# Relational Quantum Mechanics

*First published Mon Feb 4, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jan 2, 2008*

Relational quantum mechanics is an interpretation of quantum theory
which discards the notions of absolute state of a system, absolute
value of its physical quantities, or absolute event. The theory
describes the way systems affect one another in the course of
physical interactions. State and physical quantities refer always to
the interaction, or the relation, between *two* systems.
Nevertheless, the theory is assumed to be complete. The physical
content of quantum theory is understood as expressing the net of
relations connecting all different physical systems.

## 1. Introduction

Quantum theory is our current general theory of physical motion. The
theory is the core component of the momentous change that our
understanding of the physical world has undergone during the first
decades of the 20th century. It is one of the most successful
scientific theories ever: it is supported by vast and unquestionable
empirical and technological effectiveness and is today virtually
unchallenged. But the interpretation of what the theory actually tells
us about the physical world raises a lively debate, which has continued
with alternating fortunes, from the early days of the theory in the
late twenties, to nowadays. The *relational interpretation* is
an attempt to take the theory at its face value and take seriously the
picture of reality it provides. The core idea is to read the theory as a
theoretical account of the way distinct physical systems *affect
one another* when they interact (and not of the way physical systems
“are”), and the idea that this account exhausts all that can be said
about the physical world. The physical world is thus seen as a net of
interacting components, where there is no meaning to the state of an
isolated system. A physical system (or, more precisely, its contingent
state) is reduced to the net of relations it entertains with the
surrounding systems, and the physical structure of the world is
identified as this net of relationships.

The possibility that the physical content of an empirically
successful physical theory could be debated should not surprise:
examples abound in the history of science. For instance, the great
scientific revolution was fueled by the grand debate on whether the
effectiveness of the Copernican system could be taken as an indication
that the Earth was not *in fact* at the center of the universe.
In more recent times, Einstein's celebrated first major theoretical
success, special relativity, consisted to a large extent just in
understanding the physical meaning (simultaneity is relative) of an
already existing effective mathematical formalism (the Lorentz
transformations). In these cases, as in the case of quantum mechanics,
a very strictly empiricist position could have circumvented the problem
altogether, by reducing the content of the theory to a list of
predicted numbers. But perhaps science can offer us more than such a
list; and certainly science needs more than such a list to find its
ways.

The difficulty in the interpretation of quantum mechanics derives from the fact that the theory was first constructed for describing microscopic systems (atoms, electrons, photons) and the way these interact with macroscopic apparatuses built to measure their properties. Such interactions are denoted as “measurements”. The theory consists in a mathematical formalism, which allows probabilities of alternative outcomes of such measurements to be calculated. If used just for this purpose, the theory raises no difficulty. But we expect the macroscopic apparatuses themselves—in fact, any physical system in the world—to obey quantum theory, and this seems to raise contradictions in the theory.

### 1.1 The Problem

In classical mechanics, a system *S* is described by a certain
number of physical variables. For instance, an electron is described by
its position and its spin (intrinsic angular momentum). These variables
change with time and represent the contingent properties of the system.
We say that their values determine, at every moment, the “state” of the
system. A measurement of a system's variable is an interaction between
the system *S* and an external system *O*, whose effect
on *O*, depends on the actual value *q* of the variable
(of *S*) which is measured. The characteristic feature of
quantum mechanics is that it does not allow us to assume that all
variables of the system have determined values at every moment (this
irrespectively of whether or not we know such values). It was Werner
Heisenberg who first realized the need to free ourselves from the
belief that, say, an electron has a well determined position at every
time. When it is not interacting with an external system that can
detect its position, the electron can be “spread out” over different
positions. In the jargon of the theory, one says that the electron is
in a “quantum superposition” of two (or many) different positions. It
follows that the state of the system cannot be captured by giving the
value of its variables. Instead, quantum theory introduces a new notion
of “state” of a system, which is different from a list of values of its
variables. Such a new notion of state was developed in the work of
Erwin Schrödinger in the form of the “wave function” of the
system, usually denoted by Ψ. Paul Adrien Maurice Dirac gave a
general abstract formulation of the notion of quantum state, in terms
of a vector Ψ moving in an abstract vector space. The time
evolution of the state Ψ is deterministic and is governed by the
Schrödinger equation. From the knowledge of the state Ψ, one
can compute the probability of the different measurement outcomes
*q*. That is, the probability of the different ways in which the
system *S* can affect a system *O* in an interaction with
it. The theory then prescribes that at every such
‘measurement’, one must update the value of Ψ, to take
into account which of the different outcomes has happened. This sudden
change of the state Ψ depends on the specific outcome of the
measurement and is therefore probabilistic. It is called the “collapse
of the wave function”.

The problem of the interpretation of quantum mechanics takes then
different forms, depending on the relative ontological weight we choose
to assign to the wave function Ψ or, respectively, to the sequence
of the measurement outcomes *q*, *q*′,
*q*″, …. If we take Ψ as the “real” entity
which fully represents the actual state of affairs of the world, we
encounter a number of difficulties. First, we have to understand how
Ψ can change suddenly in the course of a measurement: if we
describe the evolution of two interacting quantum systems in terms of
the Schrödinger equation, no collapse happens. Furthermore, the
collapse, seen as a physical process, seems to depend on arbitrary
choices in our description and shows a disturbing amount of
nonlocality. But even if we can circumvent the collapse problem, the
more serious difficulty of this point of view is that it appears to be
impossible to understand how specific observed values *q*,
*q*′, *q*″, … can emerge from the same
Ψ. A better alternative is to take the observed values *q*,
*q*′, *q*″, … as the actual elements
of reality, and view Ψ just as a bookkeeping device, determined by
the actual values *q*, *q*′, *q*″,
… that happened in past. From this perspective, the real events
of the world are the “realization” (the “coming to reality”, the
“actualization”) of the values *q*, *q*′,
*q*″, … in the course of the interaction between
physical systems. This actualization of a variable *q* in the
course of an interaction can be denoted as the *quantum event*
*q*. An exemple of a quantum event is the detection of an
electron in a certain position. The position variable of the electron
assumes a determined value in the course of the interaction between the
electron and an external system and the quantum event is the
“manifestation” of the electron in a certain position. Quantum events
have an intrinsically discrete (“quantized”) granular structure.

The difficulty of this second option is that if we take the quantum
nature of all physical systems into account, the statement that a
certain specific event *q* “has happened” (or, equivalently that
a certain variable has or has not taken the value *q*) can be
true and not-true at the same time. To clarify this key point, consider
the case in which a system *S* interacts with another system (an
apparatus) *O*, and exhibits a value *q* of one of its
variables. Assume that the system *O* obeys the laws of quantum
theory as well, and use the quantum theory of the combined system
formed by *O* and *S* in order to predict the way this
combined system can later interact with a *third* system
*O*′. Then quantum mechanics forbids us to assume that
*q* has happened. Indeed, as far as its later behavior is
concerned, the combined system *S+O* may very well be in a
quantum superposition of alternative possible values *q*,
*q*′, *q*″, …. This “second observer”
situation captures the core conceptual difficulty of the interpretation
of quantum mechanics: reconciling the possibility of quantum
superposition with the fact that the observed world is characterized by
uniquely determined events *q*, *q*′,
*q*″, …. More precisely, it shows that we cannot
disentangle the two: according to the theory an observed quantity
(*q*) can be at the same time determined and not determined. An
event may have happened and at the same time may not have happened.

## 2. Relational view of quantum states

The way out from this dilemma suggested by the relational
interpretations is that the quantum events, and thus the values of the
variables of a physical system S, namely the *q*'s, are
relational. That is, they do not express properties of the system S
alone, but rather refer to the relation between two systems.

The best developed of these interpretations is
*relational quantum mechanics* (Rovelli 1996, 1997).
For evaluations and critical account of this view of quantum theory,
see for instance van Fraassen (2010) and Bitbol (2007).
The central tenet of *relational quantum mechanics*
is that there is no meaning in saying that a
certain quantum event has happened or that a variable of the system
*S* has taken the value *q*: rather, there is meaning in
saying that the event *q* has happened or the variable has taken
the value *q* *for* *O*, or *with respect
to* *O*. The apparent contradiction between the two
statements that a variable has or hasn't a value is resolved by
indexing the statements with the different systems with which the
system in question interacts. If I observe an electron at a certain
position, I cannot conclude that the electron *is* there: I can
only conclude that the electron *as seen by me* is there.
Quantum events only happen in interactions between systems, and the
fact that a quantum event has happened is only true with respect to the
systems involved in the interaction. The unique account of the state of
the world of the classical theory is thus fractured into a multiplicity
of accounts, one for each possible “observing” physical system. In the
words of Rovelli (1996): “Quantum mechanics is a theory about the
physical description of physical systems relative to other systems, and
this is a complete description of the world”.

This relativisation of actuality is viable thanks to a remarkable
property of the formalism of quantum mechanics. John von Neumann was
the first to notice that the formalism of the theory treats the
measured system (*S* ) and the measuring system (*O*)
differently, but the theory is surprisingly flexible on the choice of
where to put the boundary between the two. Different choices give
different accounts of the state of the world (for instance, the
collapse of the wave function happens at different times); but this
does not affect the predictions on the final observations. Von Neumann
only described a rather special situation, but this flexibility
reflects a general structural property of quantum theory, which
guarantees the consistency among all the distinct “accounts of the
world” of the different observing systems. The manner in which this
consistency is realized, however, is subtle.

What appears with respect to *O* as a measurement of the
variable *q* (with a specific outcome), appears with respect to
*O*′ simply as the establishing of a *correlation*
between *S* and *O* (without any specific outcome). As
far as the observer *O* is concerned, a quantum event has
happened and a property *q* of a system *S* has taken a
certain value. As far as the second observer *O*′ is
concerned, the only relevant element of reality is that a correlation
is established between *S* and *O*. This correlation will
manifest itself only in any further observation that *O*′
would perform on the *S+O* system. Up to the time in which it
physically interacts with *S+O*, the system *O*′
has no access to the actual outcomes of the measurements performed by
*O* on *S* . This actual outcome is real only with
respect to *O* (Rovelli 1996, pp. 1650–52). Consider for
instance a two-state system *O* (say, a light-emitting diode, or
l.e.d., which can be *on* or *off*) interacting with a
two-state system *S* (say, the spin of an electron, which can be
*up* or *down*). Assume the interaction is such that if
the spin is *up* (*down*) the l.e.d. goes *on*
(*off*). To start with, the electron can be in a superposition
of its two states. In the account of the state of the electron that we
can associate with the l.e.d., a quantum event happens in the
interaction, the wave function of the electron collapses to one of two
states, and the l.e.d. is then either *on* or *off*. But
we can also consider the l.e.d./electron composite system as a quantum
system and study the interactions of this composite system with another
system *O*′. In the account associated to
*O*′, there is no event and no collapse at the time of the
interaction, and the composite system is still in the superposition of
the two states [spin *up*/l.e.d. *on*] and [spin
*down*/l.e.d. *off*] after the interaction. It is
necessary to assume this superposition because it accounts for
measurable interference effects between the two states: if quantum
mechanics is correct, these interference effects are truly observable
by *O*′. So, we have two discordant accounts of the same
events. Can the two discord accounts be compared and does the
comparison lead to contradiction? They can be compared, because the
information on the first account is stored in the state of the l.e.d.
and *O*′ has access to this information. Therefore
*O* and *O*′ can compare their accounts of the
state of the world.

However, the comparison does not lead to contradiction *because
the comparison is itself a physical process that must be understood in
the context of quantum mechanics*. Indeed, *O*′ can
physically interact with the electron and then with the l.e.d. (or,
equivalently, the other way around). If, for instance, he finds the
spin of the electron *up*, quantum mechanics predicts that he
will then consistently find the l.e.d. on (because in the first
measurement the state of the composite system collapses on its [spin
*up*/l.e.d. *on*] component). That is, the multiplicity
of accounts leads to no contradiction precisely because the comparison
between different accounts can only be a physical quantum interaction.
This internal self-consistency of the quantum formalism is general, and
it is perhaps its most remarkable aspect. This self consistency is
taken in relational quantum mechanics as a strong indication of the
relational nature of the world.

In fact, one may conjecture that this peculiar consistency between the observations of different observers is the missing ingredient for a reconstruction theorem of the Hilbert space formalism of quantum theory. Such a reconstruction theorem is still unavailable: On the basis of reasonable physical assumptions, one is able to derive the structure of an orthomodular lattice containing subsets that form Boolean algebras, which “almost”, but not quite, implies the existence of a Hilbert space and its projectors' algebra (see the entry quantum logic and probability theory.) Perhaps an appropriate algebraic formulation of the condition of consistency between subsystems could provide the missing hypothesis to complete the reconstruction theorem.

Bas van Fraassen has given an extensive critical discussion of this interpretation; he has also suggested an improvement, in the form of an additional postulate weakly relating the description of the same system given by different observers (van Fraassen 2010). Michel Bitbol has analyzed the relational interpretation of quantum mechanics from a Kantian perspective, substituting functional reference frames for physical (or naturalized) observers (Bitbol 2007).

## 3. Correlations

The conceptual relevance of *correlations* in quantum
mechanics,—a central aspect of relational quantum mechanics—is
emphasized by David Mermin, who analyses the statistical features of
correlation (Mermin 1998), and arrives at views close to the relational
ones. Mermin points out that a theorem on correlations in Hilbert space
quantum mechanics is relevant to the problem of what exactly quantum
theory tells us about the physical world. Consider a quantum system
*S* with internal parts *s*, *s*′,…,
that may be considered as subsystems of *S* , and define the
correlations among subsystems as the expectation values of products of
subsystems' observables. It can be proved that, for any resolution of
*S* into subsystems, the subsystems' correlations determine
*uniquely* the state of *S*. According to Mermin, this
theorem highlights two major lessons that quantum mechanics teaches us:
first, the relevant physics of *S* is entirely contained in the
correlations both among the *s*, *s*′,…,
themselves (internal correlations) and among the
*s*′,…, and other systems (external correlations);
second, correlations may be ascribed physical reality whereas,
according to well-known ‘no-go’ theorems, the quantities
that are the terms of the correlations cannot (Mermin 1998).

## 4. Self-reference and self-measurement

From a relational point of view, the properties of a system exists only in reference to another system. What about the properties of a system with respect to itself? Can a system measure itself? Is there any meaning of the correlations of a system with itself? Implicit in the relational point of view is the intuition that a complete self-measurement is impossible. It is this impossibility that forces all properties to be referred to another system. The issue of the self-measurement has been analyzed in details in two remarkable works, from very different perspectives, but with similar conclusions, by Marisa Dalla Chiara and by Thomas Breuer.

### 4.1 Logical aspect of the measurement problem

Marisa Dalla Chiara (1977) has addressed the *logical* aspect
of the measurement problem. She observes that the problem of
self-measurement in quantum mechanics is strictly related to the
*self-reference* problem, which has an old tradition in logic.
From a logical point of view the measurement problem of quantum
mechanics can be described as a characteristic question of “semantical
closure” of a theory. To what extent can quantum mechanics apply
consistently to the objects and the concepts in terms of which its
metatheory is expressed? Dalla Chiara shows that the duality in the
description of state evolution, encoded in the ordinary (i.e. von
Neumann's) approach to the measurement problem, can be given a purely
logical interpretation: “If the apparatus observer *O* is an
object of the theory, then *O* cannot realize the reduction of
the wave function. This is possible only to another *O*′,
which is ‘external’ with respect to the universe of the
theory. In other words, any apparatus, as a particular physical system,
can be an object of the theory. Nevertheless, *any apparatus which
realizes the reduction of the wave function is necessarily only a
metatheoretical object* ” (Dalla Chiara 1977, p. 340). This
observation is remarkably consistent with the way in which the state
vector reduction is justified within the relational interpretation of
quantum mechanics. When the system *S+O* is considered from the
point of view of *O*′, the measurement can be seen as an
interaction whose dynamics is fully unitary, whereas by the point of
view of *O* the measurement breaks the unitarity of the
evolution of *S*. The unitary evolution does not break down
through mysterious physical jumps, due to unknown effects, but simply
because *O* is not giving a full dynamical description of the
interaction. *O* cannot have a full description of the
interaction of *S* with himself (*O*), because his
information is correlation information and there is no meaning in being
correlated with oneself. If we include the observer into the system,
then the evolution is still unitary, but we are now dealing with the
description of a different observer.

### 4.2 Impossibility of complete self-measurement

As is well known, from a purely logical point of view self-reference
properties in formal systems impose limitations on the descriptive
power of the systems themselves. Thomas Breuer has shown that, from a
physical point of view, this feature is expressed by the existence of
limitations in the universal validity of physical theories, *no
matter whether classical or quantum* (Breuer 1995). Breuer studies
the possibility for an apparatus *O* to measure its own state.
More precisely, of measuring the state of a system *containing*
an apparatus *O*. He defines a map from the space of all sets of
states of the apparatus to the space of all sets of states of the
system. Such a map assigns to every set of apparatus states the set of
system states that is compatible with the information
that—after the measurement interaction—the apparatus is in one of
these states. Under reasonable assumptions on this map, Breuer is able
to prove a theorem stating that no such map can exist that can
distinguish all the states of the system. An apparatus *O*
cannot distinguish all the states of a system *S* containing
*O*. This conclusion holds irrespective of the classical or
quantum nature of the systems involved, but in the quantum context it
implies that no quantum mechanical apparatus can measure all the
quantum correlations between *itself* and an external system.
These correlations are only measurable by a second external apparatus,
observing both the system and the first apparatus.

## 5. Other relational views

### 5.1 Quantum reference systems

A relational view of quantum mechanics has been proposed also by
Gyula Bene (1997). Bene argues that quantum states are relative in the
sense that they express a relation between a system to be described and
a different system, containing the former as a subsystem and acting for
it as a *quantum reference system* (here the system is contained
in the reference system, while in Breuer's work the system contains the
apparatus). Consider again a measuring system (*O*) that has
become entangled with a measured system (*S* ) during a
measurement. Once again, the difficulty of quantum theory is that there
is an apparent contradiction between the fact that the quantity
*q* of the system assumes an observed value in the measurement,
while the composite *S+O* system still has to be considered in a
superposition state, if we want to properly predict the outcome of
measurements on the *S+O* system. This apparent contradiction is
resolved by Bene by relativizing the state not to an observer, as in
the relational quantum mechanics sketched in Section 2, but rather to a
relevant composite system. That is: there is a state of the system
*S* relative to *S* alone, and a state of the system
*S* relative to the *S+O* composite system. (Similarly,
there is a state of the system *O* relative to itself alone, and
a state of the system *O* relative to the *S+O*
ensemble.) The ensemble with respect to which the state is defined is
called by Bene the *quantum reference system* . The state of a
system with respect to a given quantum reference system correctly
predicts the probability distributions of any measurement on the entire
reference system. This dependence of the states of quantum systems from
different quantum systems that act as reference systems is viewed as a
fundamental property that holds no matter whether a system is observed
or not.

### 5.2 Sigma algebra of interactive properties

Similar views have been expressed by Simon Kochen in unpublished but
rather well-known notes (Kochen 1979, preprint). In Kochen's words:
“The basic change in the classical framework which we advocate lies in
dropping the assumption of the absoluteness of physical properties of
interacting systems… Thus quantum mechanical properties acquire
an interactive or relational character.” Kochen uses a σ-algebra
formalism. Each quantum system has an associated Hilbert space. The
properties of the system are established by its interaction with other
quantum systems, and these properties are represented by the
corresponding projection operators on the Hilbert space. These
projectors are elements of a Boolean σ-algebra, determined by
the physics of the interaction between the two systems. Suppose a
quantum system *S* can interact with quantum systems
*Q*, *Q*′,…. In each case, *S* will
acquire an interaction σ-algebra of properties
σ(*Q*), σ(*Q*′) since the interaction
between *S* and *Q* may be finer grained than the
interaction between *S* and *Q*′. Thus,
interaction σ-algebras may have non-trivial intersections. The
*family* of all Boolean σ-algebras forms a category, with
the sets of the projectors of each σ-algebra as objects. In
Kochen's words: “Just as the state of a composite system does not
determine states of its components, conversely, the states of
the… correlated systems do not determine the state of the
composite system […] We thus resolve the measurement problem by
cutting the Gordian knot tying the states of component systems
uniquely to the state of the combined system.” This is very similar in
spirit to the Bene approach and to Rovelli's relational quantum
mechanics, but the precise technical relation between the formalisms
utilized in these approaches has not yet been analysed in full detail.

Further approaches at least formally related to Kochen's have been proposed by Healey (1989), who also emphasises an interactive aspect of his approach, and by Dieks (1989). See also the entry on modal interpretations of quantum mechanics.

### 5.3 Quantum theory of the universe

Relational views on quantum theory have been defended also by Lee Smolin (1995) and by Louis Crane (1995) in a cosmological context. If one is interested in the quantum theory of the entire universe, then, by definition, an external observer is not available. Breuer's theorem shows then that a quantum state of the universe, containing all correlations between all subsystems, expresses information that is not available, not even in principle, to any observer. In order to write a meaningful quantum state, argue Crane and Smolin, we have to divide the universe in two components and consider the relative quantum state predicting the outcomes of the observations that one component can make on the other.

### 5.4 Relation with Everett's relative-state interpretation

Relational ideas underlie also the interpretations of quantum theory inspired by the work of Everett. Everett’ original work (Everett 1975) relies on the notion of “relative state” and has a marked relational tone (see the entry on Everett's relative-state formulation of quantum). In the context of Everettian accounts, a state may be taken as relative either (more commonly) to a “world”, or “branch”, or (sometimes) to the state of another system (see for instance Saunders 1996, 1998). While the first variant (relationalism with respect to branches) is far from the relational views described here, the second variant (relationalism with respect to the state of a system) is closer.

However, it is different to say that something is relative to a
system or that something is relative to a state of a system. Consider
for instance the situation described in the example of Section 5:
According to the relational interpretation, after the first measurement
the quantity *q* has a given value and only one for *O*,
while in Everettian terms the quantity *q* has a value for one
state of *O* and a different value for another state of
*O*, and the two are equally real. In Everett, there is an
ontological multiplicity of realities, which is absent in the
relational point of view, where physisical quantities are uniquely
determined, once two systems are given.

The difference derives from a very general interpretational
difference between Everettian accounts and the relational point of
view. Everett (at least in its widespread version) takes the state
Ψ as the basis of the ontology of quantum theory. The overall state
Ψ includes different possible branches and different possible
outcomes. On the other hand, the relational interpretation takes the
quantum events *q*, that is, the actualizations of values of
physical quantities, as the basic elements of reality (see Section 1.1
above) and such *q*'s are assumed to be univocal. The relational
view avoids the traditional difficulties in taking the *q*'s as
univocal simply by noticing that a *q* does not refer to a
system, but rather to a pair of systems.

For a comparison between the relational interpretation and other current interpretations of quantum mechanics, see Rovelli 1996.

## 6. Some consequences of the relational point of view

A number of open conceptual issues in quantum mechanics appear in a different light when seen in the context of a relational interpretation of the theory. In particular, the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen (EPR) correlations have a substantially different interpretation within the perspective of the relational interpretation of quantum mechanics. Laudisa (2001) has argued that the non-locality implied by the conventional EPR argument turns out to be frame-dependent, and this result supports the “peaceful coexistence” of quantum mechanics and special relativity. More radically, Rovelli and Smerlak (2006) argue that these correlations do not entail any form of “non-locality”, when viewed in the context of this interpretation, essentially because there is a quantum event relative to an observer that happens at a spacelike separation from this observer. The abandonment of strict Einstein realism implied by the relational stance permits to reconcile quantum mechanics, completeness and locality.

Also, the relational interpretation allows one to give a precise definition of the time (or, better, the probability distribution of the time) at which a measurement happens, in terms of the probability distribution of the correlation between system and apparatus, as measurable by a third observer (Rovelli 1998).

Finally, it has been suggested in Rovelli (1997) that the
relationalism at the core of quantum theory pointed out by the
relational interpretations might be connected with the spatiotemporal
relationalism that characterizes general relativity. Quantum mechanical
relationalism is the observation that there are no absolute properties:
properties of a system *S* are relative to another system
*O* with which *S* is interacting. General relativistic
relationalism is the well known observation that there is no absolute
localization in spacetime: localization of an object *S* in
spacetime is only relative to the gravitational field, or to any other
object *O*, to which *S* is contiguous. There is a
connection between the two, since interaction between *S* and
*O* implies contiguity and contiguity between *S* and
*O* can only be checked via some *quantum* interaction.
However, because of the difficulty of developing a consistent and
conceptually transparent theory of quantum gravity, so far this
suggestion has not been developed beyond the stage of a simple
intuition.

## 7. Conclusion

Relational interpretations of quantum mechanics propose a solution to
the interpretational difficulties of quantum theory based on the idea
of weakening the notions of the state of a system, event, and the idea
that a system, at a certain time, may just have a certain property. The
world is described as an ensemble of events (“the electron is the point
*x*”) which happen only *relatively to* a given observer.
Accordingly, the state and the properties of a system are relative to
another system only. There is a wide diversity in style, emphasis, and
language in the authors that we have mentioned. Indeed, most of the
works mentioned have developed independently from each other. But it is
rather clear that there is a common idea underlying all these
approaches, and the convergence is remarkable.

Werner Heisenberg first recognized that the electron does not have a well defined position when it is not interacting. Relational interpretations push this intuition further, by stating that, even when interacting, the position of the electron is only determined in relation to a certain observer, or to a certain quantum reference system, or similar.

In physics, the move of deepening our insight into the physical
world by relativizing notions previously used as absolute has been
applied repeatedly and very successfully. Here are a few examples. The
notion of the velocity of an object has been recognized as meaningless,
unless it is indexed with a reference body with respect to which the
object is moving. With special relativity, simultaneity of two distant
events has been recognized as meaningless, unless referred to a
specific state of motion of something. (This something is usually
denoted as “the observer” without, of course, any implication that the
observer is human or has any other peculiar property besides having a
state of motion. Similarly, the “observer system” *O* in quantum
mechanics need not to be human or have any other property beside the
possibility of interacting with the “observed” system *S*.) With
general relativity, the position in space and time of an object has
been recognized as meaningless, unless it is referred to the
gravitational field, or to some other dynamical physical entity. The
move proposed by the relational interpretations of quantum mechanics
has strong analogies with these, but is, in a sense, a longer jump,
since all physical events and the entirety of the contingent properties
of any physical system are taken to be meaningful only as relative to a
second physical system. The claim of the relational interpretations is
that this is not an arbitrary move. Rather, it is a conclusion which is
difficult to escape, following from the observation—explained
above in the example of the “second observer”—that a variable
(of a system *S*) can have a well determined value *q*
for one observer (*O*) and at the same time fail to have a
determined value for another observer (*O*′).

This way of thinking the world has certainly heavy philosophical implications. The claim of the relational interpretations is that it is nature itself that is forcing us to this way of thinking. If we want to understand nature, our task is not to frame nature into our philosophical prejudices, but rather to learn how to adjust our philosophical prejudices to what we learn from nature.

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## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- Bitbol, M., “Physical Relations or Functional Relations?
A non-metaphysical construal of Rovelli's Relational Quantum Mechanics”,
*Philosophy of Science Archive:*http://philsci-archive.pitt.edu/archive/00003506/ (2007). - Smolin, L., “The Bekenstein bound, topological quantum field theory and pluralistic quantum field theory”, Penn State preprint CGPG-95/8-7, 1995, Los Alamos Archive gr-qc/9508064.

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