The Role of Decoherence in Quantum Mechanics
Interference phenomena are a well-known and crucial aspect of quantum mechanics, famously exemplified by the two-slit experiment. There are situations, however, in which interference effects are artificially or spontaneously suppressed. The theory of decoherence is precisely the study of (spontaneous) interactions between a system and its environment that lead to such suppression of interference. We shall make more precise what we mean by this in Section 1, which discusses the concept of suppression of interference and gives a simplified survey of the theory, emphasising features that will be relevant to the following discussion. In fact, the term decoherence refers to two largely overlapping areas of research. The characteristic feature of the first (often called ‘dynamical’ or ‘environmental’ decoherence) is the study of concrete models of (spontaneous) interactions between a system and its environment that lead to suppression of interference effects. That of the second (the theory of ‘decoherent histories’ or ‘consistent histories’) is an abstract (and in fact more general) formalism that captures the essential features of the phenomenon of decoherence. The two are obviously closely related, and will both be reviewed in turn in Section 1.
Decoherence is relevant (or is claimed to be relevant) to a variety of questions ranging from the measurement problem to the arrow of time, and in particular to the question of whether and how the ‘classical world’ may emerge from quantum mechanics. This entry mainly deals with the role of decoherence in relation to the main problems and approaches in the foundations of quantum mechanics. Specifically, Section 2 analyses the claim that decoherence solves the measurement problem. It also discusses the exacerbation of the problem through the inclusion of environmental interactions, the idea of emergence of classicality, and the motivation for discussing decoherence together with approaches to the foundations of quantum mechanics. Section 3 then reviews the relation of decoherence to some of the main foundational approaches. Finally, in Section 4 we mention suggested applications that would push the role of decoherence even further.
Suppression of interference has of course featured in many papers since the beginning of quantum mechanics, such as Mott's (1929) analysis of alpha-particle tracks. The modern foundation of decoherence as a subject in its own right was laid by H. D. Zeh in the early 1970s (Zeh 1970; 1973). Equally influential were the papers by W. Zurek from the early 1980s (Zurek 1981; 1982). Some of these earlier examples of decoherence (e.g., suppression of interference between left-handed and right-handed states of a molecule) are mathematically more accessible than more recent ones. A concise and readable introduction to the theory is provided by Zurek in Physics Today (1991). (This article was followed by publication of several letters with Zurek's replies (1993), which highlight controversial issues.) More recent surveys are the ones by Zeh (1995), which devotes much space to the interpretation of decoherence, Zurek (2003), and the books on decoherence by Giulini et al. (1996) and Schlosshauer (2007).
- 1. Essentials of Decoherence
- 2. Conceptual Appraisal
- 3. Decoherence and Approaches to Quantum Mechanics
- 4. Scope of Decoherence
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The two-slit experiment is a paradigm example of an interference experiment. One repeatedly sends electrons or other particles through a screen with two narrow slits, the electrons impinge upon a second screen, and we ask for the probability distribution of detections over the surface of the screen. In order to calculate this, one cannot just take the probabilities of passage through the slits, multiply with the probabilities of detection at the screen conditional on passage through either slit, and sum over the contributions of the two slits. There is an additional so-called interference term in the correct expression for the probability, and this term depends on both wave components that pass through one or the other slit.
There are, however, situations in which this interference term (for detections at the screen) is not observed, i.e. in which the classical probability formula applies. This happens for instance when we perform a detection at the slits, whether or not we believe that measurements are related to a ‘true’ collapse of the wave function (i.e. that only one of the components survives the measurement and proceeds to hit the screen). The disappearence of the interference term, however, can happen also spontaneously, when no collapse (true or otherwise) is presumed to happen. Namely, if some other systems (say, sufficiently many stray cosmic particles scattering off the electron) suitably interact with the wave between the slits and the screen. In this case, the reason why the interference term is not observed is because the electron has become entangled with the stray particles. The phase relation between the two components of the wave function, which is responsible for interference, is well-defined only at the level of the larger system composed of electron and stray particles, and can produce interference only in a suitable experiment including the larger system. Probabilities for results of measurements performed only on the electron are calculated as if the wave function had collapsed to one or the other of its two components, but in fact the phase relations have merely been distributed over a larger system. It is this phenomenon of suppression of interference through suitable interaction with the environment that we call ‘dynamical’ or ‘environmental’ decoherence.
The study of ‘dynamical’ decoherence consists to a large extent in the exploration of concrete spontaneous interactions that lead to suppression of interference. Several features of interest arise in models of such interactions (although by no means are all such features common to all models).
One feature of these environmental interactions is that they suppress interference between states from some preferred set, be it a discrete set of states (e.g. left- and right-handed states in models of chiral molecules, or the upper and lower component of the wave function in our simple example of the two-slit experiment), or some continuous set (e.g. the coherent states of a harmonic oscillator). The intuitive picture is one in which the environment monitors the system of interest by continuously ‘measuring’ some quantity characterised by the set of preferred states (‘eigenstates of the decohering variable’). Formally, this is reflected in the (at least approximate) diagonalisation of the reduced state of the system of interest in the basis of privileged states (whether discrete or continuous).
These preferred states can be characterised in terms of their robustness or stability with respect to the interaction with the environment. Roughly speaking, the system gets entangled with the environment, but the states between which interference is suppressed are the ones that would themselves get least entangled with the environment under further interaction. The robustness of the preferred states is related to the fact that information about them is stored in a redundant way in the environment (say, because a Schrödinger cat has interacted with so many stray particles: photons, air molecules, dust). This information can later be acquired by an observer without further disturbing the system (we observe—however that may be interpreted—whether the cat is alive or dead by intercepting on our retina a small fraction of the light that has interacted with the cat).
In this connection, one also says that decoherence induces ‘effective superselection rules’. The concept of a (strict) superselection rule means that there are some observables—called classical in technical terminology—that commute with all observables (for a review, see Wightman (1995)). Intuitively, these observables are infinitely robust, since no possible interaction can disturb them (at least as long as the interaction Hamiltonian is considered to be an observable). By an effective superselection rule one means, analogously, that certain observables (e.g. chirality) will not be disturbed by the interactions that actually take place.
Interaction potentials are functions of position, so the preferred states will tend to be related to position. In the case of the chiral molecule, the left- and right-handed states are indeed characterised by different spatial configurations of the atoms in the molecule. In the case of the harmonic oscillator, one should think of the environment coupling to (‘measuring’) approximate eigenstates of position, or rather approximate joint eigenstates of position and momentum (since information about the time of flight is also recorded in the environment), thus leading to coherent states being preferred. (Rough intuitions should suffice here; see also the entries on quantum mechanics and measurement in quantum theory.)
The resulting localisation can be on a very short length scale, i.e. the characteristic length above which coherence is dispersed (‘coherence length’) can be very short. A speck of dust of radius a = 10-5cm floating in the air will have interference suppressed between (position) components with a width of 10-13cm. Even more strikingly, the time scales for this process are minute. This coherence length is reached after a microsecond of exposure to air, and suppression of interference on a length scale of 10-12cm is achieved already after a nanosecond.
One can thus argue that generically the states privileged by decoherence at the level of components of the quantum state are localised in position or both position and momentum, and therefore kinematically classical. (One should be wary of overgeneralisations, as already pointed out, but this is certainly a feature of many concrete examples that have been investigated.)
What about classical dynamical behaviour? Interference is a dynamical process that is distinctively quantum, so, intuitively, lack of interference might be thought of as classical-like. To make the intuition more precise, think of the two components of the wave going through the slits. If there is an interference term in the probability for detection at the screen, it must be the case that both components are indeed contributing to the particle manifesting itself on the screen. But if the interference term is suppressed, one can at least formally imagine that each detection at the screen is a manifestation of only one of the two components of the wave function, either the one that went through the upper slit, or the one that went through the lower slit. Thus, there is a sense in which one can recover at least one dynamical aspect of a classical description, a trajectory of sorts: from the source to either slit (with a certain probability), and from the slit to the screen (also with a certain probability). That is, one recovers a ‘classical trajectory’ at least in the sense used in classical stochastic processes.
In the case of continuous models of decoherence based on the analogy of approximate joint measurements of position and momentum, one can do even better. In this case, the trajectories at the level of the components (the trajectories of the preferred states) will approximate surprisingly well the corresponding classical (Newtonian) trajectories. Intuitively, one can explain this by noting that if the preferred states (which are wave packets that are narrow in position and remain so because they are also narrow in momentum) are the states that tend to get least entangled with the environment, they will tend to follow the Schrödinger equation more or less undisturbed. But in fact, narrow wave packets follow approximately Newtonian trajectories, at least if the external potentials in which they move are uniform enough along the width of the packets (results of this kind are known as ‘Ehrenfest theorems’). Thus, the resulting ‘histories’ will be close to Newtonian ones (on the relevant scales).
The most intuitive physical example for this are the observed trajectories of alpha particles in a bubble chamber, which are indeed extremely close to Newtonian ones, except for additional tiny ‘kinks’. As a matter of fact, one should expect slight deviations from Newtonian behaviour. These are due both to the tendency of the individual components to spread and to the detection-like nature of the interaction with the environment, which further enhances the collective spreading of the components (a narrowing in position corresponds to a widening in momentum). These deviations appear as noise, i.e. particles being kicked slightly off course. According to the type of system, and the details of the interaction, the noise component might actually dominate the motion, and one obtains (classical) Brownian-motion-type behaviour.
Other examples include trajectories of a harmonic oscillator in equilibrium with a thermal bath, and trajectories of particles in a gas (without which the classical derivation of thermodynamics from statistical mechanics would make no sense; see below Section 4).
None of these features are claimed to obtain in all cases of interaction with some environment. It is a matter of detailed physical investigation to assess which systems exhibit which features, and how general the lessons are that we might learn from studying specific models. In particular, one should beware of common overgeneralisations. For instance, decoherence does not affect only and all ‘macroscopic systems’. True, middle-sized objects, say, on the Earth's surface will be very effectively decohered by the air in the atmosphere, and this is an excellent example of decoherence at work. On the other hand, there are also very good examples of decoherence-like interactions affecting microscopic systems, such as in the interaction of alpha particles with the gas in a bubble chamber. And further, there are arguably macroscopic systems for which interference effects are not suppressed. For instance, it has been shown to be possible to sufficiently shield SQUIDS (a type of superconducting devices) from decoherence for the purpose of observing superpositions of different macroscopic currents—contrary to what one had expected (see e.g. Leggett 1984, and esp. 2002, Section 5.4). Anglin, Paz and Zurek (1997) examine some less well-behaved models of decoherence and provide a useful corrective as to the limits of decoherence.
As we have just discussed, when interference is suppressed, e.g. in a two-slit experiment, we can also speak (at least formally) about the ‘trajectory’ followed by an individual electron. In particular, we can assign probabilities to the alternative trajectories, so that probabilities for detection at the screen can be calculated by summing over intermediate events. The decoherent histories formalism (originating with Griffiths 1984; Omnès 1988, 1989; and Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990) takes this as the defining feature of decoherence.
In a nutshell, the formalism is as follows. Take orthogonal families of projections with
- ∑α1 Pα1 = 1,… , ∑αn Pαn = 1
Given times t1,… ,tn one defines histories as time-ordered sequences of projections at the given times, choosing one projection from each family, respectively. Such histories form a so-called alternative and exhaustive set of histories.
Take a state ρ(t). We wish to define probabilities for the set of histories. If one takes the usual probability formula based on repeated application of the Born rule, one obtains
- Tr(PαnUtntn-1… Pα1Ut1t0 ρ(t0) U*t1t0Pα1… U*tntn-1Pαn)
(where Uts represents the unitary evolution operator from time s to time t, and its adjoint U*ts the inverse evolution).
We shall take (2) as defining ‘candidate probabilities’. In general these probabilities exhibit interference, in the sense that if one sums over intermediate events (if one ‘coarse-grains’ the histories), one does not obtain probabilities of the same form (2). But we can impose, as a consistency or (weak) decoherence condition, precisely that interference terms should vanish for any pair of distinct histories. It is easy to see that this condition takes the form
- ReTr(Pα′nUtntn-1… Pα′1Ut1t0 ρ(t0) U*t1t0Pα1… U*tntn-1Pαn) = 0
for any pair of distinct histories. If this is satisfied, we can view (2) as defining the distribution functions for a stochastic process with the histories as trajectories. (There are some differences between the various authors, but we shall gloss them over.)
Decoherence in the sense of this abstract formalism is thus defined simply by the condition that (quantum) probabilities for wave components at a later time may be calculated from (quantum) probabilities for wave components at an earlier time and (quantum) conditional probabilities according to the standard classical formula, i.e. as if the wave had collapsed.
Models of dynamical decoherence fall under the scope of decoherence thus defined, but the abstract definition is much more general. A stronger form of the decoherence condition, namely the vanishing of both the real and imaginary part of the trace expression in (3) (the ‘decoherence functional’), can be used to prove theorems on the existence of (later) ‘permanent records’ of (earlier) events in a history, which is a generalisation of the idea of ‘environmental monitoring’. For instance, if the state ρ is a pure state |ψ><ψ| this strong decoherence condition is equivalent, for all n, to the orthogonality of the vectors
- PαnUtntn-1… Pα1Ut1t0 |ψ>
and this in turn is equivalent to the existence of a set of orthogonal projections Rα1...αiti (for any ti≤tn) that extend consistently the given set of histories and are perfectly correlated with the histories of the original set (Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990). Note, however, that these ‘generalised records’ need not be stored in separate degrees of freedom, such as an environment or measuring apparatus.
Various authors have taken the theory of decoherent histories as providing an interpretation of quantum mechanics. For instance, Gell-Mann and Hartle sometimes talk of decoherent histories as a neo-Everettian approach, while Omnès appears to think of histories along neo-Copenhagen lines (perhaps as an experimental context creating a ‘quantum phenomenon‘ that can stretch back into the past). Griffiths (2002) has probably developed the most detailed of these interpretational approaches (trying to do justice to various earlier criticisms, e.g. by Dowker and Kent (1995, 1996)).
In itself, however, the formalism is interpretationally neutral and has the particular merit of bringing out two crucial conceptual points: that wave components can be reidentified over time, and that if we do so, we can formally identify ‘trajectories’ for the system. As such, it is particularly useful as a tool for describing decoherence in connection with attempts to solve the problem of the classical regime in the context of various different interpretational approaches to quantum mechanics. In particular, it has become a standard tool in discussions of Everett interpretations, where ‘worlds’ can be formally described as histories in a consistent family (see, e.g., Saunders 1993).
The fact that interference is typically very well suppressed between localised states of macroscopic objects suggests that it is relevant to why macroscopic objects in fact appear to us to be in localised states. A stronger claim is that decoherence is not only relevant to this question but by itself already provides the complete answer. In the special case of measuring apparatuses, it would explain why we never observe an apparatus pointing, say, to two different results, i.e. decoherence would provide a solution to the measurement problem of quantum mechanics. As pointed out by many authors, however (e.g. Adler 2003; Zeh 1995, pp. 14–15), this claim is not tenable.
The measurement problem, in a nutshell, runs as follows. Quantum mechanical systems are described by wave-like mathematical objects (vectors) of which sums (superpositions) can be formed (see the entry on quantum mechanics). Time evolution (the Schrödinger equation) preserves such sums. Thus, if a quantum mechanical system (say, an electron) is described by a superposition of two given states, say, spin in x-direction equal +1/2 and spin in x-direction equal -1/2, and we let it interact with a measuring apparatus that couples to these states, the final quantum state of the composite will be a sum of two components, one in which the apparatus has coupled to (has registered) x-spin = +1/2, and one in which the apparatus has coupled to (has registered) x-spin = -1/2. The problem is that, while we may accept the idea of microscopic systems being described by such sums, the meaning of such a sum for the (composite of electron and) apparatus is not immediately obvious.
Now, what happens if we include decoherence in the description? Decoherence tells us, among other things, that plenty of interactions are taking place all the time in which differently localised states of macroscopic systems couple to different states of their environment. In particular, the differently localised states of the macroscopic system could be the states of the pointer of the apparatus registering the different x-spin values of the electron. By the same argument as above, the composite of electron, apparatus and environment will be a sum of (i) a state corresponding to the environment coupling to the apparatus coupling in turn to the value +1/2 for the spin, and of (ii) a state corresponding to the environment coupling to the apparatus coupling in turn to the value -1/2 for the spin. Again, the meaning of such a sum for the composite system is not obvious.
We are left with the following choice whether or not we include decoherence: either the composite system is not described by such a sum, because the Schrödinger equation actually breaks down and needs to be modified, or it is described by such a sum, but then we need to understand what that means, and this requires giving an appropriate interpretation of quantum mechanics. Thus, decoherence as such does not provide a solution to the measurement problem, at least not unless it is combined with an appropriate interpretation of the theory (whether this be one that attempts to solve the measurement problem, such as Bohm, Everett or GRW; or one that attempts to dissolve it, such as various versions of the Copenhagen interpretation). Some of the main workers in the field such as Zeh (2000) and (perhaps) Zurek (1998) suggest that decoherence is most naturally understood in terms of Everett-like interpretations (see below Section 3.3, and the entries on Everett's relative-state interpretation and on the many-worlds interpretation).
Unfortunately, naive claims of the kind that decoherence gives a complete answer to the measurement problem are still somewhat part of the ‘folklore’ of decoherence, and deservedly attract the wrath of physicists (e.g. Pearle 1997) and philosophers (e.g. Bub 1997, Chap. 8) alike. (To be fair, this ‘folk’ position has at least the merit of attempting to subject measurement interactions to further physical analysis, without assuming that measurements are a fundamental building block of the theory.)
Decoherence is clearly neither a dynamical evolution contradicting the Schrödinger equation, nor a new interpretation of the theory. As we shall discuss, however, it both reveals important dynamical effects within the Schrödinger evolution, and may be suggestive of possible interpretations of the theory.
As such it has much to offer to the philosophy of quantum mechanics. At first, however, it seems that discussion of environmental interactions should actually exacerbate the existing problems. Intuitively, if the environment is carrying out, without our intervention, lots of approximate position measurements, then the measurement problem ought to apply more widely, also to these spontaneously occurring measurements.
Indeed, while it is well-known that localised states of macroscopic objects spread very slowly with time under the free Schrödinger evolution (i.e., if there are no interactions), the situation turns out to be different if they are in interaction with the environment. Although the different components that couple to the environment will be individually incredibly localised, collectively they can have a spread that is many orders of magnitude larger. That is, the state of the object and the environment could be a superposition of zillions of very well localised terms, each with slightly different positions, and that are collectively spread over a macroscopic distance, even in the case of everyday objects.
Given that everyday macroscopic objects are particularly subject to decoherence interactions, this raises the question of whether quantum mechanics can account for the appearance of the everyday world even apart from the measurement problem in the strict sense. To put it crudely: if everything is in interaction with everything else, everything is generically entangled with everything else, and that is a worse problem than measuring apparatuses being entangled with the measured systems. And indeed, discussing the measurement problem without taking decoherence (fully) into account may not be enough, as we shall illustrate by the case of some versions of the modal interpretation in Section 3.4.
What suggests that decoherence may be relevant to the issue of the classical appearance of the everyday world is that at the level of components of the wave function the quantum description of decoherence phenomena can display tantalisingly classical aspects. The question is then whether, if viewed in the context of any of the main foundational approaches to quantum mechanics, these classical aspects can be taken to explain corresponding classical aspects of the phenomena. The answer, perhaps unsurprisingly, turns out to depend on the chosen approach, and in the next section we shall discuss in turn the relation between decoherence and several of the main approaches to the foundations of quantum mechanics.
Even more generally, one can ask whether the results of decoherence could thus be used to explain the emergence of the entire classicality of the everyday world, i.e. to explain both kinematical features such as macroscopic localisation and dynamical features such as approximately Newtonian or Brownian trajectories in all cases where such descriptions happen to be phenomenologically adequate. As we have mentioned already, there are cases in which a classical description is not a good description of a phenomenon, even if the phenomenon involves macroscopic systems. There are also cases, notably quantum measurements, in which the classical aspects of the everyday world are only kinematical (definiteness of pointer readings), while the dynamics is highly non-classical (indeterministic response of the apparatus). In a sense, if we follow Bohr in requiring the world of classical concepts in order to describe in the first place ‘quantum phenomena’ (see the entry on the Copenhagen interpretation), then, if decoherence gives us indeed the everyday classical world, the quantum phenomena themselves would become a consequence of decoherence (Zeh 1995, p. 33; see also Bacciagaluppi 2002, Section 6.2). The question of explaining the classicality of the everyday world becomes the question of whether one can derive from within quantum mechanics the conditions necessary to discover and practise quantum mechanics itself, and thus, in Shimony's (1989) words, close the epistemological circle.
In this generality the question is clearly too hard to answer, depending as it does on how far the physical programme of decoherence (Zeh 1995, p. 9) can be successfully developed. We shall thus postpone the (partly speculative) discussion of how far this programme might go until Section 4.
There is a wide range of approaches to the foundations of quantum mechanics. The term ‘approach’ here is more appropriate than the term ‘interpretation’, because several of these approaches are in fact modifications of the theory, or at least introduce some prominent new theoretical aspects. A convenient way of classifying these approaches is in terms of their strategies for dealing with the measurement problem.
Some approaches, so-called collapse approaches, seek to modify the Schrödinger equation, so that superpositions of different ‘everyday’ states do not arise or are very unstable. Such approaches may have intuitively little to do with decoherence since they seek to suppress precisely those superpositions that are created by decoherence. Nevertheless their relation to decoherence is interesting. Among collapse approaches (Section 3.1), we shall discuss von Neumann's collapse postulate and theories of spontaneous localisation (for which see also the entry on collapse theories).
Other approaches, known as ‘hidden variables’ approaches, seek to explain quantum phenomena as equilibrium statistical effects arising from a deeper-level theory, rather strongly in analogy with attempts at understanding thermodynamics in terms of statistical mechanics (see the entry on philosophy of statistical mechanics). Of these, the most developed are the so-called pilot-wave theories (Section 3.2), in particular the theory by de Broglie and Bohm (see also the entry on Bohmian mechanics).
Finally, there are approaches that seek to solve (or dissolve) the measurement problem strictly by providing an appropriate interpretation of the theory. Slightly tongue in cheek, one can group together under this heading approaches as diverse as Everett interpretations (see the entries on Everett's relative-state interpretation and on the many-worlds interpretation), modal interpretations and the Copenhagen interpretation. We shall be analysing these approaches specifically in their relation to decoherence (we discuss the Everett interpretation in Section 3.3, the modal interpretations in Section 3.4, and the Copenhagen interpretation in Section 3.5).
3.1.1 Von Neumann
It is notorious that von Neumann (1932) proposed that the observer's consciousness is somehow related to what he called Process I, otherwise known as the collapse postulate or the projection postulate, which in his book is treated on a par with the Schrödinger equation (his Process II). There is some ambiguity in how to interpret von Neumann. He may have been advocating some sort of special access to our own consciousness that makes it appear to us that the wave function has collapsed; this would suggest a phenomenological reading of Process I. Alternatively, he may have proposed that consciousness plays some causal role in precipitating the collapse; this would suggest that Process I is a physical process taking place in the world on a par with Process II.
In either case, von Neumann's interpretation relies on the insensitivity of the final predictions (for what we consciously record) to exactly where and when Process I is used in modelling the evolution of the quantum system. This is often referred to as the movability of the von Neumann cut between the subject and the object, or some similar phrase. Collapse could occur anywhere along the so-called von Neumann chain: when a particle impinges on a screen, or when the screen blackens, or when an automatic printout of the result is made, or in our retina, or along the optic nerve, or when ultimately consciousness is involved. Von Neumann thus needs to show that all of these models are equivalent, as far as the final predictions are concerned, so that he can indeed maintain that collapse is related to consciousness, while in practice applying the projection postulate at a much earlier (and more practical) stage in the description.
Von Neumann poses this problem in Section VI.1 of his book. In Section VI.2, by way of preparation, he discusses the relation between states of systems and subsystems, in particular the partial trace, and the biorthogonal decomposition theorem, i.e. the theorem stating that an entangled quantum state can always be written in the special form
- ∑k ckφkξk
for two suitable bases (note the perfect correlations in (5)). Then in Section VI.3, after discussing his insolubility argument (see again footnote 14), von Neumann shows that there always is a Hamiltonian that will lead from a state of the form ∑k ckφkξ0 to a state of the form (5). This concludes von Neumann's argument.
What von Neumann has shown is that, under suitable modelling of the measurement interaction, applying the collapse postulate directly to the measured observable or applying it to the pointer observable of the apparatus (or by extension to the ‘optic nerve signal observable’, etc.) leads to the same statistics of results.
What he has not shown is that the assumption that the collapse occurs at the level of consciousness is equivalent to the assumption that it happens at any other earlier stage if one considers also other possible measurements that could be carried out along the von Neumann chain. Indeed, if collapse occurs only at the level of consciousness, it is in principle possible, instead of looking at the pointer, to perform a different measurement on the composite of system and apparatus that would detect interference between the different components of (5).
This is now precisely where decoherence plays a role. Indeed, while such measurements are possible in principle, decoherence will make them impossible to perform in practice. Therefore, if we assume that Process I is a real physical process, decoherence makes it in practice impossible to detect where along the measurement chain this process takes place, thus allowing von Neumann to postulate that it happens when consciousness gets involved. This aspect will be relevant also in the next subsection.
3.1.2 Spontaneous collapse theories
The best known theory of spontaneous collapse is the so-called GRW theory (Ghirardi Rimini & Weber 1986), in which a material particle spontaneously undergoes localisation in the sense that at random times it experiences a collapse of the form used to describe approximate position measurements. In the original model, the collapse occurs independently for each particle (a large number of particles thus ‘triggering’ collapse much more frequently); in later models the frequency for each particle is weighted by its mass, and the overall frequency for collapse is thus tied to mass density.
Thus, formally, the effect of spontaneous collapse is the same as in some of the models of decoherence, at least for one particle. Two crucial differences on the other hand are that we have ‘true’ collapse instead of suppression of interference (cf. above Section 1), and that spontaneous collapse occurs without there being any interaction between the system and anything else, while in the case of decoherence suppression of interference generally arises through interaction with the environment.
Can decoherence be put to use in GRW? The situation may be rather complex when the decoherence interaction does not approximately privilege position (e.g. when it selects for currents in a SQUID instead), because collapse and decoherence might actually ‘pull’ in different directions. But in those cases in which the decoherence interaction also takes the form of approximate position measurements, the answer presumably boils down to a quantitative comparison. If collapse happens faster than decoherence, then the superposition of components relevant to decoherence will not have time to arise, and insofar as the collapse theory is successful in recovering classical phenomena, decoherence plays no role in this recovery. Instead, if decoherence takes place faster than collapse, then (as in von Neumann's case) the collapse mechanism can find ‘ready-made’ structures onto which to truly collapse the wave function. Simple comparison of the relevant rates in models of decoherence and in spontaneous collapse theories (Tegmark 1993, esp. Table 2) suggests that this is generally the case. Thus, it seems that decoherence should play a role also in spontaneous collapse theories.
A further aspect of the relation between decoherence and spontaneous collapse theories relates to the experimental testability of spontaneous collapse theories. Exactly as we have just discussed in the previous subsection in the context of von Neumann's Process I, if we assume that collapse is a real physical process, decoherence will make it extremely difficult in practice to detect empirically when and where exactly spontaneous collapse takes place (see the nice discussion of this point in Chapter 5 of Albert (1992)).
Even worse, at least with the proviso that decoherence may be put to use also in no-collapse approaches such as pilot-wave or Everett (possibilities that we discuss in the next sub-sections), then in all cases in which decoherence is faster than collapse, what might be interpreted as evidence for collapse could be reinterpreted as ‘mere’ suppression of interference (for instance in the case of measurements), and only those cases in which the collapse theory predicts collapse but the system is shielded from decoherence (or perhaps in which the two pull in different directions) could be used to test collapse theories experimentally.
One particularly bad scenario for experimental testability is related to the speculation (in the context of the ‘mass density’ version) that the cause of spontaneous collapse may be connected with gravitation. Tegmark 1993 (Table 2) quotes some admittedly uncertain estimates for the suppression of interference due to a putative quantum gravity, but they are quantitatively very close to the rate of destruction of interference due to the GRW collapse (at least outside of the microscopic domain). Similar conclusions are arrived at by Kay (1998). If there is indeed such a quantitative similarity between these possible effects, then it would become extremely difficult to distinguish between the two. In the presence of gravitation, any positive effect could be interpreted as support for either collapse or decoherence (with the above proviso). And in those cases in which the system is effectively shielded from decoherence (say, if the experiment is performed in free fall), if the collapse mechanism is indeed triggered by gravitational effects, then no collapse should be expected either.
The relation between decoherence and spontaneous collapse theories is thus indeed far from straightforward.
3.2.1 De Broglie-Bohm and related theories
Pilot-wave theories are no-collapse formulations of quantum mechanics that assign to the wave function the role of determining the evolution of (‘piloting’, ‘guiding’) the variables characterising the system, say particle configurations, as in de Broglie's (1928) and Bohm's (1952) theory, or fermion number density, as in Bell's (1987, Chap. 19) ‘beable’ quantum field theory, or again field configurations, as in various proposals for pilot-wave quantum field theories (for a recent survey, see Struyve 2011).
De Broglie's idea was to modify classical Hamiltonian mechanics in such a way as to make it analogous to classical wave optics, by substituting for Hamilton and Jacobi's action function the phase S of a physical wave. Such a ‘wave mechanics’ of course yields non-classical motions, but in order to understand how de Broglie's dynamics relates to typical quantum phenomena, we must include Bohm's (1952, Part II) analysis of the appearance of collapse. In the case of measurements, Bohm argued that the wave function evolves into a superposition of components that are and remain separated in the total configuration space of measured system and apparatus, so that the total configuration is ‘trapped’ inside a single component of the wave function, which will guide its further evolution, as if the wave had collapsed (‘effective’ wave function). This analysis allows one to recover qualitatively the measurement collapse and by extension such typical quantum features as the uncertainty principle and the perfect correlations in an Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen experiment. (The quantitative aspects of the theory are also very well developed, but we shall not describe them here.)
It is natural to extend this analysis from the case of measurements induced by an apparatus to that of ‘spontaneous measurements’ as performed by the environment in the theory of decoherence, thus applying the same strategy to recover both quantum and classical phenomena. The resulting picture is one in which de Broglie-Bohm theory, in cases of decoherence, describes the motion of particles that are trapped inside one of the extremely well localised components selected by the decoherence interaction. Thus, de Broglie-Bohm trajectories will partake of the classical motions on the level defined by decoherence (the width of the components).
This use of decoherence would arguably resolve the puzzles discussed, e.g., by Holland (1996) with regard to the possibility of a ‘classical limit’ of de Broglie's theory. One baffling problem, for instance, is that trajectories with different initial conditions cannot cross in de Broglie-Bohm theory, because the wave guides the particles by way of a first-order equation, while, as is well known, Newton's equations are second-order and possible trajectories in Newton's theory do cross. Now, however, the non-interfering components produced by decoherence can indeed cross, and so will the trajectories of particles trapped inside them.
The above picture is natural, but it is not obvious. De Broglie-Bohm theory and decoherence contemplate two a priori distinct mechanisms connected to apparent collapse: respectively, separation of components in configuration space and suppression of interference. While the former obviously implies the latter, it is equally obvious that decoherence need not imply separation in configuration space. One can expect, however, that decoherence interactions of the form of approximate position measurements will.
If the main instances of decoherence are indeed coextensive with instances of separation in configuration, de Broglie-Bohm theory can thus use the results of decoherence relating to the formation of classical structures, while providing an interpretation of quantum mechanics that explains why these structures are indeed observationally relevant. In that case, the question that arises for de Broglie-Bohm theory is not only the standard question of whether all apparent measurement collapses can be associated with separation in configuration (by arguing that at some stage all measurement results are recorded in macroscopically different configurations), but also whether all appearance of classicality can be associated with separation in configuration space.
A discussion of the role of decoherence in pilot-wave theory in the form suggested above is still largely outstanding. An informal discussion is given in Bohm and Hiley (1993, Chap. 8), partial results are given by Appleby (1999), some simulations have been realised by Sanz and co-workers (e.g. Sanz and Borondo 2009); and a different approach is suggested by Allori (2001; see also Allori & Zanghì 2009). Appleby discusses Bohmian trajectories in a model of decoherence and obtains approximately classical trajectories, but under a special assumption. The simulations currently published by Sanz and co-workers are based on simplified models, but fuller results have been announced. Allori investigates in the first place the ‘short wavelength’ limit of de Broglie-Bohm theory (suggested by the analogy to the geometric limit in wave optics). The role of decoherence in her analysis is crucial but limited to maintaining the classical behaviour obtained under the appropriate short wavelength conditions, because the behaviour would otherwise break down after a certain time.
While, as argued above, it appears plausible that decoherence might be instrumental in recovering the classicality of pilot-wave trajectories in the case of the non-relativistic particle theory, it is less clear whether this strategy might work equally well in the case of field theory. Doubts to this effect have been raised, e.g., by Saunders (1999) and by Wallace (2008). Essentially, these authors doubt whether the configuration-space variables, or some coarse-grainings thereof, are, indeed, decohering variables. At least in the opinion of the present author, further detailed investigation is needed.
3.2.2 Nelson's stochastic mechanics
Nelson's (1966, 1985) stochastic mechanics is strictly speaking not a pilot-wave theory. It is a proposal to recover the wave function and the Schrödinger equation as effective elements in the description of a fundamental diffusion process in configuration space. Insofar as the proposal is successful, however, it then shares many features with de Broglie-Bohm theory. In particular, the current velocity for the particles in Nelson's theory turns out to be equal to the de Broglie-Bohm velocity, and the particle distribution in Nelson's theory is equal to that in de Broglie-Bohm theory (in equilibrium).
It follows that many results from pilot-wave theories can be imported into Nelson's stochastic mechanics. However, decoherence has been very little discussed in the literature on stochastic mechanics, if at all, and the strategies used in pilot-wave theories to recover the appearance of collapse and the emergence of a classical regime still need to be applied specifically in the case of stochastic mechanics. This would presumably also resolve some conceptual puzzles specific to Nelson's theory, such as the problem of two-time correlations raised in Nelson (2006).
Over the years, since the original paper by Everett (1957), some very diverse ‘Everett interpretations’ have been proposed, which possibly only share the core intuition that a single wave function of the universe should be interpreted in terms of a multiplicity of ‘realities’ at some level or other. This multiplicity, however understood, is formally associated with components of the wave function in some decomposition.
Various such Everett interpretations, roughly speaking, differ as to how to identify the relevant components of the universal wave function, and how to justify such an identification (the so-called problem of the ‘preferred basis’ — although this may be a misnomer), and differ as to how to interpret the resulting multiplicity (various ‘many-worlds’ or various ‘many-minds’ interpretations), in particular with regard to the interpretation of the (emerging?) probabilities at the level of the components (problem of the ‘meaning of probabilities’).
The last problem is perhaps the most hotly debated aspect of Everett. Clearly, decoherence enables reidentification over time of both observers and of results of repeated measurement (and thus definition of empirical frequencies). In recent years progress has been made especially along the lines of interpreting the probabilities in decision-theoretic terms for a ‘splitting’ agent (see in particular Deutsch (1999) and Wallace (2003b, 2007)).
The most useful application of decoherence to Everett, however, seems to be in the context of the problem of the preferred basis. Decoherence yields a natural solution to the problem, in that it identifies a class of ‘preferred’ states (not necessarily an orthonormal basis!), and allows one to reidentify them over time, so that one can identify ‘worlds’ with the trajectories defined by decoherence (or more abstractly with decoherent histories). If part of the aim of Everett is to interpret quantum mechanics without introducing extra structure, in particular without postulating the existence of some preferred basis, then one will try to look for potentially relevant structures that are already present in the wave function. In this sense, decoherence is the ideal candidate for identifying ‘worlds’ (see e.g. Wallace 2003a).
A justification for this identification can be variously given by suggesting that a ‘world’ should be a temporally extended structure and thus reidentification over time will be a necessary condition for defining worlds; or similarly by suggesting that in order for observers to have evolved there must be stable records of past events (Saunders 1993, and the unpublished Gell-Mann & Hartle 1994) (see the Other Internet Resources section below); or that observers must be able to access robust states, preferably through the existence of redundant information in the environment (Zurek's ‘existential interpretation’, 1998).
Alternatively to some global notion of ‘world’, one can look at the components of the (mixed) state of a (local) system, either from the point of view that the different components defined by decoherence will separately affect (different components of the state of) another system, or from the point of view that they will separately underlie the conscious experience (if any) of the system. The former sits well with Everett's (1957) original notion of relative state, and with the relational interpretation of Everett preferred by Saunders (e.g. 1993) and, it would seem, Zurek (1998) (see the entry on Everett's relative-state interpretation). The latter leads directly to the idea of many-minds interpretations.
The idea of many minds was suggested early on by Zeh (2000; also 1995, p. 24). As Zeh puts it, von Neumann's motivation for introducing collapse was to save what he called ‘psycho-physical parallelism’ (arguably to be understood as supervenience of the mental on the physical: only one mental state is experienced, so there should be only one corresponding component in the physical state). In a decohering no-collapse universe one can instead introduce a new psycho-physical parallelism, in which individual minds supervene on each non-interfering component in the physical state. Zeh indeed suggests that, given decoherence, this is the most natural interpretation of quantum mechanics.
Modal interpretations originated with Van Fraassen (1973, 1991) as pure reinterpretations of quantum mechanics (other later versions coming more to resemble pilot-wave theories). Van Fraassen's basic intuition was that the quantum state of a system should be understood as describing a collection of possibilities, represented by components in the (mixed) quantum state. His proposal considers only decompositions at single instants, and is agnostic about reidentification over time. Thus, it can directly exploit only the fact that decoherence produces descriptions in terms of classical-like states, which will count as possibilities in Van Fraassen's interpretation. This ensures ‘empirical adequacy’ of the quantum description (a crucial concept in Van Fraassen's philosophy of science). The dynamical aspects of decoherence can be exploited indirectly, in that single-time components will exhibit records of the past, which ensure adequacy with respect to observations, but about whose veridicity Van Fraassen remains agnostic.
A different strand of modal interpretations is loosely associated with the (distinct) views of Kochen (1985), Healey (1989) and Dieks and Vermaas (e.g. 1998). We focus on the last of these to fix ideas. Van Fraassen's possible decompositions are restricted to one singled out by a mathematical criterion (related to the biorthogonal decomposition theorem mentioned above in Section 3.1), and a dynamical picture is explicitly sought (and was later developed). In the case of an ideal (non-approximate) quantum measurement, this special decomposition coincides with that defined by the eigenstates of the measured observable and the corresponding pointer states, and the interpretation thus appears to solve the measurement problem (for this case at least).
At least in Dieks's original intentions, however, the approach was meant to provide an attractive interpretation of quantum mechanics also in the case of decoherence interactions, since at least in simple models of decoherence the same kind of decomposition singles out more or less also those states between which interference is suppressed (with a proviso about very degenerate states).
However, this approach fails badly when applied to other models of decoherence, e.g., that in Joos and Zeh (1985, Section III.2). Indeed, it appears that in more general models of decoherence the components singled out by this version of the modal interpretation are given by delocalised states, and are unrelated to the localised components naturally privileged by decoherence (Donald 1998; Bacciagaluppi 2000). Note that Van Fraassen's original interpretation is untouched by this problem, and so are possibly some more recent modal or modal-like interpretations by Spekkens and Sipe (2001), Bene and Dieks (2002) and Berkovitz and Hemmo (2006).
Finally, some of the views espoused in the decoherent histories literature could be considered as cognate to Van Fraassen's views, identifying possibilities, however, at the level of possible courses of world history. Such ‘possible worlds’ would be those temporal sequences of (quantum) propositions satisfying the decoherence condition and in this sense supporting a description in terms of a probabilistic evolution. This view would be using decoherence as an essential ingredient, and in fact may turn out to be the most fruitful way yet of implementing modal ideas; a discussion in these terms has been outlined by Hemmo (1996).
Bohr is often credited with more or less the following view. Everyday concepts, in fact the concepts of classical physics, are indispensable to the description of any physical phenomena (in a way and terminology somewhat reminiscent of Kant's transcendental arguments). However, experimental evidence from atomic phenomena shows that classical concepts have fundamental limitations in their applicability: they can only give partial (complementary) pictures of physical objects. While these limitations are quantitatively negligible for most purposes in dealing with macroscopic objects, they apply also at that level (as shown by Bohr's willingness to apply the uncertainty relations to parts of the experimental apparatus in the Einstein-Bohr debates), and they are of paramount importance when dealing with microscopic objects. Indeed, they shape the characteristic features of quantum phenomena, e.g., indeterminism. The quantum state is not an ‘intuitive’ (anschaulich, also translated as ‘visualisable’) representation of a quantum object, but only a ‘symbolic’ representation, a shorthand for the quantum phenomena that are constituted by applying the various complementary classical pictures.
While it is difficult to pinpoint exactly what Bohr's views were (the concept and even the term ‘Copenhagen interpretation’ have been argued to be a later construct; see Howard 2004), it is clear that according to Bohr, classical concepts are autonomous from, and indeed conceptually prior to, quantum theory. If we understand the theory of decoherence as pointing to how classical concepts might in fact emerge from quantum mechanics, this seems to undermine Bohr's basic position. Of course it would be a mistake to say that decoherence (a part of quantum theory) contradicts the Copenhagen approach (an interpretation of quantum theory). However, decoherence does suggest that one might want to adopt alternative interpretations, in which it is the quantum concepts that are prior to the classical ones, or, more precisely, the classical concepts at the everyday level emerge from quantum mechanics (irrespectively of whether there are even more fundamental concepts, as in pilot-wave theories). In this sense, if the programme of decoherence is successful in the sense sketched in Section 2.3, it will indeed be a blow to Bohr's interpretation coming from quantum physics itself.
On the other hand, Bohr's intuition that quantum mechanics as practised requires a classical domain would in fact be confirmed by decoherence, if it turns out that decoherence is indeed the basis for the phenomenology of quantum mechanics, as the Everettian and possibly the Bohmian analysis suggest. As a matter of fact, Zurek (2003) locates his existential interpretation half-way between Bohr and Everett.
We have already mentioned in Section 1.1 that some care has to be taken lest one overgeneralise conclusions based on examining only well-behaved models of decoherence. On the other hand, in order to assess the programme of explaining the emergence of classicality using decoherence (together with appropriate foundational approaches), one has to probe how far the applications of decoherence can be pushed. In this final section, we survey some of the further applications that have been proposed for decoherence, beyond the easier examples we have seen such as chirality or alpha-particle tracks. Whether decoherence can indeed be successfully applied to all of these fields will be in part a matter for further assessment, as more detailed models are proposed and investigated.
A straightforward application of the techniques allowing one to derive Newtonian trajectories at the level of components has been employed by Zurek and Paz (1994) to derive chaotic trajectories in quantum mechanics. The problem with the quantum description of chaotic behaviour is that prima facie there should be none. Chaos is characterised roughly as extreme sensitivity in the behaviour of a system on its initial conditions, in the sense that the distance between the trajectories arising from different initial conditions increases exponentially in time. Since the Schrödinger evolution is unitary, it preserves all scalar products and all distances between quantum state vectors. Thus, it would seem, close initial conditions lead to trajectories that are uniformly close throughout all of time, and no chaotic behaviour is possible (‘problem of quantum chaos’). The crucial point that enables Zurek and Paz's analysis is that the relevant trajectories defined by decoherence are at the level of components of the state of the system. Unitarity is preserved because the vectors in the environment, to which these different components are coupled, are and remain orthogonal: how the components themselves more specifically evolve is immaterial. Explicit modelling yields a picture of quantum chaos in which different trajectories branch (a feature absent from classical chaos, which is deterministic) and then indeed diverge exponentially. As with the crossing of trajectories in de Broglie-Bohm theory (Section 3.2), one has behaviour at the level of components that is qualitatively different from the behaviour derived for wave functions of an isolated system.
The idea of effective superselection rules was mentioned in Section 1.1. As pointed out by Giulini, Kiefer and Zeh (1995, see also Giulini et al. 1996, Section 6.4), the justification for the (strict) superselection rule for charge in quantum field theory can also be phrased in terms of decoherence. The idea is simple: an electric charge is surrounded by a Coulomb field (which electrostatically is infinitely extended; the argument can also be carried through using the retarded field, though). States of different electric charge of a particle are thus coupled to different, presumably orthogonal, states of its electric field. One can consider the far-field as an effectively uncontrollable environment that decoheres the particle (and the near-field), so that superpositions of different charges are indeed never observed.
Another claim about the significance of decoherence relates to time asymmetry (see e.g. the entries on time asymmetry in thermodynamics and philosophy of statistical mechanics), in particular to whether decoherence can explain the apparent time-directedness in our (classical) world. The issue is again one of time-directedness at the level of components emerging from a time-symmetric evolution at the level of the universal wave function (presumably with special initial conditions). Insofar as (apparent) collapse is indeed a time-directed process, decoherence will have direct relevance to the emergence of this ‘quantum mechanical arrow of time’ (for a spectrum of discussions, see Zeh 2001, Chap. 4; Hartle 1998, and references therein; Bacciagaluppi 2002, Section 6.1, and Bacciagaluppi 2007). Whether decoherence is connected to the other familiar arrows of time is a more specific question, various discussions of which are given, e.g., by Zurek and Paz (1994), Hemmo and Shenker (2001) and the unpublished Wallace (2001) (see the Other Internet Resources below).
Zeh (2003) argues from the notion that decoherence can explain ‘quantum phenomena’ such as particle detections that the concept of a particle in quantum field theory is itself a consequence of decoherence. That is, only fields need to be included in the fundamental concepts, and ‘particles’ are a derived concept, unlike what might be suggested by the customary introduction of fields through a process of ‘second quantisation’. Thus decoherence seems to provide a further powerful argument for the conceptual primacy of fields over particles in the question of the interpretation of quantum field theory.
Finally, it has been suggested that decoherence could be a useful ingredient in a theory of quantum gravity, for two reasons. First, because a suitable generalisation of decoherence theory to a full theory of quantum gravity should yield suppression of interference between different classical spacetimes (Giulini et al. 1996, Section 4.2). Second, it is speculated that decoherence might solve the so-called problem of time, which arises as a prominent puzzle in (the ‘canonical’ approach to) quantum gravity. This is the problem that the candidate fundamental equation (in this approach)—the Wheeler-DeWitt equation—is an analogue of a time-independent Schrödinger equation, and does not contain time at all. The problem is thus in a sense simply: where does time come from? In the context of decoherence theory, one can construct toy models in which the analogue of the Wheeler-DeWitt wave function decomposes into non-interfering components (for a suitable sub-system) each satisfying a time-dependent Schrödinger equation, so that decoherence appears in fact as the source of time. An accessible introduction to and philosophical discussion of these models is given by Ridderbos (1999), with references to the original papers.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Crull, E. (University of Aberdeen), and Bacciagaluppi, G. (University of Aberdeen), 2011, ‘Translation of W. Heisenberg: “Ist eine deterministische Ergänzung der Quantenmechanik möglich?”’, available online in the Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive.
- Felline, L. (Universidad Autóonoma de Barcelona) and Bacciagaluppi, G. (University of Aberdeen), 2011, ‘Locality and Mentality in Everett Interpretations: Albert and Loewer's Many Minds’, available online in the Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive.
- Gell-Mann, M. (Santa Fe Institute), and Hartle, J. B. (UC/Santa Barbara), 1994, ‘Equivalent Sets of Histories and Multiple Quasiclassical Realms’, available online in the arXiv.org e-Print archive.
- Wallace, D. (Oxford University), 2000, ‘Implications of Quantum Theory in the Foundations of Statistical Mechanics’, available online in the Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive.
- Wallace, D. (Oxford University), 2002, ‘Quantum Probability and Decision Theory, Revisited’, available online in the arXiv.org e-Print archive. This is a longer version of Wallace (2003b).
- The arXiv.org e-Print archive, formerly the Los Alamos archive. This is the main physics preprint archive.
- The Pittsburgh Phil-Sci Archive. This is the main philosophy of science preprint archive.
- A Many-Minds Interpretation Of Quantum Theory, maintained by Matthew Donald (Cavendish Lab, Physics, University of Cambridge). This page contains details of his many-minds interpretation, as well as discussions of some of the books and papers quoted above (and others of interest). Follow also the link to the ‘Frequently Asked Questions’, some of which (and the ensuing dialogue) contain useful discussion of decoherence.
- Quantum Mechanics on the Large Scale, maintained by Philip Stamp (Physics, University of British Columbia). This page has links to the available talks from the Vancouver workshop mentioned in footnote 1; see especially the papers by Tony Leggett and by Philip Stamp.
- Decoherence Website, maintained by Erich Joos. This is a site with information, references and further links to people and institutes working on decoherence, especially in Germany and the rest of Europe.