might otherwise render a quasiclassical family inconsistent, preventing the application of the Born rule and its generalizations. Once again, this statement can be supported by model calculations of an appropriate sort which make it plausible, but work still remains to be done in coming to a full understanding of decoherence in quantum terms. Invoking decoherence by itself outside the framework provided by the histories approach does not solve the conceptual difficulties of quantum theory; see, e.g., Adler (2003).

7. Measurement and Preparation

The principles discussed above provide a resolution of the measurement problem of quantum foundations: that is, how to discuss the measurement process itself in fully quantum mechanical terms. It is convenient to think of this as made up of two problems:

  • (M1) How can the macroscopic outcome of the measurement, traditionally thought of as a pointer position, be described in quantum terms?
  • (M2) How is this outcome related to the earlier microscopic property the apparatus was designed to measure?

The reliable preparation of a microscopic system in a particular quantum state raises similar conceptual issues; indeed, what in textbooks are often called “measurements” would be better thought of as “preparations”. Both are discussed below.

7.1 Schematic model

The issues are most simply addressed by using a simple schematic quantum model of measurement and preparation that goes back to J. von Neumann (1932: sec. VI.3). Let $\HC_S$ be the Hilbert space of the system to be measured, henceforth referred to as a particle, and $\HC_M$ that of the measuring device or apparatus. For example, $\HC_S$ could be the 2-dimensional Hilbert space of the spin of a spin-half particle, whereas the quantum description of its position might be included in $\HC_M$, along with all the many degrees of freedom needed to describe the apparatus itself. Let $\{\ket{s^j}\}$ be an orthonormal basis for $\HC_S$, with states labeled by a superscript so subscripts can label time. Let

\[\ket{s_0} = \sum_j c_j \ket{s^j},\quad \ket{M_0},\quad \ket{\Psi_0}=\ket{s_0}\otimes\ket{M_0} \label{eqn18}\]

be the normalized initial states of the particle, the measuring device, and the total system at time $t_0$. Here $c_j$ are complex numbers satisfying $\sum_j|c_j|^2=1$.

Let $T(t',t)$, subsection 4.2, be the unitary time development operator for the total system, and assume it is trivial—equal to the identity operator $I=I_S\otimes I_M$—for $t$ and $t'$ both less than some $t_1$ or both greater than $t_2$, whereas for the interval from $t_1$ to $t_2$ during which the particle and the apparatus interact,

\[T(t_2,t_1) \bigl( \ket{s^j}\otimes\ket{M_0}\bigr) = \ket{w^j}\otimes \ket{M^j}. \label{eqn19}\]

Here the $\ket{M^j}$ are orthonormal states of the apparatus, $\inpd{M^j}{M^k}=\delta_{jk}$, corresponding to different pointer positions, and the $\ket{w^j}$ are normalized, $\inp{w^j}=1$, but not necessarily orthogonal; it may be that $\inpd{w^j}{w^k}\neq 0$ when $j\neq k$. (In von Neumann's original model the $\ket{w^j}$ were the same as the $\ket{s^j}$, and this is also possible, but is not being assumed, for the situation we are considering.) The transformation \eqref{eqn19} can be extended to a unitary transformation on $\HC_S\otimes\HC_M$, because the orthogonality of the $\ket{M^j}$ ensures that the states on the right side of \eqref{eqn19} are normalized and mutually orthogonal. Unitary time development leads to states

\begin{align} \label{eqn20} \ket{\Psi_1} &= T(t_1,t_0) \ket{\Psi_0} =\ket{\Psi_0}, \\ \ket{\Psi_2} &= T(t_2,t_1) \ket{\Psi_1} = \sum_j c_j\ket{w^j}\otimes\ket{M^j} \nonumber \end{align}

for the total system at times $t_1$ and $t_2$.

7.2 Measurement

To study the physical implications of this model we need to introduce a family of histories. From a mathematical perspective the simplest such family is based solely on unitary time development and takes the form

\[\FC_u:\;\;[\Psi_0]\;\odot\; \{[\Psi_1],I-[\Psi_1]\}\;\odot\; \{[\Psi_2], I-[\Psi_2]\}, \label{eqn21}\]

where $[\Psi_1]$ and $[\Psi_2]$ are projectors onto the states $\ket{\Psi_1}$ and $\ket{\Psi_2}$ defined in \eqref{eqn20}, and the family \eqref{eqn21} should be interpreted as a set of four mutually exclusive histories obtained by choosing at $t_1$ one of the projectors inside the first pair of curly brackets, and at $t_2$ one inside the second pair. The corresponding chain kets, subsection 4.2, are zero except for the single history $[\Psi_0]\odot [\Psi_1] \odot [\Psi_2]$, which is assigned probability 1 by \eqref{eqn17}.

The family $\FC_u$ is of no use for resolving the first measurement problem M1, because the family of histories does not include the projectors $\{[M^j]\}$ for the pointer positions at time $t_2$ needed to discuss the measurement outcome, nor can it be refined to include them, because $[\Psi_2]$ will not commute with some of the $[M^j]$, assuming at least two of the $c_j$ in \eqref{eqn18} are nonzero. This is the basic reason why the first measurement problem M1 is an enormous difficulty for quantum interpretations in which the only possible time dependence for a closed quantum system is that given by Schrödinger's equation. By contrast, the histories approach gives the physicist Liberty to use a different family

\[\FC_1:\;\;[\Psi_0]\;\odot\;[\Psi_1] \;\odot\; \{[M^j]\} \label{eqn22}\]

in place of $\FC_u$. Note that $[M^j]$ is understood as $I_S\otimes[M^j]$, using a common physicist's convention. In addition a projector $R=I_M-\sum_j[M^j]$ should be included among the possibilities at the final time $t_2$, but as it occurs with zero probability it can be ignored. The consistency of the family $\FC_1$ is easily demonstrated, and the probability $|c_j|^2$ for the final position $[M^j]$ is an immediate consequence of \eqref{eqn17}.

However, the second measurement problem M2, relating the outcome of the measurement to the property of the particle before the measurement, cannot be solved using the family $\FC_1$, because the properties of interest, the $[s^j]$, are not included among the possibilities at time $t_1$. To discuss these requires another family

\[\FC_2:\;\;[\Psi_0]\;\odot\; \{ [s^j]\}\;\odot\; \{[M^k]\}. \label{eqn23}\]

Again, $[s^j]$ can be understood as $[s^j]\otimes I_M$, a property of the particle without reference to the apparatus. Showing that $\FC_2$ is consistent is straightforward, as is calculating the joint probability distribution

\[\Pr(\,[s^j]_1,[M^k]_2) = |c_j|^2 \delta_{jk} \label{eqn24}\]

using \eqref{eqn17}. Here the subscripts refer to the time: the particle property at time $t_1$ before the measurement takes place, and the outcome at $t_2$ when the measurement is over. The marginal probabilities are

\[\Pr([s^j]_1) = \Pr([M^j]_2) = |c_j|^2. \label{eqn25}\]

Thus for every case in which $c_k$ is not zero (so $[M^k]$ occurs with finite probability) one has the conditional probability

\[\Pr([s^j]_1 \boldsymbol{\mid} [M^k]_2) = \delta_{jk}. \label{eqn26}\]

In other words, given a measurement outcome $[M^k]$ at $t_2$ one can be certain that the prior state of the particle at $t_1$ was $[s^k]$; i.e., the apparatus did what it was designed to do.

7.3 Preparation and wave function collapse

The reader may have noticed that the particle states $\ket{w^j}$ in \eqref{eqn19} played no role in our discussion of measurement in subsection 7.2. Von Neumann's original (1932: sec. VI.3) presentation used $\ket{w^j}=\ket{s^j}$, as he thought it important that a second measurement could confirm the first. This practice was followed in later textbooks, and has resulted in some confusion. The $\ket{w^j}$ are in fact irrelevant when considering measurements, but they are useful when considering a preparation procedure in which macroscopic apparatus is used to produce a quantum system—again we shall speak of it as a particle—in some well-defined state. To see how this works let us again employ the model of subsection 7.1 with unitary development given by \eqref{eqn19}, but now introduce a family

\[\FC_p:\;\;[\Psi_0]\;\odot\;[\Psi_1] \;\odot\; \{[v^l]\otimes[M^j]\} \label{eqn27}\]

that is a refinement of $\FC_1$ in \eqref{eqn22}, with $I_S$ replaced by a projective decomposition onto some orthonormal basis $\{\ket{v^j}\}$ of the particle Hilbert space $\HC_S$. The joint probability distribution at time $t_2$ of the particle and pointer states is then

\begin{align} \label{eqn28} \Pr([M^j],[v^l]) &= \mte{\Psi_2}{[v^l]\otimes[M^j]} \\ &= |c_j|^2 \mte{w^j}{[v^l]} \nonumber \\ &= |c_j|^2 |\inpd{v^l}{w^j}|^2. \nonumber \end{align}

Since $\Pr([M^j]) = |c_j|^2$, \eqref{eqn25}, one obtains the conditional probability

\[\Pr([v^l]\boldsymbol{\mid} [M^j]) = |\inpd{v^l}{w^j}|^2 \label{eqn29}\]

(assuming $|c_j|^2$ is not 0). That is to say, if the measurement outcome is known to be $[M^j]$, then the probability of any property of the particle is precisely that given by assuming the particle is in the state $\ket{w^j}$, with “state” having its usual meaning: a pre-probability from which the probability distribution for the properties represented by any projective decomposition of its identity can be calculated; see subsection 3.5.

Note that this discussion remains valid when $\{\ket{w^j}\}$ is not a collection of orthogonal states, even though this means that the corresponding projectors $\{[w^j]\}$ cannot all belong to the same projective decomposition of $I_S$. The point is that $\ket{w^j}$ is assigned to the particle only in association with the projector $[M^j]$, and the collection $\{\ket{w^j}\otimes\ket{M^j}\}$ is orthogonal. In such circumstances the $[w^j]$ are what in Ch. 14 of Griffiths (2002a) are referred to as dependent or contextual (“conditional” would be equally good) properties: they must be understood in conjunction with other properties, which in this case are the pointer positions $[M^j]$, when forming part of a quantum description or history.

What has here been deduced from fundamental quantum principles, including the Born rule, is in textbooks stated as a mysterious and separate principle of “wave function collapse”: if the measurement outcome is $[M^j]$ then the particle state “collapses” onto a particular state associated with this outcome. To make closer contact with textbook discussions of this topic, let

\[S = \sum_j \sigma_j [s^j] \label{eqn30}\]

be a Hermitian operator with nondegenerate eigenvalues $\sigma_j$, and let $\ket{w^j}=\ket{s^j}$. Then the measurement outcome $[M^j]$ corresponds to measuring the eigenvalue $\sigma_j$—see the remarks in subsection 3.3—and \eqref{eqn29} and the remarks following it justify assigning to the particle at time $t_2$ the ket $\ket{w^j}=\ket{s^j}$. One may add that the more general form of wave function collapse embodied in the Lüder's rule (Busch & Lahti 2009) is likewise a consequence of the general quantum principles governing stochastic time development set forth in section 4, so need not be added as an additional hypothesis.

In any case there is no need to set $\ket{w^j}$ equal to $\ket{s^j}$ in order to discuss quantum measurements, and a better way of viewing the family $\FC_p$ in \eqref{eqn27} is as a model of a quantum preparation process in which the macroscopic pointer position tells one the future rather than the past state of the particle. The conditional probability in \eqref{eqn29} refers specifically to properties at the time $t_2$, but given the assumption that $T(t',t)$ is trivial for times after $t_2$, the argument leading to \eqref{eqn29} is easily extended to $[v^l]$ and $[M^j]$ at any times (not necessarily the same) later than $t_2$. In general the outcome $[M^j]$ is random, and if the wrong $j$ occurs $\ket{w^j}$ may not be the desired state. But then the preparer can throw the particle away (run it into a baffle) and repeat the experiment until the desired outcome occurs. There are more sophisticated ways to do preparations, but our model illustrates the general idea, and in fact discarding unwanted outcomes is a procedure often used in quantum optics. The essential point is that an apparatus can be constructed using quantum principles to prepare a particle whose future state is known on the basis of macroscopic (pointer) information.

7.4 Concluding remarks

In summary, the histories approach resolves both quantum measurement problems M1 and M2 by introducing appropriate stochastic families of histories. In order to describe the measurement outcome as a pointer position one needs an appropriate projective decomposition of the identity, the $[M^l]$ in our simple model, that includes pointer positions. Similarly, in order to discuss how properties of the microscopic particle before the measurement are related to measurement outcomes, one needs a decomposition at $t_1$ that includes these properties, the $[s^j]$ in \eqref{eqn23} for our simple model. There is no fundamental quantum principle that forces one to use these decomposition; the choice is based on utility, and illustrates the importance of principle R4 in section 5. And it is worth emphasizing that neither the validity nor the utility of a particular framework is in any way reduced by the existence of other frameworks which are incompatible (or incommensurate) with it.

The model introduced in subsection 7.1 has severe simplifications when compared to any experimental situation in a laboratory. However, extending it to something more realistic poses difficulties no worse than those encountered when introducing quasiclassical descriptions, section 6. Rather than a pure initial state $\ket{M_0}$ it is more realistic to use a macroscopic projector of the type mentioned in section 6, or else an initial density operator. Similarly, macroscopic projectors should replace the pure state projectors $[M^j]$ for pointer positions, and the conditions satisfied by $T(t',t)$ should be expressed using these macroscopic states, while retaining microscopic states for the particle. None of these changes presents any difficulties in principle; see the discussion in Ch. 17 of Griffiths (2002a) for additional details. The role of decoherence is to allow a consistent quasiclassical description, as noted in section 6. By itself decoherence does not resolve either of the measurement problems; see, e.g., Adler (2003).

Finally, while wave function collapse is a legitimate calculational procedure when describing a preparation in quantum mechanical terms, it amounts to nothing more than a convenient way of calculating conditional probabilities useful in the quantum description of a preparation. Trying to view it as some sort of mysterious physical process leads to confusion and the incorrect notion that quantum mechanics is somehow inconsistent with special relativity, which is our next topic.

8. Locality and Special Relativity

According to some interpretations of quantum mechanics, e.g., d'Espagnat (2006), Maudlin (2011), the quantum world is infested with nonlocal influences: systems which are far apart, even spacelike separated in the sense of special relativity, can influence each other. This has given rise to the notion that quantum theory is incompatible with special relativity. No such nonlocal influences are present in the histories interpretation, which is perfectly compatible with special relativity. The following discussion is based on more detailed treatments found in Chs. 23 and 24 of Griffiths (2002a) and in Griffiths (2002b, 2011a, 2011b).

8.1 Singlet state of spin-half particles

The Bohm version (Bohm 1951: Chapter 22) of the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen paradox (Einstein, Podolsky, & Rosen 1935) is based on the spin singlet state

\[\ket{\psi_0} = \bigl( \ket{z^+_a,z^+_b} - \ket{z^-_a,z^-_b} \bigr) \label{eqn31}\]

of two spin-half particles $a$ and $b$, using the same notation as in subsection 2.3. This is said to be an entangled state because it is not a product state of the form $\ket{a,b} = \ket{a}\otimes\ket{b}$. It is easy to show that the corresponding projector $[\psi_0]$ does not commute with any projector on a nontrivial property of particle $a$, such as $[z^+_a]$, or on a nontrivial property of $b$. (The trivial properties are the identity and the zero projector.) Thus a quantum description that contains $[\psi_0]$ as a property cannot at the same time ascribe any nontrivial properties to either of the particles.

This is a mathematical fact which makes no reference to where the particles are located in space. It is true for the ground state of a hydrogen atom, in which the electron and proton are on top of each other, as well as for the situation we consider next in which particle $a$ is in Alice's laboratory and $b$ in Bob's laboratory some distance away. Suppose that Alice measures $S_{az}$ for her particle and Bob measures $S_{bz}$ for his. Then using $[\psi_0]$ as a pre-probability, subsection 3.5, one can show that the outcomes, although they are random, will always be opposite: if Alice obtains $+1/2$ (in units of $\hbar$), Bob will find $-1/2$; if Alice obtains $-1/2$, Bob will find $+1/2$.

Correlated outcomes are by themselves not surprising once one accepts the idea that quantum mechanics is stochastic, not deterministic. Here is a classical analogy: Charlie in Chicago places a red slip of paper in an opaque envelope and a green slip in a second identical envelope, and after shuffling them chooses one at random and mails it to Alice in Atlanta and the other to Bob in Boston. Upon opening her envelope and finding a red slip, Alice can at once conclude from her knowledge of the protocol that Bob's envelope contains a green slip of paper. There is no need to invoke some superluminal influence to explain this.

Her reasoning is exactly the same in the case where Charlie prepares a spin singlet state at the center of the laboratory and sends the two particles in opposite directions towards apparatuses constructed by Alice and Bob, both competent experimentalists, and Alice measures $S_{az}$. From her measurement outcome and because she is a competent experimentalist she is entitled to conclude that before the measurement took place particle $a$ possessed the value indicated later by the pointer position; see the discussion in subsection 7.2. Assume for the sake of discussion that this was $S_{az} = +1/2$. Then from her knowledge of the protocol (initial singlet state) she can assign a state $S_{bz}=-1/2$ to Bob's particle and use this (as a pre-probability) to assign a probability to the outcome of a measurement of $S_{bz}$. She employs a scheme of probabilistic inference appropriate to the quantum world; there is no need to invoke wave function collapse except, perhaps, as a handy calculational tool.

But suppose Bob rather than measuring $S_{bz}$ measures some other component $S_{bw}$ of the spin of particle $b$, where $w$ could be $x$ or $y$ or some arbitrary direction in space? Again, Alice on the basis of her measurement outcome can still assign an $S_{bz}$ value to Bob's particle before measurement, and use it as a pre-probability to calculate a probability for Bob's measurement outcome. Conversely, given the outcome of his $S_{bw}$ measurement (and knowledge of the protocol) Bob can assign a state $S_{aw}$ to Alice's particle before it is measured, and use that to predict the outcome of a measurement of $S_{az}$. Both reasoning processes follow the rules indicated above in subsection 5.1, but when $w$ is neither $z$ nor $-z$ the single framework rule means they cannot be combined. It is at this point that quantum principles must be used, unlike the analysis applicable to colored slips of paper, where one can employ the single quasiclassical framework (section 6) appropriate for macroscopic physics.

If Alice measured $S_{az}$, then surely she could have instead measured $S_{ax}$ perhaps making the choice between this and $S_{az}$ at the very last instant, even after Bob has completed his measurement; what would have occurred in that situation? This is a counterfactual question of the form discussed in subsection 5.2, and we refer the reader to the references given there.

8.2 Bell inequalities and Einstein locality

Quantum theory predicts correlations in the spin-singlet state that do not satisfy Bell inequalities (Shimony 2009), and by now there is ample evidence from experiments on the analogous property of pairs of correlated photons that quantum theory is correct, and therefore one or more of the assumptions that go into the derivation of a Bell inequality must be faulty. While the claim has been made that the key assumption is locality, and therefore a violation of Bell inequalities implies that the real (quantum) world is nonlocal, a histories analysis identifies the problem as a different assumption made by Bell: the existence of classical hidden variables that are inconsistent with Hilbert space quantum mechanics. For details see Chs. 23 and 24 of Griffiths (2002a); also Griffiths (2011a, 2011b).

In addition, the histories approach makes it possible to establish on the basis of quantum mechanics itself a principle of Einstein locality (Griffiths 2011b):

Objectively real internal properties of an isolated individual system do not change when something is done to another non-interacting system.

This statement is to be understood in the following way. Let $\HC_S$ be the Hilbert spaces of an isolated individual system $S$, $\HC_R$ that of the rest of the world, so $\HC=\HC_S\otimes\HC_R$ is the Hilbert space of the total system. The properties of $S$ must be represented by a projective decomposition of $\HC_S$, or by a consistent family of such properties. That $S$ is isolated means there is no interaction between $S$ and $R$, which is to say that for any two times $t$ and $t'$ during the period of interest the time development operator of the total system factors:

\[T(t',t)=T_S(t',t)\otimes T_R(t',t). \label{eqn32}\]

Something done to another system might be, for example, the choice between measuring $S_{bx}$ and $S_{bz}$ for a particle $b$ which is part of $R$, with the measuring apparatus and whatever makes the measurement choice, e.g., a quantum coin (Sec. 19.2 of Griffiths 2002a) that is also part of $R$.

9. Quantum Information

Quantum information is at present a very active field of research, one in which quantum foundational issues continually arise. One reason for current interest is the hope of building quantum computers that are capable, assuming they can be made to work properly, of carrying out certain information-processing tasks faster and more efficiently than is possible using ordinary classical computers. To be sure, if the entire world is quantum mechanical then our current “classical” computers must in some real sense be quantum computers. So what is the difference? At least to a first approximation, classical computation is that kind where a single quasiclassical framework, section 6, suffices for describing the carriers of information (e.g., on-off states of transistors) and the way information is processed, whereas quantum computation is what cannot be so described. Further clarifying this distinction is one of the tasks of quantum information theory.

Classical information theory as developed by Shannon and his successors employs standard (Kolmogorov) probability theory. The histories approach to quantum mechanics also uses standard probability theory, and thus it is plausible that as long as one sticks to a single quantum framework, both the mathematical structure and the intuition associated with classical information theory can be directly translated into the quantum domain. This is indeed the case, and such a quantum framework is not limited to quasiclassical states; it can also include microscopic quantum states.

This makes it possible for the histories approach to answer two questions raised by J. S. Bell (1990) as objections to using information theory to address foundational issues in quantum mechanics: “Whose information? Information about what?” The answers in reverse order: information is always about quantum properties or, more generally, properties at different times, thus histories. And it is possessed by someone who, like Alice in subsection 8.1, can build a reliable piece of apparatus and interpret the (macroscopic) outcome by applying consistent quantum principles.

Not all problems in quantum information can be simply and immediately mapped in a useful way onto a single framework, and those that cannot are what make quantum information an interesting, as well as a rather difficult, field of research. Note that the single framework rule forbids combining incompatible frameworks, but allows one to compare them or work out relationships that hold between results in different frameworks. Therefore one can say that, at least in some general sense, problems at the frontiers of quantum information theory have to do with comparisons of incompatible frameworks. For a more extended discussion of these issues consult Sec. 7 of Griffiths (2013).

In summary, the histories approach provides a consistent conceptual framework for the full scope of quantum information theory, including classical (Shannon) information as a special case.

10. Paradoxes Resolved

The histories approach resolves, or one might say “tames”, all the usual quantum paradoxes in the sense of providing a clear explanation of why certain results which seem peculiar from the perspective of classical physics are perfectly consistent with quantum theory, and can thus serve as useful illustrations of its basic principles. As the explanations have for the most part already been published, what is found below is mostly just a few comments along with references.

10.1 Schrödinger's cat

The paradox of Schrödinger (1935)'s cat is a particularly striking way of stating the unresolved difficulties associated with the first measurement problem in standard (i.e., textbook) quantum mechanics. It corresponds to using the framework $\FC_u$, \eqref{eqn21} in subsection 7.2, with $\ket{\Psi_2}$ the superposition of dead and live cat states. The histories approach addresses this paradox by first noting that there is nothing wrong from the point of view of fundamental quantum theory (principle R2 of subsection 5.1) with using $\FC_u$, but it is a serious misunderstanding to suppose that $\ket{\Psi_2}$ or the corresponding property $[\Psi_2]$ represents a cat which is both dead and alive. First, the projectors, let us call them $P_d$ and $P_a$, that correspond to the cat being dead and alive do not commute with $[\Psi_2]$, so they cannot, by the single framework rule, be brought into the discussion (and, indeed, it is doubtful that any projector associated with what one might call “catness” will commute with $[\Psi_2]$). Second, since $P_d P_a=0$ (distinct macroscopic states) both properties cannot be true simultaneously, so it is false to say that the cat is both dead and alive. In addition the historian may remark that the existence of other frameworks in no way invalidates a discussion based on the quasiclassical one that lies behind the ordinary language discussion of cats, which is distinguished by its utility and not by some framework selection rule, see subsection 11.3. In this case a useful framework is the counterpart of $\FC_1$, \eqref{eqn22} in subsection 7.2, with quasiclassical projectors $P_d$ and $P_a$ at time $t_2$, and $\ket{\Psi_2}$ understood not as a property but as a pre-probability useful for assigning probabilities that the cat is dead or alive. At this point the paradox has disappeared.

A similar but somewhat more complex analysis can be applied to Wigner (1961)'s friend; the solution is to use an appropriate framework.

10.2 Interference paradoxes

The best known of the interference paradoxes is the double slit. How can successive quantum particles passing through the slit system and later detected at specific points in the interference zone build up a pattern showing interference of a sort that depends on the separation of the slits, even though measurements carried out directly behind the slits will show that the particle passed through one or the other, but not both? Feynman's discussion (Feynman, Leighton, & Sands 1965: Chapter 1, where two holes replace the two slits) is superb. What is essentially the same paradox, but in a form somewhat easier to analyze, is the one in which a particle passes through the two arms of Mach-Zehnder interferometer. Chapter 13 of Griffiths (2002a) provides an extensive discussion of how the histories approach deals with different possibilities in a consistent way that avoids paradoxes while producing analogs of all the interesting effects discussed by Feynman.

10.3 Incompatibility paradoxes

The Bell-Kochen-Specker family of paradoxes (Bell 1966; Kochen & Specker 1967) are based on a relatively simple idea, although its execution is sometimes complicated: if one chains together a sufficient number of incompatible frameworks it is possible to arrive at a logical contradiction. The chaining consists in finding a projector which belongs to two (or more) incompatible decompositions of the identity, and then assuming it has the same truth value in both frameworks, whereas in any single decomposition one and only one projector is true. The histories approach blocks paradoxes of this sort because they (obviously) violate the single framework rule. For more details see Ch. 22 of Griffiths (2002a).

The three-box paradox of Aharonov & Vaidman (1991) is similar to Bell-Kochen-Specker, except that in this case quantum dynamics is involved, and the issue has to do with incommensurate families of histories (combining them violates the consistency conditions) rather than incompatible sample spaces. Again, the histories resolution of the paradox, Sec. 22.5 of Griffiths (2002a), consists in applying the single framework rule: a contradiction can only be reached by violating quantum rules of reasoning.

10.4 Counterfactual paradoxes

In the histories approach the rule governing counterfactual reasoning, as indicated in subsection 5.2, is that a single framework must be used for comparing the actual and counterfactual world. Counterfactual paradoxes are constructed by ignoring this rule. One of the best known is Wheeler's (1978) delayed choice paradox in which in a Mach-Zehnder interferometer the second beam splitter is or is not removed at a time when the quantum particle (or wave) has already passed the first beam splitter, so the particle is already physically present inside the interferometer. With the second beam splitter absent one can determine the arm through which the particle passed, whereas the interference exhibited when the beam splitter is present shows that the particle cannot have been in a particular arm. For a discussion of precisely how the histories approach deals with this situation and avoids a paradox see Ch. 20 of Griffiths (2002a).

There are a number of other paradoxes which hinge upon the (incorrect) use of counterfactuals, or at least include a counterfactual element in the way they are stated. Among these are Hardy (1992)'s paradox, discussed in considerable detail in Ch. 25 of Griffiths (2002a), and the somewhat similar Greenberger-Horne-Zeilinger paradox (Greenberger, Horne, Shimony, & Zeilinger 1990; Greenberger, Horne, & Zeilinger 1989). (A more recent discussion of the use of counterfactuals in Hardy's paradox will be found in (Griffiths 2012; Stapp 2012).)

10.5 Nonlocality paradoxes

As discussed in section 8, the Bohm (spin singlet) version of the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen paradox has been interpreted, by Bell and others, as indicating that quantum theory is nonlocal. Similar conclusions have been drawn from the Hardy and the Greenberger-Horne-Zeilinger paradoxes stated in a form which involves measurements at distinct physical locations. One can add to this list the Elitzur-Vaidman indirect measurement paradox (Elitzur & Vaidman 1993), which again suggests some form of nonlocal influence. When critically examined using the tools provided by the histories interpretation all evidence for nonlocality vanishes, consistent with the demonstration of Einstein locality discussed in subsection 8.2. Details are given in Chs. 21, 23, 24, and 25 of Griffiths (2002a).

11. Difficulties and Objections

Any physical theory can give rise to various kinds of conceptual difficulty. Problems may arise because of lack of familiarity with, or misunderstanding of, new ideas. Most students upon their first encounter with calculus or with special relativity have difficulties of this sort, which can be cleared up by additional study, working through examples, and the like. In addition theories may be internally inconsistent. This is often the case when they are relatively new and under development, but can also be true of more mature theories. Indeed certain theories turn out to be of great usefulness despite the fact that they contain serious flaws or inconsistencies. (Standard, which is to say textbook, quantum mechanics is a prime example!) And even theories which are properly understood and are internally consistent can be rejected, either by individual scientists or the community as a whole, because they are not “good physics”, a term whose importance should not be underestimated even if it cannot be given a precise definition. The histories interpretation of quantum theory has given rise to conceptual difficulties that fall in all of these areas, and while it is impossible in a few words to discuss each of them in detail, the following remarks are intended to indicate the general nature of some of the more serious issues raised by critics, along with responses made by advocates of the histories approach. For a more detailed discussion both of quantum conceptual difficulties in general and those specific to the histories approach, see Griffiths (2014).

11.1 Internal consistency

The issue of internal consistency has been raised by Kent (1997) and by Bassi & Ghirardi (1999, 2000) on the grounds that the rules for reasoning using histories, summarized in section 5, lead to contradictions: certain assumptions allow one to derive both a proposition and its contradiction. Equivalently, a quantum property can be assigned, on the basis of the same initial data, probabilities of both 0 and 1. These criticisms have been answered in Griffiths & Hartle (1998) and in Griffiths (2000a, 2000b). In addition there is a general argument for the consistency of the histories approach in Ch. 16 of Griffiths (2002a). The key point, easily overlooked as it has no close analogy in classical physics, is the single framework rule R3 of section 5. In situations that involve quantum properties at a single time the use of a single framework means the use of a particular projective decomposition of the identity and the associated Boolean event algebra. When reasoning is restricted to this algebra the usual rules of propositional logic apply, so an inconsistency at this level would imply the inconsistency of standard logic. If the framework in question consists of a family of histories of a closed system, it cannot be assigned probabilities using the extended Born rule, subsection 4.2, unless the consistency conditions are satisfied. But in those cases where probabilities can be assigned they satisfy the usual rules of probabilistic reasoning, thus ruling out contradictions.

11.2 Single framework rule

The single framework rule itself lies at the center of a large number of objections to the histories approach, which is hardly surprising since in an important sense it marks the boundary between classical and quantum physics. As it is absent from classical physics and from most quantum textbooks, the concept is unfamiliar, and one has to work through various examples in order to gain an intuitive as well as a formal understanding of how it deals with the various paradoxes and other conceptual difficulties of quantum theory. The four principles R1 to R4 found in subsection 5.1 should help in understanding how frameworks should be thought of and how they should be used. It is of particular importance that the single framework rule does not imply that there is only one way available to the physicist to think about or discuss a particular situation. What it forbids is not the construction of many, perhaps mutually incompatible, frameworks, but combining them in the fashion characteristic of the incompatibility paradoxes discussed above in subsection 10.3. Indeed, the single framework rule rather than being a restriction actually extends the Liberty of the theoretical physicist to describe the quantum world in a consistent way without the danger of running into insoluble paradoxes. But Liberty is coupled to a denial of the unicity of the world, subsection 11.4, which is perhaps the most important philosophical implication of quantum mechanics from the histories perspective, as well as the principal stumbling block in the way of a wider acceptance of that approach as a satisfactory interpretation of quantum theory.

11.3 Nonuniqueness of quasiclassical frameworks

An objection first raised by Dowker & Kent (1996), and subsequently repeated by Kent (1998), Schlosshauer (2004), and Wallace (2008), among others, is that quasiclassical frameworks are by no means the only possible consistent families of histories in a closed quantum system. In particular, one can have consistent families in which there is quasiclassical behavior up to some time followed by something which is not at all quasiclassical at a later time. This would be a serious objection if historians were claiming that there must be a unique family of histories which can be used to describe the world, but such is not the case. The physicist is at Liberty to choose a family whose histories closely resemble those of classical mechanics, and the existence of alternative frameworks in no way diminishes the validity of such a quasiclassical description. (For further remarks see section 4.2 of Griffiths (2013).) One senses that underlying such criticisms is the expectation that any good physical theory must satisfy the principle of unicity, to which we now turn.

11.4 Unicity

In a probabilistic theory the limiting cases of a probability equal to 1 or 0 are equivalent to asserting that the corresponding proposition (e.g., “the system has property $P$”) is, respectively, true or false. In the histories approach probabilities are linked to frameworks, and for this reason the notions of “true” and “false” are also framework dependent. This cannot lead to inconsistencies, a proposition being both true and false, because of the single framework rule. But it is contrary to a deeply rooted faith or intuition, shared by philosophers, physicists, and the proverbial man in the street, that at any point in time there is one and only one state of the universe which is “true”, and with which every true statement about the world must be consistent. In Sec. 27.3 of Griffiths (2002a) this belief is referred to as unicity, and it is what must be abandoned if the histories interpretation of quantum theory is on the right track.

As an example, consider the measurement model in subsection 7.2, where in the family $\FC_u$ at time $t_2$ the measurement apparatus is in a superposition state corresponding to a projector which is incompatible with the projectors representing different pointer positions, which are employed in the family $\FC_1$. The histories approach says the physicist is at Liberty to employ either family, both of which are valid ways of describing the quantum world, but Incompatibility forbids combining them into a single description. The prohibition on combining families is based on the fact that certain quantum projectors do not commute, something quite specific to quantum mechanics with no classical counterpart. In classical mechanics the true state of affairs for a physical system is always represented by a single point in the phase space. It is this feature that has to be abandoned in quantum mechanics interpreted using histories. (For further comments, see Sec. 4.5 of Griffiths (2014).)

Abandoning unicity is certainly a radical proposal, comparable in the history of science to the radical step our intellectual ancestors took when they replaced the centuries old notion of an immovable earth with the modern concept of a spinning planet in motion around the sun. In making that transition it was important to develop an understanding of why the earlier ideas worked so well; e.g., why one did not feel the earth was moving. By analogy it is helpful to note, as discussed in section 6, that from a quantum perspective the macroscopic world of everyday experience can be understood for all, or almost all, practical purposes using a single quasiclassical framework. Within that framework the principle of unicity holds, and one can thus understand why it was quite satisfactory before the quantum revolution, and remains so in sciences where specific quantum effects do not need to be taken into account.


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