Self-Knowledge

First published Fri Feb 7, 2003; substantive revision Mon May 18, 2015

In philosophy, “self-knowledge” standardly refers to knowledge of one’s own sensations, thoughts, beliefs, and other mental states. At least since Descartes, most philosophers have believed that our knowledge of our own mental states differs markedly from our knowledge of the external world (where this includes our knowledge of others’ thoughts). But there is little agreement about what precisely distinguishes self-knowledge from knowledge in other realms. Partially because of this disagreement, philosophers have endorsed competing accounts of how we acquire self-knowledge. These accounts have important consequences for a broad range of philosophical issues, especially issues in epistemology and the philosophy of mind.

This entry focuses on knowledge of one’s own particular mental states. A separate topic sometimes referred to as “self-knowledge”, knowledge about a persisting self, is addressed in a supplement: Knowledge of the Self.

1. The Distinctiveness of Self-Knowledge

What is special about self-knowledge, compared to knowledge in other domains? Self-knowledge is thought to differ from other sorts of knowledge in one or more of the following ways.

  1. Self-knowledge is especially secure, epistemically.
  2. Self-knowledge is (sometimes) acquired by use of an exclusively first-personal method.
  3. Self-knowledge is special because of the distinctive agential relation one bears to one’s own mental states.
  4. One’s pronouncements about one’s own mental states carry a special authority or presumption of truth.

The differences between these are subtle. Statement (1) identifies the distinctive feature of self-knowledge as the epistemic status of a certain class of beliefs, whereas statement (2) identifies it by the method one uses in forming these beliefs. Statement (3) emphasizes the subject’s cognitive agency. Statement (4) rejects purely first-personal characterizations, focusing instead on the way utterances like “I’m in pain” are treated by others. Statements (1) and (2) are ways of cashing out the notion that we enjoy “privileged access” to our own mental states. Only these first two statements construe the distinctive feature of self-knowledge as plainly epistemic; however, most who endorse (3) also claim that this agential relation grounds a special epistemic relation. A minority of philosophers denies that self-knowledge is special at all.

1.1 Epistemic security

The strongest epistemic claims on behalf of self-knowledge are infallibility and omniscience. One is infallible about one’s own mental states if and only if (hereafter, “iff”) one cannot have a false belief to the effect that one is in a certain mental state. One is omniscient about one’s own states iff being in a mental state suffices for knowing that one is in that state. (This omniscience thesis is sometimes expressed by saying that mental states are self-intimating or self-presenting.) Contemporary philosophers generally deny that we are infallible or omniscient about our mental states. Here is a simple counter-example to the claim of infallibility. Kate trusts her therapist’s insights into her own psychology, and so she believes him when he tells her that she resents her mother. But the therapist is mistaken—Kate does not resent her mother. Hence, Kate has a false belief about her own attitude. This case also undercuts the claim of omniscience, assuming that Kate is unaware of her genuine (non-resentful) attitude towards her mother.

In the case described, Kate’s belief about her attitude is based on the testimony of another person. Relying on testimony is, of course, a way of gaining knowledge about all sorts of things, including knowledge of others’ mental states. As mentioned above, some philosophers believe that one has a special way of knowing about one’s own states, a way that others cannot use to apprehend one’s own states. If we restrict the relevant domain to beliefs formed by use of a method that is exclusively a method of attaining self-knowledge—perhaps introspection—we can formulate a more plausible infallibility thesis. We can generate an even more plausible thesis by limiting this restricted infallibility claim to pains and other sensations. Descartes endorsed a limited infallibility thesis of this sort. He says:

There remains sensations, emotions and appetites. These may be clearly perceived provided we take great care in our judgments concerning them to include no more than what is strictly contained in our perception—no more than that of which we have inner awareness. But this is a very difficult rule to observe, at least with regard to sensations. (Descartes 1644/1984: I.66, p. 216)

This thesis is still quite controversial. A common objection to even limited infallibility claims is the idea, often attributed to Wittgenstein, that where one cannot be wrong, one cannot be right either. For instance, Wright maintains that the possibility of error is required for concept application, which is in turn required for substantial self-knowledge.“[E]rror—if only second-order error—has to be possible, if a genuine exercise of concepts is involved” (Wright 1989: 634).

The omniscience thesis seems even less plausible than the unqualified infallibility thesis. But consider the following passage from Locke.

[It is] impossible for any one to perceive, without perceiving that he does perceive. When we see, hear, smell, taste, feel, meditate, or will any thing, we know that we do so. (Locke 1689/1975 II.27.ix)

Is Locke really saying that all of our thoughts and sensations are accompanied by (justified, true) beliefs about those thoughts and sensations? It is more likely that Locke means that we are always conscious of our thoughts and sensations. This statement is plausible on the “higher-order” theory of consciousness, according to which conscious states are states one is conscious of.

In any case, the omniscience thesis may also be qualified. Some modify the omniscience thesis by claiming that, for some states, anyone who is in a state of that kind is justified in believing that she is, even if the thinker doesn’t actually have this belief (Peacocke 1999; Siewert 1998; Smithies 2012). Horgan and Kriegel (2007) use a modified omniscience thesis, restricted to sensations (or “phenomenal experiences”), to argue for a qualified infallibility thesis:

The basic idea behind our approach to phenomenal infallibility is that, because the occurrence of a phenomenal experience already involves the subject’s awareness of it, for the subject to acquire a belief about the experience may involve little more than an act of shifting or redirecting attention. (2007: 135)

Claims of infallibility and omniscience concern general relations between beliefs about mental states and those mental states themselves. What is relevant to the most famous philosophical argument involving self-knowledge is not these general relations but, rather, the certainty of a particular instance of belief. This is Descartes’ cogito argument (Descartes 1641/1895), which aims to demonstrate that, so long as you are carefully attending to your own thoughts, nothing—not even a supremely powerful evil genius who controls your thoughts and seeks to deceive you—can render misleading your evidence that you are thinking (and that, therefore, you exist).

Perhaps the most widely accepted view along these lines is that self-knowledge, even if not absolutely certain, is especially secure, in the following sense: self-knowledge is immune from some types of error to which other kinds of empirical knowledge—most obviously, perceptual knowledge—are vulnerable. Some theorists who take this line maintain that there is a causal gap between a perceptual state and its object, and this gap introduces sources of error that are absent in direct introspective apprehension of a sensation (Gertler 2012; Horgan 2012; Siewert 2012).

Those who maintain that beliefs about one’s own mental states are especially secure, epistemically, typically account for this fact by citing the distinctiveness of the method used to determine our own mental states. We now turn to this “special method” claim.

1.2 Special method

Most philosophers accept that there is some method of grasping one’s own mental states that is special in the sense that it is available exclusively to the subject. Traditionally, this special method was construed as a kind of “inward” gaze, directed at the mental state to be grasped.

1.2.1 Looking inward: Introspection

The term “introspection”’—literally, “looking within”—captures a traditional way of conceiving how we grasp our own mental states. This term uses a spatial metaphor to express a divide between the “inner” world of thought and the “external” world. The term “introspection” is used in various ways in the self-knowledge literature. Perhaps the most common usage is that suggested by the term’s literal meaning: on this usage, introspection is inner observation—or “inwardly directed attention” (Goldman 2006: 246)—that, when successful, yields awareness of a mental state. The notion that inner observation is the special method by which we achieve self-knowledge is central to the acquaintance and inner sense accounts (see 3.1 and 3.2 below).

1.2.2 Looking outward: Transparency

While the term “introspection” connotes a looking within, a view that has recently gained prominence envisions the method unique to self-knowledge as requiring precisely the opposite. On this view, we ascertain our own thoughts by looking outward, to the states of the world they represent. This is known as the transparency view, in that it takes self-knowledge to involve looking “through” the (transparent) mental state, directly to the state of the world it represents. This view is associated with a famous passage from Evans.

[I]n making a self-ascription of belief, one’s eyes are, so to speak, or occasionally literally, directed outward—upon the world. If someone asks me “Do you think there is going to be a third world war?”, I must attend, in answering him, to precisely the same outward phenomena as I would attend to if I were answering the question “Will there be a third world war?” (Evans 1982: 225)

The idea that the special method by which we achieve self-knowledge involves transparency is central to empiricist transparency accounts (see 3.5 below), as well as to some rationalist and agentialist accounts (see 3.6 and 3.7).

1.3 Agency

Many of our mental states, such as itches and tickles, are states we simply undergo. But arguably, some are more active: for instance, we commit to beliefs and form intentions on the basis of reasons. “Our rational beliefs and intentions are not mere mental attitudes, but active states of normative commitment” (Korsgaard 2009: 39). According to agentialist views, the truly distinctive kind of self-knowledge is knowledge of these “active states of normative commitment”. And what is truly distinctive about this kind of self-knowledge is that, when one believes or intends on the basis of reasons, these attitudes are more profoundly one’s own than states (like itches and tickles) that merely occur within one. The agentialist contends that, whereas we know our itches and tickles only by observation, we can know our beliefs and intentions non-observationally, insofar as they are exercises of rational agency. Section 3.7 surveys leading agentialist views.

1.4 First-person authority

The views just described take the subject to be in a special epistemic position, vis-à-vis her own mental states. But a competing approach, sometimes attributed to Wittgenstein (Wright 1989), maintains that the special authority of self-attributions is primarily a matter of social-linguistic practices, which dictate that we should treat subjects as authoritative about their own states. On this view, one who responds to a self-attribution like “I believe that it’s raining” with “no, you don’t” (in ordinary circumstances) exhibits a misunderstanding of social-linguistic norms.

The first-person authority view does not require that self-attributions be epistemically grounded. But our social-linguistic practice of treating others as authorities on their own states cries out for explanation: what could justify this practice other than the assumption that they are in an epistemically privileged position relative to those states? Critics of the first-person authority view, including Wright (1998), worry that in failing to explain the practice of treating persons as default authorities, this view is “a mere invitation to choose to treat as primitive something which we have run into trouble trying to explain” (1998: 45).

The first-person authority view diagnoses the authority granted to self-attributions in non-epistemic terms. Strictly speaking, then, this position is not concerned with self-knowledge. However, neo-expressivist accounts (see 3.8 below) regard the phenomenon of first-person authority as centrally important to understanding self-knowledge.

2. Doubts about the distinctiveness of self-knowledge

2.1 General doubts

The idea that self-knowledge is not profoundly special was especially prevalent during the heyday of behaviorism. For instance, Ryle (1949) suggests that the difference between self-knowledge and other-knowledge is at most a matter of degree, and stems from the mundane fact that each of us is always present to observe our own behavior. He argues that if self-knowledge were epistemically direct, then the higher-order mental state that constitutes immediate grasp of one’s own mental state would have to be grasped as well. This would quickly lead to a regress, which could be blocked only by positing a state that somehow comprehends itself. But Ryle regarded this sort of reflexivity as impossible. Interestingly, skepticism about reflexive self-awareness was already present in James (1884).

Self-consciousness, if the word is to be used at all, must not be described on the hallowed paraoptical model, as a torch that illuminates itself by beams of its own light reflected from a mirror in its own insides. (Ryle 1949: 39)

No subjective state, whilst present, is its own object; its object is always something else. (James 1884: 2)

Doubts about self-knowledge are also fueled by more general epistemological concerns, such as the familiar worry that the observational process unavoidably alters the target of observation (Hill 1991),[1] and doubts about the possibility of theory-free observations (Dennett 1991). Others argue that while self-attributions may constitute self-knowledge, they are not epistemically superior to other kinds of beliefs.

I suspect … [that our] judgments about the world to a large extent drive our judgments about our experience. Properly so, since the former are the more secure. (Schwitzgebel 2008: 268)

In the same vein, some (including Stich 1983) deny that self-knowledge is special, relative to knowledge of others’ states, by claiming that ordinary (“folk”) concepts of psychological states are theoretical concepts. If psychological states are theoretical entities, both self-attributions and other-attributions will proceed by inference from observed data—presumably, behavior. (See the entry on folk psychology as a theory.)

Skepticism of a different kind stems from a puzzle raised by Boghossian (1989). According to some prominent accounts, mental states—in particular, attitudes such as desires and beliefs—are individuated in part by their relations to other states and/or the environment. On standard views, desiring that q partly consists in being disposed to A when one believes “A-ing is an effective means of achieving q”; believing “A-ing is an effective means of achieving q” partly consists in being disposed to A when one desires that q. Some philosophers take attitudes to be relational in another way as well, namely that attitude contents depend on relations to the environment: e.g., one cannot desire water unless H2O is (or was) present in one’s environment. Boghossian’s puzzle concerns how we could have privileged access to our relationally-defined mental states. He notes that there seem to be three ways we might know our mental states: (a) on the basis of inner observation, (b) on the basis of inference, or (c) on the basis of nothing. But, he argues, each of these options presents difficulties. Regarding (a): inner observation seems to reveal only intrinsic features of a desire or a belief, not relational features. Regarding (b): that we must rely on inference, to know our own mental states, seems to imply that we lack privileged access to them. Regarding (c): knowledge on the basis of nothing is rare at best. For example, the self-attribution “I’m now thinking that writing requires concentration” involves thinking that writing requires concentration. It is thus self-verifying, and hence may constitute knowledge on the basis of nothing beyond that thought (Burge 1988). But most cases of self-knowledge are not like this. Boghossian concludes that we face a trilemma regarding self-knowledge.

Philosophers have responded to Boghossian’s trilemma in a variety of ways. Some deny the assumption that recognizing a relationally defined state requires identifying the relational properties that make it the state that it is (Burge 1988; Heil 1988). Others argue that self-knowledge can be privileged even if it rests on inference (Dretske 1994; Byrne 2005). And some maintain that we can know our attitudes through introspective observation, and that this weakens the case for relational construals of attitudes (Pitt 2004).

2.2 Doubts based on empirical results

Empirical work in psychology constitutes another source of doubt about the epistemic status of self-attributions. In a widely cited paper, Nisbett and Wilson (1977) present studies showing that subjects routinely misidentify the factors that influenced their reasoning processes. For instance, subjects in one study explained their preference for a product by its apparent quality, when in fact the product’s spatial position relative to its competitors seemed to drive the preferences.

The accuracy of subject reports is so poor as to suggest that any introspective access that may exist is not sufficient to produce generally correct or reliable reports. (1977: 33)

While these studies are instructive, their results are limited in that they apply only to the unconscious sources of decisions; they are silent as to our privileged access to our current states. Wilson now acknowledges this limitation.

[T]o the extent that people’s responses are caused by the conscious self, they have privileged access to the actual causes of these responses; in short, the Nisbett and Wilson argument was wrong about such cases. (Wilson 2002: 106)

Schwitzgebel (2002) has marshalled other sorts of empirical evidence to show that introspective reports are unreliable. But Schwitzgebel has also suggested that our attitudes about introspection may be particularly obstinate. This conclusion is borne out by his collaboration with a psychologist (Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel 2007). The authors collect introspective reports from a single individual, who carries a beeper that sounds at random moments; when it sounds, she is to note what she is currently thinking and feeling. The two authors sometimes differ as to the correct interpretation of the test subject’s reports, and as to her introspective accuracy. Strikingly, their disagreement about the reliability of introspection remains even after their lengthy discussion of the results. Schwitzgebel attributes this disagreement, in part, to their respective prior attitudes about introspection (Hurlburt is “optimistic” while Schwitzgebel is “a skeptic”).

This outcome suggests that not only careful empirical work, but also difficult conceptual work, is required for determining introspection’s reliability—or, in Goldman’s terms, “calibrating” it.

A crucial problem for the theory of introspection is to fix its range of reliability. This is the problem of calibration, which arises for any scientific instrument and cognitive capacity. I would subdivide the problem into two parts. One would seek to specify the operational conditions under which introspection is (sufficiently) reliable. The second would seek to specify the propositional contents for which it is reliable. (Goldman 2004: 14)

As Goldman notes, we can fix the range of introspective reliability only by using introspection and evaluating its results for internal coherence and for consistency with other sources. But since there is no clear consensus as to how to evaluate the results of introspection, or what weight to accord other sources of evidence about mental states, such as external stimuli and behavior, introspection faces an especially thorny and complex problem of calibration.

2.3 The anti-luminosity argument

Williamson (2000) has argued against a particular, seemingly plausible thesis regarding self-knowledge: that someone experiencing a sensation can know that she is experiencing that sensation. (That is, sensations are “luminous”.) Williamson imagines a subject who feels cold at dawn, but gradually warms until she feels warm at noon. At some point she feels barely cold, and truly believes that she feels cold. At the next moment, she feels only very slightly warmer than at the previous moment; but since she felt barely cold at the previous moment, at this later moment she may not, in fact, feel cold. The fact that the thought “I feel cold” at the later moment would be false implies that the previous (true) thought is not “safe” enough to qualify as knowledge. Given that sensations are usually regarded as especially accessible, the fact that one is not always in a position to know whether one is experiencing a given sensation suggests that one is not always in a position to know whether one is in any given mental state.

I will briefly sketch two prominent responses to Williamson. The first highlights the limits of Williamson’s argument. That argument appears to show that one is not always in a position to know all of one’s own sensations; in particular, one is not always able to detect sensations that are marginal or near-marginal, like being barely cold. But the argument seems not to threaten knowledge in less marginal cases: if one is now very cold, the belief “I feel cold” would not be false, in a nearly identical situation (DeRose 2002). So Williamson’s argument doesn’t show that no sensations are luminous.

In another response, Weatherson (2004) argues that sensations may be constituents of corresponding self-attributions: the subject may think “I’m having this sensation”, where that thought incorporates the sensation as part of its content. (This response dovetails with acquaintance accounts.) If having a sensation generally allows the subject to form a self-attributing belief that appropriately incorporates that sensation, then feeling cold may be luminous after all. For even a slight difference between feeling cold and feeling not-cold will make a difference in the corresponding self-attributions.[2]

3. Accounts of Self-Knowledge

3.1 Acquaintance Accounts

The idea that we know our mental states through acquaintance with them is usually associated with Russell (1917), but such accounts trace their lineage at least to Descartes. According to these accounts, our awareness of our mental states is sometimes peculiarly direct, in both an epistemic sense and a metaphysical sense. It is epistemically direct in that I am not aware of my mental state by being aware of something else. It is metaphysically direct in that no event or process mediates between my awareness and the mental state itself. By contrast, I may be aware that it rained last night only by being aware of the wet pavement; and, more controversially, my visual experience may mediate between my awareness of the pavement and the pavement itself.

The claim that introspective access is both epistemically and metaphysically direct is most plausible for phenomenal states like pain. This is because how a phenomenal state appears (epistemically) and how it actually is (its ontology or nature) are, according to many philosophers, one and the same.

Pain … is not picked out by one of its accidental properties; rather it is picked out by the property of being pain itself, by its immediate phenomenological quality. (Kripke 1980: 152–3)

[T]here is no appearance/reality distinction in the case of sensations. (Hill 1991: 127)

Limiting acquaintance accounts to self-knowledge of phenomenal states—or, more strictly, self-knowledge of mental states individuated by phenomenology—does not entirely fix their scope, as philosophers disagree as to which kinds of mental states are individuated by phenomenology. Recently, the idea that thoughts have a distinctive phenomenology has received renewed attention (Bayne and Montague 2011; Kriegel 2013; see the entry on consciousness and intentionality). Pitt (2004) uses the fact that we seem able to know what we’re thinking in a direct, highly secure way—one that is best explained by an acquaintance model of introspection—to argue that thoughts have distinctive phenomenological properties with which we are acquainted. Some philosophers also argue that conscious attitudes, such as judgments, have distinctive phenomenologies.

The purported epistemic and metaphysical directness of introspection does not imply that we are either infallible or omniscient about our own states, since it is an open question whether we routinely engage in introspection. But if introspection involves epistemically and metaphysically direct access to one’s phenomenal states, then its proper use may allow the relevant self-attributions to achieve a high degree of certainty.

Acquaintance accounts hold special appeal for epistemic foundationalists, who claim that all of our knowledge rests on a foundation of beliefs that are justified, but not justified by other beliefs. Acquaintance accounts provide for highly secure beliefs that are justified by experiences rather than by other beliefs. For example, Fumerton (2005) argues that an experience can directly justify the belief that one is having that experience. In this context, the truth-maker for a belief is the mental state that makes it true: e.g., the truth-maker for “I’m in pain” is the pain itself. (Terms in square brackets are mine).

One wants the truth-maker ‘before’ consciousness [metaphysical directness] in a way that provides complete intellectual assurance [epistemic directness] concerning the truth of what one believes. (Fumerton 2005: 122)

One approach to explaining how experiences can directly justify beliefs about them draws on the phenomenon of demonstrative reference (Gertler 2001; Chalmers 2003). Demonstrative reference often involves literal pointing: by pointing to my desk, I can demonstratively refer to it as “that (desk)”. Of course, we don’t literally point to our experiences. But as Sosa aptly observes, “Selective attention is the index finger of the mind” (2003: 279). By attending to how an experience feels (or appears), one can use this appearance—e.g., the itchiness of an itch—to refer to the feature demonstratively, as “this quality”. One can then register the presence of the itch by thinking “I’m now experiencing this quality” Since reference is secured by attending to the itchiness, one grasps the feature in question, as itchiness. Chalmers, who has an especially well-developed theory of phenomenal concepts along these lines, refers to this grasp of phenomenal features as a “direct phenomenal concept”.

The clearest cases of direct phenomenal concepts arise when a subject attends to the quality of an experience, and forms a concept wholly based on the attention to the quality, “taking up” the quality into the concept. (Chalmers 2003: 235)

Some critics charge that acquaintance accounts construe introspective beliefs as too close to their objects to qualify as genuine, substantial knowledge. In effect, this objection denies that introspective attention to an instance of a phenomenal quality can provide for an understanding of that quality adequate for genuine factual knowledge.

Another worry about acquaintance accounts stems from the observation that we sometimes err about our experiences. In a famous example, a fraternity pledge is blindfolded and told that his hand will be burned with a cigarette. An icicle is then applied to his hand, and the pledge responds by screaming as if in pain. On the relevant interpretation of this case, the pledge mistakes coldness for pain: it epistemically seems to him that his phenomenology is that of pain. This kind of error is the basis for Schwitzgebel’s objection to acquaintance accounts.

Philosophers who speak of “appearances” or “seemings” in discussing consciousness invite conflation of the epistemic and phenomenal senses of these terms. … “It appears that it appears that such-and-such” may have the look of redundancy, but on disambiguation the redundancy vanishes: “it epistemically seems to me that my phenomenology is such-and-such”. No easy argument renders this statement self-verifying. (Schwitzgebel 2008: 263)

To answer this objection, acquaintance theorists will concede that we can be wrong about our own phenomenal states. These accounts require only that, under certain conditions, the phenomenal reality of an experience constitutes its epistemic appearance (Horgan and Kriegel 2007; Gertler 2012).

The idea that we know (even some of) our sensations by acquaintance remains highly controversial; the idea that we know our thoughts, or our beliefs or other attitudes, by acquaintance is even more controversial. As James (1884) observed, self-knowledge requires more than mere contact with a mental state: it requires that one properly conceptualize the state, classifying it as a state of a particular kind (e.g., as pain or coldness). The most difficult hurdle for acquaintance accounts is to explain how this conceptualization occurs. In particular, the difficulty is to explain how awareness of a mental state can be direct and immediate, yet epistemically substantial—a genuine grasp of the state as a state of a certain kind.

3.2 Inner Sense Accounts

While acquaintance accounts construe self-knowledge as strikingly distinctive in its directness and epistemic security, inner sense accounts take the opposite tack: they construe introspection as similar to perception in crucial respects.

Locke, an early inner sense theorist, described the introspective faculty as follows.

This Source of Ideas, every Man has wholly in himself … And though it be not Sense, as having nothing to do with external Objects; yet it is very like it, and might properly enough be call’d internal Sense. (Locke 1689/1975: II.1.iv.)

Inner sense accounts construe introspection as similar to perception in that it involves a monitoring mechanism or “self-scanning process” (Armstrong 1993: 324) that takes mental states as input and yields representations of those states as output. On such accounts, and in contrast to acquaintance accounts, the connection between the introspected state (the input) and the introspective state (the output) is causal and contingent. But inner sense accounts allow that introspection also differs from perception in significant ways. Perception is achieved through dedicated organs such as eyes and ears, whereas there is no (literal) organ of introspection. “The ‘organ’ of introspection is attention, the orientation of which puts a subject in an appropriate relation to a targeted state” (Goldman 2006: 244). Perception ordinarily involves sensory experiences, whereas “No one thinks that one is aware of beliefs and thoughts by having sensations or quasi-sense-experiences of them” (Shoemaker 1994: 255).

The monitoring mechanism involved in inner sense must form representations of the mental states it takes as input. But how does this process ensure that the output (the representation of the scanned mental state) matches the input (the scanned state itself)? On some inner sense accounts, the output representation “redeploys” the content of the input state (Nichols and Stich 2003; Goldman 2006). But as Goldman points out, the redeployment of content—even when “content” is used broadly, to include sensory-experiential contents—cannot fully explain the transition from the scanned mental state to the representation thereof. A complete account must also explain how the introspective process correctly classifies the type of mental state at issue: as, e.g., a visual experience, belief, or desire. Goldman proposes that the introspective process uses the neural properties of states to type-identify them (Goldman 2006: ch. 9).

Inner sense accounts’ construal of introspection as a causal process makes them particularly well-suited to reliabilist (or, more broadly, epistemically externalist) approaches to self-knowledge. For example, Armstrong characterizes the introspective process as “a mere flow of information or beliefs” (Armstrong 1993: 326). The causal connections involved in self-monitoring need not be known by the subject in order to deliver self-knowledge, and inner sense accounts generally regard knowledge based in introspection as non-inferential. Since the relevant scanners or monitoring mechanisms are directed only towards one’s own states, introspection is an exclusively first-personal method. But at least some inner sense theorists note that the asymmetry of access is merely contingent, as it is possible, in principle, for one’s “inner sense” mechanism to be linked to someone else’s mental states. Armstrong finds it “perfectly conceivable that we should have direct [read: non-inferential] awareness of the mental states of others”, through a kind of telepathic scanning (1993: 124).

Perhaps the chief benefit of inner sense accounts is that they are especially conducive to a broadly naturalistic picture of mentality, according to which mentality is part of nature broadly continuous with the nonmental realm. By assimilating introspection to perception, inner sense accounts construe mentality as epistemically continuous with the nonmental, and thus allow a single overarching epistemology to apply to both self-knowledge and knowledge of external things. Since most of the leading arguments for mind-body dualism depend on the claim that our epistemic relations to mental states diverge in crucial ways from our epistemic relations to physical objects, the claim that the mental is epistemically continuous with the nonmental paves the way for assimilating mentality to the nonmental realm ontologically as well.[3]

Shoemaker (1994) offers a sustained critique of inner sense accounts. His main objection centers on the charge that, if we knew our own mental states through a perception-like mechanism, then the following scenario would be possible. A rational creature with ordinary mental states like pains and beliefs, and possessing concepts of pain and belief, might be “self-blind”: that is, unable to recognize its own thoughts and sensations. But, he says, self-blindness in a rational creature is impossible. Inner sense accounts imply that self-blindness is possible, Shoemaker thinks, because they regard the capacity for self-knowledge as on a par with sensory capacities like vision, and hence as a capacity that a rational person might lack. Shoemaker’s discussion has been as influential for its positive suggestion—that our capacity for self-knowledge is closely tied to rationality (see 3.6 and 3.7)—as for its critical treatment of inner sense accounts.

Shoemaker presents three main arguments to show that self-blindness is impossible in a rational creature. First, mental states like pains are defined, in part, by the behaviors they rationalize, such as taking aspirin; such behaviors aren’t rational unless the subject is aware of the pain. Second, one is not a rational subject unless one can recognize, in certain circumstances, that one’s beliefs (or other attitudes) should be modified; and this recognition requires awareness of one’s attitudes. Third, rational subjects will, necessarily, generally behave as if they are aware of their beliefs: e.g., they will not assert “snow is white” unless they are also disposed to assert “I believe that snow is white”. And this suggests that, necessarily, rational subjects are generally aware of their beliefs.

I am tempted to say that if everything is as if a creature has knowledge of its beliefs and desires, then it does have knowledge of them. (Shoemaker 1988: 192)

Kind (2003) contends that these arguments do not directly threaten inner sense accounts. At most, she thinks, Shoemaker has shown that rational creatures will generally be capable of self-awareness. But since this conclusion is silent as to how such awareness occurs, it does not rule out the possibility that it is achieved through inner sense. Gertler (2011a: ch. 5) contends that the inner sense theorist can block Shoemaker’s objection by stipulating that no creature qualifies as rational unless it has the characteristics Shoemaker sees as “essential to being a rational being”: this may mean that having a well-functioning inner sense (or something equivalent) is required for being rational. Shoemaker’s challenge to inner sense views requires a stronger thesis, namely that rational beings must be capable of self-knowledge in order to exist at all.

Another objection to inner sense accounts targets their epistemic externalism. Peacocke notes that while these accounts postulate “a genuine explanation [of one’s self-ascription] at the sub-personal level”, this explanation does not explain why we have any reason to endorse the self-attributions it generates (Peacocke 1999: 224). Inner sense accounts are not likely to appeal to those who take self-knowledge to rest on internal or accessible reasons for belief.

3.3 The Interpretive-Sensory Account

Like inner sense accounts, Carruthers’ interpretive-sensory access (or ISA) account takes self-knowledge to arise through a subpersonal cognitive system that is reliable yet fallible (Carruthers 2011). But the ISA account denies a key assumption of inner sense accounts, namely, that there is a cognitive faculty dedicated specifically to self-knowledge. It proposes that a single “mindreading” system detects both one’s own mental states and the mental states of others. This “mindreading” system takes sensory data as input; interprets these data by drawing on situational facts and background information; and yields representations of mental states as output.

One striking feature of the ISA account is its claim that nearly all self-knowledge requires self-interpretation. This fits with the idea that a single mindreading system provides both self-knowledge and other-knowledge, since it is plausible that we understand others’ attitudes by interpretation (of their speech and other behavior). Carruthers argues that the frequency with which we err about our own attitudes, through confabulation or other sorts of processes, supports the claim that in identifying our own attitudes we are forced to engage—often unsuccessfully—in self-interpretation. He hypothesizes that the mindreading system “evolved for outward-looking social purposes” and was only later co-opted for self-knowledge (2011: 69).

The ISA account converges with Ryle’s (1949) view about self-knowledge at some crucial points. (I’m indebted here to Byrne 2012a.) One of these is the claim that inner speech contributes significantly to self-knowledge, in a way that roughly parallels outer speech’s contribution to other-knowledge. Ryle suggests that the experience of inner speech is a maximally effective type of “eavesdropping”.

We eavesdrop on our own voiced utterances and our own silent monologues. In noticing these we are preparing ourselves to do something new, namely to describe the frames of mind which these utterances disclose. But there is nothing intrinsically proprietary about this activity. I can pay heed to what I overhear you saying as well as to what I overhear myself saying, though I cannot overhear your silent colloquies with yourself. (Ryle 1949: 184)

Drawing on Ryle’s remark about hearing our own silent colloquies, Cassam (2011) sketches a proposal about how we know our “passing thoughts”, where having the passing thought that p does not involve taking any particular attitude towards p. Cassam proposes that “I know that I am having the thought that P by being conscious of saying to myself that P in my internal monologue” (2011: 3). Carruthers endorses a similar broadly similar proposal, arguing that passing thoughts expressed in inner speech can be known without interpretation (Carruthers 2011: 107–8). On the ISA view, interpretation is not required for such knowledge, or for knowledge of any state that can be recognized solely on the basis of raw sensory data, since sensory data are the inputs to the mindreading system.

Carruthers argues that because judgments, decisions, and other attitudes are defined by their causal roles, these cannot be known purely on the basis of an experience of inner speech or other sensory data.

[T]he experience of [a sentence in inner speech] surely isn’t, itself, a judgment, or a decision, or any other occurrent attitude. (2011: 68)

This point echoes the first horn of Boghossian’s trilemma; the ISA theorist’s response to that trilemma is to take self-knowledge (of the relevant states) to be inferential. Some will balk at the idea that self-interpretation is required for determining that I’m now judging that p, or deciding to q. However, this issue may have more to do with disputes about whether occurrent attitudes have distinctive phenomenologies than with accounts of self-knowledge.

Some critics will target the ISA account’s claim that a single mindreading system, one that developed to provide for other-knowledge, also subserves self-knowledge. This claim is closely linked to the idea that our basic conception of mental states—“folk psychology”—derives from theorizing. Those who reject that idea will maintain that the ISA account reverses the proper explanatory order, since our basic conception of mental states derives not from theory but from our awareness of such states in ourselves, achieved by use of an exclusively first-personal faculty of introspection.

3.4 The Reasons Account

The accounts discussed in 3.1–3.3 exemplify two starkly different epistemological approaches to self-knowledge. Acquaintance theorists maintain that self-knowledge can sometimes satisfy strongly internalist conditions, conditions that require, for knowledge that p, that one’s belief that p be based in reasons or evidence that are accessible to the subject. A pain or itch that is known by acquaintance is grasped through accessible evidence: the painfulness or itchiness itself. Inner sense accounts and the ISA account construe (most) self-knowledge in epistemically externalist terms. Beliefs qualify as knowledge by virtue of some feature not directly accessible to the thinking subject, such as the fact that they appropriately result from the exercise of a reliable (inner sense or mindreading) mechanism.

The reasons account of self-knowledge, first advanced by Peacocke (1999), combines elements of internalism and elements of externalism. Peacocke rejects pure externalism, maintaining that when I self-attribute the belief that (say) in Australia July is a winter month, this self-attribution seems to me rational, in that I have an accessible, “personal-level” reason for it. He attempts to carve out a fourth option for self-knowledge, beyond the three options expressed in Boghossian’s trilemma, arguing that we can know some of our mental states without observing them, or by inference; yet this knowledge is still on the basis of something, namely a reason.

According to the reasons account, a conscious state can serve as a reason for belief or action, even if the thinker is not conscious of the state. The following analogy may illuminate the basic idea here. An itch can serve as a reason for scratching, even if there is no further conscious state (distinct from the itch) that constitutes an awareness of the itch. Peacocke argues that, in a broadly similar way, a conscious judgment that p can serve as a direct reason for my self-attributing the belief that p, without my having any distinct awareness of that judgment. (Compare Silins 2012.)

The transition from judging that p (a conscious, occurrent state) to believing that one believes that p (that is, to self-attributing a dispositional belief) is a rational one, on this view, because judging is conceptually linked with believing: making a judgment “is the fundamental way to form a belief” (Peacocke 1999: 238). Similarly, since remembering that p is conceptually linked with (dispositionally) believing that p, a conscious memory that p can justify the belief that one believes that p. And anyone in a position to self-attribute a belief will possess the concept of belief, and so will grasp—or at least, manifest cognitive dispositions appropriately reflecting—these conceptual truths.[4]

Drawing on Peacocke, Paul (2012) develops a reasons account of how we know our intentions. On this account, the transition from deciding to do something (or remembering that one has so decided) to believing that one intends to do that thing is rational, since it is a conceptual truth that deciding normally suffices for intending.

Coliva (2008) objects that judgments cannot rationalize self-attributions of belief in the way the reasons theorist contends, because they are not suitably accessible. Her argument rests, in part, on the claim that the phenomenology of a conscious thought—such as “things will look up”—does not indicate whether this is the content of a judgment or, instead, of a wish. McHugh (2012) responds on behalf of the reasons account, arguing that there is a “phenomenology characteristic of judging that p” that is present in cases where ordinary self-knowledge is possible (2012: 148). The prospects for the reasons account, as an account of self-knowledge of the attitudes, may depend on whether attitudes have “proprietary phenomenology” (Pitt 2004). (For more on that question, see Bayne and Montague 2011.)

3.5 Transparency Accounts

Transparency accounts are inspired by the idea discussed above, in connection with Gareth Evans’ famous remark: that if asked whether you believe that there will be a third world war, you answer by directly considering the likelihood of a third world war. The metaphor of transparency expresses the notion that one “looks through” the (transparent) mental state to directly consider what it represents.

Evans’ remark concerns beliefs specifically. Most transparency theorists develop their accounts as explanations of how we know our beliefs, and later expand these accounts to cover some other kinds of states. Within the class of transparency accounts, there are profoundly differing views about how self-knowledge is achieved and its epistemic status. Some transparency theorists hold that the self-attributions generated by following Evans’ procedure qualify as knowledge only because of our rational agency relative to our attitudes—roughly, the fact that believing, intending (etc.) are things we do, on the basis of reasons. These agentialist accounts will be discussed in subsection 3.7 below.

The current subsection focuses on transparency accounts that see Evans’ procedure as generating empirical justification or warrant for self-attributions, justification or warrant that does not rest on our rational agency relative to our attitudes. According to these accounts, the transparency of mental states provides for an exclusively first-personal method of knowing them, and explains the special security of self-attributions. I will briefly survey the three leading empiricist transparency accounts—developed by Dretske (1994), Fernández (2003, 2013), and Byrne (2005, 2011a).

Dretske describes self-knowledge as “a form of perceptual knowledge that is obtained—indeed, can only be obtained—by awareness of non-mental objects” (Dretske 1994: 264). E.g., I can know that I’m thinking it’s snowing only by inference from my awareness of a non-mental object, such as the falling snow. This account secures first-person authority, since my awareness of the snow would not similarly support an inference about anyone else’s mental state. The account requires that we rely on background beliefs to justify the inference from seeing snow to I’m thinking that it’s snowing. Aydede (2003) has questioned whether these background beliefs will themselves be available (or justified).

Fernández’s version of the transparency account avoids this worry about background beliefs, by taking self-knowledge to be non-inferential. He argues that a mental state, and a self-attribution of that state, can share a single basis. For example, seeing snow falling will ordinarily result in the belief that it’s snowing; this visual experience may also form the basis for the self-attribution I believe that it’s snowing, according to Fernández. So a single state can serve as the basis for both the belief that p and the belief that I believe that p.

Fernández (2013) labels this “the bypass model”, to indicate that the self-attribution is based directly on the basis for the first-order belief, “bypassing” the first-order belief itself. The self-attribution is justified in a way that is “partly internalist, and partly externalist” (ibid.: 44). If I reflect on why I believe that I believe that it’s snowing, I will realize that I (seem to) see falling snow; so I have access to the basis for my self-attribution. And my seeming to see falling snow provides externalist warrant for my self-attribution because that perceptual state tends to correlate with my believing that it’s snowing.

The bypass method is exclusively first-personal, since only I can base a belief directly on my perceptual state. And it is more secure than others’ means of knowing my mental states. Others know my states only by inference—from my behavior, and/or their observations of the evidence available to me. But self-knowledge that satisfies the bypass model is non-inferential, since the self-attribution (e.g., the belief that I believe that it’s snowing) is not inferred from its basis (e.g., seeing falling snow).

By contrast, Byrne’s (2005, 2011a) transparency account is explicitly inferentialist. He claims that we know our beliefs by reasoning according to the “doxastic schema” described by Gallois (1996).

\[\frac{p}{\mbox{I believe that } p}\]

Byrne argues that reasoning in accord with the doxastic schema is in a certain sense self-verifying. To reason in accord with the doxastic schema is to infer I believe that p from the premise p; one does not infer from a premise unless one believes the premise; so such reasoning will yield only true self-attributions. The doxastic schema is thus self-verifying.[5] And it is self-verifying regardless of whether the premise is justified, or even whether the thinker regards it as justified.

Byrne’s main thesis, that self-knowledge is achieved through use of the doxastic schema, rests on two basic claims. The first is that it’s independently plausible that we actually use the doxastic schema (as Evans’ remarks suggest). The second basic claim anchoring Byrne’s view is that the hypothesis that we use the doxastic schema best explains the special security and asymmetry of self-knowledge. On his proposal, the special epistemic security of self-knowledge is a matter of externalist warrant: the doxastic schema is not only self-verifying but also yields self-attributions that are “safe” in that they could not easily have been false.[6] Byrne’s proposal also captures the asymmetry of self-knowledge: reasoning from “p” to “s/he believes that p” will not reliably yield true other-attributions, since one’s own recognition that p is not appropriately connected to others’ beliefs about whether p.

How plausible are these transparency accounts? These accounts endorse Evans’ idea that directly considering whether p can enable us to answer the question “Do you believe that p?”. But as Shah and Velleman (2005) observe, this procedure may generate a new belief.

[O]ne can answer the question whether I now believe that p by forming a conscious belief with respect to p, whereupon one’s consciousness of that belief will provide the answer; but one cannot answer the question whether I already believe that p in a way that begins with forming the belief. (2005: 506)

For example, Evans’ suggestion seems to be that to answer the question “Do you believe that there will be a third world war?” one should consider geopolitical matters. But such consideration may produce a new belief rather than revealing a pre-existing belief. The transparency theorist cannot respond to this worry by stipulating that, when considering whether p, one should not draw any new conclusions. Avoiding new conclusions would require already knowing one’s beliefs, that is, which conclusions one had already drawn.[7]

Transparency theorists will respond by noting that these accounts do not recommend strategies for determining what one believes. They simply aim to explain the provenance of privileged self-attributions, by identifying processes that could generate self-attributions with the epistemic features characteristic of self-knowledge. IF my belief that I believe that p is appropriately inferred from my awareness of p (Dretske), or based on my basis for believing that p (Fernández), or inferred from the premise that p (Byrne), THEN this belief is especially secure self-knowledge, achieved through an exclusively first-personal method. These ways of arriving at self-attributions may not be conscious, and need not be triggered by the thinker’s wondering about her beliefs. Even if they are so triggered, and the process creates a new belief, the self-attributions may nonetheless qualify as knowledge (about what one believes at the time of the self-attribution).

Still, the objection exposes a limit to transparency accounts: they cannot distinguish newly-formed judgments from previous dispositional beliefs, and so cannot account for our apparent ability to know what we believe at the time the question “Do you believe that p?” is posed (Gertler 2011b). Byrne responds that

the transparency proposal … is not that one can determine that one believes that p at t1 by examining the evidence at a later time t2 and concluding that p. (Byrne 2011a: 208)

The significance of this limitation depends on a larger question, as to whether privileged access attaches to knowledge of one’s own dispositional beliefs—which on many views are the central type of belief—or only to conscious or occurrent judgments.

A different objection concerns these accounts’ presumption that self-knowledge need not meet epistemically internalist conditions on knowledge. Boyle (2011) targets Byrne’s view on this point, arguing that even if the inference from p to I believe that p reliably yields true (and safe) self-attributions, this inference cannot explain self-knowledge since it will not appear reasonable to the thinker: after all, in general the fact that p doesn’t imply that I believe that p. (Fernández addresses this worry, in arguing that beliefs formed through the bypass method will seem reasonable to the subject.) Valaris (2011) argues that the transition from p to I believe that p is not a genuine inference, since it cannot be used in hypothetical contexts—e.g., when one reasons from a premise one doesn’t believe, merely to see what follows from it.

Some transparency theorists extend the account to cover attitudes other than belief, such as desires and intentions (Byrne 2011a, Fernández 2013; for worries about these extensions of the transparency account, see Ashwell 2013a,b). Byrne also extends the account to knowing what one thinks and what one perceives (Byrne 2011b, 2012b). Other objections to the more general transparency approach to desires and intentions are discussed in 3.7, as they also apply to agentialist versions of transparency.

3.6 Rationalist Accounts

The accounts of self-knowledge outlined thus far share a common feature: they all construe self-knowledge as a form of empirical knowledge. This is not to say that our capacity for reasoning plays no role in these theories; after all, these are intended to explain how self-knowledge is achieved by thinkers like us, who can engage in ordinary reasoning (such as making inferences and recognizing plain conceptual truths). But these theories attach no special importance to our rationality per se.

Rationalist accounts of self-knowledge maintain that our status as rational thinkers contributes substantially to self-knowledge. Agentialist accounts (discussed in the next section) also take our status as rational thinkers to contribute substantially to self-knowledge, but on agentialist views this contribution is linked with the agency exercised in rational deliberation. I reserve the term “rationalist” for accounts that emphasize the rationality’s significance for self-knowledge, independent of claims about our cognitive agency. The two leading rationalist views are Gallois’ (1996) and Shoemaker’s (1994).

Here again is Gallois’ “doxastic schema” (Gallois 1996):

\[\frac{p}{\mbox{I believe that } p}\]

Like Byrne, Gallois maintains that reasoning according to the doxastic schema generates self-knowledge. But unlike Byrne, Gallois takes the resulting self-knowledge to meet epistemically internalist conditions for knowledge. Gallois’ claim is that whenever a rational thinker consciously believes that p, she is justified in self-attributing that belief. He argues as follows. No rational thinker will have a conscious belief unless she regards that belief as justified—that is, unless it is subjectively justified. And subjective justification for a belief must be available to the thinker, and recognizable as her subjective justification.[8] Finally, a rational person who regards herself as justified in believing that p is justified in self-attributing the belief that p.

Gallois’ view is a transparency account, since it denies that the self-attribution of a belief is based on observing or scanning the belief. But the central role played by rationality, in his picture, sharply distinguishes it from the empiricist transparency accounts described in the previous subsection. This difference enables Gallois’ account to allow for strong internalist justification for self-attributions. But it also limits that account, to beliefs that the thinker regards as justified.

Shoemaker defends a thesis about the extent of self-knowledge known as “constitutivism”,[9] namely: for rational thinkers, being in certain mental states constitutes knowledge that one is in them.

[A]ll you have to add to the available first-order belief, in order to get the second-order belief is the appropriate degree of intelligence, etc. It is not that adding this pushes the creature into a new state, distinct from any it was in before… (Shoemaker 1994: 288–9)

Shoemaker limits the constitutivist thesis to rational thinkers who have the appropriate repertoire of mental state concepts (the concepts of belief, desire, pain, etc.). His argument that such thinkers must be capable of self-knowledge rests on his objections to perceptual models of introspection, outlined in 3.2 above: namely, that no such thinker could be incapable of self-knowledge (“self-blind”). For a self-blind person would (i) fall into certain conceptual errors, such as asserting transparency-violating sentences (“It’s raining but I don’t believe that it is”); (ii) be unable to communicate his beliefs, and hence to engage in cooperative endeavors; (iii) be devoid of true agency, since agency involves higher-order deliberation regarding lower-order states; and (iv) regard himself “as a stranger”, e.g., in observing himself taking aspirin without grasping that he was in pain.

Importantly, Shoemaker sees the capacity for self-knowledge as an essential part of our rational nature. In effect, he is proposing that what it is for a rational creature to have a belief is, in part, for that creature to be aware of that belief; what it is for a rational creature to be in pain is, in part, for it to be aware of that pain; etc. He tentatively proposes a functionalist analysis of these constitution relations (ibid.: 287–9).

Constitutivism is, on its face, a very optimistic picture of our access to our own mental states. An obvious worry concerns mundane cases of ignorance or self-deception. The constitutivist may regard such phenomena as involving failures of rationality and, therefore, as falling outside the scope of the constitutivist thesis. Peacocke (1999) worries that, if a mental state partly constitutes the belief that one is in it, then from the thinker’s perspective, the latter belief may seem baseless.[10]

Rationalist accounts must strike a delicate balance. The idea that our rationality guarantees that we grasp, or are capable of grasping, our own mental states is plausible only on a fairly demanding conception of what it is to be rational. For example, Gallois’ account requires that rational thinkers have access to (what they regard as) justification for every conscious belief they possess. Insofar as rationalist accounts invoke highly demanding conceptions of rationality, one may reasonably wonder whether they truly describes the situation of cognitively flawed creatures like us.

3.7 Agentialist Accounts

The accounts of self-knowledge canvassed thus far treat self-knowledge as a largely epistemic phenomenon, concerning the thinker’s access to her mental states. But as noted in Section 1, some philosophers deny that the special character of self-attributions is primarily epistemic. One version of this denial charges that by focusing on our access to our mental states, standard accounts of self-knowledge portray the thinker engaged in self-reflection as passive, a mere spectator (or detector) of a cognitive show. Agentialists contend that some of our mental life expresses our agency—e.g., believing and intending are things we do. Moreover, recognizing an attitude as one’s own involves seeing it as a commitment for which one is responsible (Burge 1996; Moran 2001; Bilgrami 2006; Boyle 2009; Coliva 2012a).

Here, Moran expresses the agentialist outlook.

The phenomena of self-knowledge … are themselves based as much in asymmetries of responsibility and commitment as they are in difference in capacities or in cognitive access. (Moran 2001: 64)

Agentialism is inspired by a broadly Kantian approach to reason and agency, according to which a thinker’s most basic self-conception is agential: to regard oneself as “I” is to see oneself as an author of thoughts, rather than as something in which thoughts merely occur. This self-conception is also a conception of oneself as rational, as a thing that believes and intends (etc.) on the basis of reasons.

Agentialists maintain that our rational agency guarantees that we are capable of—or even that we possess—self-knowledge. But particular versions of agentialism differ as to the precise link between agency and self-knowledge.

I begin with Burge, who maintains that our responsibility for our beliefs entitles us to self-attributions. To establish this point, Burge uses the following (seemingly transcendental) reasoning. Our rational agency confers on us certain obligations vis-à-vis our beliefs. In particular, we are obligated to (try to) satisfy certain rational norms: that one’s beliefs should conform to one’s evidence; that a belief set should be internally consistent; etc. In order to satisfy these rational norms—e.g., to assess our beliefs for conformance with our evidence, or for consistency with other beliefs—we must rely on judgments as to which beliefs we have. So our responsibility to satisfy rational norms epistemically entitles us to those judgments about our attitudes that are crucial for satisfying those norms.

[I]f one lacked entitlement to judgments about one’s attitudes, one could not be subject to rational norms governing how one ought to alter those attitudes given that one had reflected on them. (Burge 1996: 101)

The distinctively agentialist dimension of our entitlement to self-knowledge is that the relevant judgments about our own attitudes are permissible, since they are required for the kind of critical reasoning about our attitudes that we are obligated to undertake, in our effort to satisfy rational norms.[11]

Burge does not describe how we arrive at judgments about our attitudes to which we are entitled. What is crucial is that we are capable of the kind of self-knowledge that is needed for critical reasoning. When engaged in critical reflection on one’s own beliefs, those beliefs will be directly sensitive to one’s reasons: e.g., there will be an “immediate rationally necessary connection” (1996: 109) between the discovery that a particular belief is unjustified and the suspension of that belief.

Moran, in contrast, does outline a procedure for achieving self-knowledge, namely, the transparency method. He argues that facts about our rational agency justify our use of this method.

[A]s I conceive of myself as a rational agent, … I can report on my belief about X by considering (nothing but) X itself. (Moran 2001: 84)

Moran’s account of how the transparency method yields knowledge differs markedly from empiricist transparency accounts (3.5 above). First, on Moran’s view considering X itself involves marshaling reasons bearing on X. Returning to Evans’ example: in response to the question “Do you believe there will be a third world war?”, I directly consider evidence bearing on that question, e.g., concerning geopolitics. Second, whereas empiricist transparency accounts are entirely compatible with our being passive, relative to our attitudes, Moran argues that the transparency procedure provides knowledge of one’s own beliefs only insofar as those beliefs express our rational agency. On his view, the transparency method justifies a self-attribution such as “I believe that there will be a third world war” only because reflection on evidence enables one to commit to the self-attributed belief. That self-attribution is then an avowal: it does not simply register the belief’s presence but expresses commitment to it.

O’Brien worries that Moran’s account is too demanding. She argues that I am not justified in self-attributing the belief that there will be a third world war, on the basis of considering geopolitics, unless I recognize that my reasons for expecting a third world war constitute evidence that I believe it will occur. But this recognition in turn requires a reflective grasp of the nature of deliberation that seems unnecessary for ordinary self-attributions (O’Brien 2003: 379–81).

Moran accepts that the link between evidence bearing on whether p, and the belief that p, should be accessible to ordinary thinkers. His explanation of this link illustrates the central significance of rational agency in his larger epistemic picture. He reasons as follows. We could not engage in rational thought unless we had the epistemic right to “something like a Transcendental assumption of Rational Thought”: the assumption that we are rational, in that our attitudes are shaped by our reasons. So we do have the epistemic right to that assumption. And our right to that assumption gives us the epistemic right to use the transparency method, that is, to answer to the question “do you believe that p?” by directly marshaling reasons bearing on p. (Boyle (2009) provides a different argument for a Moran-style view.)

Bilgrami (2006) also develops an agentialist view of self-knowledge. Like Burge and Moran, Bilgrami regards self-knowledge as intimately tied to the phenomenon of rational agency. But his view is not merely that, as thinkers responsible for our attitudes, we must be capable of coming to know them (Moran would add: by use of a particular method). Rather, he argues that we could not exercise the agency involved in believing unless, in believing, we already knew what we believed. Beliefs are necessarily known by the thinker because they are commitments.

[I]t is the nature of commitments that they are [known by the thinker]. … [C]ommitments … are states that, were we not to live up to them, we should be prepared to criticize ourselves and be prepared also to try and do better, by way of living up to them… We cannot therefore have commitments without believing that we have them. … Thus the very condition for having a commitment presupposes that one has a second-order belief that one has that commitment. (2006: 287)

On similar grounds, Bilgrami argues that our agency, relative to our commitments, ensures that we will not err in self-ascribing a commitment.

This latter claim is also advanced by Coliva (2012a), who develops a version of agentialism she calls constructivism. Coliva argues that self-ascriptions of commitments—which for her include not only beliefs and intentions but also rationally held conative attitudes, such as desires—will always be true (provided that the thinker in question is rational and has the relevant concepts), because these self-ascriptions will create the attitudes ascribed.

When understood in the way proposed, a judgement (or a sincere assertion) such as 
“I believe/desire/intend/wish/hope that P” is like a performative, namely like “I promise to buy you an ice-cream”… : it makes a certain thing happen, for it does create the first-order propositional attitude as a commitment. … [This] is possible precisely because judging “I believe/desire/intend/wish/hope that P” becomes just an alternative way of undertaking the same commitments one would make by judging that P (is worth pursuing or having)… (2012a: 235–6)

We now consider the prospects for agentialism generally. Some critics will deny that agentialism can explain the epistemic dimension of self-knowledge. Although agentialists generally downplay the significance of the epistemic, agentialists must explain why certain self-attributions qualify as knowledge; otherwise, agentialism is not a genuine competitor to the accounts of self-knowledge described above. Because the various versions of agentialism differ as to the justification or warrant attaching to judgments about one’s attitudes, their responses to this challenge will differ.

A possible drawback of agentialism is its limited application. It not applies only to attitudes that express our rational agency; but many of our attitudes are insensitive to reasons.[12] Beliefs that are deeply entrenched (such as superstitions) or comforting (as in wishful thinking) sometimes persevere in the face of counter-evidence. Intentions that run counter to one’s goals sometimes withstand practical deliberation. Desires sometimes clash with deeper values. Agentialists generally allow that we may have privileged access to such attitudes, through some observational process. But they maintain that the need for observation signals that the attitude is problematic. If I can know about my own attitude only through observation, then I am “alienated” (Moran 2001) from that attitude; my relation to it, qua agent, is “brute, contingent, non-rational” (Burge 1996); and I can view it only from a “third-person perspective” (Bilgrami 2006) and not “as my own” (Boyle 2009).[13]

Critics of agentialism maintain that knowing an attitude through an observational process does not preclude a thinker from regarding it as her own in the relevant sense. Reed (2010) argues that empirical investigation is sometimes required to determine what one believes on a certain issue: in his example, an economist must consult her previous work to determine her position on a complex question about taxation, but she nonetheless fully endorses that belief as her own. Similarly, Lawlor (2009) argues that reflection on reasons (e.g., on larger goals or values) is sometimes insufficient to grasp our desires. In such cases, she claims, we grasp a desire only through inference from introspected cues: e.g., imagining the situation in question; noticing that this exercise is associated with a certain phenomenology, say of eager anticipation; and inferring that we desire that that situation come about.[14]

3.8 Expressivist Accounts

Expressivist views highlight similarities between utterances like “I’m in pain” and direct expressions of one’s mental states, such as “ouch!” The most radical version of expressivism—what Bar-On (2004) calls Simple Expressivism, sometimes attributed to Wittgenstein—denies that utterances like “I’m in pain” are even truth-apt, let alone reflect knowledge of one’s mental states. On this view, an utterance like “I’m in pain” expresses only pain, and not the belief or knowledge that one is in pain. This utterance does not express anything true or false, any more than wincing expresses something true or false. So while simple expressivism aims to explain how utterances like “I’m in pain” function, it is not an account of self-knowledge.

However, the idea that utterances like “I’m in pain”—avowals—directly express the mental states they ascribe has inspired recent accounts of self-knowledge (Finkelstein 2003; Bar-On 2004). These more recent accounts differ from expressivism in allowing that avowals are true (or false). They are aptly characterized as neo-expressivist (borrowing Bar-On’s label for her own view).

Neo-expressivists emphasize the directness with which a mental state can issue in an avowal. In particular, they maintain that no judgment to the effect that I’m in pain or desire water intervenes between my pain or desire and my utterance “I’m in pain” or “I want water”. Just as a wince flows from my pain directly, and is not based on a judgment to the effect that I’m in pain, a spontaneous avowal like “I want water” flows from my desire directly, unmediated by any judgment; but it may be true nonetheless.

The central phenomenon that neo-expressivism seeks to explain is first-person authority: that we ordinarily accept avowals without hesitation, and we don’t expect the subject to be in a position to cite evidence that she is in pain or wants water. (Neo-expressivists allow that these practices, while standard, admit of exceptions.[15]) The special role of avowals is not limited to public statements; one can avow “in thought” with the same authority involved in spontaneous verbal expressions (Bar-On 2004: 9; Finkelstein 2003: 103). First-person authority stems from the fact that it is only the subject herself who can directly express her states through an avowal.

Neo-expressivists differ in how they understand first-person authority and, relatedly, in how the distinctive features of avowals relate to self-knowledge.

Finkelstein allows that my avowal “I’m so happy!” may be caused by my happiness. But he denies that this is a matter of brute causation, as hitting someone’s knee with a hammer brutely causes his leg to kick out. Rather, what differentiates these cases is that my happiness and my spontaneous avowal

have, we might say, a particular kind of intelligibility. We might speak here of a distinctive logical space in which we locate mental items and their expressions along with the circumstances against whose background they have the significances that they do. (2003: 126)

Finkelstein emphasizes that, by “logical space”, he does not mean that my happiness rationalizes the avowal. (A relevant contrast here is with the reasons account.) Instead, he says, my avowal, like my smiling, makes sense together with my happiness in something like the way that a dog’s pain and its moaning make sense together, in “the logical space of animate life”. The dog’s moaning is not rationalized by its pain, according to Finkelstein; but nor is it merely an effect of the pain.

Since dogs are not usually thought to possess self-knowledge, this analogy raises the question: Does my avowal “I’m happy” represent (or indicate) knowledge that I’m happy? The answer is complex, on Finkelstein’s view. He denies that my happiness constitutes epistemic justification for my avowal; in fact, he denies that avowals are the sort of things that are justified. Whether the avowing subject is to be credited with self-knowledge depends, he thinks, on how one understands “knowledge”: in particular, on whether one takes knowledge to require justification.

For both Finkelstein and Bar-on, the explanation of avowals’ authority—the fact that we ordinarily accept avowals at face value, and don’t expect an avowing subject to have evidence in support of her avowal—is non-epistemic. Avowals are authoritative, not because the avowing subject has special epistemic access to the states they ascribe, but simply because avowals express mental states directly.

But for Bar-On, unlike Finkelstein, explaining first-person authority is a separate project from explaining the epistemic dimension of self-knowledge. Bar-On maintains that the avowal “I’m so happy!” can represent “genuine and privileged self-knowledge” (Bar-On 2004: 405), although the avowing subject typically has not “formed the active judgment [that he is happy] on some basis”, and cannot offer evidence bearing on his happiness (2004: 363). She is not committed to a particular account of how avowals constitute knowledge, but she presents a number of approaches compatible with her neo-expressivism.

To give a sense of the epistemic resources available to the neo-expressivist, I’ll briefly describe one approach that Bar-On presents. On this approach, my happiness confers a positive epistemic status on my avowal “I’m so happy!” by being the reason for that avowal. This approach exploits an idea central to the reasons account, viz. that a conscious state can justify a self-ascription directly, without mediation by a judgment to the effect that one is in that state. (The neo-expressivist might balk at Peacocke’s requirement that the reason must be accessible to the knowing subject.) A subject who avows that p “would accept p upon considering it”. Insofar as my happiness is the reason for my avowal, I am warranted in the belief expressed by “I’m so happy!”.

[A]vowing subjects enjoy a special epistemic warrant, since their pronouncements, when true, are epistemically grounded in the very states they ascribe to themselves, which states also serve as the reasons for their acts of avowing. This special warrant accrues to subjects only when issuing present-tense self-ascriptions of occurrent mental states, and only when they do so in the avowing mode—that is, only when they exercise their first-person privilege. (Bar-On 2004: 405)

This “first-person privilege” stems from the fact that only the subject can directly express her states.

Doubts about neo-expressivism center on the question whether it truly explains knowledge of our mental states. One might question whether avowals, which issue from the states they ascribe directly, can represent the kind of epistemic achievement ordinarily associated with robust self-knowledge. (Epistemic internalists will be particularly likely to harbor doubts on this score.) But as we saw above, accounting for knowledge is not a primary goal of Finkelstein’s account. And even for a neo-expressivist like Bar-On, who is concerned to identify possible sources of epistemic warrant for avowals, explaining why subjects’ attitudes towards the mental states they self-ascribe epistemically qualifies as knowledge is, at most, a peripheral goal. The core of neo-expressivism is its non-epistemic account of phenomena often associated with self-knowledge, namely, first-person authority.

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Further Reading

Anthologies on self-knowledge:

  • Cassam, Q. (ed.), 1994, Self-Knowledge, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Coliva, A. (ed.), 2012, The Self and Self-Knowledge, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gertler, B. (ed.), 2003, Privileged Access: Philosophical Accounts of Self-Knowledge, Aldershot: Ashgate Publishing.
  • Hatzimoysis, A. (ed.), 2011, Self-Knowledge, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • D. Smithies and D. Stoljar (eds.), 2012, Introspection and Consciousness, Oxford: Oxford University Press,
  • Wright, C., B. Smith, and C. Macdonald, (eds.), 1998, Knowing Our Own Minds, Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Other Internet Resources

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