Everett's Relative-State Formulation of Quantum Mechanics

First published Wed Jun 3, 1998; substantive revision Mon Jul 7, 2014

Hugh Everett III's relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics is an attempt to solve the quantum measurement problem by dropping the collapse dynamics from the standard von Neumann-Dirac formulation of quantum mechanics. Everett then wanted to recapture the predictions of the standard collapse theory by explaining why observers nevertheless get determinate measurement records that satisfy the standard quantum statistics. There has been considerable disagreement over the precise content of his theory and how it was suppose to work. Here we will consider how Everett himself presented the theory, then briefly compare his presentation to the popular many-worlds interpretation.

1. Introduction

Everett developed his relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics while a graduate student in physics at Princeton University. His doctoral thesis (1957a) was accepted in March 1957 and a paper (1957b) covering essentially the same material was published in July of the same year. DeWitt and Graham (1973) later published Everett's longer, more detailed description of the theory (1956) in a collection of papers on the topic. The published version was revised from a longer draft thesis that Everett had given John Wheeler, his Ph.D. adviser, in January 1956 under the title “Wave Mechanics Without Probability”. While Everett always favored the description of the theory as presented in the longer thesis, Wheeler, in part because of Bohr's disapproval of Everett's critical approach, insisted on the revisions that led to the much shorter thesis that Everett ultimately defended.

Everett took a job outside academics as a defense analyst in the spring of 1956. While subsequent notes and letters indicate that he continued to be interested in the conceptual problems of quantum mechanics and, in particular, in the reception and interpretation of his formulation of the theory, he did not take an active role in the debates surrounding either. Consequently, the long version of his thesis (1956) is the most complete description of his theory. Everett died in 1982. See Byrne 2010 and Barrett and Byrne 2012 for further biographical details.

Everett's no-collapse formulation of quantum mechanics was a direct reaction to the measurement problem that arises in the standard von Neumann-Dirac collapse formulation of the theory. Everett understood this problem in the context of a version of the Wigner's Friend story. Everett's solution to the problem was to drop the collapse postulate from the standard formulation of quantum mechanics then deduce the empirical predictions of the standard collapse theory as the subjective experiences of observers who were themselves modeled as physical systems in the theory.

There have been a number of mutually incompatible presentations of Everett's theory. Indeed, most no-collapse interpretations of quantum mechanics have at one time or another either been directly attributed to Everett or suggested as charitable reconstructions. The most popular of these, the many worlds interpretation, is often simply attributed to Everett directly and without comment even when Everett himself never described his theory in terms of many worlds.

In order to understand Everett's proposal for solving the quantum measurement problem, one must first understand what he took the measurement problem to be. We will start with this, then consider Everett's presentation of his relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics quantum mechanics and contrast it briefly with two versions of the many worlds interpretation.

2. The Measurement Problem

Everett presented his relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics as a way of avoiding conceptual problems encountered by the standard von Neumann-Dirac collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. The main problem, according to Everett, was that the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics, like the Copenhagen interpretation, required observers always to be treated as external to the system described by the theory. One consequence of this was that neither the standard collapse theory nor the Copenhagen interpretation can be used to describe the physical universe as a whole. He took the von Neumann-Dirac collapse theory to be inconsistent and the Copenhagen interpretation to be essentially incomplete. We will follow the main argument of Everett's thesis and focus here on the measurement problem as encountered by the standard collapse theory.

In order to understand what Everett was worried about, one must first understand how the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics works. The theory involves the following principles (von Neumann, 1955):

  1. Representation of States: The state of a physical system S is represented by an element of unit length in a Hilbert space (a vector space with an inner product).
  2. Representation of Observables: Every physical observable O is represented by a Hermitian operator O on the Hilbert space representing states, and every Hermitian operator on the Hilbert space corresponds to some observable.
  3. Eigenvalue-Eigenstate Link: A system S has a determinate value for observable O if and only if the state of S is an eigenstate of O. If it is, then one would with certainty get the corresponding eigenvalue as the result of measuring O of S.
  4. Dynamics: (a) If no measurement is made, then a system S evolves continuously according to the linear, deterministic dynamics, which depends only on the energy properties of the system. (b) If a measurement is made, then the system S instantaneously and randomly jumps to a state where it either determinately has or determinately does not have the property being measured. The probability of each possible post-measurement state is determined by the system's initial state. More specifically, the probability of ending up in a particular final state is equal to the norm squared of the projection of the initial state on the final state.

Everett referred to the standard von Neumann-Dirac theory the “external observation formulation of quantum mechanics” and discussed it beginning (1956, 73) and (1957, 175) in the long and short versions of his thesis respectively. While he took the standard collapse theory to encounter a serious conceptual problem, he also used it as the starting point for his presentation of pure wave mechanics, which he described as the standard collapse theory but without the collapse dynamics (rule 4b). We will briefly describe the problem with the standard theory, then turn to Everett's discussion of the Wigner's Friend story and his proposal for replacing the standard theory with pure wave mechanics.

According to the eigenvalue-eigenstate link (rule 3) a system would typically neither determinately have nor determinately not have a particular given property. In order to determinately have a particular property the vector representing the state of a system must be in the ray (or subspace) in state space representing the property, and in order to determinately not have the property the state of a system must be in the subspace orthogonal to it, and most state vectors will be neither parallel nor orthogonal to a given ray.

The deterministic dynamics (rule 4a) typically does nothing to guarantee that a system will either determinately have or determinately not have a particular property when one observes the system to see whether the system has that property. This is why the collapse dynamics (rule 4b) is needed in the standard formulation of quantum mechanics. It is the collapse dynamics that guarantees that a system will either determinately have or determinately not have a particular property (by the lights of rule 3) whenever one observes the system to see whether or not it has the property. But the linear dynamics (rule 4a) is also needed to account for quantum mechanical interference effects. So the standard theory has two dynamical laws: the deterministic, continuous, linear rule 4a describes how a system evolves when it is not being measured, and the random, discontinuous, nonlinear rule 4b describes how a system evolves when it is measured.

But the standard formulation of quantum mechanics does not say what it takes for an interaction to count as a measurement. Without specifying this, the theory is at best incomplete since it does not indicate when each dynamical law obtains. Moreover, if one supposes that observers and their measuring devices are constructed from simpler systems that each obey the deterministic dynamics, as Everett did, then the composite systems, the observers and their measuring devices, must evolve in a continuous deterministic way, and nothing like the random, discontinuous evolution described by rule 4b can ever occur. That is, if observers and their measuring devices are understood as being constructed of simpler systems each behaving as quantum mechanics requires, each obeying rule 4a, then the standard formulation of quantum mechanics is logically inconsistent since it says that the two systems together must obey rule 4b. This is the quantum measurement problem in the context of the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. See the entry on measurement in quantum theory.

The problem with the theory, Everett argued, was that it was logically inconsistent and hence untenable. In particular, one could not provide a consistent account of nested measurement in the theory. Everett illustrated the problem of the consistency of the standard collapse theory in the context of an “amusing, but extremely hypothetical drama” (1956, 74–8), a story that was a few years later famously retold by Eugene Wigner.

Everett's version of the Wigner's Friend story involved an observer A who knows the state function of some system S, and knows that it is not an eigenstate of the measurement he is about to perform on it, and an observer B who is in possession of the state function of the composite system A+S. Observer A believes that the outcome of his measurement on S will be randomly determined by the collapse rule 4b, hence A attributes to A+S a state describing A as having a determinate measurement result and S as having collapsed to the corresponding state. Observer B, however, attributes the state function of the room after A's measurement according to the deterministic rule 4a, hence B attributes to A+S an entangled state where, according to rule 3, neither A nor S even has a determinate quantum-mechanical state of its own. Everett argued that since A and B make incompatible state attributions to A+S, the standard collapse theory yields a straightforward contradiction.

It would be extraordinarily difficult in practice for B to make a Wigner's Friend interference measurement that would determine the state of a composite system like A+S, hence the “extremely hypothetical” nature of the drama. Everett was careful, however, to explain why this was entirely irrelevant to the conceptual problem at hand. Indeed, he explicitly rejected that one might simply “deny the possibility that B could ever be in possession of the state function of A+S.” Rather, he argued, that “no matter what the state of A+S is, there is in principle a complete set of commuting operators for which it is an eigenstate, so that, at least, the determination of these quantities will not affect the state nor in any way disrupt the operation of A,” nor, he added, are there “fundamental restrictions in the usual theory about the knowability of any state functions.” And he concluded that “it is not particularly relevant whether or not B actually knows the precise state function of A+S. If he merely believes that the system is described by a state function, which he does not presume to know, then the difficulty still exists. He must then believe that this state function changed deterministically, and hence that there was nothing probabilistic in A's determination” (1956, 76). And, Everett argued, B is right in so believing.

That Everett took the Wigner's Friend story, which involves an experiment that, on the basis of decoherence considerations, would be virtually impossible to perform, to pose the central conceptual problem for quantum mechanics is essential to understanding how he thought of the measurement problem and what it would take to solve it. In particular, Everett held that one only has a satisfactory solution to the quantum measurement problem if one can provide a consistent account of nested measurement. And concretely, this meant that one must be able to tell the Wigner's Friend story consistently.

Being able to consistently tell the Wigner's Friend story then was, for Everett, a necessary condition for any satisfactory resolution of the quantum measurement problem.

3. Everett's Proposal

In order to solve the measurement problem Everett proposed dropping the collapse dynamics (rule 4b) from the standard collapse theory and taking the resulting physical theory to provide a complete and accurate description of all physical systems in the context of all possible physical interactions. Everett called the theory pure wave mechanics. He believed that he could deduce the standard statistical predictions of quantum mechanics (the predictions that depend on rule 4b in the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics) in terms of the subjective experiences of observers who are themselves treated as ordinary physical systems within pure wave mechanics.

Everett described the proposed deduction in the long thesis as follows:

We shall be able to introduce into [pure wave mechanics] systems which represent observers. Such systems can be conceived as automatically functioning machines (servomechanisms) possessing recording devices (memory) and which are capable of responding to their environment. The behavior of these observers shall always be treated within the framework of wave mechanics. Furthermore, we shall deduce the probabilistic assertions of Process 1 [rule 4b] as subjective appearances to such observers, thus placing the theory in correspondence with experience. We are then led to the novel situation in which the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic. While this point of view thus shall ultimately justify our use of the statistical assertions of the orthodox view, it enables us to do so in a logically consistent manner, allowing for the existence of other observers (1956, 77–8).

Everett's goal, then, was to show that the memory records of an observer as described by quantum mechanics without the collapse dynamics would agree with those predicted by the standard formulation with the collapse dynamics. More specifically, he wanted to show that observers, modeled as servomechanisms within pure wave mechanics, would have fully determinate relative measurement records and the probabilistic assertions of the standard theory will correspond to statistical properties of typical sequences of such relative records.

Note that, in the context of his version of the Wigner's Friend story, Everett was insisting on three things simultaneously: (1) there are no collapses of the quantum-mechanical state, hence B is correct in attributing to A+S a state where A is in an entangled superposition of having recorded mutually incompatible results, (2) there is a sense in which A nevertheless got a fully determinate measurement result, and (3) such determinate results satisfy the standard quantum statistics.

The main problem in understanding what Everett had in mind is in figuring out precisely how the correspondence between the predictions of the standard collapse theory and the pure wave mechanics was supposed to work. Part of the problem is that the former theory is stochastic with fundamentally chance events and the latter deterministic with no mention of probabilities whatsoever, but there is also a problem even accounting for determinate measurement records in pure wave mechanics. In order to see why, we will consider how Everett's no-collapse proposal plays out in a simple interaction like A's measurement in the Wigner's Friend story.

Consider measuring the x-spin of a spin-1/2 system. Such a system will be found to be either “x-spin up” or “x-spin down”. Suppose that J is a good observer. For Everett, being a good x-spin observer meant that J has the following two dispositions (the arrows below represent the time-evolution of the composite system as described by the deterministic dynamics of rule 4a):

equation 1

equation 2

If J measures a system that is determinately x-spin up, then J will determinately record “x-spin up”; and if J measures a system that is determinately x-spin down, then J will determinately record “x-spin down” (and we assume, for simplicity, that the spin of the object system S is undisturbed by the interaction).

Now consider what happens when J observes the x-spin of a system that begins in a superposition of x-spin eigenstates:

equation 3

The initial state of the composite system then is:

equation 4

Here J is determinately ready to make an x-spin measurement, but the object system S, according to rule 3, has no determinate x-spin. Given J's two dispositions and the fact that the deterministic dynamics is linear, the state of the composite system after J's x-spin measurement will be:

equation 5

On the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics, somehow during the measurement interaction the state would collapse to either the first term of this expression (with probability equal to a squared) or to the second term of this expression (with probability equal to b squared). In the former case, J ends up with the determinate measurement record “spin up”, and in the later case J ends up with the determinate measurement record “spin down”. But on Everett's proposal no collapse occurs. Rather, the post-measurement state is simply this entangled superposition of J recording the result “spin up” and S being x-spin up and J recording “spin down” and S being x-spin down. Call this state E.

On the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link (rule 3) E is not a state where J determinately records “spin up”, neither is it a state where J determinately records “spin down”. So Everett's interpretational problem is to explain the sense in which J's entangled superposition of mutually incompatible records represents a determinate measurement outcome that agrees with the empirical prediction made by the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics when the standard theory predicts that J either ends up with the fully determinate measurement record “spin up” or the fully determinate record “spin down”, with probabilities equal to a-squared and b-squared respectively. More specifically, here the standard collapse theory predicts that on measurement the quantum-mechanical state of the composite system will collapse to precisely one of the following two states:

equation 6

and that there is thus a single, simple matter of fact about which measurement result J recorded.

Everett, then, faced two closely related problems. The determinate-record problem requires him to explain how a measurement interaction like that just described might yield a determinate record in the context of pure wave mechanics. And the probability problem requires him to somehow recover the standard quantum statistics for such determinate records.

Everett took the key to the solution of both problems to be the principle of the fundamental relativity of states:

There does not, in general, exist anything like a single state for one subsystem of a composite system. Subsystems do not possess states that are independent of the states of the remainder of the system, so that the subsystem states are generally correlated with one another. One can arbitrarily choose a state for one subsystem, and be led to the relative state for the remainder. Thus we are faced with a fundamental relativity of states, which is implied by the formalism of composite systems. It is meaningless to ask the absolute state of a subsystem--one can only ask the state relative to a given state of the remainder of the subsystem. (1956, 103; 1957, 180)

One might understand Everett as adding the fundamental principle of relativity of states to pure wave mechanics to allow for a richer interpretation of states than that provided by just the eigenvalue-eigenstate link (rule 3). The resulting theory is the relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics. Central to this theory is the distinction between absolute and relative states. This distinction played an essential explanatory role for Everett.

While the absolute state E is one where J has no determinate measurement record and S has no determinate x-spin, each of these systems also has relative states by dint of the correlation between J recording variable and S's x-spin. In particular, in state E, J recorded “x-spin up” relative to S being in the x-spin up state and that J recorded “x-spin down” relative to S being in the x-spin down state.

So while J has no absolute determinate record in state E, in each of these relative states, J has a determinate relative record. It is these relative records that Everett's takes to solve the determinate record problem:

Let one regard an observer as a subsystem of the composite system: observer + object-system. It is then an inescapable consequence that after the interaction has taken place there will not, generally, exist a single observer state. There will, however, be a superposition of the composite system states, each element of which contains a definite observer state and a definite relative object-system state. Furthermore, as we shall see, each of these relative object system states will be, approximately, the eigenstates of the observation corresponding to the value obtained by the observer which is described by the same element of the superposition. Thus, each element of the resulting superposition describes an observer who perceived a definite and generally different result, and to whom it appears that the object-system state has been transformed into the corresponding eigenstate. (1956, 78).

Absolute states, then, provide absolute properties for complete composite systems by way of the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link, and relative states provide relative properties for subsystems of a composite system. And on Everett's account of the empirical faithfulness of pure wave mechanics, he identifies an observer's determinate measurement records with the modeled observer's relative memory states.

In particular, it is that each relative memory state describes a relative observer with a determinate measurement result that explains determinate measurement records on Everett's view. Why this was enough to fully explain our experience of determinate measurement records ultimately rests on his understanding what it means for a physical theory to be empirically faithful.

4. Empirical Faithfulness

While the physicist Bryce DeWitt would later argue for his own particular reconstruction of Everett's theory (see below), when DeWitt first read Everett's description of pure wave mechanics, he objected because its surplus structure made the theory too rich to represent the world we experience. In his 7 May 1957 letter to Everett's adviser John Wheeler, DeWitt wrote

I do agree that the scheme which Everett sets up is beautifully consistent; that any single one of the [relative memory states of an observer] ... gives an excellent representation of a typical memory configuration, with no causal or logical contradictions, and with “built-in” statistical features. The whole state vector ... , however, is simply too rich in content, by vast orders of magnitude, to serve as a representation of the physical world. It contains all possible branches in it at the same time. In the real physical world we must be content with just one branch. Everett's world and the real physical world are therefore not isomorphic. Barrett and Byrne (eds) (2012, 246–7)

The thought was that the richness of pure wave mechanics indicated an empirical flaw in the theory because we do not notice other branches. As DeWitt put it:

The trajectory of the memory configuration of a real observer ... does not branch. I can testify to this from personal introspection, as can you. I simply do not branch. Barrett and Byrne (eds) (2012, 246)

Wheeler showed Everett the letter and told him to reply. In his 31 May 1957 letter to DeWitt, Everett began by summarizing his understanding of the proper cognitive status of physical theories.

First, I must say a few words to clarify my conception of the nature and purpose of physical theories in general. To me, any physical theory is a logical construct (model), consisting of symbols and rules for their manipulation, some of whose elements are associated with elements of the perceived world. If this association is an isomorphism (or at least a homomorphism) we can speak of the theory as correct, or as faithful. The fundamental requirements of any theory are logical consistency and correctness in this sense. Barrett and Byrne (eds) (2012, 253)

In the final long version of his thesis, Everett further explained in a footnote that “[t]he word homomorphism would be technically more correct, since there may not be a one-one correspondence between the model and the external world” (1956, 169). The map is a homomorphism because (1) there may be elements of the theory that do not directly correspond to experience and because (2) a particular theory may not seek to explain all of experience. It is case (1) that is particularly important here: Everett considered the surplus experiential structure represented in the various branches of the absolute state to be explanatorily harmless.

In his letter to DeWitt, Everett described how he understood the aim of physical inquiry: “There can be no question of which theory is ‘true’ or ‘real’ — the best that one can do is reject those theories which are not isomorphic to sense experience” Barrett and Byrne (eds) (2012, 253). The task then was to find our experience in an appropriate way in the relative-state model of pure wave mechanics.

So, for Everett, a theory was empirically faithful and hence empirically acceptable if there was a homomorphism between its model and the world as experienced. What this amounted to here was that pure wave mechanics is empirically faithful if one can find observers' experiences appropriately associated with modeled observers in the model of the theory. In short, Everett took pure wave mechanics to be empirically faithful because one could find quantum mechanical experience in the model as relative memory records associated with relative modeled observers.

While he left significant room in precisely how one might interpret the theory, the core of Everett's interpretation involved four closely related arguments.

5. Four Arguments

Together the following four arguments indicate the sense in which Everett took pure wave mechanics to be empirically faithful and to recapture the empirical predictions of the standard collapse theory.

5.1 Experience is found in the relative memory records of observers

As suggested earlier, Everett held that one can find our actual experience in the model of pure wave mechanics as relative measurement records associated with modeled observers. In the state E, for example, since J has a different relative measurement record in each term of the superposition written in the determinate record basis and since these relative records span the space of quantum-mechanically possible outcomes of this measurement, regardless of what result the actual observer gets, we will be able to find his experience represented as a relative record of the modeled observer in the the interaction as described by pure wave mechanics.

More generally, if one performs a sequence of measurements, it follows from the linearity of the dynamics and Everett's model of an ideal observer that every quantum-mechanically possible sequence of determinate measurement results will be represented in the entangled post-measurement state as relative sequence of determinate measurement records. This is also true in the theory if one only relatively, rather than absolutely, makes the sequence of observations. In this precise sense, then, it is possible to find our experience as sequences of relative records in the model of pure wave mechanics.

Everett took such relative records to be sufficient to explain the subjective appearances of observers because in an ideal measurement, every relative state will be one where the observer in fact has, and, as we will see in the next section, would report that she has, a fully determinate, repeatable measurement record that agrees with the records of other ideal observers. As Everett put it, the system states observed by a relative observer are eigenstates of the observable being measured (1957, 188). For further details of Everett's discussion of this point see (1956, 129–30), (1955, 67), (1956 121–3 and 130–3), and (1957, 186–8 and 194–5).

Note that Everett did not require a physically preferred basis to solve the determinate record problem to show that pure wave mechanics was empirically faithful. The principle of the fundamental relatively of states explicitly allows for arbitrarily specified decompositions of the absolute universal state into relative states. Given his understanding of empirical faithfulness, all Everett needed to explain a particular actual record was to show that is that there is some decomposition of the state that represents the modeled observer with the corresponding relative record. And he clearly has that in pure wave mechanics under relatively weak assumptions regarding the nature of the actual absolute quantum mechanical state.

5.2 Pure wave mechanics predicts that one would not ordinarily notice that there are alternative relative records

It was important to Everett to explain why one would not ordinarily notice the surplus structure of pure wave mechanics. In his reply to DeWitt, Everett claimed that pure wave mechanics “is in full accord with our experience (at least insofar as ordinary quantum mechanics is) ... just because it is possible to show that no observer would ever be aware of any ‘branching,’ which is alien to our experience as you point out” Barrett and Byrne (eds) (2012, 254).

There are two distinct arguments that Everett seems to have had in mind.

First, one would only notice macroscopic splitting if one had access to records of macroscopic splitting events, but records of such events will be rare precisely insofar as measurements that would show that there are branches where macroscopic measurement apparata have different macroscopic measurement records for the same measurement would require one to perform something akin to a Wigner's Friend measurement on a macroscopic system, which, as Everett indicated in his characterization of his version of the Wigner Friend story as “extremely hypothetical,” would be extraordinarily difficult to do. The upshot is that, while not impossible, one should not typically expect to find reliable relative measurement records indicating that there are branches corresponding to alternative macroscopic measurement records.

Second, Everett repeatedly noted in his various deductions of subjective appearances that it follows directly from the dynamical laws of pure wave mechanics that it would seem to an ideal agent that he had fully determinate measurement results. Albert and Loewer presented a dispositional version of this line of argument in their presentation of the bare theory (a version of pure wave mechanics) as a way of understanding Everett's formulation of quantum mechanics (Albert and Loewer, 1988, and Albert, 1992; see also the bare theory chapter of Barrett 1999).

The idea is that if there are no collapse of the quantum mechanical state an ideal modeled observer like J would have the sure-fire disposition falsely to report and hence to believe that he had a perfectly ordinary, fully sharp and determinate measurement record. The trick is to ask the observer not what result he got, but rather whether he got some specific determinate result. If the post-measurement state was:

equation 7

then J would report “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down”. And he would make precisely the same report if he ended up in the post-measurement state:

equation 8

So, by the linearity of the dynamics, J would falsely report “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down” when in the state E:

equation 9

Thus, insofar as his beliefs agree with his sure-fire dispositions to report that he got a fully determinate result, it would seem to J that he got a perfectly determinate ordinary measurement result even when he did not (that is, he did not determinately get “spin up” and did not determinately get “spin down”).

So, while which result J got in state E is a relative fact, that it would seem to J that he got some determinate result is an absolute fact. (See Albert (1992) and Barrett (1999) for further discussion of such dispositional properties of modeled observers on the “bare theory.” See Everett (1956, 129–30), (1955, 67), (1956 121–3 and 130–3), and (1957, 186–8 and 194–5) for parallel discussions in pure wave mechanics.)

5.3 The surplus structure of pure wave mechanics is in principle detectable and hence isn't surplus structure at all

While sometimes extremely difficult to detect, Everett insisted that alternative relative states, even alternative relative macroscopic measurement records, were always in principle detectable. Hence they do not, as DeWitt worried, represent surplus structure at all. Indeed, since all branches, in any basis, are in principle detectable, all branches in any decomposition of the state of a composite system were operationally real on Everett's view. As he put it in the long thesis:

It is ... improper to attribute any less validity or “reality” to any element of a superposition than any other element, due to [the] ever present possibility of obtaining interference effects between the elements, all elements of a superposition must be regarded as simultaneously existing (1956, 150).

While Everett understood decoherence considerations, he did not believe that they rendered the detection alternative measurement records impossible. Indeed, as indicated in his discussion of the Wigner's Friend story above, Everett held that it was always in principle possible to measure an observable that would detect an alternative post-measurement branch, and it was this that he used to argue the other direction. It is precisely because the linear dynamics requires that all branches of the global wave function are at least in principle detectable that pure wave mechanics requires that all branches are equal real.

And, again, note that this does not mean that only branches in one physically preferred basis are real. Rather, it means that every branch in every decomposition of a composite system is real in Everett's operational sense of ‘real’ since any such state might in principle entail observational consequences.

So while one should not typically expect to find relative records of alternative, macroscopically distinct branches, such alternative branches do not represent surplus structure on Everett's view insofar as they are required by the linear dynamics and in principle possible to detect. In this sense, pure wave mechanics provides the simplest possible theory compatible with the operational consequences of the linear dynamics.

One upshot of this is that pure wave mechanics allows one to have a specific sort of inductive empirical evidence in favor of the theory. In particular, since real for Everett means has observable consequences, any experiment that illustrates quantum interference provides empirical evidence for the operational existence of alternative Everett branches on some decomposition of the state. Again, Everett was an operational realist concerning all branches in every basis insofar as they might be detected. Specifically, one provides increasingly compelling evidence in favor of pure wave mechanics correctly describing macroscopic measurement interactions the closer one gets to being able to perform something like a Wigner's Friend interference experiment.

5.4 One should expect to find the standard quantum statistics in a typical relative sequence of measurement records

Everett did not solve the probability problem by finding probabilities in pure wave mechanics. Indeed, as suggested by his original thesis title, he repeatedly insisted that there were no probabilities and took this to be an essential feature of the theory. Rather, what it meant for pure wave mechanics to be empirically faithful with respect to the statistical predictions of quantum mechanics is that one can find the standard quantum statistics we experience in the distribution of a typical relative relative sequence of a modeled observer's measurement records. In explaining this, Everett appealed to a measure of typicality given by the norm squared of the amplitude associated with each relative state in an orthogonal decomposition of the absolute state.

The thought then is that if an observer supposes that his relative measurement records will be faithfully represented by a typical relative sequence of measurements records, in Everett's norm-squared measure of typicality, he will expect to observe the standard statistical predictions of quantum mechanics.

Everett got to the result in two steps. First, he found a well-behaved measure of typicality over relative states whose value is fully determined by the model of pure wave mechanics. Then he showed that, in the limit as the number of measurement interactions gets large, almost all relative sequences of measurement records, in the sense of almost all given by the specified measure, will exhibit the standard quantum statistics. Note that it is typically false that most relative sequences by count will exhibit the standard quantum statistics, and Everett knew this. This is why his explicit choice of how to understand typicality is essential to his account of the standard quantum statistics. See Everett (1956, 120–30) and (1957, 186–94) for discussions of typicality and the quantum statistics.

It is then left to the reader to notice that if one assumes that one's relative records are typical, in the precise sense that Everett specified, then they should be expected to exhibit the standard quantum statistics. Were such an assumption added to the theory, then one should expect to see the standard quantum statistics as determinate relative records.

Everett took this deduction to establish that the relative state formulation of pure wave mechanics is empirically faithful over the standard quantum statistics.

6. Faithfulness and the Problem of Empirical Adequacy

Pure wave mechanics, then, is empirical faithful since (1) one can find an observer's determinate measurement records as the relative records of an idealized modeled observer in the theory and (2) the model of pure wave mechanics provides a typicality measure over relative states corresponding such that a typical relative sequence of measurement records in that measure will exhibit the standard quantum statistics. The first result is Everett's resolution of the determinate record problem, and the second his resolution of the probability problem.

The upshot is that if one associates one's experience with relative records and if one expects one's relative sequence of records to be typical in the norm-squared-amplitude sense, then one should expect one's experience to agrees with the standard statistical predictions of quantum mechanics, wherever it makes coherent predictions. And where the standard collapse theory and the Copenhagen interpretation do not make coherent predictions, as in the Wigner's Friend story, one should expect to see evidence that the linear dynamics always correctly describes the evolution of every physical system whatsoever. So while pure wave mechanics explains why one would not typically observe other branches, it also predicts that other branches are in principle observable, and hence do not represent surplus structure.

One might, of course, want more than empirical faithfulness from a satisfactory formulation of quantum mechanics. In keeping with his view that pure wave mechanics is quantum mechanics without probabilities, Everett simply conceded that every relative state under every decomposition of the absolute state in fact obtains. The resulting problem, one might feel, is that empirical faithfulness, in Everett's sense at least, is a relatively weak form of empirical adequacy. This can be seen by considering how one should understand the very notion of having a differential expectations when every physically possible measurement result is in fact fully realized in the model of the theory.

For Everett to call his norm-squared-amplitude measure a measure of typicality might suggest that a sample relative state is somehow selected with respect to the measure. If that were the case, then it would be natural to expect, by stipulation as suggested earlier, one's relative sequence of measurement records to be typical. But then it would also be natural to suppose that it would be probable that a relative sequence of measurements records exhibit the standard quantum statistics, and, for Everett, there were no probabilities in the theory. And indeed, there are no probabilities whatsoever in the statement of the theory, and hence no way to derive them without adding something to the theory.

But the problem here is more fundamental that that might suggest. Insofar as a probability is a measure over possibilities where precisely one is in fact realized and insofar as all possibilities are realized in pure wave mechanics, there simply can be no probabilities associated with alternative relative sequences of measurement records. Similarly, any understanding of typicality that somehow involves the selection of a typical relative sequence of records rather than an atypical sequence of records is incompatible with pure wave mechanics since the theory describes no such selection. Neither can the typicality measure represent an expectation of the standard quantum statistics obtaining for one's actual relative sequence of measurement records at the exclusion of the rest since all such sequences are equally actual in Everett's operationalist sense of actual. Insofar as the theory describes any possible result as occurring, it describes every possible result as occurring, so there is no particular sequence of measurement records that is realized satisfying, or failing to satisfy, one's prior expectations.

That Everett's notion of empirical faithfulness is a relatively weak version of empirical adequacy, then, is exhibited in what pure wave mechanics, being empirically faithful, does not explain. In particular, it does not explain what it is about the physical world that makes it appropriate to expect one's relative sequence of records to be typical in the norm-squared-amplitude sense, or any other sense. In short, while one can get subjective expectations for future experience by stipulation, the theory itself does not describe a physical world where such expectations might be understood as expectations concerning what will in fact occur. One might take Everett's typicality measure to determine the subjective degree to which I should expect a particular relative sequence of records being (relative) mine, but to get even this would require careful explanatory amendments to Everett's presentation of the theory. One can get a concrete sense of what such a strategy would involve by contrasting pure wave mechanics with something like Bohmian mechanics the many-thread or many-maps formulations of quantum mechanics where one has a clear notion of subjective quantum probabilities (see Barrett 1999 and 2005 for discussions of this approach).

7. Many Worlds

While he was initially skeptical of Everett's views, DeWitt became an ardent proponent of the many-worlds interpretation, a theory that DeWitt presented as the EWG interpretation of quantum mechanics after Everett, Wheeler, and DeWitt's graduate student R. Neill Graham. In his description of the many-worlds interpretation DeWitt (1970) emphasized that its central feature was the metaphysical commitment to physically splitting worlds. DeWitt's description subsequently became the most popular understanding of Everett's theory (see Barrett (2011b) for further discussion of Everett's attitude toward DeWitt and the many worlds interpretation).

DeWitt described the theory in the context of the Schroedinger's cat thought experiment.

The animal [is] trapped in a room together with a Geiger counter and a hammer, which, upon discharge of the counter, smashes a flask of prussic acid. The counter contains a trace of radioactive material—just enough that in one hour there is a 50% chance one of the nuclei will decay and therefore an equal chance the cat will be poisoned. At the end of the hour the total wave function for the system will have a form in which the living cat and the dead cat are mixed in equal portions. Schrodinger felt that the wave mechanics that led to this paradox presented an unacceptable description of reality. However, Everett, Wheeler and Graham's interpretation of quantum mechanics pictures the cats as inhabiting two simultaneous, noninteracting, but equally real worlds. (1970, 31)

DeWitt took this view to follow from “the mathematical formalism of quantum mechanics as it stands without adding anything to it.” More specifically, he claimed that EWG had proven a metatheorem that the mathematical formalism of pure wave mechanics interprets itself:

Without drawing on any external metaphysics or mathematics other than the standard rules of logic, EWG are able, from these postulates, to prove the following metatheorem: The mathematical formalism of the quantum theory is capable of yielding its own interpretation. (1970, 33)

He gave Everett credit for the metatheorem, Wheeler credit for encouraging Everett, and Graham credit for clarifying the metatheorem. DeWitt and Graham later described Everett's formulation of quantum mechanics as follows:

[It] denies the existence of a separate classical realm and asserts that it makes sense to talk about a state vector for the whole universe. This state vector never collapses and hence reality as a whole is rigorously deterministic. This reality, which is described jointly by the dynamical variables and the state vector, is not the reality we customarily think of, but is a reality composed of many worlds. By virtue of the temporal development of the dynamical variables the state vector decomposes naturally into orthogonal vectors, reflecting a continual splitting of the universe into a multitude of mutually unobservable but equally real worlds, in each of which every good measurement has yielded a definite result and in most of which the familiar statistical quantum laws hold (1973, v).

For his part, DeWitt conceded that this constant splitting of worlds whenever the states of systems become correlated was counterintuitive:

I still recall vividly the shock I experienced on first encountering this multiworld concept. The idea of 10100 slightly imperfect copies of oneself all constantly splitting into further copies, which ultimately become unrecognizable, is not easy to reconcile with common sense. Here is schizophrenia with a vengeance (1973, 161).

That said, he strongly promoted the theory at every turn, and Everett's views quickly came to be identified with DeWitt and Graham's many-worlds interpretation.

While Everett's presentation of his theory was unclear at several points, DeWitt's exegesis did little to help clarify pure wave mechanics. Since a number of these confusions persist in discussions of Everett, we will briefly consider DeWitt and Graham's interpretation and compare it against Everett's description of the relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics.

To begin, since purely mathematical postulates entail only purely mathematical theorems, one cannot deduce any metaphysical commitments whatsoever regarding the physical world from the mathematical formalism of pure wave mechanics alone. The formalism of pure wave mechanics might entail the sort of metaphysical commitments that DeWitt and others have envisioned only if supplemented with sufficiently strong metaphysical assumptions, strong enough to determine a metaphysical interpretation for the theory. Concerning the claim that pure wave mechanics interprets itself by way of a metatheorem that Everett proved, on even a broad understanding of what might count as such a metatheorem, there is nothing answering to DeWitt's description in either the long or short versions of Everett's thesis.

Second, contrary to what DeWitt, Graham, and others have supposed, Everett was not committed to causally isolated worlds. In contrast, as we have seen, Everett held that it is always in principle possible for branches to interact. More specifically, he argued that “no matter what the state of [Wigner's Friend] is, there is in principle a complete set of commuting operators for which it is an eigenstate, so that, at least, the determination of these quantities will not affect the state nor in any way,” he denied that there are fundamental restrictions about the “knowability of any state functions,” and he believed that the sense in which all branches of the global state are equally actual is given by the ever-present possibility of interaction between branches. So while one clearly can describe situations where there is no post-measurement interference between the branches representing incompatible measurement records, one can also describe interactions where there is, and for Everett there was no special physical distinction to be made between the two cases.

Third, there was no consensus between Everett, Wheeler, DeWitt, and Graham concerning what Everett's theory was. In particular, we know what Everett thought of Graham's formulation of the theory. In his personal copy of DeWitt's description of the many worlds interpretation, Everett wrote the word “bullshit” next to the passage where DeWitt presented Graham's clarification of Everett's views (See Barrett and Byrne (2012, 364–6) for scans of Everett's handwritten marginal notes).

Finally, as indicated in the discussion of empirical faithfulness above, Everett's understanding of pure wave mechanics was decidedly non-metaphysical. In particular, He carefully avoided talk of multiple, splitting worlds, his understanding of the reality of branches was purely operational, and he explicitly denied that the aim of physics was to produce true theories. That the proper aim, rather, was to produce empirically faithful theories in the sense that he described, was an essential part of Everett's argument for why his theory was not only acceptable but ought to be preferred to the other formulations of quantum mechanics that he knew (which explicitly included the standard collapse theory, the Copenhagen interpretation, and Bohmian mechanics; see Barrett and Byrne (eds.) 2012, 152–5).

For Everett, the relative states of its subsystems provided a way to characterize branches of the absolute state of a composite system. Insofar as the principle of the fundamental relativity of states allows one to consider the quantum-mechanical state in any specified basis, there is no canonical way to individuate branches. This makes it natural perhaps to think of the existence of branches operationally, as Everett did. Rather than take the branches determined by a physically preferred basis or those determined by, or roughly determined by, some decoherence condition to determine which physically possible worlds were real, he took every branch in any basis to have observational consequences and hence to be real in his operational sense. Given how he understood branches and their role in determining the empirical faithfulness of the theory, Everett never had to say anything concerning how a particular physically preferred basis is selected because none was required.

While Everett himself did not do so, one might nevertheless designate a special set of branches of the global absolute state, say, those that satisfy exhibit an appropriate sort of stable diachronic identity, to represent worlds, or emergent worlds, or approximate emergent worlds. But how one understands such physical entities cannot be determined solely by the mathematical formalism of pure wave mechanics.

This has led recent many-worlds proponents like David Wallace (2010 and 2012) to add explicit interpretative assumptions to the formalism of pure wave mechanics. In contrast with DeWitt, who seems to have taken worlds to be basic entities described by the global absolute state, Wallace takes the quantum state as basic, then seeks to characterize worlds as emergent entities represented in its structure. The analogy he gives is that pure wave mechanics describes the quantum state just as classical field theory describes physical fields (2010, 69). Worlds then are understood as physically real but contingently emergent entities that are identified with approximate substructures of the quantum state, or as Wallace puts it, “mutually dynamically isolated structures instantiated within the quantum state, which are structurally and dynamically ‘quasiclassical’” (2010, 70). Just a bit more carefully, one would expect such emergent worlds to be more or less isolated depending on the physical situation and properties one seeks to describe and the degree of decoherence in fact exhibited by the systems as characterized.

On this account, there is no simple matter of fact concerning what or even how many emergent worlds there are because such questions depend on one's level of description and on how well-isolated one requires the worlds to be for the explanatory considerations at hand. But, however one individuates them, the emergent worlds correspond to approximately determinate decoherent substructures of the quantum state. Hence, only some relative states describe physically real worlds.

In contrast, as we have seen, when Everett claimed that all branches were equally real, he had something less metaphysical and more empirical in mind, which, in turn, suggests a quite different understanding of branches. In particular, since every branch in every decomposition of the state has potential empirical consequences for the results of one's future observations, every branch, not just those represented in a favored decohering basis, is operationally real. In short, every relative state describes something that the linear dynamics requires one to take as real in the only sense that Everett understood.

There is certainly a place for a decoherence account of quasiclassicality akin to the sort that Wallace and others favor as an extension of Everett’s project insofar as it yields a yet richer sense in which one might find our experience in the model of pure wave mechanics. But, given how he understood his theory and what was required for it to be empirically acceptable, Everett's explanatory goals were arguably more modest than those of many Everettians and hence more readily attained.

Consider probability again. If one were to take pure wave mechanics to be directly descriptive of the real physical world, one might feel that one should explain what it is about the world that makes it appropriate to expect one's relative sequence of records to be typical in the norm-squared-amplitude sense when every physically possible outcome is in fact realized as a relative state. For his part, however, Everett believed that all that was required to explain the standard quantum statistics was that one be able to find them somehow associated in a precise and unambiguous way with the relative records of an ideal modeled observer. And he arguably did just this. That such an account does not, without additional assumptions, explain why one should expect one's measurement records to exhibit the standard quantum statistics in a world directly described by pure wave mechanics is a weakness of the account, but, arguably, one that need not have worried Everett given the relatively modest explanatory aim of empirical faithfulness.

8. Summary

Everett took his version of the Wigner's Friend story to reveal the inconsistency of the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics and the incompleteness of the Copenhagen interpretation. The problem was that neither could make sense of nested measurement. And since pure wave mechanics allowed one to provide a consistent account of nested measurement, he took it to immediately resolve the measurement problem. The task then was to explain the sense in which pure wave mechanics might be taken to be empirically faithful over determinate measurement records exhibiting the standard quantum-mechanical statistics.

Everett's relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics has a number of salient virtues. It eliminates the collapse dynamics and hence immediately resolves the potential conflict between the two dynamical laws. It is consistent, applicable to all physical systems, and perhaps as simple as a formulation of quantum mechanics can be. And it is empirically faithful in that one can find an observer's quantum experience as relative records in the model of pure wave mechanics and one can find a measure over relative sequences of records such that most such sequences exhibit the standard quantum statistics.

Insofar as Everett's standard of empirical faithfulness just involved finding measurement records associated with a modeled observer in the theory that agree with one's experience, it is a relatively weak variety of empirical adequacy. The relative weakness of this condition is illustrated by the fact that the way that one's experience is found in the model of pure wave mechanics does not explain why one should expect to have that particular experience in a world described by the theory. Judging a theory to be empirically adequate when it tells us that there is a sense in which everything physically possible in fact happens clearly puts pressure on the very idea of empirical adequacy. But one might nevertheless argue that the empirical faithfulness of the relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics represent a nontrivial empirical virtue.

There remain a number of alternative reconstructions of Everett's relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics. Insofar as one takes pure wave mechanics to provide a clear starting point for addressing the quantum measurement problem, one might find such alternatives naturally compelling.

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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with further suggestions.]

Acknowledgments

I would like to thank Peter Byrne for his very helpful suggestions on an earlier version of this article.

Copyright © 2014 by
Jeffrey Barrett <jabarret@uci.edu>

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