Everett's Relative-State Formulation of Quantum Mechanics

First published Wed Jun 3, 1998; substantive revision Fri Sep 10, 2010

Hugh Everett III's relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics is an attempt to solve the quantum measurement problem by dropping the collapse dynamics from the standard von Neumann-Dirac formulation of quantum mechanics. Everett then wanted to recapture the predictions of the standard collapse theory by explaining why observers nevertheless get determinate measurement records (or at least appear to do so) and by accounting for quantum probabilities. It is, however, unclear precisely how this was supposed to work. There have been several attempts to reconstruct Everett's no-collapse theory in order to account for determinate measurement records and quantum probabilities. These attempts have led to such formulations of quantum mechanics as the many-worlds, many-minds, many-histories, relative-fact, and bare theories. Each of these captures at least part of what Everett claimed for his theory, but each also encounters problems.


1. Introduction

Everett developed his relative-state interpretation of quantum mechanics while a graduate student in physics at Princeton University. His doctoral thesis (1957a) was accepted in March 1957 and a paper (1957b) covering essentially the same material was published in July of the same year. DeWitt and Graham (1973) later published a much longer and more detailed description of the theory that had been written by Everett before the official thesis. This longer description was a slightly revised version of a draft thesis that Everett had given John Wheeler, his Ph.D. adviser, in January 1956 under the title “Wave Mechanics Without Probability”. While there is evidence that Everett always favored his original description of the theory, Wheeler insisted on the significant revisions that led to the thesis that Everett ultimately defended.

Everett took a job outside academics as a defense analyst in the spring of 1956. While subsequent notes and letters indicate that Everett continued to be interested in the conceptual problems of quantum mechanics and in the reception and interpretation of his theory, he did not take an active role in the debates surrounding either. Consequently, his extended presentation of the theory (1973) is perhaps the most detailed record of what he had in mind. Everett died in 1982.

Everett's no-collapse formulation of quantum mechanics was a direct reaction to the measurement problem that arises in the standard von Neumann-Dirac collapse formulation of the theory. Everett's solution to the problem was to drop the collapse postulate from the standard formulation of quantum mechanics then deduce the empirical predictions of the standard theory as the subjective experiences of observers who are themselves treated as physical systems described by his theory. It is, however, unclear precisely how Everett intended for this to work. And since his account of quantum probabilities depends on his account of determinate measurement records, it is also unclear precisely how Everett's account of quantum probabilities is supposed to work. As a result, it is unclear the sense in which Everett's theory is empirical adequate or even whether it is supposed to answer to such traditional theoretical virtues.

Because of the ambiguity in Everett's presentation of the theory, there have been several mutually incompatible attempts to explain what he had in mind. Indeed, it is perhaps fair to say that most no-collapse interpretations of quantum mechanics have at one time or another either been directly attributed to Everett or suggested as charitable reconstructions.

In order to understand Everett's basic proposal for solving the quantum measurement problem, which is itself perfectly clear, one must first understand the measurement problem encountered by the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. We will then briefly consider a few standard approaches to understanding Everett's relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics more generally.

2. The Measurement Problem

Everett presented his relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics as a way of avoiding the problems encountered by the standard von Neumann-Dirac collapse formulation. The main problem, according to Everett, was that the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics required observers always to be treated as external to the system described by the theory. One consequence of this was that the standard collapse formulation could not be used to describe the universe as a whole since the universe contains observers.

In order to understand what Everett was worried about, one must first understand how the standard formulation of quantum mechanics works. The standard von Neumann-Dirac theory is based on the following principles (von Neumann, 1955):

  1. Representation of States: The possible physical states of a system S are represented by the unit-length vectors in a Hilbert space (which for present purposes one may regard as a vector space with an inner product). The physical state at a time is then represented by a single vector in the Hilbert space.
  2. Representation of Properties: For each physical property P that one might observe of a system S there is a linear operator P, on the vectors that represent the possible states of S, that represents the property.
  3. Eigenvalue-Eigenstate Link: A system S determinately has physical property P if and only if P operating on S (the vector representing S's state) yields S. We say then that S is in an eigenstate of P with eigenvalue 1. S determinately does not have property P if and only if P operating on S yields 0.
  4. Dynamics: (a) If no measurement is made, then a system S evolves continuously according to the linear, deterministic dynamics, which depends only on the energy properties of the system. (b) If a measurement is made, then the system S instantaneously and randomly jumps to a state where it either determinately has or determinately does not have the property being measured. The probability of each possible post-measurement state is determined by the system's initial state. More specifically, the probability of ending up in a particular final state is equal to the norm squared of the projection of the initial state on the final state.

According to the eigenvalue-eigenstate link (Rule 3) a system would typically neither determinately have nor determinately not have a particular given property. In order to determinately have a particular property the vector representing the state of a system must be in the ray (or subspace) in state space representing the property, and in order to determinately not have the property the state of a system must be in the plane (or subspace) orthogonal to it, and most state vectors will be neither parallel nor orthogonal to a given ray (or subspace). Further, the deterministic dynamics (Rule 4a) typically does nothing to guarantee that a system will either determinately have or determinately not have a particular property when one observes the system to see whether the system has that property. This is why the collapse dynamics (Rule 4b) is needed in the standard formulation of quantum mechanics. It is the collapse dynamics that guarantees that a system will either determinately have or determinately not have a particular property whenever one observes the system to see whether or not it has the property. But the linear dynamics (Rule 4a) is also needed to account for quantum mechanical interference effects. So the standard formulation of quantum mechanics has two dynamical laws: the deterministic, continuous, linear Rule 4a describes how a system evolves when it is not being measured, and the random, discontinuous, nonlinear Rule 4b describes how a system evolves when it is measured.

But what does it take for an interaction to count as a measurement? Unless we know this, the standard formulation of quantum mechanics is at best incomplete since we do not know when each dynamical law obtains. Moreover, and this is what worried Everett, if we suppose that observers and their measuring devices are constructed from simpler systems that each obey the deterministic dynamics, then the composite systems, the observers and their measuring devices, must evolve in a continuous deterministic way, and nothing like the random, discontinuous evolution described by Rule 4b can ever occur. That is, if observers and their measuring devices are understood as being constructed of simpler systems each behaving as quantum mechanics requires, each obeying Rule 4a, then the standard formulation of quantum mechanics is logically inconsistent since it says that the two systems together must obey Rule 4b. This is the quantum measurement problem in the context of the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. See the entry on measurement in quantum theory.

In order to preserve the consistency of quantum mechanics, Everett concluded that the standard collapse formulation could not be used to describe systems that contain observers; that is, it could only be used to describe a system where all observers are external to the described system. And, for Everett, this restriction on the applicability of quantum mechanics was unacceptable. Everett wanted a formulation of quantum mechanics that could be applied to any physical system whatsoever, one that described observers and their measuring devices the same way that it described every other physical system.

3. Everett's Proposal

In order to solve the quantum measurement problem Everett proposed dropping the collapse dynamics (Rule 4b) from the standard collapse theory and proposed taking the resulting physical theory as providing a complete and accurate description of all physical systems whatsoever. Everett then intended to deduce the standard statistical predictions of quantum mechanics (the predictions that depend on Rule 4b in the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics) as the subjective experiences of observers who are themselves treated as ordinary physical systems within the new theory.

Everett says:

We shall be able to introduce into [the relative-state theory] systems which represent observers. Such systems can be conceived as automatically functioning machines (servomechanisms) possessing recording devices (memory) and which are capable of responding to their environment. The behavior of these observers shall always be treated within the framework of wave mechanics. Furthermore, we shall deduce the probabilistic assertions of Process 1 [rule 4b] as subjective appearances to such observers, thus placing the theory in correspondence with experience. We are then led to the novel situation in which the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic. While this point of view thus shall ultimately justify our use of the statistical assertions of the orthodox view, it enables us to do so in a logically consistent manner, allowing for the existence of other observers (1973, p. 9).

Everett's goal then was to show that the memory records of an observer as described by quantum mechanics without the collapse dynamics would somehow agree with those predicted by the standard formulation with the collapse dynamics. The main problem in understanding what Everett had in mind is in figuring out how this correspondence between the predictions of the two theories was supposed to work.

In order to see what happens, let us try Everett's no-collapse proposal for a simple measurement interaction. One can measure the x-spin of a physical system. More specifically, a spin-1/2 system will be found to be either “x-spin up” or “x-spin down” when its x-spin is measured. So suppose that J is a good observer who measures the x-spin of a spin-1/2 system S. For Everett, being a good x-spin observer means that J has the following two dispositions (the arrows below represent the time-evolution described by the deterministic dynamics of Rule 4a):

equation 1

equation 2

If J measures a system that is determinately x-spin up, then J will determinately record “x-spin up”; and if J measures a system that is determinately x-spin down, then J will determinately record “x-spin down” (and we assume, for simplicity, that the spin of the object system S is undisturbed by the interaction).

Now consider what happens when J observes the x-spin of a system that begins in a superposition of x-spin eigenstates:

equation 3

The initial state of the composite system then is:

equation 4

Here J is determinately ready to make an x-spin measurement, but the object system S, according to Rule 3, has no determinate x-spin. Given J's two dispositions and the fact that the deterministic dynamics is linear, the state of the composite system after J's x-spin measurement will be:

equation 5

On the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics, somehow during the measurement interaction the state would collapse to either the first term of this expression (with probability equal to a squared) or to the second term of this expression (with probability equal to b squared). In the former case, J ends up with the determinate measurement record “spin up”, and in the later case J ends up with the determinate measurement record “spin down”. But on Everett's proposal no collapse occurs. Rather, the post-measurement state is simply this entangled superposition of J recording the result “spin up” and S being x-spin up and J recording “spin down” and S being x-spin down. Call this state E for Everett. On the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link (Rule 3) E is not a state where J determinately records “spin up”, neither is it a state where J determinately records “spin down”. So the puzzle for an interpretation of Everett is to explain the sense in which J's entangled superposition of mutually incompatible records is supposed to agree with the empirical prediction made by the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. The standard collapse theory, again, predicts that J either ends up with the fully determinate measurement record “spin up” or the fully determinate record “spin down”, with probabilities equal to a-squared and b-squared respectively.

Everett confesses that a post-measurement state like E is puzzling:

As a result of the interaction the state of the measuring apparatus is no longer capable of independent definition. It can be defined only relative to the state of the object system. In other words, there exists only a correlation between the states of the two systems. It seems as if nothing can ever be settled by such a measurement (1957b, p. 318).

And he describes the problem he consequently faces:

This indefinite behavior seems to be quite at variance with our observations, since physical objects always appear to us to have definite positions. Can we reconcile this feature of wave mechanical theory built purely on [Rule 4a] with experience, or must the theory be abandoned as untenable? In order to answer this question we consider the problem of observation itself within the framework of the theory (1957b, p. 318).

Then he describes his solution to this determinate-record (determinate-experience) problem:

Let one regard an observer as a subsystem of the composite system: observer + object-system. It is then an inescapable consequence that after the interaction has taken place there will not, generally, exist a single observer state. There will, however, be a superposition of the composite system states, each element of which contains a definite observer state and a definite relative object-system state. Furthermore, as we shall see, each of these relative object system states will be, approximately, the eigenstates of the observation corresponding to the value obtained by the observer which is described by the same element of the superposition. Thus, each element of the resulting superposition describes an observer who perceived a definite and generally different result, and to whom it appears that the object-system state has been transformed into the corresponding eigenstate. In this sense the usual assertions of [the collapse dynamics (Rule 4b)] appear to hold on a subjective level to each observer described by an element of the superposition. We shall also see that correlation plays an important role in preserving consistency when several observers are present and allowed to interact with one another (to ‘consult’ one another) as well as with other object-systems (1973, p. 10).

To this end Everett presents a principle that he calls the fundamental relativity of quantum mechanical states. On this principle, one can say that in state E, J recorded “x-spin up” relative to S being in the x-spin up state and that J recorded “x-spin down” relative to S being in the x-spin down state. But this principle cannot by itself provide Everett with the determinate measurement records (or the determinate measurement experiences) predicted by the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. The standard formulation predicts that on measurement the quantum-mechanical state of the composite system will collapse to precisely one of the following two states:

equation 6

and that there is thus a single, simple matter of fact about which measurement result J recorded. On Everett's account it is unclear whether J ends up recording one result or the other or perhaps somehow both.

The problem is that there is a gap in Everett's exposition between what he set out to explain and what he ultimately ends up saying. He set out to explain why observers get precisely the same sort of measurement records in his no-collapse formulation of quantum mechanics as predicted by the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics, but he ends up describing a post-measurement observer who apparently does not have any particular measurement record. And since it is unclear exactly how Everett intends to explain determinate measurement records, it is also unclear how he intends to explain why one should expect one's determinate measurement records to exhibit the standard quantum statistics. It is this gap in Everett's exposition that has encouraged subsequent reconstructions of his theory.

A satisfactory reconstruction of Everett's relative-state interpretation would address each of the following three problems and ideally do so in a way that somehow takes quantum mechanics without the collapse dynamics as descriptively complete:

First, it would explain the sense in which an observer has a determinate measurement record when the post-measurement quantum-mechanical state E is not an eigenstate of there being a single determinate record. Alternatively, it might somehow explain why there appears to be a determinate physical record when they is in fact no such record.

Second, it would account for the standard probabilistic predictions of quantum mechanics. In order to do this in a straightforward way, one must have already solved the determinate record problem so that there is something to which quantum probabilities might apply. Further, assigning standard quantum probabilities to possible determinate measurement outcomes presupposes that only one of the determinate records is in fact realized for an observer. Finally, assigning standard quantum probabilities to my future measurement records requires an understanding of how to identify which future Everett branch represents me. Alternatively, if all Everett branches describe measurement records that in fact obtain and hence that occur with classical probability one, one might seek to develop a new, nonstandard notion of probability that will give the right quantum probabilities even when one knows that every physically possible measurement outcome is fully realized (see Saunders 1998 for an example of a nonstandard notion of probability that applies to relative facts). The challenge then would be to explain why one should care about the new notion of probability when, at least on the face of it, the nonstandard probability of an event cannot matter for the purposes of rational action since every physically possible event in fact occurs. A closely related approach is to seek to develop a new, nonstandard notion of rational choice that makes sense even when one knows that every physically possible outcome will occur (see Deutsch 1999, Wallace 2003 and 2007, and Greaves 2006 for variations on this strategy). But then the question is why one should want a nonstandard notion of rational choice in the first place. One might argue that if one is committed to every Everett branch in fact being realized, one must have either a nonstandard account of probability or rational choice, or both. But then why should a classically rational agent ever opt for such a commitment? Hence the third problem.

So third, and finally, a satisfactory reconstruction of Everett would allow one to explain how one might have empirical justification for accepting the relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics if the physical world were in fact faithfully described by the theory. That is, the theory is only satisfactory if it is empirically coherent (See Barrett 1996 for a discussion of the condition of empirical coherence). A theory that is not empirically coherent might be true, it is just that one would never have good empirical grounds for accepting it as true. One might, of course, seek to develop new, nonstandard criteria for rational acceptance in order to make one's favorite reading of Everett rationally acceptable, but then one might likewise make any physical theory rationally acceptable (see Wallace 2006 for an example of an argument that Everettian quantum mechanics is rationally acceptable on empirical grounds).

Each of the following strategies for reconstructing Everett's theory provides a different context for addressing these three interpretational problems.

4. The Bare Theory

Albert and Loewer's bare theory (Albert and Loewer, 1988, and Albert, 1992) is arguably the most radical interpretation of Everett. On this reading, one supposes that Everett intended to drop the collapse dynamics but to keep the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link.

So how does the bare theory account for J's determinate experience? The short answer is that it doesn't. Rather, on the bare theory, one tries to explain why J would falsely believe that he has an ordinary determinate measurement record. The trick is to ask the observer not what result he got, but rather whether he got some specific determinate result. If the post-measurement state was:

equation 7

then J would report “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down”. And he would make precisely the same report if he ended up in the post-measurement state:

equation 8

So, by the linearity of the dynamics, J would falsely report “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down” when in the state E:

equation 9

Thus, one might argue, it would seem to J that he got a perfectly determinate ordinary measurement result even when he did not (that is, he did not determinately get “spin up” and did not determinately get “spin down”).

The idea is to try to account for all of J's beliefs about his determinate experiences by appealing to such illusions. Rather than predicting the experiences that we believe that we have, a proponent of the bare theory tells us that we do not have many determinate beliefs at all and then tries to explain why we nonetheless determinately believe that we do.

While one can tell several suggestive stories about the sort of illusions that an observer would experience, including stories for why an observer might end up believing that his measurement records were randomly distributed with the standard quantum statistics (see Albert 1992 and Barrett 1999), there are at least two serious problems with the bare theory. One problem is that the bare theory is not empirically coherent: If the bare theory were true, it would be impossible to ever have empirical evidence for accepting it as true. Another is that if the bare theory were true, one would most likely fail to have any determinate beliefs at all (since on the deterministic dynamics one would almost never expect that the global state was an eigenstate of any particular observer being sentient), which is presumably not the sort of prediction one looks for in a successful physical theory (for more details on how experience is supposed to work in the bare theory and some the problems it encounters see Albert 1992; Bub, Clifton, and Monton, 1998; and Barrett, 1994, 1996 and 1999).

5. Many Worlds

DeWitt's (1971) many-worlds interpretation (also called the splitting-worlds theory) is easily the most popular reading of Everett. On this theory there is one world corresponding to each term in the expansion of E when written in the preferred basis (there are always many ways one might write the quantum-mechanical state of a system as the sum of vectors in the Hilbert space; in choosing a preferred basis, one chooses a single set of vectors that can be used to represent a state and thus one chooses a single preferred way of representing a state as the sum of vectors in the Hilbert space). The theory's preferred basis is chosen so that each term in the expansion of E describes a world where there is a determinate measurement record. Given the preferred basis (surreptitiously) chosen above, E describes two worlds: one where J (or perhaps better J1) determinately records the measurement result “spin up” and another where J (or J2) determinately records “spin down”.

DeWitt and Graham describe their reading of Everett as follows:

[Everett's interpretation of quantum mechanics] denies the existence of a separate classical realm and asserts that it makes sense to talk about a state vector for the whole universe. This state vector never collapses and hence reality as a whole is rigorously deterministic. This reality, which is described jointly by the dynamical variables and the state vector, is not the reality we customarily think of, but is a reality composed of many worlds. By virtue of the temporal development of the dynamical variables the state vector decomposes naturally into orthogonal vectors, reflecting a continual splitting of the universe into a multitude of mutually unobservable but equally real worlds, in each of which every good measurement has yielded a definite result and in most of which the familiar statistical quantum laws hold (1973, p. v).

DeWitt admits that this constant splitting of worlds whenever the states of systems become correlated is counterintuitive:

I still recall vividly the shock I experienced on first encountering this multiworld concept. The idea of 10100 slightly imperfect copies of oneself all constantly splitting into further copies, which ultimately become unrecognizable, is not easy to reconcile with common sense. Here is schizophrenia with a vengeance (1973, p. 161).

But while the theory is counterintuitive, it does (unlike the bare theory) provide a perfectly straightforward explanation for why observers end up with determinate measurement records. In the state described by E there are two perfectly ordinary physical observers, each occupying a different physical world and each with a perfectly determinate measurement record. There are, however, other problems with such a splitting-worlds reading of Everett.

One problem is simply interpretational: it is unclear that Everett himself had a physical splitting of observers in mind. Perhaps Everett's most careful explanation of how pure wave mechanics accounts for determinate experience is found in a footnote to his extended presentation.

At this point we encounter a language difficulty. Whereas before the observation we had a single observer state afterwards there were a number of different states for the observer, all occurring in a superposition. Each of these separate states is a state for an observer, so that we can speak of the different observers described by the different states. On the other hand, the same physical system is involved, and from this viewpoint it is the same observer, which is in different states for the different elements of the superposition (i. e., has had different experiences in the separate elements of the superposition). In this situation we shall use the singular when we wish to emphasize that a single physical system is involved, and the plural when we wish to emphasize the different experiences for the separate elements of the superposition. (1973, 68 footnote)

On the face of it, this seems perfectly clear. There is exactly one post-measurement physical observer and multiple classical states simultaneously obtain for the one physical observer. It remains to explain how it is possible for multiple, classically incompatible, states each to obtain determinately for a single physical system in a way that does not require physical splitting. But it does seem, at least here, that for Everett there is no physical splitting of observers or any other physical systems.

A standard complaint is that the splitting worlds reading of Everett is ontologically extravagant. One would presumably only ever need one physical world, our world, to account for our experience. The idea behind postulating the actual existence of a different physical world corresponding to each term in the quantum-mechanical state is that is allows one to explain our determinate experiences while taking the deterministically-evolving quantum-mechanical state to be in some sense a complete and accurate description of the physical facts. But again one might wonder whether the sort of completeness one gets warrants the ontology of multiple worlds.

The preferred basis problem is arguably a more serious problem for a splitting-worlds reading of Everett. In order to explain our determinate measurement records, the theory requires one to choose a preferred basis so that observers have determinate records (or determinate experiences) in each term of the quantum-mechanical state as expressed in this basis. The problem is that not just any basis will do this. Making the total angular momentum of all the sheep in Austria determinate by choosing such a preferred basis to tell us when worlds split, would presumably do little to account for the determinate memory I have concerning what I just typed. But this is the problem, we do not really know what basis would make our most immediately accessible physical records, those records that determine our experiences and beliefs, determinate in every world. The problem of choosing which observable to make determinate is known as the preferred-basis problem.

One might have hoped that the selection of a preferred basis would work the other way around: that the biological evolution of observers would select for observers who record their measurement results in whatever physical observable is in fact determinate. The idea is that observers would either start recording their measurement results in whatever physical observable is in fact determinate or face some sort of failure in action for not having determinate measurement records. The problem is that there is arguably no decreased fitness in a no-collapse theory like Everett's for an observer who fails to have determinate measurement records. In order to see why, suppose that only the position of particles is in fact determinate, as in Bohmian mechanics, but that an observer nonetheless tries to record his measurements in terms of the x-spin of the particles in his brain. Such an observer would typically not have any determinate measurement records, but this would not matter for introspection or action. The observer would himself not know because, for bare theory reasons, he would falsely believe that he had determinate measurement records. But neither would other observers typically know that he failed to have determinate records, for as soon as the observer's brain state becomes quantum-mechanically correlated with the position of anything, the observer would have an effectively determinate measurement record by dint of this correlation in the physically preferred quantity. The evolutionary upshot of this is that, as soon as there is the possibility of a determinate failure in action, a good observer would have precisely those determinate dispositions that would lead to successful action regardless of whether he started with a determinate measurement record. While such an observer eventually has something that serves the dispositional role of a measurement record, his belief that he had a determinate classical measurement record before he correlated his brain state with the state of the determinate preferred observable was simply false. (See Albert's 1992 discussion of measurement records in Bohmian mechanics and GRW for more details.)

Given the constraints on property ascription posed by the Kochen-Specker theorem, one might argue that we do need to select a preferred basis in order to have any significant set of physical properties determinate. (See the article The Kochen-Specker Theorem.) Among the facts that one would want to have determinate are the values of our measurement records. But saying exactly what a preferred basis must do in order to make our most immediately accessible measurement records determinate is difficult since this is something that ultimately depends on the relationship between mental and physical states and on exactly how we expect our best physical theories to account for our experience. The preferred basis problem involves quantum mechanics, ontological questions concerning the philosophy of mind, and epistemological questions concerning the nature of our best physical theories. It is, consequently, a problem that requires special care.

Another problem with a splitting-worlds reading of Everett concerns the statistical predictions of the theory. The standard collapse theory predicts that J will get the result “spin up” with probability a-squared and “spin down” with probability b-squared in the above experiment. Insofar as there will be two copies of J in the future, J is guaranteed to get each of the two possible measurement results; so, in this sense, the probability of J getting the result “spin up”, say, is one. But that is the wrong answer. A principle of indifference might lead one to assign probability ½ to each of the two possible measurement outcomes. But such a principle would be difficult to justify, and probability ½ is the wrong answer anyway. The moral is that it is impossible to get the right answer for probabilities without adding something to the theory.

In order to get a better idea concerning what one would have to add to get the right probabilities here, one might note that the question “What is the probability that J will record the result ‘spin up’?” is strictly speaking nonsense if one cannot identify which of the future observers is J. That is, if one does not have transtemporal identities for the observers in a theory, then one cannot assign probabilities to their future experiences. So in order to get probabilities out of the many-worlds theory, the first step is to provide an account of the transtemporal identity of observers. Since there is no rule telling us which worlds are which at different times, the splitting-worlds theory cannot, as it stands, make any statistical predictions whatsoever concerning an observer's future experiences. And not being able to account for the standard quantum probabilities is a serious problem since it was the successful statistical predictions of quantum mechanics that made quantum mechanics worth taking seriously in the first place.

For his part, Everett believed that probabilities in his theory had the same status as probabilities in classical thermodynamics. More specifically, he thought that he had derived quantum probabilities from pure wave mechanics by showing that the norm-squared coefficient measure in quantum mechanics is canonical in the same sense as Lebesgue measure is canonical in thermodynamics. At a conference at Xavier University in 1962 Everett put it this way:

In statistical mechanics it turns out that there is uniquely one measure of the phase space which you can use, the Lebesgue measure. This is because it is preserved under the transformation of phase space (by [Liouville's] theorem) being essentially the only measure giving the conservation of probability. It is precisely this analogue that I use on the branching of the state function and I can therefore assert that the probabilistic interpretation of quantum mechanics can be deduced quite as rigorously from pure wave mechanics as the deductions of statistical mechanics. (Werner 1962, 97)

Probabilities in classical thermodynamics are perfectly ordinary in that they are probabilities of physical states obtaining or not, and it is a feature of the theory that precisely one physical state obtains at each time. Insofar as Everett believed that there was a close analogy between quantum probabilities and thermodynamical probabilities, then, this presumably counts against any reading of Everett where one insists that each Everett branch is somehow in fact fully realized. Further, insofar as probabilities in classical thermodynamics are taken to be epistemic, it might also suggest that Everett had an epistemic account of probability in mind to accompany his deterministic theory.

On the other hand, it is not entirely clear how Everett wanted the analogy to work. Lebesgue measure is canonical in thermodynamics in the sense that it is the measure of a set of possible phase states that is preserved when that set is evolved under the deterministic classical dynamics. This does not mean that an agent's epistemic probabilities for possible states obtaining are, or should be, always given by the Lebesgue measure in the theory. Indeed, probability assignments are only given by the Lebesgue measure on 6N-dimensional phase space under very special conditions, conditions that may never in fact fully obtain. That Lebesgue measure is canonical in the sense indicated by Liouville's theorem, then, does not constitute a deduction of epistemic probabilities in classical thermodynamics (see Albert 2000, for example, for a detailed argument that one must also assume a statistical hypothesis and a past hypothesis to derive the standard probabilities in thermodynamics). So, if the analogy between thermodynamics and quantum mechanics is as close as Everett suggested, the invariance properties of the norm-squared coefficient measure under the linear dynamics would not constitute a deduction of epistemic probabilities in pure wave mechanics either.

A final problem is that it is unclear how to formulate a splitting-worlds reading of Everett that is compatible with the constraints of special relativity. Suppose one opts for a strong sort of splitting, contrary to what Everett seems to suggest, where there are more physical systems after a typical measurement than before. If this involves somehow the creation of an entirely new universe (a complete copy of spacetime with an event structure, say) then when is the new universe created? One problem is in giving a frame-independent description of the creation event in the original universe, another is in making sense in relativity of an event that creates a new spacetime when all events, including the creation event, are supposed to be characterized by the local features of a particular fixed spacetime.

Those who favor a decoherence account of splitting worlds sometimes seem to imagine some sort of “unzipping” of spacetime that occurs along the forward light cone of the spacetime region that contains the measurement interaction. While decoherence effects can be expected to propagate along the forward light cone of the region that contains the interaction event between the measuring device and the object system, and while there is no problem describing the decoherence effects themselves in a way that is perfectly compatible with relativity, there is a problem in imagining that such a splitting process somehow physically copies the systems involved. A strong picture of spacetime somehow unzipping into connected spacetime regions along the forward light cone of the measurement event, would not be compatible with special relativity insofar as relativity presupposes that all events occur on the stage of Minkowski spacetime. And if we give up this assumption, then it is unclear what the rules are for compatibility with special relativity.

Alternatively, one might imagine that there is only one non-branching spacetime but many, equally real, physical copies of the relevant systems being created by the splitting process. But then it is unclear how this might be compatible with the conservation laws associated with the symmetries of the Lorentz group; and insofar as conservation of energy is violated, the theory is strongly incompatible with special relativity. Of course, one might suggest giving up or modifying special relativity; but such a sacrifice would only be attractive if the benefits clearly outweighed the cost, and the cost of sacrificing relativity is high given its long track-record of empirical and explanatory success. If one takes seriously the option of giving up or changing relativity in order to accommodate one's favorite reading of Everett, then it is again unclear what the rules are for theory evaluation.

If one understands Everett's talk of splitting as in some sense only metaphorical, then one may avoid the problems associated with a strong notion of physical splitting. But one also loses the entirely straightforward explanation of determinate physical records that is provided by a strong splitting-worlds reading of Everett. See the entry on the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics for more details concerning splitting-worlds and the many-worlds theory. For more on the metaphysics of many worlds and discussions of probability see Geroch (1984), Stein (1994), Healey (1984), Bell (1987), Butterfield (1995), Albert and Barrett (1995), Clifton (1996), Saunders (1997, 1998), Barrett (1999), and Wallace (2002).

6. Many Minds

Everett also said that on his formulation of quantum mechanics “the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic” (1973, p. 9). Albert and Loewer (1988) have captured this feature in their many-minds theory by distinguishing between the time evolution of an observer's physical state, which is continuous and causal, and the evolution of an observer's mental state, which is discontinuous and probabilistic.

Perhaps the oddest thing about this theory is that in order to get the observer's mental state in some way to supervene on his physical state, Albert and Loewer associate with each observer a continuous infinity of minds. The physical state always evolves in the usual deterministic way, but each mind evolves randomly (with probabilities determined by the particular mind's current mental state and the evolution of the global quantum-mechanical state). On the mental dynamics that they describe, one should expect a-squared of J's minds to end up associated with the result “spin up” (the first term of E) and b-squared of J's minds to end up associated with the result “spin down” (the second term of E). The mental dynamics is also stipulated to be memory-preserving.

An advantage of this theory over the many-worlds theory is that there is no physically preferred basis. To be sure, one must choose a preferred basis in order to specify the mental dynamics completely (something that Albert and Loewer never completely specify), but as Albert and Loewer point out, this choice has absolutely nothing to do with any physical facts; rather, it can be thought of as part of the description of the relationship between physical and mental states. Another advantage of the many-minds theory is that, unlike the many-worlds theory, it really does make the usual probabilistic predictions for the future experiences of a particular mind (this, of course, requires that one take the minds to have transtemporal identities, which Albert and Loewer do as part of their unabashed commitment to a strong mind-body dualism). And finally, it is one of the few formulations of quantum mechanics that is manifestly compatible with special relativity. (For a discussion of why it is difficult to solve the quantum measurement problem under the constraints of relativity see Barrett 2000 and 2002, for discussions of locality in the many minds theory, see Hemmo and Pitowski 2003, and Bacciagaluppi 2002, and for the relationship between relativity and the many worlds theory see Bacciagaluppi 2002.)

The main problems with the many-minds theory concern its commitment to a strong mind-body dualism and the question of whether the sort of mental supervenience one gets is worth the trouble of postulating a continuous infinity of minds associated with each observer. Concerning the latter, one might well conclude that a single-mind theory, where each observer has one mind that evolves randomly given the evolution of the standard quantum mechanical state, would be preferable. (See Albert, 1992, Donald, 1997 (in Other Internet Resources section), and Barrett, 1995 and 1999, for more details and criticism; for a broader discussion see Lockwood, 1989 and 1996.)

Both the single-mind and many-minds theories can be thought of as hidden-variable theories like Bohmian mechanics. (See the entry on Bohmian mechanics.) But instead of position being made determinate, as it is in Bohm's theory, and then hoping that the determinate positions of particles will provide observers with determinate measurement records, it is the mental states of the observers that are directly made determinate here, and while this is a non-physical parameter, it is guaranteed to provide observers with determinate measurement records.

7. Many Histories

Gell-Mann and Hartle (1990) understand Everett's theory as one that describes many, mutually decohering histories. The main difference between this approach and the many-worlds interpretation is that, instead of stipulating a preferred basis, here one relies on the physical interactions between a physical system and its environment (the way in which the quantum-mechanical states become correlated) to effectively choose what physical quantity is determinate at each time for each system.

One problem concerns whether and in what sense environmental interactions can select a physically preferred basis for the entire universe, which is what we presumably need in order to make sense of Everett's formulation. After all, in order to be involved in environmental interactions a system must have an environment, and the universe, by definition, has no environment. And if one considers subsystems of the universe, the environment of each subsystem would presumably select a different preferred physical observable (at least slightly different for each decohering system). Another problem is that it is unclear that the environment-selected determinate quantity at a time is a quantity that would explain our determinate measurement records and experience. Proponents who argue for this approach often appeal to biological or evolutionary arguments to justify the assumption that sentient beings must record their beliefs in terms of the environment-selected (or decohering) physical properties. (See Gell-Mann and Hartle, 1990, and Zurek, 1991, for this sort of argument.) The short story is that it is not yet clear how the account of our determinate experience is suppose to work when one relies on decoherence to select a preferred basis. (See Dowker and Kent, 1996, for an extended discussion of some of the problems one encounters in such an approach.)

It is worth noting that if one allows oneself the luxury of stipulating a preferred basis (more specifically a basis where every observer's measurement records are in fact determinate, whatever that is), one can construct a many-histories theory from Albert and Loewer's many-minds theory even without the requirement that the histories mutually decohere. Take the trajectory of each of a specific observer's minds to describe the history of a possible physical world. One might then stipulate a measure over the set of all possible histories (trajectories) that would represent the prior probability of each history actually describing our world. These prior probabilities might then be Bayesian updated as one learns more about the actual history of our world. This is a version of something called the many-threads theory in Barrett (1999). Since such worlds (and everything in them) would have transtemporal identities, unlike the many-worlds theory, there would be no special problem here in talking about probabilities concerning one's future experience — the quantum probabilities in such a theory might naturally be interpreted as epistemic probabilities.

It is instructive to consider the relationship between a no-collapse hidden-variable theory like Bohmian mechanics and a many-worlds theory like the many-threads theory. In Bohmian mechanics the wave function always evolves in the usual deterministic way, but particles are taken to always have fully determinate positions. For an N-particle system, the particle configuration can be thought of as being pushed around in 3N-dimensional configuration space by the flow of the norm squared of the wave function just as a massless particle would be pushed around by a compressible fluid (the compressible fluid here is the probability distribution in configuration space given by the standard wave function). Here both the evolution of the wave function and the evolution of the particle configuration are fully deterministic. Quantum probabilities are the result of the distribution postulate. The distribution postulate sets the initial prior probability distribution equal to the norm squared of the wave function for an initial time. One learns what the new effective wave function is from one's measurement results, but one never knows more than what is allowed by the standard quantum statistics. Indeed, Bohm's theory always predicts the standard quantum probabilities for particle configurations, but it predicts these as epistemic probabilities. Bohm's theory is supposed to give determinate measurement results in terms of determinate particle configurations (say the position of the pointer on a measuring device). See Barrett (1999) and the entry on Bohmian mechanics for more details about Bohmian mechanics.

If one chooses position as the preferred physical observable and adopts the particle dynamics of Bohm's theory, then one can construct a version of the many-threads theory by fixing a single Hamiltonian and by considering every possible initial configuration of particles to correspond to a different thread (world). Here the prior probabilities are given by the distribution postulate in Bohm's theory, and these probabilities are Bayesian updated on the results of measurements. The updated epistemic probabilities yield the effective Bohmian wave function. So the only difference between Bohm's theory and the associated many-threads theory is that the many-threads theory treats all possible Bohmian worlds as simultaneously existing worlds, only one of which is ours. A many-threads theory can be constructed for virtually any determinate physical quantity just as one would construct a hidden-variable or a modal theory. (See the entry on modal interpretations of quantum theory.)

If something like the many-minds theory or the many-thread theory is what it takes to get determinate measurement records and the standard quantum probabilities in a formulation of Everett, then fixing Everett amounts to adding a hidden-variable to quantum mechanics, mental states in the former theory and the preferred observable in the latter. It is the determinate value of this so-called hidden variable that determines our determinate measurement records, and it is the dynamics of this variable together with the prior probabilities that yields the standard quantum statistics. But Everett himself presumably did not intend a hidden-variable theory.

8. Relative Facts

Perhaps the approach closest in spirit to Everett's relative-state formulation would be simply to deny that there are typically any absolute matters of fact about the properties of physical systems or the records, experiences, and beliefs of observers. (See Saunders, 1995, 1997, and 1998, for an example of how this might work.) In the experiment above, quantum mechanics would not describe J as believing that his result was “spin up” and it would not describe J as believing that his result was “spin down”. There would typically be no such simple facts; rather, facts about the observer would typically be essentially relative: Here J believes that his result was “spin up” relative to S being x-spin up and J believes that his result was “spin down” relative to S being x-spin down. So what is the state of S? The state of S is x-spin up relative to J believing that his result was “spin up”, etc. Similarly, on this reading of Everett, there are typically no simple matters of fact about the properties of any individual physical systems.

Saunders (1995, 1998) has proposed that one think of Everett branches as corresponding to a new indexical akin to time. Just as one might have different physical states obtain at different times, now one might have different physical states obtain at the same time but at different branches. So here, rather than account for determinate measurement records at a time, one denies that there typically is any simple matter of fact concerning what an observer's measurement record is at a time. Insofar as there is a matter of fact concerning the value of a measurement record, it is a fact at a time and at a branch.

On this proposal, there would be a different branch indexical for each complete basis one might specify. But the complete set of relative facts at a time, the set of relative facts that one gets by considering every possible branch indexical at a time, does not require one to specify a preferred basis for the theory.

Quantum probabilities here would be descriptive, not of which Everett branch will be actual (since they all are), but rather of the relative structure induced by a particular branch indexical. While it is unclear, at least on a standard account of rational choice, why an agent should care to have such probabilities inform action, there is at least a relatively straightforward way of understanding empirical adequacy. The empirical adequacy of the theory might be judged, instead of at a time as standardly conceived, at a time and at a branch.

There will, however, always be times and branches where the quantum statistics are satisfied, others where they are almost satisfied, and others where they fail entirely. One cannot argue that the ordinary probability of finding oneself at a time and branch where the standard quantum statistics are (almost) satisfied is high. The ordinary probability of finding oneself at each time and branch, insofar as ordinary probability makes sense here at all, would be one since all times and branches are actual. It is only the new notion of probabilities as descriptive of the relative structure induced by a particular branch indexical that would distinguish between normal and anomalous Everett branches. But again, it is unclear why one should care about this notion of typicality on a standard account of rational choice when all of the branches are actual.

9. Summary

It may never be entirely clear precisely what Everett himself had in mind, but his work in trying to make sense of quantum mechanics without the collapse postulate was both heroic and suggestive. Puzzling over how one might reconstruct Everett's theory continues to hold promise insofar as one is committed to finding a satisfactory no-collapse formulation of quantum mechanics.

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Acknowledgments

I would like to thank Peter Byrne for his very helpful suggestions on an earlier version of this article.

Copyright © 2010 by
Jeffrey Barrett <jabarret@uci.edu>

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