Locke on Real Essence

First published Wed Dec 19, 2012; substantive revision Wed Jun 4, 2014

The technical term ‘real essence’ is introduced into the philosophical lexicon by the English philosopher John Locke (1632–1704) in his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding[1] (hereafter “Essay”) that was first published in London, in December of 1689. In order to understand a great many of Locke's arguments in Books III and IV of the Essay, it is important to understand what a real essence is. Thus, the purpose of this entry is to explain the various interpretations of ‘real essence’ that are in the current literature. Another reason why this matters is that the concept of ‘real essence’ (or variations of it) has been at the center of much of the philosophical debate over natural kind realism since the time of Locke, so some of this entry can serve as an historical introduction to that debate as well.

Very simply stated, a real essence, for Locke, is what makes something what it is, and in the case of physical substances, it is the underlying physical cause of the object's observable qualities (unless otherwise noted, we shall confine our discussion in this article to the real essences of material substances). A nominal essence, on the other hand, is an abstract idea that we make when we identify similar qualities shared by objects; the nominal essence is the idea of those shared similarities. The distinction between real and nominal essences plays an important semantic role in Book III and an important epistemological role in Book IV of the Essay. The semantic role will be discussed more below, but in a nutshell, Locke argues in Book III that words have meaning only insofar as we can attach ideas to them. Since nominal essences are the abstract ideas we use to name and distinguish the species or genera of things, the meanings of our species or genera terms just are abstract ideas. For example, a common idea of penguins is of short, black and white flightless waterfowl. That abstract idea is the meaning of the word ‘penguin’. By contrast, Locke goes on to argue, we have no ideas of real essences and so our species or genus terms refer to the nominal essences, not to the real essences (II.xxxi.6; citations to Locke's Essay are given as book, chapter, section; so Book II, chapter xxxi, section 6 is given as “II.xxxi.6”).

Regarding knowledge, in Book IV Locke argues that knowledge is real only if our ideas correspond to their archetypes in the appropriate way. Scientific knowledge occurs when our nominal essence ideas match the real essences. According to Locke, in mathematics and morality the nominal and real essences are the same. That is, the definitions of mathematical or moral concepts constitute both the nominal and real essences of those concepts. For that reason it is possible to have a human science of mathematics and morality. In the case of substances, however, the real and nominal essences are always different, and so there is no possible human science of substances (IV.vi.12–16).

1. Essences of Substances: Real and Nominal

The canonical definition of the real essences is given in III.iii.15, where Locke contrasts his ‘real essences’ with what he calls ‘nominal essences’:

First, Essence may be taken for the very being of any thing, whereby it is, what it is. And thus the real internal, but generally in Substances, unknown Constitution of Things, whereon their discoverable Qualities depend, may be called their EssenceSecondly,…it being evident, that Things are ranked under Names into sorts or Species, only as they agree to certain abstract Ideas, to which we have annexed those Names, the Essence of each Genus, or Sort, comes to be nothing but that abstract Idea, which the General, or Sortal (if I may have leave so to call it from Sort, as I do General from Genus,) Name stands for. And this we shall find to be that, which the Word Essence imports, in its most familiar use. These two sorts of Essences, I suppose, may not unfitly be termed, the one the Real, the other the Nominal Essence.

Real essences are the submicroscopic constitutions which cause the observable qualities of substances, and the nominal essences are the abstract ideas that constitute the definitions of species or genera. To flesh this out a little more clearly we must define a few more terms.

Locke defines the ‘quality’ of any substance as “the Power to produce any Idea in our mind” (II.viii.8). There are three categories of qualities according to the mechanical natural philosophy. Primary qualities are the inseparable features of a body, e.g., its size, shape, solidity, mobility, texture, weight, etc. (II.viii.9). Secondary qualities are the colors, sounds, smells, tastes, etc., of any object. These are secondary because these features of objects do not exist in the objects themselves, but rather are nothing but the power of the primary qualities of the object to produce an idea in us of a certain kind (II.viii.10). So, for example, the color of the table is not in the table, rather, it is part of how the matter and texture of the table (i.e., its primary qualities), as it reflects, absorbs and refracts light, has the power to produce ideas in us of that color. Finally, the tertiary qualities of a body are those powers in it that, by virtue of its primary qualities, give it the power to produce observable changes in the primary qualities of other bodies, e.g., the power of the sun to melt wax is a tertiary quality of the sun (II.viii.23).

When one creates a nominal essence, one is cobbling together a collection of particular qualities—from among these three kinds of qualities—that one observes together in a substance and making that collection definitive of a species or genus. Having said that, I should point out that when Locke thinks of a species or genus, he is not thinking of these terms as applying exclusively in the biological realm, but rather as applying generally to any possible classification scheme we create when we organize our world through naming. So, for example, gold is as much a species of the genus metal as human is a species of the genus animal.

The term ‘nominal’ refers to names or naming, and is used by Locke to indicate that classifying substances based on their similar qualities is an exercise in naming. For example, the nominal essence of gold is the abstract idea that constitutes our definition of ‘gold’, i.e., yellowish, heavy, malleable metal that can be dissolved in Aqua Regia, but not in sulfuric acid, etc. According to Locke, the nominal essence contains the properties that give meaning to the name ‘gold’ and allow us to know what gold is wherever we find it. What makes the nominal essence an essence is that it contains both the necessary and sufficient conditions for something to belong to its species or genus. Because of how gold is defined, every yellowish, heavy, malleable metal that dissolves in water and hydrochloric acid and not in sulfuric acid, is gold.

In this way, nominal essences are created by human choice: we decide what we want to include in our definitions of species or genera. To borrow from Locke, species are “the workmanship of the understanding”, not of nature.

I would not here be thought to forget, much less to deny, that Nature in the Production of Things, makes several of them alike: there is nothing more obvious, especially in the Races of Animals, and all Things propagated by Seed. But yet, I think, we may say, the sorting of them under Names, is the Workmanship of the Understanding, taking occasion from the similitude it observes amongst them, to make abstract general Ideas, and set them up in the mind, with Names annexed to them, as Patterns, or Forms, (for in that sence the word Form has a very proper signification,) to which, as particular Things existing are found to agree, so they come to be of that Species, have that Denomination, or are put into that Classis. (III.iii.13)

Nature provides us with similarities and we create definitions of species and genera. However, no matter how dependent general names are on our definitions, we are answerable to nature and must keep our definitions as close as we can to what nature provides. It is in this sense that species and genera are the workmanship of the human understanding; we take what nature gives us and we create our own definitions and taxonomical categories.

On the other hand, a real essence is an essence because it makes the object to be what it is. It is real in that it does not include human choice for it to be what it is, rather, it is precisely as nature made it. In the case of a piece of gold, the real essence is that collection of particles that make up that particular piece of gold and give it its qualities of color, weight, electrical conductivity, malleability, etc..

2. Polemics: Real and Nominal Essences vs. Scholastic Substantial Forms

Locke's above definition of real and nominal essences is given as a critical response to the Aristotelian influenced Scholasticism of the late medieval and early renaissance natural philosophy. Locke's distinction between real and nominal essences appears to be in reference to the Aristotelian distinction between real and nominal definitions. A real definition, according to the Aristotelian tradition, is one that accords with the natural hierarchy and identifies the essence of the species or genus being studied, e.g., ‘man is the rational animal’ (reason being the essence of the species, animal being the genus). A nominal definition, by contrast, is a pseudo-definition that identifies the members of the species or genus, but fails to capture the essence, e.g., ‘man is the featherless biped’. A science of nature, for Aristotle and the Scholastics, consists of real definitions and not mere nominal ones. While Locke agrees that a science requires knowledge of essences, and thus of species, he differs from the Aristotelians by arguing that there are no real definitions of substances, but there are of moral and mathematical concepts (see Ayers 1996, Locke, vol. II, pp. 18–30).

According to the Scholastic way of understanding the term ‘essence’, it refers to what makes a thing what it is:

Concerning the real Essences of corporeal Substances, (to mention those only,) there are, if I mistake not, two Opinions. The one is of those, who using the Word Essence, for they know not what, suppose a certain number of those Essences, according to which, all natural things are made, and wherein they do exactly every one of them partake, and so become of this or that Species. (III.iii.17)

The Scholastic concept of essence, or what is more properly called a ‘substantial form’, is of an imperceptible, immaterial essence that imposes order onto the matter that it is joined with and makes it a member of a natural species or genus, imbuing it with all of its relevant characteristics, i.e., its essential properties. Essential properties are those features that tell us to what species or genus an object belongs, e.g., being warm blooded is an essential property of mammals, being rational is an essential property of humans, being yellowish and heavy are essential properties of gold. Each of these essential properties is caused by the substantial form that is conjoined with the matter of the substance to make it what it is.

In this way, then, the substantial form of any object in the Scholastic theory plays two roles: it (a) tells us to what species the substance belongs; and (b) it causes the observable qualities and properties of the substance. For example, according to the Scholastic theory, a lump of gold is an instance of gold because its matter possesses the substantial form of gold which causes all of the properties of gold, e.g., malleability, yellowish color, heaviness, etc..

By contrast, however, Locke does not think of the essence of a physical object as an immaterial substantial form, nor does he think that a single entity can play both roles of determining the species or genus membership of a substance and be the unobservable underlying cause of the qualities of the substance. Instead, Locke divides up the concept of essence into two different concepts playing two distinct roles. First, he defines the real essence of physical objects as the internal constitution of the substance that is the cause of the observable qualities of the object. He then argues that this internal constitution is not what answers the ‘what is it?’ question because the species membership of physical beings is only determined by their outward appearance, i.e., by their nominal essences. Second, he defines the nominal essence as that collection of observable qualities that are included in the definition of the species or genus. This process has three stages; we create an abstract idea based on similarities among objects, we then give a name to that abstract idea, and finally we classify objects that fit our abstract idea into the same species or genus. So, for Locke, the real essence plays role (b), that is, the causal and explanatory role of being the physical cause of the properties and qualities of each substance; but only the nominal essence plays role (a), that is, the nominal essence alone determines its species or genus membership. The chart below illustrates this division of labor:

a) Determines Species/Genus Membership

b) Causes/Explains Observable Qualities

Scholastics

Substantial Form

Substantial Form

Locke

Nominal Essence

Real Essence

One of Locke's main purposes in making this distinction is to deploy them in his criticisms of the Scholastic account of (a), the species of natural substances. However, when criticizing the Scholastic account of (b), the explanation of the qualities of bodies, Locke typically refrains from invoking the concept of ‘real essence’ and instead talks about the primary, secondary and tertiary qualities of bodies (see, for example II.viii.10–26). So, at a minimum, it seems that Locke invoked this distinction between real and nominal essences in order to prove a negative point: real essences are not relevant to role (a).

As noted above, according to the Scholastics, species and genera are created by nature; every natural substance is a combination of matter and substantial form. Matter, on its own, is inert and does not cause anything. By contrast, the substantial form of any substance is its species essence, which is an immaterial entity that makes the object what it is, makes it a member of a particular species and genus and causes its characteristic properties. So, for the Scholastics, all natural substances belong to a determinate species by nature, independently of any human naming activities. On this view then, if we know what qualities a substance possesses, and we know that all qualities are produced by a substantial form, then it is a simple matter to determine its species simply by noting the qualities the substance exhibits. For example, if what makes a particular object a piece of gold is the possession of the substantial form of gold, then whatever exhibits the properties of gold has the substantial form of gold, and so we know the species to which it belongs is gold. Creating a taxonomy for the Scholastics is attempting to discover how nature has already classified substances into species and genera by looking for similarities among their persistent qualities (qualities that tend to remain even when the circumstances or conditions of the object change) that reveal the deeper similarity of sharing substantial forms.

By distinguishing between real and nominal essences, Locke can deploy these new concepts in a sustained critique of the Scholastic theory of species. Locke offers three main arguments against the Scholastic view.

First, he deploys the corpuscularian hypothesis against the Scholastics to argue that ‘borderline cases’ create a serious challenge to their doctrine of substantial forms, but which are allowed for, and even explained by, corpuscularian principles. By his lights, if we assume that nature produces substances by imposing a substantial form (what Locke mockingly calls ‘moulds and forms’), or species essence onto them, then the existence of entities that do not fit into any single species shows us at least that not all beings are produced according to natural moulds and forms:

[The opinion] which supposes these Essences, as a certain number of Forms or Molds, wherein all natural Things, that exist, are cast, and do equally partake, has, I imagine, very much perplexed the Knowledge of natural Things. The frequent Productions of Monsters, in all the Species of Animals, and of Changelings, and other strange Issues of humane Birth, carry with them difficulties, not possible to consist with this Hypothesis: Since it is as impossible, that two Things, partaking exactly of the same real Essence, should have different Properties, as that two Figures partaking in the same real Essence of a Circle, should have different Properties. (III.iii.17)

If nature made species or genera by giving all members of the same kind the same form or mould (or, he seems to suggest above, real essence), then there would be no way to explain generative variation in nature (he reiterates this kind of argument in III.vi.15–17) or the differences between samples of the same species of chemicals or minerals. On the other hand, if nature makes real essences, which are material structures that cause the observable qualities of each substance, then these kinds of variations can be explained by variations among the physical structures of the bodies (see Jolley 1999, pp. 144–50).

Secondly, as we saw above, Locke adduces the semantic point that our general terms (and their corresponding ideas), being human constructs via the process of abstraction, constitute the (nominal) essences of things, not some immaterial substantial form: “Whereby it is evident, that the Essences of the sorts, or (if the Latin word pleases better) Species of Things, are nothing else but these abstract Ideas” (III.iii.12). Abstract ideas are formed when we take a set of objects and mentally strip away enough particular ideas to reveal what properties they all have in common. The resulting ideas are purely mental constructions; the putative substantial forms of the objects are irrelevant to this process. Therefore, essences and species are human constructs, not the products of nature, i.e., they are purely nominal.

Locke's third argument rests on the Scholastic's assumption that nature produces many things alike. The natural production of physically similar entities, however, is a double-edged sword. Nature not only produces similarities among objects, but it produces far too many similarities. That is, among the vast array of similar qualities that objects share we must select those few which we take to be important enough to constitute the meaning of the general term and thereby constitute the species or genus. This selection process is not something that nature can do, only we can decide which qualities are important enough to count as part of the definition of a species or genus.

By introducing the distinction between real and nominal essences and thereby dividing their roles, Locke has provided himself with a number of resources to criticize the Scholastic theory of species.

3. Historical Antecedents: Bacon and Boyle

While the concept and definition of ‘real essence’ is original with Locke, at least a generation before him there were Englishmen who defended non-Scholastic taxonomical theories that employed material structures, either atomic or corpuscularian structures, to play both roles (a) and (b), and therefore serve as the essences of physical substances. One notable example is from Sir Francis Bacon.

In Book II §§i–vii of The New Organon (1620), Bacon seems to give a version of corpuscular natural kinds by redefining the concept of ‘formal cause’ as both the material structure of bodies and the laws that govern the natural effects of these structures that accounts for their species and genus membership. For example, in II.ii he says,

For though nothing exists in nature except individual bodies which exhibit pure individual acts [powers] in accordance with law…It is this law and its clauses which we understand by the term Forms…. (Bacon 1620, 103)

And later in II.iii: “But he who knows forms comprehends the unity of nature in very different materials” (Bacon 1620, 103). These Baconian forms, as they constitute the powers of material bodies, divide nature into two classes of material structures: the elements (what he calls ‘major associations’) and the genera and species of natural bodies (his ‘minor associations’):

We want elements to be understood in the sense not of the prime qualities of things, but of the major constituents of natural bodies. For the nature of things is so distributed that the quantity or mass of certain bodies is very great, because their structure requires the texture of an easy and common material…But the quantity of certain other bodies in the universe is small and occurs rarely, because the texture of their matter is very different, very subtle and for the most part delimited and organic; such are the species of natural things, metals, plants, animals. (Bacon 1620, 226)

According to Bacon, more general material structures convene to create larger—and more sparse—bodies, and given the laws of nature that correlate powers to these structures, these bodies have their natures and belong to a species or genus due to the structures and causal powers of their constituent parts. Baconian forms exhibit the two features of what me might call ‘corpuscular forms’: material structures plus the laws of nature combine to cause and explain the properties of bodies and determine their species membership.[2]

Similarly, in the Origine of Formes and Qualities, Robert Boyle employs the concept of a material essence when he argues for the existence of corpuscular forms that do all the same philosophical and explanatory work as both the real and nominal essences:

…why may we not say, that the Form of a Body, being made up of those Qualities united in one Subject, doth likewise consist in such a Convention of those newly nam'd Mechanical Affections of Matter, as is necessary to constitute a Body of that Determinate kind. And so, though I shall for brevities sake retain the word Forme, yet I would be understood to mean by it, not a Real Substance distinct from Matter, but onely the Matter it self of a Natural Body, consider'd with its peculiar manner of Existence [corpuscular structure], which I think may not inconveniently be call'd either its Specifical or its Denominating State, or its Essential Modification, or, if you would have me express it in one word, its Stamp: for such a Convention of Accidents is sufficient to perform the Offices that are necessarily requir'd in what Men call a Forme, since it makes the body such as it is, making it appertain to this or that Determinate Species of Bodies, and discriminating it from all other Species of Bodies whatsoever…. (Boyle 1666, p. 324.)

That is, Boylean corpuscular forms both cause and explain the qualities of bodies and sort natural bodies into species based on the structure of the matter and the laws binding qualities to the specific structures.[3]

So, we see that there are corpuscular versions of natural kind realism afoot in early seventeenth-century England where both roles of determining the species or genus membership and of causing and explaining the observable qualities are played by the same entity: corpuscular structure. The degree to which Locke agrees with, rejects or even engages with these views is a matter of scholarly controversy.

Nevertheless, we can say that, just as with the Scholastic natural philosophy, there were adherents to the mechanical natural philosophy who postulated a single entity to play both the causal and classificatory roles; we can call these philosophers ‘corpuscular realists’ and we may say that they argue for the existence of what we might call ‘corpuscular species’, i.e., species created by nature by corpuscular forms. By contrast, again, Locke objects to this general approach for the creation of a scientific taxonomy:

Nor indeed can we rank, and sort Things, and consequently (which is the end of sorting) denominate them by their real Essences, because we know them not. Our Faculties carry us no farther towards the knowledge and distinction of Substances, than a Collection of those sensible Ideas, which we observe in them; which however made with the greatest diligence and exactness, we are capable of, yet is more remote from the true internal Constitution, from which those Qualities flow, than, as I said, a Countryman's Idea is from the inward contrivance of that famous Clock at Strasburg, whereof he only sees the outward Figure and Motions. (III.vi.9)

If we have no knowledge of real essences, then there is no way to use real essences in our sorting practice. Moreover, as he alludes at the end of the quotation, in order for a general inference about the internal constitutions of substances to be justified, we would have to know a lot more about the causal connections between the internal constitution and what we observe than we do:

…it is impossible for us to know, that this or that quality or Idea has a necessary connexion with a real Essence, of which we have no Idea at all, whatever Species that supposed real Essence may be imagined to constitute. (IV.vi.5)

The differences between Locke and the natural kind realists from among the ranks of the corpuscularians can be illustrated by the following chart:

a) Determines Species/Genus Membership

b) Causes/Explains Observable Qualities

Scholastics

Substantial Form

Substantial Form

Corpuscular Realists

Corpuscular Form

Corpuscular Form

Locke

Nominal Essences

Real Essences

There are Locke scholars who (though this is controversial) argue that Locke uses this distinction between real and nominal essences to criticize the taxonomical theories of both the Scholastics and those mechanistic natural philosophers who invoke corpuscular species forms (see Jones 2010, pp. 147–172).

It is universally agreed that Locke thinks that we sort things into species and genera based on nominal essences and species and genera are a kind of human linguistic categorization process. On the other hand, one might think, Locke has no reason to reject natural kinds (which concern the metaphysics of nature, and not the meanings of names) simply because our sorting process is arbitrary. In other words, there are those who argue that Locke was a natural kind realist, even though he was convinced that taxonomies are the workmanship of the understanding. Whether Locke thinks that there are natural kinds, i.e., types of real essences independently of human sorting activities, is an interpretive issue we shall address in 4.3 below.

4. Interpretive Issues

In this section, I discuss four main areas of interpretive dispute concerning real essences: (i) relativized real essences; (ii) individual real essences; (iii) real essences and natural kinds; and (iv) real essences, internal constitutions and substance.

4.1. Relativized Real Essences

There are two main interpretations of real essences in the literature: the relativized real essence thesis, according to which a real essence just is whatever microstructure causes the nominally essential qualities of the object; and (for lack of a better name) the unrelativized real essence thesis, whereby the real essences consist of the total microstructure of the substance, not just the features causally responsible for the nominal essence. Textual evidence for the relativized real essence thesis comes from III.vi.6:

By this real Essence, I mean, that real constitution of any Thing, which is the foundation of all those Properties, that are combined in, and are constantly found to co-exist with the nominal Essence; that particular constitution, which every Thing has within it self, without any relation to any thing without it. But Essence, even in this sense, relates to a Sort, and supposes a Species: For being that real Constitution, on which the Properties depend, it necessarily supposes a sort of Things, Properties belonging only to Species, and not to Individuals…Here are Essences and Properties, but all upon supposition of a Sort, or general abstract Idea, which is considered as immutable: but there is no individual parcel of Matter, to which any of these Qualities are so annexed, as to be essential to it, or inseparable from it. That which is essential, belongs to it as a Condition, whereby it is of this or that Sort: But take away the consideration of its being ranked under the name of some abstract Idea, and then there is nothing necessary to it, nothing inseparable from it. [4]

Some Locke scholars take this to imply that the real essence is always relativized to the nominal essence for Locke. If properties belong only to species—not to individuals—and real essences are defined as the real constitution of a thing that is the foundation of its properties, then it seems to follow that the real essence of a thing is defined in relation to the species to which the thing belongs.

Critics of the relativized real essence interpretation of the Essay will point out that if real essences are only for sorted substances, then Locke ought to consistently use the term ‘real essence’ whenever referring to the submicroscopic structure of sorted individuals. However, in II.xxiii.37 Locke uses ‘internal constitution,’ not ‘real essence’ to refer to the causal ground of the nominally essential qualities of gold:

…the greatest part of the Ideas, that make our complex Idea of Gold, are Yellowness, great Weight, Ductility, Fusibility, and Solubility, in Aqua Regia, etc. all united together in an unknown Substratum; all which Ideas, are nothing else, but so many relations to other Substances; and are not really in the Gold, considered barely in it self, though they depend on those real, and primary Qualities of its internal constitution, whereby it has a fitness, differently to operate, and be operated on by several other Substances.

These powers he lists are nominally essential properties of gold, but since Locke refers to their causal ground as an ‘internal constitution’ and not as a ‘real essence,’ one might argue, it seems that ‘real essence’ is not uniquely employed to designate the submicroscopic foundation of the powers included within the nominal essence.

Moreover, critics of the relativized real essence interpretation will likely focus on the part of (III.vi.6) that seems to bracket off all nominally essential qualities from a real essence: “By this real Essence, I mean, that real constitution of any Thing…which every Thing has within it self, without any relation to any thing without it.” That is, one might argue that if we can consider a real essence all by itself, independently of any relations to other objects or observers, then real essences are not relativized to nominal essences because we can consider a real essence without reference to “any relation to anything without it” and nominally essential qualities require relations to observers.

There are important issues here that a consistent and plausible interpretation of Locke on real essences must take into account. How one does so will impact what one may say with respect to the possibility of real essences for individual objects in Locke.

4.2. Individual Real Essences

A related, but importantly distinct issue, concerns the possibility of real essences for individuals. On the one hand, if every object has an underlying physical constitution, then there seems to be no problem with thinking of individuals has possessing real essences. On the other hand, if real essences are only for sorted individuals, then there are no real essences for individuals until we have classified them by a nominal essence; until an individual is sorted, it only has an internal constitution, not a real essence. If one adopts the relativized real essence interpretation of the Essay, then there are no real essences for unsorted individuals. If, however, one adopts the unrelativized real essence interpretation, then it appears possible that Locke could think that unsorted individuals have a real essence and not just an internal constitution.

Of course, in III.vi.4 Locke famously denies that anything is essential to a particular:

‘Tis necessary for me to be as I am; GOD and Nature has made me so: But there is nothing I have, is essential to me. An Accident, or Disease, may very much alter my Colour, or Shape; a Fever, or Fall, may take away my Reason, or Memory, or both; and an Apoplexy leave neither Sense, nor Understanding, no nor Life…None of these are essential to the one, or the other, or to any Individual whatsoever, till the Mind refers it to some Sort or Species of things; and then presently, according to the abstract Idea of that sort, something is found essential. Let any one examine his own Thoughts, and he will find, that as soon as he supposes or speaks of Essential, the consideration of some Species, or the complex Idea, signified by some general name, comes into his Mind: And ‘tis in reference to that, that this or that Quality is said to be essential. So that if it be asked, whether it be essential to me, or any other particular corporeal Being to have Reason? I say no; no more than it is essential to this white thing I write on, to have words in it. But if that particular Being, be to be counted of the sort Man, and to have the name Man given it, then Reason is essential to it, supposing Reason to be a part of the complex Idea the name Man stands for….

However, one might argue that in this section Locke is only considering nominally essential qualities and saying that none of the candidates for nominally essential qualities are essential to a being, qua species or genus member, until it has been sorted.

Moreover, the second sentence of III.vi.6, where he inserts the clarification that a real essence is “…that particular constitution, which every Thing has within it self, without any relation to any thing without it,” appears to say that there can be real essences of unsorted individuals. If a real essence is definable as a corpuscular structure cum causal powers that a body has independently of anything else, then it seems to follow that there are individual real essences independently of how we sort them. That is, if every natural substance has some submicroscopic corpuscular constitution on which its observable qualities depend, then it seems to follow that unsorted individuals have a real essence (see Owen 1991 and Vienne 1993).[5]

It is possible that Locke was not always clear and consistent in his use of the term ‘real essence’ and that these puzzles are impossible to resolve. However, it is also possible that when Locke was focusing on the precise meanings of terms that he was indeed careful, and there is a consistent interpretation of his views on this issue. Either way, any interpretation of Locke on real essences must determine whether there are real essences for only sorted individuals or not.

4.3. Real Essences & Natural Kinds

Another important exegetical issue that arises in the Essay is whether Locke thought that there are natural kinds based on real essences. Scientific disciplines categorize the objects they study into kinds. To say that a kind is natural is to say that a grouping of similar individuals exists independently of human decisions. The hope of each scientific discipline is to identify as many natural kinds as possible within their domain and to determine their properties accurately. To this end, we create scientific taxonomies, like the periodic table of elements, the phylogenetic tree, etc., to organize the kinds we have identified and to study their properties. On the face of it, the question of whether there are natural kinds in Locke seems to be the same as the question of whether there are species, and as we saw above (in §§1–3) Locke denies that there are natural species. However, it is possible to distinguish between a species (a classification humans make based on observed similarities) and a natural kind (a grouping that occurs naturally and independently of human naming practices). Locke is clearly aware of this distinction, so it is possible that what he has said about sorting and nominal essences only reveals what he thinks about nominal essences and our practice of sorting, which is a semantic issue, not about the metaphysics of nature.

To be sure, there are passages in the Essay that seem to indicate that Locke was a natural kind realist even if he was a conventionalist about taxonomical practices. For example:

The other, and more rational Opinion, is of those, who look on all natural Things to have a real, but unknown Constitution of their insensible Parts, from which flow those sensible Qualities, which serve us to distinguish them one from another, according as we have Occasion to rank them into sorts, under common Denominations. (III.iii.17)

In other words, one might argue, if real essences cause the observable qualities of bodies, and we sort things into species based on observable similarities, then if we assume that similarities among the real essences always results in similar observable qualities, and similar observable qualities are always caused by similar real essences, there is reason to think that Locke assumed that our nominal essences track, at least to some degree, real kinds in nature.

There are places in the Essay where Locke seems to think along these lines. In III.vi.36 he says “Nature makes many particular Things, which do agree one with another, in many sensible Qualities, and probably too, in their internal frame and Constitution.” In a letter to Molyneux, Locke says:

I hope I have no where said, there is no such sort of creatures in nature as birds; if I have, it is both contrary to the truth and to my opinion. This I do say, that there are real constitutions in things from whence these simple ideas flow, which we observ'd combined in them. And this I farther say, that there are real distinctions and differences in those real constitutions one from another; whereby they are distinguished one from another, whether we think of them or name them or no. (Locke, Works, vol. IV, pp. 305–6)

Indeed, there are passages where Locke speaks of the “imperfection” of our species ideas and the need to make them better conform to nature. For example, in III.xi.24 he says that:

And therefore in Substances, we are not always to rest in the ordinary complex Idea, commonly received as the signification of that Word, but must go a little farther, and enquire into the Nature and Properties of the Things themselves, and thereby perfect, as much as we can, our Ideas of their distinct Species…

There is no reason, so one may argue, to suspect that our species ideas could be either perfected or imperfect if there is no natural kind archetype. On the other hand, there is some evidence that Locke anticipated this kind of account and rejected it. For example, he says:

…That we find many of the Individuals that are ranked into one Sort, called by one common Name, and so received as being of one Species, have yet Qualities depending on their real Constitutions, as far different one from another, as from others, from which they are accounted to differ specifically. This, as it is easy to be observed by all, who have to do with natural Bodies; so Chymists especially are often, by sad Experience, convinced of it, when they, sometimes in vain, seek for the same Qualities in one parcel of Sulphur, Antimony, or Vitriol, which they have found in others. For though they are Bodies of the same Species, having the same nominal Essence, under the same Name; yet do they often, upon severe ways of examination, betray Qualities so different one from another, as to frustrate the Expectation and Labour of very wary Chymists. But if Things were distinguished into Species, according to their real Essences, it would be as impossible to find different Properties in any two individual Substances of the same Species, as it is to find different Properties in two Circles, or two equilateral Triangles. (III.vi.8)

This argument is a modus tollens: if the members of a nominally defined species had the same type of real essence, then they should all exhibit the same qualities (including those not included in the nominal essence), but they do not exhibit all of the same qualities, therefore they do not all have the same type of real essence.

This question of whether real essences could be the foundation of natural kinds for Locke is as old as the Essay itself. Both Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz and Edward Stillingfleet, Lord Bishop of Worcester, point out that Locke's position on real essences seems to entail that there are natural kinds based on similarities among the real essences. As Leibniz put it in his critique of the Essay entitled New Essays on Human Understanding (1704),

[i]t is true that we cannot define a species in terms of something which is unknown to us [e.g., real essences]; but the outer features serve in place of it…. (Leibniz 1704, p. 311)

Again later, he reiterates this point:

[when] I think of a body which is at once yellow, fusible and resistant to cupellation, I am thinking of a body whose specific essence, though hidden from me within it, gives rise to these qualities and reveals itself, at least confusedly, through them. (Leibniz 1704, p. 405)

Locke died before Leibniz's New Essays on Human Understanding were published (they were not published until 1765, sixty-one years after Locke's death and nearly fifty years after Leibniz's death), so we do not have Locke's response to Leibniz's arguments, nevertheless, Stillingfleet gave a similar argument and we have Locke's replies to him.

Like Leibniz, Stillingfleet appeals to the concept of real essence as a “natural kind” concept, claiming that there are types of real essences, and belonging to the same natural kind is a function of possessing the same kind of real essence:

But in this one sun there is a real essence, and not a mere nominal or abstracted essence; but suppose there were more suns; would not each of them have the real essence of the sun? For what is it makes the second sun to be a true sun, but having the same real essence with the first? If it were but a nominal essence, then the second would have nothing but the name. (Locke, Works, vol. IV, p. 83. Here Locke is quoting from Stillingfleet's Discourse in Vindication of the Doctrine of the Trinity, where the latter criticizes Locke's Essay.)

Locke's response is to turn the whole discussion away from real essences and back onto the nominal essences:

Your lordship's proof here brought out of my Essay, concerning the sun, I humbly conceive will not reach it; because what is said there, does not at all concern the real, but nominal essence; as is evident from hence, that the idea I speak of there, is a complex idea; but we have no complex idea of the internal constitution, or real essence of the sun. Besides, I say expressly, that our distinguishing substances into species by names, is not at all founded on their real essences. So that the sun being one of these substances, I cannot, in the place quoted by your lordship, be supposed to mean by essence of the sun, the real essence of the sun, unless I had so expressed it. But all this argument will be at an end, when your lordship shall have explained what you mean by these words, “true sun.” In my sense of them, any thing will be a true sun, to which the name sun may be truly and properly applied; and to that substance or thing, the name sun may be truly and properly applied, which has united in it that combination of sensible qualities, by which any thing else that is called sun is distinguished from other substances, i.e. by the nominal essence…. (Locke, Works, vol. IV, pp. 83–4)

Although this is controversial exegetical territory, it appears that Locke is aware of this ‘real essence’ version of natural kinds, but it further appears that he is unwilling to discuss it; his response was to steer clear of the metaphysical claim and return to the semantic issue of nominal essences.

As natural as it is to interpret Locke as a natural kind realist, there are problematic passages for that interpretation. With respect to the similarities among real essences, which was the main concern of Leibniz and Stillingfleet, in IV.vi.4 Locke argues that the assumption that species are determined by real essences fails to tell us what would count as a member of any species. That is, because we have no knowledge of real essences, no general claims about species would be justified and no individual would obviously belong to a particular species. So the assumption that Leibniz and Stillingfleet propose appears to be theoretically unmotivated. Moreover, as Locke's argument in III.vi.39 suggests, similarities in structure of the real essences, even if known, would still require us to decide which similarities (not to mention what degrees of similarity) would amount to similar enough to belong together in the same class:

For what is sufficient in the inward Contrivance, to make a new Species? There are some Watches, that are made with four Wheels, others with five: Is this a specifick difference to the Workman? Some have Strings and Physies, and others none; some have the Balance loose, and others regulated by a spiral Spring, and others by Hogs Bristles: Are any, or all of these enough to make a specifick difference to the Workman, that knows each of these, and several other different contrivances, in the internal Constitutions of Watches? ‘Tis certain, each of these hath a real difference from the rest: But whether it be an essential, a specifick difference or no, relates only to the complex Idea, to which the name Watch is given: as long as they all agree in the Idea which that name stands for, and that name does not as a generical name comprehend different Species under it, they are not essentially nor specifically different. (III.vi.39)

Whether, in fact, Locke employed real essences as the foundations of natural kinds is currently one of the hottest debates among Locke scholars, and there have been a number of good studies written in recent years.

4.4. Real Essences, Internal Constitutions and Substance

Throughout the Essay, Locke discusses real essences, internal constitutions and substratum, and getting clear on each concept is required in order to produce a consistent and accurate interpretation of Locke on real essences. While it is not possible to do justice to any of the subjects here, it is important to give some background before proceeding. When Locke defines the ‘real essence’, he often describes it as “that Constitution, whereon the Properties of these several things depended” (III.iii.19). On occasion he even connects internal constitutions with essences as if they were synonymous: “[collections of simple ideas] are therefore supposed to flow from the particular internal Constitution, or unknown Essence of that Substance” (II.xxiii.3). Similarly, the concept of ‘substance’ or ‘substratum’, i.e., pure substance in general, is conceived as an underlying ‘thing’ which supports, or upholds, the properties of bodies:

The Idea then we have, to which we give the general name Substance, being nothing, but the supposed, but unknown support of those Qualities, we find existing, which we imagine cannot subsist, sine re substante, without something to support them, we call that Support Substantia; which, according to the true import of the Word, is in plain English, standing under, or upholding. (II.xxiii.2)

The fact that the Essay uses internal constitutions, substance, and real essences as the underlying ground of the qualities of physical objects has led to some debate over the way Locke understands the relationship between the three concepts.

Regarding the relationship between real essences and substance in general, Michael Ayers has argued that Locke uses the terms ‘substance’ and ‘real essence’ as extensionally equivalent, but not intensionally equivalent. That is, both terms refer to the same objects, but convey a very different meaning. For Ayers, Locke's use of ‘substance’ conveys the idea of a thing that supports properties, whereas ‘real essence’ conveys the idea of a submicroscopic material structure that causes the powers of the object; these are different meanings, but both terms refer to only one object.[6]

On the other hand, some Locke scholars interpret the concepts of ‘substance’ (in the sense of pure substance in general, or ‘substratum’) and ‘real essence’ as both intensionally and extensionally distinct because they play very different philosophical roles. For example, according to Nicholas Jolley, Locke employs the concept of a real essence when he is addressing issues of scientific explanation and he appeals to substratum when he is discussing the general concept of what it is to be a thing (as opposed to a property or mode) (see Jolley 1999, pp. 70–78).

On the relationship between real essences and internal constitutions, one view is that Locke uses the terms ‘real essence’ and ‘internal constitution’ interchangeably. For example, in II.xxxi.6 he says “its real Essence, or internal Constitution, on which these Qualities depend, can be nothing but the Figure, Size, and Connexion of its solid Parts.” Again in III.iii.19 he uses ‘real essence’ as if it were synonymous with ‘internal constitution’: “In all which, and the like Changes, ‘tis evident, their real Essence, i.e. that Constitution, whereon the Properties of these several things depended, is destroy'd, and perishes with them.”

By contrast, Susanna Goodin (1998) argues that ‘real essence’ and ‘internal constitution’ cannot be synonymous because, according to Locke, real essences are unknowable (IV.vi.5 & 12), but internal constitutions are knowable (II.xxiii.12). One way to distinguish them is, as we saw above, to adopt the relativized view and interpret the real essence as the internal constitution that underlies the nominally essential properties, whereas the internal constitution of a substance is simply its physical make-up, independently of considerations of its nominal essence. So, on this view, Locke's uses of ‘real essence’ and ‘internal constitution’ are non-synonymous technical terms.

P. Kyle Stanford (1998), on the other hand, distinguishes real essences from internal constitutions by arguing that real essences, by definition, include the causal powers of the body, whereas the internal constitution is simply its material components. Thus, for Stanford, a real essence “consists of those features of an entity from which all of its observable or experienceable properties can be logically deduced” (Stanford 1998, p. 80). By contrast, knowledge of the internal constitution, qua mere material components, entails no such deducibility. For example, in IV.vi.11 he says that knowledge of the real essence of an object entails knowledge of all of its powers, but knowledge of mere material structure cannot entail that kind of knowledge. Moreover, in all the quotations where Locke talks about real essences, he does not just define them as a material structure, but also as the causal grounds of the observable qualities of the body, indicating that the powers are included in the definition.

5. Real Essences of Simple Ideas and Modes

One of Locke's epistemological projects is to distinguish metaphysics and natural philosophy from ethics and mathematics, and one way he does that is to distinguish their subject matters. Metaphysics and natural philosophy are concerned with substances, whereas mathematics and ethics are concerned with modes. For Locke, since an essence accounts for the existence and nature of any being, i.e., “Essence may be taken for the very being of anything, whereby it is what it is”, it follows that the concepts of real and nominal essences apply outside the realm of metaphysics and natural philosophy as well. By his lights, both simple ideas and modes have real and nominal essences. To see this, some definitions are in order.

By ‘simple idea’, Locke means a single, uniform concept or appearance that cannot be analyzed into more basic parts:

The coldness and hardness, which a Man feels in a piece of Ice, being as distinct Ideas in the Mind, as the Smell and Whiteness of a Lily; or as the taste of Sugar, and smell of a Rose: And there is nothing can be plainer to a Man, than the clear and distinct Perception he has of those simple Ideas; which being each in it self uncompounded, contains in it nothing but one uniform Appearance, or Conception in the mind, and is not distinguishable into different Ideas. (II.ii.1)

Our complex idea of gold might include its color, heaviness, solidity, etc., but each of these ideas can be set aside and considered all on its own as a simple idea. One simple idea, e.g., that of the yellowness of the lump of gold, is simple because it is a single, uniform appearance of that particular shade and not a collection of more basic appearances. The same goes for our idea of its hardness and heaviness. We can mentally separate the color from the hardness or heaviness and think of it all on its own.

By ‘mode’, Locke means complex ideas of qualities that depend upon substances for their existence:

First, Modes I call such complex Ideas, which however compounded, contain not in them the supposition of subsisting by themselves, but are considered as Dependences on, or Affections of Substances; such are the Ideas signified by the Words Triangle, Gratitude, Murther, etc. (II.xii.4)

So, for example, gratitude does not exist on its own, rather it requires a thing that is grateful in order to exist. Mixed modes are,

the Complex Ideas, we mark by the names Obligation, Drunkenness, a Lye, etc. which consisting of several Combinations of simple Ideas of different kinds, I have called Mixed Modes, to distinguish them from the more simple Modes, which consist only of simple Ideas of the same kind. These mixed Modes being also such Combinations of simple Ideas, as are not looked upon to be the characteristical Marks of any real Beings that have a steady existence, but scattered and independent Ideas, put together by the Mind, are thereby distinguished from the complex Ideas of Substances. (II.xxii.1)

Given that there are real and nominal essences for modes and that a general knowledge consists in knowledge of essences, then Locke needs some way to distinguish the essences of modes from those of substances.

According to Locke, one of the main differences between substances on the one hand and simple ideas and modes on the other is that the real essences of substances are distinct from their nominal essences, whereas for simple ideas and modes, they are the same.

Essences being thus distinguished into Nominal and Real, we may farther observe, that in the Species of simple Ideas and Modes, they are always the same: But in Substances, always quite different. Thus a Figure including a Space between three Lines, is the real, as well as nominal Essence of a Triangle; it being not only the abstract Idea to which the general Name is annexed, but the very Essentia, or Being, of the thing it self, that Foundation from which all its Properties flow, and to which they are all inseparably annexed. But it is far otherwise concerning that parcel of Matter, which makes the Ring on my Finger, wherein these two Essences are apparently different. For it is the real Constitution of its insensible Parts, on which depend all those properties of Colour, Weight, Fusibility, Fixedness, etc. which are to be found in it. Which Constitution we know not; and so having no particular Idea of, have no Name that is the Sign of it. But yet it is its Colour, Weight, Fusibility, and Fixedness, etc. which makes it to be Gold, or gives it a right to that Name, which is therefore its nominal Essence. (III.iii.18)

So the real essences of a triangle, or gratitude, or murder, or yellow, or sweet, etc., are exactly the same as their nominal essences. There is nothing more to being a triangle than being a plane, closed three-sided figure. Similarly, there is nothing more to being a particular ‘species’ or shade of yellow than the nominal definition.[7]

While it is clear that Locke envisioned some analogy between the real and nominal essences of substances with those of modes, it is unclear, however, just how that analogy should be cashed out. For example, Roger Woolhouse argues that it is a mistake for Locke to say that mode ideas have a real essence at all because there is nothing like a corpuscular structure that is analogous to the definition of a concept like triangle or lying. Moreover, there is, according to Woolhouse, nothing that binds the nominally essential qualities of modes together, whereas, for substances there is an underlying physical structure (see Woolhouse 1971, pp. 125–128). Indeed it is quite difficult to see how a mode could have a real essence if the model for what a real essence is comes from corpuscular structures. If Woolhouse is right, then Locke has no way to make good on his intended analogy and he is unable to adequately differentiate modes from substances.

P. Kyle Stanford (1998), on the other hand, suggests that the analogy between real and nominal essences was intended to be based in their entailment relations. Stanford argues that, just as every property of a substance flows from the real essence with geometrical necessity (IV.vi.11), so too does every property of a triangle follow from its definition with geometrical necessity. And this fact is what all real and nominal essences have in common for Locke. By his way of thinking, even though the connection between the real essence of a piece of gold is the causal ground of the nominally essential properties of gold, and the real essence of a triangle is the logical ground for the nominally essential properties of a triangle, they are alike in that all nominally essential properties can be deduced from the idea of the real essence; if we knew the real essence of a triangle, then we could deduce from it any of the properties of a triangle. To make this analogy work, Stanford argues that the real essence of a substance is more than a corpuscular structure, it must also include the causal powers that produce the observable qualities of the substance; in like fashion, the real essence of modes includes the logical ground from which the nominally essential properties of the term flow. If Stanford is correct, then there is a possible analogy between the real and nominal essences of modes and substances that yields an interesting interpretation of the real essences of both modes and substances.

On either reading, however, it appears that Locke is saddled with the view that in cases of simple ideas, ideas of modes and mixed modes, if we understand the meanings of the words, we know all that there is to know regarding those concepts. Moral and mathematical concepts and ideas are mere trifling propositions, analytic truths and uninformative. However, it will be difficult for many moral philosophers to accept that all they are doing is cashing out the definitions of terms and dealing with uninformative analytic truths; asserting that lying is wrong seems to be more than a trifling opinion. Moreover, it is unclear how Locke thinks moral terms can be normative, i.e., how they can constitute commands we ought to obey—if his position is correct.

In a similar vein, since many mixed modes, which include all moral concepts, are arbitrary mental constructs, it follows that we create moral concepts by producing their definitions. Since the real and nominal essences of mixed modes are the same, it follows that if we know the real essence of lying (knowingly and falsely asserting that ‘p’ with the intention to mislead someone whom we ought not to mislead, etc), we can deduce from that idea all the components of lying, and so there is nothing more to know about lying than the ideas contained within its definition. A problem with Locke's account here is that, as John Mackie points out, social scientists seek out the real essences of social phenomena such as adultery, incest, jealousy, lying and suicide, but understanding these complex phenomena involves more than simply understanding the meaning of the word. If we are to understand why people lie, we must know more than a definition of lying. Of course, it is possible for Locke to argue that once we understand all that is included in lying, we have uncovered its real essence, why people lie, and the many ways they do so, however, are separate questions that we cannot expect to be decided by a semantic theory. It is unclear how he would solve the normative problem (see Mackie 1976, pp. 90–91; see also Jolley 1999, pp. 155–161).

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