Notes to The Role of Decoherence in Quantum Mechanics

1. The first version of this entry was based on a talk given at the Exploratory Workshop on Quantum Mechanics on the Large Scale, The Peter Wall Institute for Advanced Studies, The University of British Columbia, 17–27 April 2003, on whose website are linked electronic versions of this and several of the other talks (see the Other Internet Resources).

2. Note that these probabilities are well-defined in quantum mechanics, but in the context of a separate experiment (with detection at the slits). Heisenberg (in the uncertainty paper) notes that for this reason he does not like the phrase ‘interference of probabilities’.

3. Realistically, in each single scattering the electron will couple to non-orthogonal states of the environment, thus experiencing only a partial suppression of interference. However, repeated scatterings will suppress interference very effectively.

4. Unfortunately, the distinction between ‘true’ collapse (whether or not it is a process that in fact happens in nature) and ‘as if’ collapse is sometimes overlooked, muddling conceptual discussions: further on this point, see e.g. Pearle (1997) and Zeh (1995, pp. 28–29).

5. As long as decoherence yields only effective superselection rules, one does not leave the framework of standard non-relativistic quantum mechanics. The discussion of charge in Section 4 below, however, suggests that decoherence might yield strict superselection rules, which in general require the framework of so-called algebraic quantum mechanics. More systematic discussion is needed to fully assess the interpretational implications of the latter. (My thanks to Hans Primas for discussion of this point.)

6. These values are calculated based on the classic model by Joos and Zeh (1985). Length and time scales for more massive objects are further reduced. For a not too technical partial summary of Joos and Zeh's results, see also Bacciagaluppi (2000).

7. For a review of more rigorous arguments see e.g. Zurek (2003, pp. 28–30). In particular they can be obtained from the Wigner function formalism, see e.g. Zurek (1991) and in more detail Zurek and Paz (1994), who then apply these results to derive chaotic trajectories in quantum mechanics (see below Section 4).

8. For a very accessible discussion of alpha-particle tracks roughly along these lines, see Barbour (1999, Chap. 20).

9. For more details of the decoherent histories approach, see the overview article by Halliwell (1995), and for a short discussion of some of its conceptual aspects, see Section 7 in the entry on Everett's relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics.

10. Similar results involving imperfectly correlated records can be derived in the case of mixed states (Halliwell 1999).

11. If so, the idea does not seem quite new. Wheeler's famous ‘delayed choice’ experiments are presented by him as affecting the past in this way. And a related discussion of causality was given in detail by Grete Hermann (1935) (probably the most important philosophical commentator of the emerging Copenhagen school), specifically in the context of Weizsäcker's analysis of the Heisenberg microscope.

12. In the context of dynamical decoherence, Zurek (1998) has proposed an ‘existential interpretation’, which brings together certain aspects of Bohr and of Everett.

13. As a numerical example, take a macroscopic particle of radius 1cm (mass 10g) interacting with air under normal conditions. After an hour the overall spread of its state is of the order of 1m. (This estimate uses equations [3.107] and [3.73] in Joos and Zeh (1985).)

14. Von Neumann's justification for espousing a collapse approach in the first place arguably relies: (a) on his ‘insolubility theorem’, showing that the phenomenological indeterminism in the measurement cannot be explained in terms of ignorance of the exact state of the apparatus (later generalised by several authors; see the discussion in Section 3 of the entry on collapse theories, and references therein); (b) on his ‘no-go’ theorem for hidden variables, which in his opinion excluded this other alternative approach (this theorem was criticised by Grete Hermann, 1935, Sect. 7, and much more famously by Bell, 1987, Chap. 2); (c) on his wish to uphold a one-to-one correspondence between mental states and physical states of the observer (if one gives this up, one obtains some version of the Everett interpretation; see also the discussion in Section 3.3 below).

15. The collapse consists in multiplying the wave function ψ(r) by a Gaussian of fixed width a, call it ax(r), with a probability distribution for the centre x of the Gaussian given by ∫ |ax(r)ψ(r)|2dr. In other words, if we denote by Ax the operator corresponding to multiplication by the Gaussian ax(r), the state |ψ> goes over to one of the continuously many possible states (1/<ψ|Ax*Ax|ψ>)Ax|ψ>, with probability density <ψ|Ax*Ax|ψ>. In technical language, this is a measurement associated with a POVM (positive operator valued measure). In the original model, a=10-5cm, and collapse occurs with a probability per second 1/τ, with τ=1016s.

16. This modification was introduced because the original model would have had consequences (that were already ruled out by existing experiments) for the predicted lifetime of the proton (Pearle and Squires 1994), due to the production of energy associated with the collapse. Later models also generally use the formalism of continuous spontaneous localisation (CSL), phrased in terms of stochastic differential equations (Pearle 1989, also sketched in the entry on collapse theories), but for present purposes we shall stick to the more elementary GRW theory.

17. For N particles, in the case in which the frequencies are independent of mass, it is easy to contrive examples in which the theory gives results very different from decoherence. A state of a macroscopic pointer localised in a region A superposed with a state of the pointer localised in B will almost instantaneously trigger a collapse onto one of the localised states, which is analogous to what we also expect from decoherence. However, a (contrived) state of the pointer in which all its protons are localised in region A and all its neutrons in region B, superposed with a state in which the protons are in B and the neutrons are in A, would also trigger a collapse, but onto one of these very non-classical states. In the ‘mass density’ version this difference will disappear.

18. My thanks to Bill Unruh for raising this issue.

19. By the same token one can dismiss proposed variants of de Broglie-Bohm theory that are not based on the position representation, e.g. Epstein's (1953) momentum-based theory, which would utterly fail to exhibit the correct ‘collapse’ behaviour and classical regime, precisely because decoherence interactions are clearly not momentum-based.

20. I suggest to reinterpret Appleby's assumption as an assumption about the effective wavefunction of the heat bath with which the system interacts. That is, I suggest that one should try to justify it from a pilot-wave treatment of the bath.

21. Sanz and Borondo (2009) simulate trajectories for the two-slit experiment. One model is based on the reduced density matrix of the system (and thus based on simple de-phasing), and still maintains the no-crossing feature that troubles Holland (1996). The other model, despite also being simplified, recovers the classical crossing of trajectories. Sanz and co-workers (personal communication, November 2011) have now carried out simulations including explicit modelling of the environment, and in situations more complex than the two-slit experiment. These simulations seem to confirm that classical-like trajectories can indeed be recovered in pilot-wave theory using decoherence.

22. Should this be the case, provided the results of observations are recorded in the configuration-space variables, pilot-wave field theories (as in the ‘minimalist’ model by Struyve and Westman (2007)) could still recover at least the appearance of classical trajectories (somewhat in analogy to the discussion of ‘fooled detectors’ (see e.g. Barrett 2000)). Decoherence would arguably still play a role at this level, similar to the role it plays in some neo-Copenhagen views (see e.g. the comments on Omnès in Section 1.2 above).

23. For the state of the art on the Everett interpretation(s), see the recent collection by Saunders et al. (2010), which contains the papers from the two international conferences that celebrated the 50 years of Everett's original paper.

24. This approach to probabilities is captivating, but has also attracted some serious criticism (see e.g. P. Lewis 2010). Furthermore, part of the problem of the meaning of the probabilities relates to whether Everettian probabilities make sense also in confirmation theory, in particular to whether observational data confirms (Everettian) quantum mechanics. For the latter ‘epistemic problem’ see in particular Greaves (2007) and Greaves and Myrvold (2010).

25. Such a solution to the preferred basis problem might be only partial in the sense that there are many inequivalent ways of selecting sets of decoherent histories (see e.g. Dowker and Kent 1995, 1996). On the other hand, this does not make ‘our’ set of histories any less decoherent.

26. If one assumes that mentality can be associated only with certain decohering structures of great complexity, this might have the advantage of further reducing the remaining ambiguity about the preferred ‘basis’ (see Matthew Donald's website on ‘A Many-Minds Interpretation of Quantum Theory’, referenced in the Other Internet Resources).

27. It is tempting to see the difference between (Saunders-Wallace) decoherence-based many-worlds and (Zeh) decoherence-based many-minds as merely conventional, since they arguably both share an ontology of global wave functions and local (perhaps emergent) minds, and only differ in the emphasis they place on different objectively present structures in the same decohering wave function. Note also that in Albert and Loewer's (1988) version of the many-minds interpretation, the mental does not supervene on the physical, because individual minds have trans-temporal identity of their own. This is postulated in order to define a stochastic dynamics for the minds and not have to introduce a novel concept of probability. Even in this case, however, decoherence is of crucial importance, since the dynamical evolution of the minds will have a physical correlate only if the corresponding physical components are decohered (Felline and Bacciagaluppi 2011). (Thanks to Martin Jones for discussion of this last point.)

28. Note that insofar as the movability of the cut between observer and observed is crucial for the internal coherence of the Copenhagen interpretation (a point stressed by Heisenberg, see e.g. Crull and Bacciagaluppi (2011) in the Other Internet Resources), then decoherence can be argued to be relevant also to this aspect of the Copenhagen interpretation.

29. An analogy from standard quantum mechanics may be helpful here. Take a harmonic oscillator in equilibrium with its environment. An equilibrium state is by definition a stationary state under the dynamics, i.e. it is itself time-independent. However, one can decompose the equilibrium state of the oscillator as a mixture of localised components each carrying out one of the oscillator's possible classical motions (time-dependent!). Such a decomposition can be found e.g. in Donald (1998, Section 2). For a state-of-the-art model, see Halliwell and Thorwart (2002).

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Guido Bacciagaluppi <>

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