Many-Worlds Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics

First published Sun Mar 24, 2002; substantive revision Fri Jan 17, 2014

The Many-Worlds Interpretation (MWI) of quantum mechanics holds that there are many worlds which exist in parallel at the same space and time as our own. The existence of the other worlds makes it possible to remove randomness and action at a distance from quantum theory and thus from all physics.

1. Introduction

The fundamental idea of the MWI, going back to Everett 1957, is that there are myriads of worlds in the Universe in addition to the world we are aware of. In particular, every time a quantum experiment with different possible outcomes is performed, all outcomes are obtained, each in a different world, even if we are only aware of the world with the outcome we have seen. In fact, quantum experiments take place everywhere and very often, not just in physics laboratories: even the irregular blinking of an old fluorescent bulb is a quantum experiment.

There are numerous variations and reinterpretations of the original Everett proposal, most of which are briefly discussed in the entry on Everett's relative state formulation of quantum mechanics. Here, a particular approach to the MWI (which differs from the popular “actual splitting worlds” approach in De Witt 1970) will be presented in detail, followed by a discussion relevant for many variants of the MWI.

The MWI consists of two parts:

  1. A mathematical theory which yields the time evolution of the quantum state of the (single) Universe.
  2. A prescription which sets up a correspondence between the quantum state of the Universe and our experiences.

Part (i) is essentially summarized by the Schrödinger equation or its relativistic generalization. It is a rigorous mathematical theory and is not problematic philosophically. Part (ii) involves “our experiences” which do not have a rigorous definition. An additional difficulty in setting up (ii) follows from the fact that human languages were developed at a time when people did not suspect the existence of parallel worlds.

The mathematical part of the MWI, (i), yields less than mathematical parts of some other theories such as, e.g., Bohmian mechanics. The Schrödinger equation itself does not explain why we experience definite results in quantum measurements. In contrast, in Bohmian mechanics the mathematical part yields almost everything, and the analog of (ii) is very simple: it is the postulate according to which only the “Bohmian positions” (and not the quantum wave) correspond to our experience. The Bohmian positions of all particles yield the familiar picture of the (single) world we are aware of. Thus, philosophically, a theory like Bohmian mechanics achieves more than the MWI, but at the price of adding the non-local dynamics of Bohmian particle positions.

2. Definitions

2.1 What is “A World”?

A world is the totality of macroscopic objects: stars, cities, people, grains of sand, etc. in a definite classically described state.

The concept of a “world” in the MWI belongs to part (ii) of the theory, i.e., it is not a rigorously defined mathematical entity, but a term defined by us (sentient beings) in describing our experience. When we refer to the “definite classically described state” of, say, a cat, it means that the position and the state (alive, dead, smiling, etc.) of the cat is maximally specified according to our ability to distinguish between the alternatives, and that this specification corresponds to a classical picture, e.g., no superpositions of dead and alive cats are allowed in a single world.

Another concept, which is closer to Everett's original proposal, see Saunders 1995, is that of a relative, or perspectival world defined for every physical system and every one of its states (provided it is a state of non-zero probability): I will call it a centered world. This concept is useful when a world is centered on a perceptual state of a sentient being. In this world, all objects which the sentient being perceives have definite states, but objects that are not under observation might be in a superposition of different (classical) states. The advantage of a centered world is that a quantum phenomenon in a distant galaxy does not split it, while the advantage of the definition presented here is that we can consider a world without specifying a center, and in particular our usual language is just as useful for describing worlds that existed at times when there were no sentient beings.

The concept of a world in the MWI is based on the layman's conception of a world; however, several features are different. Obviously, the definition of the world as everything that exists does not hold in the MWI. “Everything that exists” is the Universe, and there is only one Universe. The Universe incorporates many worlds similar to the one the layman is familiar with. A layman believes that our present world has a unique past and future. According to the MWI, a world defined at some moment of time corresponds to a unique world at a time in the past, but to a multitude of worlds at a time in the future.

2.2 Who am “I”?

“I” am an object, such as the Earth, a cat, etc. “I” is defined at a particular time by a complete (classical) description of the state of my body and of my brain. “I” and “Lev” do not refer to the same things (even though my name is Lev). At the present moment there are many different “Lev”s in different worlds (not more than one in each world), but it is meaningless to say that now there is another “I”. I have a particular, well defined past: I correspond to a particular “Lev” in 2012, but not to a particular “Lev” in the future: I correspond to a multitude of “Lev”s in 2022. In the framework of the MWI it is meaningless to ask: Which Lev in 2022 will I be? I will correspond to them all. Every time I perform a quantum experiment (with several possible results) it only seems to me that I obtain a single definite result. Indeed, Lev who obtains this particular result thinks this way. However, this Lev cannot be identified as the only Lev after the experiment. Lev before the experiment corresponds to all “Lev”s obtaining all possible results.

Although this approach to the concept of personal identity seems somewhat unusual, it is plausible in the light of the critique of personal identity by Parfit 1986. Parfit considers some artificial situations in which a person splits into several copies, and argues that there is no good answer to the question: Which copy is me? He concludes that personal identity is not what matters when I divide. Saunders and Wallace 2008a argue that based on the semantics of Lewis 1986 one can find a meaning for this question. However, in their reply 2008b to Tappenden 2008 they emphasise that their work is not about the nature of ‘I’, but about “serviceability”. Indeed, as it will be explained below, I should behave as if “Which copy is me?” is a legitimate question.

3. Correspondence Between the Formalism and Our Experience

We should not expect to have a detailed and complete explanation of our experience in terms of the wave function of 1033 particles that we and our immediate environment are made of. We just have to be able to draw a basic picture which is free of paradoxes. There are many attempts to provide an explanation of what we see based on the MWI or its variants in Lockwood 1989, Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990, Albert 1992, Saunders 1993, Penrose 1994, Chalmers 1996, Deutsch 1996, Joos et al. 2003, Schlosshauer 2007, Zurek 2009, and Wallace 2012. A sketch of the connection between the wave function of the Universe and our experience follows.

3.1 The Quantum State of a Macroscopic Object

The basis for the correspondence between the quantum state (the wave function) of the Universe and our experience is the description that physicists give in the framework of standard quantum theory for objects composed of elementary particles. Elementary particles of the same kind are identical. Therefore, the essence of an object is the quantum state of its particles and not the particles themselves (see the elaborate discussion in the entry on identity and individuality in quantum theory): one quantum state of a set of elementary particles might be a cat and another state of the same particles might be a small table. Clearly, we cannot now write down an exact wave function of a cat. We know, to a reasonable approximation, the wave function of some elementary particles that constitute a nucleon. The wave function of the electrons and the nucleons that together make up an atom is known with even better precision. The wave functions of molecules (i.e. the wave functions of the ions and electrons out of which molecules are built) are well studied. A lot is known about biological cells, so physicists can write down a rough form of the quantum state of a cell. Out of cells we construct various tissues and then the whole body of a cat or a table. So, let us denote the quantum state constructed in this way |ΨOBJECT.

In our construction |ΨOBJECT is the quantum state of an object in a definite state and position. According to the definition of a world we have adopted, in each world the cat is in a definite state: either alive or dead. Schrödinger's experiment with the cat leads to a splitting of worlds even before opening the box. Only in the alternative approach is Schrödinger's cat, which is in a superposition of being alive and dead, a member of the (single) centered world of the observer before she opens the sealed box with the cat (the observer perceives directly the facts related to the preparation of the experiment and she deduces that the cat is in a superposition).

Formally, the quantum state of an object which consists of N particles is defined in 3N dimensional configuration space. However, in order to make a connection to our experience it is crucial to understand the quantum state as an entangled wave function of N particles in 3 dimensional space. Physical interactions are local in 3 dimensions and we only experience objects defined in 3-space. The density of the wave function of molecules of the macroscopic object in 3-space is the bridge between the wave function of the object and our experience of that object. This concept, which is a property of the wave function only, plays the role of the primitive ontology present in other interpretations of quantum mechanics, Allori et al. 2014.

3.2 The Quantum State of a World

The wave function of all particles in the Universe corresponding to any particular world will be a product of the states of the sets of particles corresponding to all objects in the world multiplied by the quantum state |Φ of all the particles that do not constitute “objects”. Within a world, “objects” have definite macroscopic states by fiat:


The product state is only for variables which are relevant for the macroscopic description of the objects. There might be some entanglement between weakly coupled variables like nuclear spins belonging to different objects. In order to keep the form of the quantum state of the world (1), the quantum state of such variables should belong to |Φ.

Consider a text-book description of quantum measurements based on the von Neumann 1955 approach according to which each quantum measurement ends up with the collapse of the wave function to the eigenstate of the measured variable. The quantum measurement device must be a macroscopic object with macroscopically different states corresponding to different outcomes. In this case, the MWI all-particles wave function corresponding to a world with a particular outcome is the same as in the von Neumann theory provided there is a collapse to the wave function with this outcome. Von Neumann 1955 analysis helps in understanding the correspondence between the wave function and our perception of the world. However, as Becker 2004 explains, the status of the wave function for von Neumann is not ontological as in the MWI described here, but epistemic: it summarises information about the results of measurements.

In most situations, only macroscopic objects are relevant to our experience. However, today's technology has reached a point in which interference experiments are performed with single particles. In such situations a description of a world with states of only macroscopic objects, such as sources and detectors, is possible but cumbersome. Hence it is fruitful to add a description of microscopic objects. Vaidman 2010 argues that the proper way to describe the relevant microscopic particles is by the two-state vector which consists of the usual, forward evolving state specified by the measurement in the past and a backward evolving state specified by the measurement in the future. Such a description provides a simple explanation of the weak trace the particles leave, Vaidman 2013.

3.3 The Quantum State of the Universe

The quantum state of the Universe can be decomposed into a superposition of terms corresponding to different worlds:


Different worlds correspond to different classically described states of at least one object. Different classically described states correspond to orthogonal quantum states. Therefore, different worlds correspond to orthogonal states: all states |ΨWORLD i are mutually orthogonal and consequently, ∑|αi| 2 = 1.

3.4 FAPP

The construction of the quantum state of the Universe in terms of the quantum states of objects presented above is only approximate; it is good only for all practical purposes (FAPP). Indeed, the concept of an object itself has no rigorous definition: should a mouse that a cat just swallowed be considered as a part of the cat? The concept of a “definite position” is also only approximately defined: how far should a cat be displaced in order for it to be considered to be in a different position? If the displacement is much smaller than the quantum uncertainty, it must be considered to be in the same place, because in this case the quantum state of the cat is almost the same and the displacement is undetectable in principle. But this is only an absolute bound, because our ability to distinguish various locations of the cat is far from this quantum limit. Furthermore, the state of an object (e.g. alive or dead) is meaningful only if the object is considered for a period of time. In our construction, however, the quantum state of an object is defined at a particular time. In fact, we have to ensure that the quantum state will have the shape of the object not only at that time, but for some period of time. Splitting of the world during this period of time is another source of ambiguity because there is no precise definition of when the splitting occurs. The time of splitting corresponds to the time of the collapse in the approach given by von Neumann 1955. He provided a very extensive discussion showing that it does not matter when exactly the collapse occurs, and this analysis shows also that it does not matter when the splitting in the MWI occurs.

The reason that it is possible to propose only an approximate prescription for the correspondence between the quantum state of the Universe and our experience is essentially the same as the reason that led Bell 1990 to claim that “ordinary quantum mechanics is just fine FAPP”. The concepts we use: “object”, “measurement”, etc. are not rigorously defined. Bell and many others were looking (until now in vain) for a “precise quantum mechanics”. Since it is not enough for a physical theory to be just fine FAPP, a quantum mechanics needs rigorous foundations. Indeed, the MWI has rigorous foundations for (i), the “physics part” of the theory; only part (ii), the correspondence with our experience, is approximate (just fine FAPP). But “just fine FAPP” means that the theory explains our experience for any possible experiment, and this is the goal of (ii). See Wallace 2002, 2010a for more arguments why a FAPP definition of a world is enough.

3.5 Preferred Basis

The mathematical structure of the theory (i) allows infinitely many ways to decompose the quantum state of the Universe into a superposition of orthogonal states. The basis for the decomposition into worlds follows from the common concept of a world that consists of objects in definite positions and states (“definite” on the scale of our ability to distinguish them). In the alternative approach, the basis of a centered world is defined directly by an observer. Therefore, given the nature of the observer and her concepts for describing the world, the particular choice of the decomposition (2) follows (up to a precision which is good FAPP, as required). If we do not ask why we are what we are, and why the world we perceive is what it is, but only how we can explain relations between the events we observe in our world, then the problem of the preferred basis does not arise: we and the concepts of our world define the preferred basis.

But if we do ask why we are what we are, we can explain more. Looking at the details of the physical world, the structure of the Hamiltonian, the value of the Planck constant, etc., one can understand why the sentient beings we know are of a particular type and why they have their particular concepts for describing their worlds. The main argument is that the locality of interactions yields stability of worlds in which objects are well localized. The small value of the Planck constant allows macroscopic objects to be well localized for a long period of time. Worlds corresponding to localized quantum states |ΨWORLD i do not split for a long enough time such that sentient beings can perceive the locations of macroscopic objects. By contrast, a “world” obtained in another decomposition, e.g., the “world +” which is characterized by the relative phase of a superposition of states of macroscopic objects being in macroscopically distinguishable states A and B, 1/√2(|ΨA+|ΨB) |Φ , splits immediately, during a period of time which is much smaller than the perception time of any feasible sentient being, into two worlds: the new “world +” and the “world −”: 1/√2(|ΨA−|ΨB) |Φ′. This is the phenomenon of decoherence which has attracted enormous attention in recent years, e.g., Joos et al. 2003, Zurek 2003, Schlosshauer 2007, also in the “decoherent histories” framework of Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990, see Saunders 1995.

3.6 The Measure of Existence

There are many worlds existing in parallel in the Universe. Although all worlds are of the same physical size (this might not be true if we take into account the quantum aspects of early cosmology), and in every world sentient beings feel as “real” as in any other world, there is a sense in which some worlds are larger than others. I describe this property as the measure of existence of a world.

The measure of existence of a world quantifies its ability to interfere with other worlds in a gedanken experiment, see Vaidman 1998 (p. 256), and is the basis for introducing (an illusion of ) probability in the MWI. The measure of existence is the parallel of the probability measure discussed in Everett 1957 and pictorially described in Lockwood 1989 (p. 230).

Given the decomposition (2), the measure of existence of the world i is µi = |αi|2. It can also be expressed as the expectation value of Pi, the projection operator on the space of quantum states corresponding to the actual values of all physical variables describing the world i:


“I” also have a measure of existence. It is the sum of the measures of existence of all different worlds in which I exist; it can also be defined as the measure of existence of my perception world. Note that I do not directly experience the measure of my existence. I feel the same weight, see the same brightness, etc. irrespectively of how tiny my measure of existence might be.

4. Probability in the MWI

The probability in the MWI cannot be introduced in a simple way as in quantum theory with collapse. However, even if there is no probability in the MWI, it is possible to explain our illusion of apparent probabilistic events. Due to the identity of the mathematical counterparts of worlds, we should not expect any difference between our experience in a particular world of the MWI and the experience in a single-world universe with collapse at every quantum measurement.

4.1 Probability from Uncertainty

The difficulty with the concept of probability in a deterministic theory, such as the MWI, is that the only possible meaning for probability is an ignorance probability, but there is no relevant information that an observer who is going to perform a quantum experiment is ignorant about. The quantum state of the Universe at one time specifies the quantum state at all times. If I am going to perform a quantum experiment with two possible outcomes such that standard quantum mechanics predicts probability 1/3 for outcome A and 2/3 for outcome B, then, according to the MWI, both the world with outcome A and the world with outcome B will exist. It is senseless to ask: “What is the probability that I will get A instead of B?” because I will correspond to both “Lev”s: the one who observes A and the other one who observes B.

To solve this difficulty, Albert and Loewer 1988 proposed the Many Minds interpretation (in which the different worlds are only in the minds of sentient beings). In addition to the quantum wave of the Universe, Albert and Loewer postulate that every sentient being has a continuum of minds. Whenever the quantum wave of the Universe develops into a superposition containing states of a sentient being corresponding to different perceptions, the minds of this sentient being evolve randomly and independently to mental states corresponding to these different states of perception (with probabilities equal to the quantum probabilities for these states). In particular, whenever a measurement is performed by an observer, the observer's minds develop mental states that correspond to perceptions of the different outcomes, i.e. corresponding to the worlds A or B in our example. Since there is a continuum of minds, there will always be an infinity of minds in any sentient being and the procedure can continue indefinitely. This resolves the difficulty: each “I” corresponds to one mind and it ends up in a state corresponding to a world with a particular outcome. However, this solution comes at the price of introducing additional structure into the theory, including a genuinely random process.

Saunders 2010 claims to solve the problem without introducing additional structure into the theory. Working in the Heisenberg picture, he uses appropriate semantics and mereology according to which distinct worlds have no parts in common, not even at early times when the worlds are qualitatively identical. In the terminology of Lewis 1986 (p. 206) we have the divergence of worlds rather than overlap. Wilson 2012 develops this idea by introducing a framework called “indexicalism,” which involves a set of distinct diverging “parallel” worlds in which each observer is located in only one world and all propositions are construed as self-locating (indexical). In Wilson's words, “indexicalism allows us to vindicate treating the weights as a candidate objective probability measure”. However, it is not clear how this program can succeed since it is hard to identify diverging worlds in our experience and there is nothing in the mathematical formalism of standard quantum mechanics which can be a counterpart of diverging worlds, see also Kent 2010 (p. 345). In the next section, the weights associated with worlds are related to subjective ignorance probability.

4.2 Illusion of Probability from Post-Measurement Uncertainty

Tappenden 2011 supports the proposal for explaining how the illusion of probability arises, Vaidman1998, 2012, in which I identify the ignorance probability with the post-measurement uncertainty. It seems senseless to ask: “What is the probability that Lev in the world A will observe A?” This probability is trivially equal to 1. The task is to define the probability in such a way that we could reconstruct the prediction of the standard approach where the probability for A is 1/3. It is indeed senseless to ask you what is the probability that Lev in the world A will observe A, but this might be a meaningful question when addressed to Lev in the world of the outcome A. Under normal circumstances, the world A is created (i.e. measuring devices and objects which interact with measuring devices become localized according to the outcome A) before Lev is aware of the result A. Then, it is sensible to ask this Lev about his probability of being in world A. There is a definite outcome which this Lev will see, but he is ignorant of this outcome at the time of the question. In order to make this point vivid, I proposed an experiment in which the experimenter is given a sleeping pill before the experiment. Then, while asleep, he is moved to room A or to room B depending on the results of the experiment. When the experimenter has woken up (in one of the rooms), but before he has opened his eyes, he is asked “In which room are you?” Certainly, there is a matter of fact about which room he is in (he can learn about it by opening his eyes), but he is ignorant about this fact at the time of the question.

This construction provides the ignorance interpretation of probability, but the value of the probability has to be postulated:

Probability Postulate
An observer should set his subjective probability of the outcome of a quantum experiment in proportion to the total measure of existence of all worlds with that outcome.

This postulate (named the Born-Vaidman rule by Tappenden 2011) is a counterpart of the collapse postulate of the standard quantum mechanics according to which, after a measurement, the quantum state collapses to a particular branch with probability proportional to its squared amplitude. (See the entry on Measurement in Quantum Theory.) However, it differs in two aspects. First, it parallels only the second part of the collapse postulate, the Born Rule, and second, it is related only to part (ii) of the MWI, the connection to our experience, and not to the mathematical part of the theory (i).

The question of the probability of obtaining A also makes sense for the Lev in world B before he becomes aware of the outcome. Both “Lev”s have the same information on the basis of which they should give their answer. According to the probability postulate they will give the same answer: 1/3 (the relative measure of existence of the world A). Since Lev before the measurement is associated with two “Lev”s after the measurement who have identical ignorance probability concepts for the outcome of the experiment, I can define the probability of the outcome of the experiment to be performed as the ignorance probability of the successors of Lev for being in a world with a particular outcome.

The “sleeping pill” argument does not reduce the probability of an outcome of a quantum experiment to a familiar concept of probability in the classical context. The quantum situation is genuinely different. Since all outcomes of a quantum experiment are realized, there is no probability in the usual sense. Nevertheless, my construction leads all believers in the MWI to behave according to the following principle:

Behavior Principle
We care about all our successive worlds in proportion to their measures of existence.

With this principle our behavior should be similar to the behavior of a believer in the collapse theory who cares about possible future worlds in proportion to the probability of their occurrence.

There are other arguments supporting the Probability Postulate. In an earlier approach, Tappenden 2000 (p. 111) adopts a different semantics according to which “I” live in all branches and have “distinct experiences” in different “superslices”. He uses “weight of a superslice” instead of measure of existence and argues that it is intelligible to associate probabilities according to the Probability Postulate. Exploiting a variety of ideas in decoherence theory such as the relational theory of tense and theories of identity over time, Saunders 1998 also argues for the “identification of probability with the Hilbert Space norm” (which equals the measure of existence). Page 2003 promotes an approach named Mindless Sensationalism. The basic concept in this approach is a conscious experience. He assigns weights to different experiences depending on the quantum state of the universe, as the expectation values of presently-unknown positive operators corresponding to the experiences (similar to the measures of existence of the corresponding worlds (3)). Page writes “… experiences with greater weights exist in some sense more …” In all of these approaches, the postulate is introduced through an analogy with treatments of time, e.g., the measure of the existence of a world is analogous to the duration of a time interval. Note also Greaves 2004 who advocates the “Behavior Principle” on the basis of the decision-theoretic reflection principle related to the next section.

4.3 Probability Postulate from Decision Theory

In an ambitious work Deutsch 1999 claimed to derive the Probability Postulate from quantum formalism and classical decision theory. In Deutsch's argument the notion of probability is operationalised by being reduced to an agent's betting preferences. So an agent who is indifferent between receiving $20 on those branches where spin “up” is observed and receiving $10 on all branches by definition is deemed to give probability 1/2 to the spin-up branches. Deutsch then attempts to prove that the only rationally coherent strategy for an agent is to assign these operationalised “probabilities” to equal the quantum-mechanical branch weights. Wallace 2003, 2007, 2010b, 2012 developed this approach by making explicit the tacit assumptions in Deutsch's argument. In the most recent version of these proofs, the central assumptions are (i) the symmetry structure of unitary quantum mechanics; (ii) that an agent's preferences are consistent across time; (iii) that an agent is indifferent to the fine-grained branching structure of the world per se. Early criticisms of the Deutsch-Wallace approach focussed on circularity concerns (Barnum et al.2000, Baker 2007, Hemmo and Pitowsky 2007). As the program led to more explicit proofs, criticism turned to the decision-theoretic assumptions being made (Lewis 2010, Albert 2010, Kent 2010, Price 2010). Vaidman 2012 believes that to derive the Probability Postulate, at least some connection between the mathematical formalism of quantum mechanics and probability has to be postulated and points out that it is enough to assume that the probability of an outcome of a quantum measurement depends only on the measure of existence of the corresponding world. Thus, if all the worlds in which a particular experiment took place have equal measures of existence, then the probability of a particular outcome is simply proportional to the number of worlds with this outcome. The measures of existence of worlds are, in general, not equal, but the experimenters in all the worlds can perform additional specially tailored auxiliary measurements of some variables such that all the new worlds will have equal measures of existence. The experimenters should be completely indifferent to the results of these auxiliary measurements: their only purpose is to split the worlds into “equal-weight” worlds. This procedure reconstructs the standard quantum probability rule from the counting worlds approach; see Deutsch 1999 and Zurek 2005 for details. Another derivation is based on Gleason's 1957 theorem about the uniqueness of the probability measure. Similar conclusions can be reached from the analysis of the frequency operator originated by Hartle 1968. Note that many of these arguments can be applied in the frameworks of various interpretations of quantum mechanics, not just the MWI.

There are also more speculative proposals to deal with the issue of probability in the MWI. Weissman 1999 has proposed a modification of quantum theory with additional non-linear decoherence (and hence with even more worlds than in the standard MWI) which can lead asymptotically to worlds of equal mean measure for different outcomes. Hanson 2003, 2006 proposed decoherence dynamics in which observers of different worlds “mangle” each other such that approximate Born rule is obtained. Van Wesep 2006 used some algebraic method for deriving the probability rule. Buniy et al. 2006 used the ideas of decoherent histories approach of Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990.

5. Tests of the MWI

It has frequently been claimed, e.g. by De Witt 1970, that the MWI is in principle indistinguishable from the ideal collapse theory. This is not so. The collapse leads to effects that do not exist if the MWI is the correct theory. To observe the collapse we would need a super technology which allows for the “undoing” of a quantum experiment, including a reversal of the detection process by macroscopic devices. See Lockwood 1989 (p. 223), Vaidman 1998 (p. 257), and other proposals in Deutsch 1986. These proposals are all for gedanken experiments that cannot be performed with current or any foreseeable future technology. Indeed, in these experiments an interference of different worlds has to be observed. Worlds are different when at least one macroscopic object is in macroscopically distinguishable states. Thus, what is needed is an interference experiment with a macroscopic body. Today there are interference experiments with larger and larger objects (e.g., fullerene molecules C70, see Brezger et al. 2002 ), but these objects are still not large enough to be considered “macroscopic”. Such experiments can only refine the constraints on the boundary where the collapse might take place. A decisive experiment should involve the interference of states which differ in a macroscopic number of degrees of freedom: an impossible task for today's technology. It can be argued, however, that the burden of an experimental proof lies with the opponents of the MWI, because it is they who claim that there is a new physics beyond the well tested Schrödinger equation. As the analysis of Schlosshauerl 2006 shows, we have no such evidence.

The MWI is wrong if there is a physical process of collapse of the wave function of the Universe to a single-world quantum state. Some ingenious proposals for such a process have been made (see Pearle 1986 and the entry on collapse theories). These proposals (and Weissman's 1999 non-linear decoherence idea) have additional observable effects, such as a tiny energy non-conservation, that were tested in several experiments, e.g. Collett et al. 1995. The effects were not found and some (but not all!) of these models have been ruled out, see Adler and Bassi 2009.

Much of the experimental evidence for quantum mechanics is statistical in nature. Greaves and Myrvold 2010 made a careful study showing that our experimental data from quantum experiments supports the Probability Postulate of the MWI no less than it supports the Born rule in other approaches to quantum mechanics. Thus, statistical analysis of quantum experiments should not help us testing the MWI, but I might mention speculative cosmological arguments in support of the MWI by Page 1999, Kragh 2009, Aguirre and Tegmark 2011, and Tipler 2012.

6. Objections to the MWI

Some of the objections to the MWI follow from misinterpretations due to the multitude of various MWIs. The terminology of the MWI can be confusing: “world” is “universe” in Deutsch 1996, while “universe” is “multiverse”. There are two very different approaches with the same name “The Many-Minds Interpretation (MMI)”. The MMI of Albert and Loewer 1988 mentioned above should not be confused with the MMI of Lockwood et al. 1996 (which resembles the approach of Zeh 1981). Further, the MWI in the Heisenberg representation, Deutsch 2002, differs significantly from the MWI presented in the Schrödinger representation (used here). The MWI presented here is very close to Everett's original proposal, but in the entry on Everett's relative state formulation of quantum mechanics, as well as in his book, Barrett 1999, uses the name “MWI” for the splitting worlds view publicized by De Witt 1970. This approach has been justly criticized: it has both some kind of collapse (an irreversible splitting of worlds in a preferred basis) and the multitude of worlds. Now I will consider some objections in detail.

6.1 Ockham's Razor

It seems that the majority of the opponents of the MWI reject it because, for them, introducing a very large number of worlds that we do not see is an extreme violation of Ockham's principle: “Entities are not to be multiplied beyond necessity”. However, in judging physical theories one could reasonably argue that one should not multiply physical laws beyond necessity either (such a version of Ockham's Razor has been applied in the past), and in this respect the MWI is the most economical theory. Indeed, it has all the laws of the standard quantum theory, but without the collapse postulate, which is the most problematic of the physical laws. The MWI is also more economic than Bohmian mechanics ,which has in addition the ontology of the particle trajectories and the laws which give their evolution. Tipler 1986 (p. 208) has presented an effective analogy with the criticism of Copernican theory on the grounds of Ockham's razor.

One might also consider a possible philosophical advantage of the plurality of worlds in the MWI, similar to that claimed by realists about possible worlds, such as Lewis 1986 (see the discussion of the analogy between the MWI and Lewis's theory by Skyrms 1976). However, the analogy is not complete: Lewis' theory considers all logically possible worlds, far more than all the worlds that are incorporated in the quantum state of the Universe.

6.2 The Problem of Preferred Basis

A common criticism of the MWI stems from the fact that the formalism of quantum theory allows infinitely many ways to decompose the quantum state of the Universe into a superposition of orthogonal states. The question arises: “Why choose the particular decomposition (2) and not any other?” Since other decompositions might lead to a very different picture, the whole construction seems to lack predictive power.

The locality of physical interactions defines the preferred basis. As described in Section 3.5, only localized states of macroscopic objects are stable. And indeed, due to the extensive research on decoherence, the problem of preferred basis is not considered as a serious objection anymore, see Wallace 2010a. Singling out position as a preferred variable for solving the preferred basis problem might be considered as a weakness, but on the other hand, it is implausible that out of a mathematical theory of vectors in Hilbert space one can derive what our world should be. (So it is not surprising that Schwindt 2012 could not do it.) We have to add some ingredients to our theory and adding locality, the property of all known physical interactions, seems to be very natural. Position as a preferred variable is not an ontological claim (as options discussed in the next section), but it helps to build a bridge between the ontology of quantum mechanics and our experience.

6.3 The Wave Function is not Enough

As mentioned above, the gap between the mathematical formalism of the MWI, namely the wave function of the Universe, and our experience is larger than in other interpretations. This is the reason why many thought that the ontology of the wave function is not enough. Bell 1987 (p.201) felt that either the wave function is not everything, or it is not right. He was looking for a theory with local “beables”. Many followed Bell in search of a “primitive ontology” in 3+1 space-time, see Allorri et al. 2014.

A particular reason why the wave function of the Universe cannot be the whole ontology lies in the argument, led by Maudlin 2010, that this is a wrong type of object. The wave function of the Universe is defined in 3N dimensional configuration space, while we need an entity in 3+1 space-time (like the primitive ontology), see discussion by Albert 1996, Lewis 2004, Monton 2006, Ney 2012. Addition of “primitive ontology” to the wave function of the Universe helps us understand our experience, but complicates the mathematical part of the theory. It is not necessary. The expectation values of the density of each particle in space-time, which is the concept derived from the wave functions corresponding to different worlds, can play the role of “primitive ontology”. Since interactions between particles are local in space, this is what is needed for finding causal connections ending at our experience. The density of particles is gauge independent and also properly transforms between different Lorentz observers. Thus, explanation of our experience is unaffected by the “narratability failure” problem of Albert 2013: the wave function description might be different for different Lorentz observers, but the description in terms of densities of particles is the same. Note also an alternative approach based on 3+1 space-time by Wallace and Timpson 2010 who, being dissatisfied with the wave function ontology, introduced the Spacetime State Realism.

6.4 Derivation of the Probability Postulate

A popular criticism of the MWI in the past, see Belinfante 1975, which was recently repeated by Putnam 2005, is based on the naive derivation of the probability of an outcome of a quantum experiment as being proportional to the number of worlds with this outcome. Such a derivation leads to the wrong predictions, but accepting the idea of probability being proportional to the measure of existence of a world resolves this problem. Although this involves adding a postulate, we do not complicate the mathematical part (i) of the theory since we do not change the ontology, namely, the wave function. It is a postulate belonging to part (ii), the connection to our experience, and it is a very natural postulate: differences in the mathematical descriptions of worlds are manifest in our experience, see Saunders 1998.

Another criticism related to probability follows from the claim, apparently made by Everett himself and later by many other proponents of the MWI, see De Witt 1970, that the Probability Postulate can be derived just from the formalism of the MWI. Unfortunately, the criticism of this derivation (which might well be correct) is considered to be a criticism of the MWI, see Kent 1990. The recent revival of this claim involving decision theory, Deutsch 1999, which also encountered strong criticism (see Section 4.4), drew negative publicity to the MWI. It might be that the MWI has no advantage over other interpretations insofar as the derivation of the Born rule is concerned, but it also has no disadvantage, so criticism on these grounds is not founded, see Papineau 2010.

The issue, named by Wallace 2003 as the “incoherence” probability problem, is arguably the most serious difficulty. How to talk about probability when all possible outcomes happen? This led Saunders and Wallace 2008a to introduce uncertainty to the MWI. However, Section 4.2 shows how one can explain the illusion of probability of an observer in a world, while the Universe incorporating all the worlds remains deterministic. Albert 2010 argues that the probability I introduce appears too late. Vaidman 2012 answers Albert by viewing the probability as the value of a rational bet on a particular result. The results of the betting of the experimenter are relevant for his successors emerging after performing the experiment in different worlds. Since the experimenter is related to all of his successors and they all have identical rational strategies for betting, then this should also be the strategy of the experimenter before the experiment.

6.5 Social Behavior of a Believer in the MWI

There are claims that a believer in the MWI will behave in an irrational way. One claim is based on the naive argument described in the previous section: a believer who assigns equal probabilities to all different worlds will make equal bets for the outcomes of quantum experiments that have unequal probabilities.

Another claim, Lewis 2000, is related to the strategy of a believer in the MWI who is offered to play a quantum Russian roulette game. The argument is that I, who would not accept an offer to play a classical Russian roulette game, should agree to play the roulette any number of times if the triggering occurs according to the outcome of a quantum experiment. Indeed, at the end, there will be one world in which Lev is a multi-millionaire and in all other worlds there will be no Lev Vaidman alive. Thus, in the future, Lev will be a rich and presumably happy man.

However, adopting the Probability Postulate leads all believers in the MWI to behave according to the Behavior Principle and with this principle our behavior is similar to the behavior of a believer in the collapse theory who cares about possible future worlds according to the probability of their occurrence. I should not agree to play quantum Russian roulette because the measure of existence of worlds with Lev dead will be much larger than the measure of existence of the worlds with a rich and alive Lev.

Although in most situations the Behavior Principle makes the MWI believer act in the usual way, there are some situations in which a belief in the MWI might cause a change in a social behaviour, Vaidman 1990 (Section 16). If I decided to fill a lottery ticket, I can toss a coin several times to get a random number and hope to win the prize, or I can split the world several times using the Quantum World Splitter such that every number will be filled by Lev Vaidman at least in one world in our Universe, so I can be sure that there will be a Lev Vaidman with the big prize. The choice, however, is not obvious, since in choosing the quantum coin I also make sure that there will be many worlds in which I lost. (Albrecht and Phillips 2012 claim that even a toss of a regular coin splits the world, so there is no need for a quantum splitter.)

7. Why the MWI?

The reason for adopting the MWI is that it avoids the collapse of the quantum wave. (Other no-collapse theories are not better than MWI for various reasons, e.g., nonlocality of Bohmian mechanics; and the disadvantage of all of them is that they have some additional structure.) The collapse postulate is a physical law that differs from all known physics in two aspects: it is genuinely random and it involves some kind of action at a distance. According to the collapse postulate the outcome of a quantum experiment is not determined by the initial conditions of the Universe prior to the experiment: only the probabilities are governed by the initial state. There is no experimental evidence in favor of collapse and against the MWI. We need not assume that Nature plays dice: science has stronger explanatory power. The MWI is a deterministic theory for a physical Universe and it explains why a world appears to be indeterministic for human observers.

The MWI allows for a local explanation of our Universe. The most celebrated example of nonlocality given by Bell 1964 in the context of the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument cannot get off the ground in the framework of the MWI because it requires a predetermined single outcome of a quantum experiment, see discussion in Bacciagaluppi 2002 . There is no action at a distance in our Universe, but there is an entanglement. And a “world” is a nonlocal concept. This explains why we observe non-local correlations in a particular world.

Deutsch 2012 claims to provide an alternative vindication of quantum locality using a quantum information framework. This approach started with Deutsch and Hayden 2000 analyzing the flow of quantum information using the Heisenberg picture. After discussions by Rubin 2001 and Deutsch 2002, Hewitt-Horsman and Vedral 2007 analyzed the uniqueness of the physical picture of the information flow. Timpson 2005 and Wallace and Timpson 2007 questioned the locality demonstration in this approach and the meaning of the locality claim was clarified in Deutsch 2012. Rubin 2011 suggested that this approach might provide a simpler route toward generalization of the MWI of quantum mechanics to the MWI of field theory.

The MWI resolves most, if not all, paradoxes of quantum mechanics (e.g., Schrödinger cat), see Vaidman 1994. A physical paradox is a phenomenon contradicting our intuition. The laws of physics govern the Universe incorporating all the worlds and this is why, when we limit ourselves to a single world, we may run into a paradox. An example is getting information about a region from where no particle ever came using the interaction-free measurement of Elitzur and Vaidman 1993. Indeed, on the scale of the Universe there is no paradox: in other worlds particles were in that region.

Vaidman 2001 finds it advantageous to think about all worlds together even in analysing a controversial issue of classical probability theory, Sleeping Beauty Problem. Accepting the Probability Postulate reduces the analysis of probability to a calculation of the measures of existence of various worlds. Note, however, that the Quantum Sleeping Beauty also became a topic of a hot controversy: Lewis 2007, Papineau and Durà-Vilà 2009, Bradley 2011, Wilson 2013, Schwarz 2012, Groisman et al. 2013.

The strongest proponents of the MWI can be found among cosmologists, e.g., Aguirre and Tegmark 2011. In quantum cosmology the MWI allows for discussion of the whole Universe, thereby avoiding the difficulty of the standard interpretation which requires an external observer. Recently, Bousso and Susskind 2012 argued that even considerations in the framework of string theory lead to the MWI.

Another community where the majority favors the MWI is that of the researchers in quantum information. In quantum computing, the key issue is the parallel processing performed on the same computer; this is very similar to the basic picture of the MWI. Recently the usefulness of the MWI for explaining the speedup of quantum computation has been questioned: Steane 2003, Duwell 2007, and Cuffaro 2012. It is not that the quantum computation cannot be understood without the framework of the MWI; rather, it is just easier to think about quantum algorithms as parallel computations performed in parallel worlds, Deutsch and Jozsa 1992. There is no way to use all the information obtained in all parallel computations — the quantum computer algorithm is a method in which the outcomes of all calculations interfere, yielding the desired result. The cluster-state quantum computer also performs parallel computations, although it is harder to see how we get the final result. The criticism follows from identifying the computational worlds with decoherent worlds. Quantum computer process has no decoherence and the preferred basis is chosen to be the computational basis.

Recent studies suggest that some of the fathers of quantum mechanics held views close to the MWI: Allori et al. 2011 say this about Schrödinger, and Becker 2004 about von Neumann. At the birth of the MWI Wheeler 1957 wrote: “No escape seems possible from this relative state formulation if one wants to have a complete mathematical model for the quantum mechanics ...” Since then, the MWI struggles against the Copenhagen interpretation, see Byrne 2010, gaining some legitimacy only in recent years Deutsch 1996, Bevers 2011, and Barrett 2011. The current controversial status of the MWI can be learned from the very diverse opinions in the talks of its 50th anniversary celebrations: Oxford 2007, Perimeter 2007 .


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I am thankful to everybody who has borne with me through endless discussions of the MWI (in this and other worlds) and I acknowledge partial support by grant 1125/10 of the Israel Science Foundation.

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