Set Theory: Constructive and Intuitionistic ZF

First published Fri Feb 20, 2009; substantive revision Wed Feb 19, 2014

Constructive and intuitionistic Zermelo-Fraenkel set theories are axiomatic theories of sets in the style of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory (ZF) which are based on intuitionistic logic. They were introduced in the 1970's and they represent a formal context within which to codify mathematics based on intuitionistic logic (see the entry on constructive mathematics). They are formulated on the standard first order language of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory and make no direct use of inherently constructive ideas. In working in constructive and intuitionistic ZF we can thus to some extent rely on our familiarity with ZF and its heuristics.

Notwithstanding the similarities with classical set theory, the concepts of set defined by constructive and intuitionistic set theories differ considerably from that of the classical tradition; they also differ from each other. The techniques utilised to work within them, as well as to obtain metamathematical results about them, also diverge in some respects from the classical tradition because of their commitment to intuitionistic logic. In fact, as is common in intuitionistic settings, a plethora of semantic and proof-theoretic methods are available for the study of constructive and intuitionistic set theories.

This entry introduces the main features of constructive and intuitionistic set theories. As the field is expanding at a fast pace, we can only briefly recall some key aspects of the known results and available techniques. We shall focus more on constructive set theory, as we should like to highlight important foundational issues that arise within it. Note that we shall omit a conspicuous part of the literature on constructive and intuitionistic ZF which relates to their categorical interpretations. This area has seen major developments over the years, so much so that an adequate treatment of that progress would require a substantial extension of this entry. The interested reader might wish to consult the entry on category theory and its references (see also its supplement Programmatic Reading Guide).

1. The Essence of Constructive and Intuitionistic Set Theory

Constructive and intuitionistic Zermelo-Fraenkel set theories are based on intuitionistic rather than classical logic, and therefore represent a natural environment within which to codify and study mathematics based on intuitionistic logic. For constructive ZF, the main focus has been to represent the mathematical practice of Bishop (Bishop 1967, Bishop and Bridges 1985).

For the basic concepts and the driving ideas of intuitionistic logic, constructive mathematics and intuitionism, the reader may wish to consult the following entries:

For classical set theory, the entry on set theory.

Constructive and intuitionistic ZF are based on the same first-order language as classical ZF set theory, which has only the binary predicate symbol ∈ (membership) as non-logical symbol. That is, they are formulated on the basis of intuitionistic first-order logic with equality, plus the binary predicate symbol ∈. We can thus take advantage of the simplicity of the set-theoretic language and of our familiarity with it (Myhill 1975). As with Bishop-style constructive mathematics, Constructive and intuitionistic ZF are compatible with the classical tradition, in the sense that all of their theorems are classically true. In fact, the two formal systems that we shall consider, Constructive Zermelo-Fraenkel (CZF) and Intuitionistic Zermelo-Fraenkel (IZF), give rise to full classical ZF by the simple addition of the principle of the excluded middle.

1.1 Axiomatic freedom

Classical Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory is based on classical first-order predicate logic with equality. On top of the logical principles are axioms and schemata which describe the notion of set the theory codifies. These principles can be classified into three kinds. First, there are principles that enable us to form new sets from given ones. For example, the axiom of pair allows us to form a set which is the pair of two given sets. Secondly, there are principles that establish properties of the set theoretic structure. For example, the axiom of extensionality identifies all sets having the same elements. Third, and finally, there are axioms asserting the existence of specific sets. Thus the axiom of infinity states that there is an infinite set. These principles all together are usually called the set-theoretic principles.

When introducing versions of ZF based on intuitionistic logic, the first step is to eliminate from the logic the principle of the excluded middle (EM). The next step is to choose a good stock of set-theoretic principles which faithfully represent the desired notion of constructive set. These tasks turn out to be more challenging than one at first might have expected. In fact, as is well known, systems based on a “weaker” logic have the ability to distinguish between statements which are equivalent from the point of view of a “stronger” logic. In the case of set theory, some of the ZF axioms or schemata are often presented by one of many classically equivalent formulations. Classically it is only a matter of convenience which one to use at a specific time. When working on the basis of intuitionistic logic, however, various formulations of a classical axiom may turn out to be distinct (non-equivalent). In fact, one can envisage new statements which are classically equivalent to a ZF axiom but intuitionistically separate from it (for example CZF's subset collection axiom (Aczel 1978)).

As to the first step, consisting in eliminating the principle of excluded middle from the logic, it turns out that simply evicting this principle from the underlying logic is insufficient; that is, it is not enough to take the intuitionistic rather than the classical predicate calculus as our basis. We also need to ensure that the set theoretic axioms do not bring undesirable forms of excluded middle back into our theory. For example, as noted by Myhill (1973), we need extra care in choosing an appropriate statement for the axiom of foundation. Foundation is introduced in set theory to rule out sets which are members of themselves and thus ∈-chains of sets. The usual formulation of foundation asserts that each inhabited set (a set with at least one element) has a least element with respect to the membership relation. This statement, however, can be shown to yield constructively unacceptable instances of excluded middle on the basis of modest set-theoretic assumptions. Therefore the usual formulation of foundation has to be omitted from a set theory based on intuitionistic logic. For a proof, see the supplementary document:

Set-theoretic principles incompatible with intuitionistic logic.

The typical move in formulating set theories based on intuitionistic logic is then to replace foundation with the classically equivalent schema of set induction, which does not have the same “side effects” but has similar consequences.[1]

As to the second step, related to the selection of a good stock of set-theoretic principles, the schemata of replacement and separation, and the axiom of power set have attracted most attention. For the exact formulation of these principles see the supplementary document:

Axioms of CZF and IZF.

Here the following is a typical scenario. Given what are classically two variants of a single set-theoretic principle, their classical proof of equivalence requires at some point an instance of the excluded middle. However, in general this proof of equivalence will not carry through to an intuitionistic context, and thus what are classically two forms of one principle may result into two distinct principles when working intuitionistically. Choosing one rather than the other of them may therefore influence the notion of set we thus define. In the context of constructive set theories like CZF, power set and separation are replaced by intuitionistically weaker principles. One reason for this is that the full strenght of power set and full separation are seen as unnecessary, since their weaker substitutes seem to suffice for carrying out constructive mathematics. Another reason is that they are seen as philosophically problematic, since they may introduce forms of impredicativity within the set theory (see the section on Predicativity in constructive set theory). The case of replacement versus collection is somehow more complex (see for example the articles (Friedman and Scedrov 1985), (Rathjen 2005) and (Rathjen 2012)). It is worth stressing that while adopting the usual formulation of foundation goes against the very assumption of intuitionistic logic as background logic, the principles of separation and power set have no incompatibility with intuitionistic logic at all, so much so that they are integral part of the intuitionistic theory of sets IZF (Friedman 1973a).

To summarise, in formulating a set theory based on intuitionistic logic, the first task is to expel the principle of excluded middle, including those instances of it which might be hidden in familiar formulations of set-theoretic axioms. The next task is to choose one version of each classical principle which best characterises the desired notion of set. This opens up a range of choices one can make, as a plurality of intuitionistic principles may correspond to one classical principle. It should be stressed that from a constructive point of view this plurality of options (and thus systems), rather than causing uneasiness, is a highly desirable situation, as it constitutes a form of “axiomatic freedom”. For example, it allows us to differentiate between a number of mathematical notions, thus better capturing our intuitions of them as distinct. It also gives us the freedom to choose the notions and theories which best suit a given context. In addition, by adopting intuitionistic logic we can include within our theories principles which are classically very strong, without having to commit to their classical strength. For example, one can add a notion of inaccessible set to a weak constructive set theory and obtain a (generalised) predicative theory, while the same notion embedded in a classical context becomes extremely strong (see the sections on Predicativity in constructive set theory and Large sets in constructive and intuitionistic ZF). Finally, a rich area of (meta-theoretical) study of the relations between the resulting distinct set-theoretic systems naturally arises. As one could expect, this freedom also has a price, as a highly technical study of the axiomatic theories might be necessary to distinguish their principles as well as to unveil some of their subtleties. This again can be seen as an advantage, since it forces us to a deeper and clearer analysis of the mathematical notions involved and prompts us to develop new sophisticated tools.

1.2 Constructive versus intuitionistic set theory

Although there are many systems of sets based on intuitionistic logic, we can distinguish two main trends within the literature. According to the first one, we take all of what is available in classical ZF set theory and only modify those principles, such as foundation, which have a clear incompatibility with intuitionistic logic. This gives rise to set theories such as Intuitionistic Zermelo-Fraenkel, IZF, a variant of which was introduced as early as in (Friedman 1973a). (See Beeson 1985, Chapters 8 and 9 and Scedrov 1985 for two surveys on IZF.) The rationale behind these theories appears to be that of granting the mathematician the most powerful tools possible, as long as compatibility with intuitionistic logic is preserved. According to the second approach, in addition to the adherence to intuitionistic logic we also introduce restrictions on the set-theoretic principles admitted, as far as the resulting system complies with the constructive mathematical practice. Theories of this second kind can thus be seen as the outcome of a double process of restriction with respect to classical ZF. First there is a restriction to intuitionistic logic, then a restriction is imposed on the set-theoretic constructions allowed. The latter is motivated by (1) the observation that weaker principles appear to suffice for the constructive mathematical practice and (2) the desire to adhere to a form of predicativity (see the next section for a clarification of this notion of predicativity). Paradigmatic examples of the latter kind of systems are Myhill's Constructive Set Theory (Myhill 1975), Friedman's system B (Friedman 1977) and Aczel's Constructive Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory CZF (Aczel 1978; 1982; 1986, Aczel and Rathjen 2001; 2010). We can also say that in this second approach the foundational predisposition influences the practice to a higher degree.

In the following we shall make use of a convention which is often in place today, according to which the adjective “intuitionistic” refers to those set theories, such as IZF, which are impredicative, while “constructive” refers to set theories, such as CZF, which comply with a form of predicativity. It should be noted, however, that this convention is not always witnessed in the literature. In fact, the adjective “constructive” has also been used to denote impredicative theories, and “intuitionistic” to refer to predicative foundational theories such as Martin-Löf type theory (Martin-Löf 1975; 1984). It is also worth noting that the present convention on the use of the words “constructive” and “intuitionistic” differs from that made in the context of constructive mathematics (see for example the entry on constructive mathematics and also Bridges and Richman 1987).

1.3 Predicativity in constructive set theory

In this entry we shall not address the subject of predicativity in detail, for which the reader may wish to consult (Feferman 2005). Other references include, for example, the section on predicativism in the entry on philosophy of mathematics and the entry on paradoxes and contemporary logic. We need however to explain what we mean by predicativity in the present context.

Predicativism has its origins in the writings of Poincaré and Russell, who responded to the paradoxes that were discovered in Cantor's and Frege's set theories in the early 20th century. Subsequently Weyl made fundamental contributions to the study of predicative mathematics (Weyl 1918, see also Feferman 1988). According to one notion, a definition is impredicative if it defines an object by reference to a totality which includes the object to be defined. With his Vicious Circle Principle (VCP), Russell intended to eliminate the circularity in mathematics that arises from such impredicative definitions. We recall here one of the formulations of the VCP:

Whatever contains an apparent variable must not be a possible value of that variable (Russell 1908, in van Heijenoort 1967, 163).

Poincaré, Russell and Weyl's foundational analysis of predicativity has paved the way for a variety of logical analyses of the notion. The most commonly accepted analysis is due to Feferman and Schütte (independently) following lines indicated by Kreisel (Kreisel 1958, Feferman 1964 and Schütte 1965; 1965a). Here proof theory has played a pivotal role. In very rough terms, the idea was to single out a collection of theories (a transfinite progression of systems of ramified second order arithmetic indexed by ordinals) by means of which to characterise a certain notion of predicative ordinal. Feferman and Schütte's proof theoretic analysis of these theories has identified an ordinal (usually referred to as Γ0) which is the least non-predicative ordinal according to this notion. Then a formal system is considered as predicatively justifiable if it is proof-theoretically reducible to a system of ramified second order arthmetic indexed by an ordinal less then Γ0. Therefore in proof theory Γ0 is usually considered as representing the limit of predicativity. (See Feferman 2005 for a more accurate informal account of this notion of predicativity and for further references).

For constructive foundational theories a more “liberal” approach to predicativism has been suggested, starting from work in the late 1950's of Lorenzen, Myhill and Wang (see e.g. Lorenzen and Myhill 1959). The driving idea is that so-called inductive definitions ought to be allowed in the realm of constructive mathematics. The intuitive justification of inductive definitions is related to the fact that they can be expressed by means of finite rules, in a “bottom-up” way. The proof-theoretic strength of theories of inductive definitions goes well beyond Feferman and Schütte's bound (Buchholz, Feferman, Pohlers and Sieg 1981). Thus relatively strong theories are considered predicative in today's foundations of constructive mathematics. This more liberal notion of predicativity has often been termed generalised predicativity. In this entry we shall reserve the term predicative for generalised predicativity, and call strictly predicative a theory conforming with Feferman and Schütte's criteria.

An example of a predicative theory in this sense is the constructive set theory CZF, as its proof-theoretic strength is the same as that of a theory of one inductive definition known as ID1. The system IZF, instead, is impredicative, as its proof-theoretic strength equates that of the whole of classical ZF (Friedman 1973a).

In set theories based on intuitionistic logic, predicativity is usually achieved by restricting the principles of separation and power set, as these appear to be the main sources of impredicativity (when the infinity axiom is assumed).

1.3.1 Impredicativity of Separation

The schema of separation allows us to form a subset of a given set whose elements satisfy a given property (expressed by a formula in the language of set theory). Given a set B and a formula φ(X), separation allows us to construct a new set, the set of those elements X of B for which φ holds. This is usually informally represented as: {XB : φ(X)}. Separation may lead to impredicativity in case the formula φ contains unbounded quantifiers ranging over the whole universe of sets; in fact, in defining the new set by separation we may thus refer to this very set, contradicting Russell's VCP. For example, if we define a set C by separation as {XB : ∀Y ψ(X,Y)}, then C is among the Y's that need to be checked for the property ψ. This form of impredicativity is avoided in constructive set theory by restricting the separation schema: by requiring that all quantifiers occurring in the formula φ range only over “previously constructed” sets. Syntactically, this means that given a set B, we can form a new set {XB : φ(X)} by separation only if any quantifier in φ is bounded, that is, it occurs only in contexts ∀X (XY → ...) and ∃X(XY ∧ ...), for some set Y.

We can see that this constraint on separation is efficacious since the proof theoretic strength of CZF, which has only restricted separation, is within the range of predicativity. However, by adding full separation to CZF one obtains an impredicative theory, in fact, one with the same proof-theoretic strength as full second order arithmetic (Lubarsky 2006).

1.3.2 Impredicativity of Powerset

The power set axiom allows us to form a set of all subsets of a given set. An example of impredicative use of power set is given by the definition of a subset of the natural numbers, N, as follows: B := {nN : ∀ CN φ(n, C)}, where φ can be taken to be a bounded formula. A form of circularity arises here as B itself is among the subsets of N which need to be checked for φ. Power set is hard to justify from a constructive point of view, not only because of these forms of circularity, but also since, as clarified by Myhill (1975, 354), in the case of an infinite set we have no idea of what counts as an arbitrary subset of it. As a consequence, there seems to be no way of generating all the subsets of an infinite set, and so we have no way to form the set of all of them. One could also say that the notion of an arbitrary subset of an infinite set seems too vague to be constructively meaningful.

Myhill writes:

Power set seems especially nonconstructive and impredicative compared with the other axioms: it does not involve, as the others do, putting together or taking apart sets that one has already constructed but rather selecting out of the totality of all sets those that stand in the relation of inclusion to a given set. (Myhill 1975, 351).

Myhill crucially observes that power set is not needed for constructive mathematics Bishop-style, as it can be replaced by one of its consequences. This is often called Myhill's exponentiation axiom and states that we can form a set of all functions from one given set to another. This axiom is clearly equivalent to power set in a classical context, where subsets of a given set may be represented by characteristic functions. In the absence of the principle of excluded middle, however, power set and exponentiation are not equivalent. Myhill's fundamental observation is that exponentiation suffices to carry out the mathematics of (Bishop 1967); for example, it allows for the construction of the (Cauchy) real numbers within constructive set theory. Myhill justifies exponentiation by noting that a function is a rule, a finite object which can actually be given. He also writes that the case of power set is different from that of exponentiation as:

even in the case of infinite sets A and B we do have an idea of an arbitrary mapping from A into B. An arbitrary mapping from Z into Z is a partial recursive function together with a proof that the computation always terminates; a similar account can be given of an arbitrary real function. There is no corresponding explanation of “arbitrary subset”. (Myhill 1975, 354).

Myhill's exponentiation axiom is now part of all major systems of constructive set theory. In the case of CZF, in fact, one has a strengthening of exponentiation, known as subset collection, which is also a weakening of power set. A generalisation of exponentiation can also be found in constructive type theory.

In the case of CZF the claim of the impredicativity of power set can be substantiated by a technical result. (Rathjen 2012b) shows that CZF plus power set exceeds the strength of classical Zermelo set theory, and thus the addition of power set to constructive Zermelo Fraenkel brings us to a fully impredicative setting. This also shows that the implication from power set to subset collection can not be reversed, as CZF's proof-theoretic strength is way below that of Zermleo set-theory.

1.3.3 The constructive universe of sets

Having introduced appropriate constraints to power set and separation, we could now face a substantial objection. Constructive and intuitionistic set theories can be seen as modifications of classical ZF set theory that are obtained by: (1) replacing classical with intuitionistic logic, and (2) accurately choosing, among various classically equivalent principles, those which seem more appropriate for given purposes. For example, we might choose principles which suffice to represent a certain mathematical practice, like, for example, Bishop style mathematics. The resulting notion of set, however, might become obscure and the choice of the set-theoretic principles might appear to a certain degree as arbitrary. In the case of intuitionistic ZF, one can justify the choice of the set-theoretic principles by examining its semantical interpretations, as Heyting semantics, or by looking at its categorical models. In the case of constructive set theory, to hinder this kind of objection, Aczel has given an interpretation of CZF in a version of Martin-Löf type theory (Aczel 1978). The claim is that a clear constructive meaning is thus assigned to CZF's notion of set by looking at its meaning in Martin-Löf type theory, since the latter is usually considered as representing an accurate and fully motivated formulation of a constructive notion of set. Aczel's interpretation of CZF in constructive type theory is given by interpeting sets as trees in type theory. That is, the universe of sets of CZF is represented by a type, V, of iterative sets built over the universe, U, of small types in constructive type theory (Aczel 1978; Martin-Löf 1984). This interpretation clearly highlights the predicativity of CZF, whose sets can be seen as trees built up from below, and whose set theoretic universe also has a clear inductive structure.

The predicativity of CZF and related systems is consonant with philosophical positions which are often associated with the use of intuitionistic logic. In particular, it would seem that if we construct the mathematical objects, for example, if the mathematical objects are mental constructions of some kind, then resorting to impredicative definitions would produce an undesirable form of circularity. This clearly contrasts with a view often associated to classical set theory, for which our mathematical activity can be seen as a gradual disclosure of properties of the universe of sets, whose existence is independent of us. Such a view is usually bound up with the use of classical logic and impredicativity in studying the set-theoretic universe. Predicativity is also often seen as related to the time-honoured distinction between actual and potential infinity. Predicative (and thus, in particular, constructive) theories are often seen as avoiding reference to actual infinity, and only committing to potential infinity (Dummett 2000, Fletcher 2007). This again seems particularly in harmony with those philosophical positions which highlight the human dimension of our mathematical activity, by seeing, for example, the mathematical objects and the truth of statements about them as dependent from us. Another related aspect is often seen as pertaining to predicativity: if the universe of sets is built up in stages by our own mathematical activity, then it would be natural also to see it as open ended. For this reason, in a constructive context, where the rejection of classical logic meets the requirement of predicativity, the universe of sets is often described as an open concet, a universe “in fieri”. This idea is especially well exemplified within constructive type theory, where the notion of type-theoretic universe has been deliberately left open by Per Martin-Löf (by not postulating specific elimination rules for it). The open ended nature of the universe of sets has paved the way for extensions of it by reflection principles. These have been investigated both within type theory and constructive set theory. See (Rathjen 2005a) for a survey of results and a foundational discussion, and also section 5.2.

2. Origins of Constructive and Intuitionistic Set Theories

Intuitionistic versions of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theories were introduced in the early 1970s by Friedman and Myhill. In (Friedman 1973) the author presents a study of formal properties of various intuitionistic systems and introduces for them an extension of Kleene's realisability method. The realisability technique is applied in (Myhill 1973) to show the existence property for a version of intuitionistic Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory (with replacement in place of collection). In another fundamental contribution Friedman extends the double negation translation of intuitonistic logic to relate classical and intuitionistic set theories (Friedman 1973a). These first papers already address the relation between some major intuitionistic set theories and classical ZF. They also clarify a key feature of set theory based on intuitionistic logic, mainly that it is amenable to powerful constructive semantic interpretations, like realizability. These techniques are applied to the study of crucial metatheoretical properties which are typical of the constructive approach and which are enjoyed by some constructive set theories (see the section on Semantic techniques). This groundbreaking work has been fully exploited and substantially extended in work by Beeson and McCarty (see Beeson 1985; McCarty 1984).

Constructive set theory from the very start has a more distinctive foundational vocation and it is bound up with Bishop's mathematics. In fact, in 1967 Bishop published the book “Foundations of constructive analysis” (Bishop 1967), which opened up a new era for mathematics based on intuitionistic logic (see the entry on constructive mathematics). The monograph stimulated fresh attempts in the logical community to clarify and formally represent the principles which were used by Bishop, though only at an informal level. First attempts by Goodman and Myhill (Goodman and Myhill 1972) made use of versions of Gödel's system T (see also (Bishop 1970) for a similar attempt). Myhill came though to the conclusion that the resulting formalisation was too complex and artificial (Myhill 1975, 347). Myhill proposed instead a system which is closer to the informal notion of set originally utilised by Bishop and also closer to the set-theoretic tradition. Myhill writes (1975, 347):

We refuse to believe that things have to be this complicated - the argumentation of (Bishop 1967) looks very smooth and seems to fall directly from a certain concept of what sets, functions, etc. are, and we wish to discover a formalism which isolates the principles underlying this conception in the same way that Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory isolates the principles underlying classical (nonconstructive) mathematics. We want these principles to be such as to make the process of formalization completely trivial, as it is in the classical case.

We observe here that Myhill's constructive set theory had distinguished notions of function, natural number and set; it thus closely represented a constructive tradition in which functions and natural numbers are conceptually independent from sets. Another fundamental step in the development of constructive set theory was Friedman's “Set-theoretical foundations for constructive analysis” (Friedman 1977). Here, among other systems, a system called B is defined which has further restrictions on the set-theoretic principles compared with Myhill's (in particular, it has no set induction). It also has a restricted form of the axiom of dependent choice. System B is there shown to be expressive enough to represent the constructive analysis of Bishop (1967) whilst being at the same time proof-theoretically very weak (due to the absence of set induction). System B is in fact a conservative extension of arithmetic (thus it is well below the limit of strict predicativity briefly recalled in section Predicativity in constructive set theory). Myhill and Friedman's systems were subsequently modified by Aczel, to obtain a system, CZF (Constructive Zermelo-Fraenkel), that is fully compatible with the ZF language (Aczel 1978, 1982, 1986; Aczel and Rathjen 2001; 2010). CZF also included no choice principles. Aczel gave an interpretation of CZF in Martin-Löf type theory with the aim of corroborating the constructive nature of the set theory. He also strengthened some of the principles of Myhill's system (namely, collection and exponentiation) on the ground that the stronger versions are still validated by the interpretation in type theory.

It should be mentioned that other foundational systems for Bishop-style constructive mathematics were introduced in the early 1970's. For example: explicit mathematics by S. Feferman (Feferman 1975), and the already mentioned Intuitionistic Type Theory (Martin-Löf 1975; 1984). Constructive type theory is usually considered the most satisfactory foundation for constructive mathematics Bishop-style. Both type theory and explicit mathematics can be seen as expressing more directly the computational content of constructive mathematics. Type theory, in particular, can be read as a very general and expressive programming language. Constructive and intuitionistic set theories display their computational content only indirectly through their semantic interpretations (see e.g. (Aczel 1977), (Lipton 1995) and the section on Semantic techniques).

3. The Axioms Systems CZF and IZF

For a reader who is already familiar with ZF set theory, we now briefly recall the axioms of the systems CZF and IZF. For a full list and an explanation of their axioms we refer instead to the supplementary document:

Axioms of CZF and IZF.

CZF and IZF are formulated on the basis of intuitionistic first-order logic with equality, having only ∈ (membership) as an additional non-logical binary predicate symbol. Their set-theoretic axioms are as follows.

IZF CZF
Extensionality (same)
Pair (same)
Union (same)
Infinity (same)
Separation Restricted Separation
Collection Strong Collection
Powerset Subset Collection
Set Induction (same)

Note that in IZF the schema of separation is unrestricted. In CZF, Collection is strengthened to compensate for restricted separation. Subset collection is a strengthening of Myhill's exponentiation axiom, thus substituting for ZF's Powerset.

4. Constructive Choice Principles

When discussing the role of classical set theory as a foundation for mathematics, one usually considers the theory ZFC, that is, the axiom system ZF plus the axiom of choice (AC). One might therefore wonder what is the status of the axiom of choice in intuitionistic settings. The question is particularly significant because at its first appearance the axiom of choice was often seen as controversial and highly non-constructive. In constructive contexts, however, one witnesses a peculiar phenomenon. The usual form of the axiom of choice is validated by theories of types such as Martin-Löf type theory, where the Curry-Howard correspondence holds (See Section 3.4 of the entry on Constructive mathematics). On the other hand, the assumption of the axiom of choice gives rise to instances of the excluded middle in extensional contexts, where a form of separation is also available. This is the case for example of constructive and intuitionistic ZF. (For the proof, see the supplementary document on Set-theoretic Principles Incompatible with Intuitionistic Logic.) A proof of the incompatibility of AC with extensional set theories based on intuitionistic logic seems to have first appeared in (Diaconescu 1975) in a categorical context. Goodman and Myhill give an argument for set theories based on intuitionistic logic (Goodman and Myhill 1978).

Although the axiom of choice is incompatible with both constructive and intuitionistic ZF, other choice principles may be added to the basic systems without producing the same undesirable results. For example one could add the principle of countable choice (AC0) or that of dependent choice (DC). In fact, both have been often employed in the constructive mathematical practice. (For their exact formulation see the supplementary document on Axioms of CZF and IZF.)

In (Aczel 1978) the author also considered a choice principle called the Presentation Axiom, which asserts that every set is the surjective image of a so-called base. A base is a set, say B, such that every relation with domain B extends a function with domain B.

The compatibility of all these forms of choice with constructive set theory has been proved by Aczel by extending his interpretation of CZF in Martin-Löf type theory (Aczel 1982). Rathjen (2006) has also considered various constructive choice principles and their mutual relations.

A final remark: although constructive and intuitionistic set theories are compatible with the principles of choice just mentioned, the set theories are often defined without any choice principles. This has the aim of allowing for a “pluralistic” foundational approach. In particular, one would like to obtain a foundational theory compatible with those contexts (e.g. categorical models of set theory) in which even these weaker principles of choice may not be validated. For similar ideas in the context of constructive type theory, see (Maietti and Sambin 2005, Maietti 2009). We wish also to mention here Richman's appeal for a constructive mathematics which makes no use of choice principles (Richman 2000; 2001).

5. Proof Theory and Semantics of Constructive and Intuitionistic ZF

In considering a certain mathematical practice (or a theory used to codify it) from a philosophical perspective, we should like to clarify with the greatest possible precision the assumptions which are made within it as well as the consequences which arise from those assumptions. This is particularly true when working with theories which are based on a weaker logic than the classical one, for which a deeper, more precise insight is mandatory. Many technical tools are available which can help us clarify those aspects. Among the available instruments, there are proof-theoretic techniques, such as proof-theoretic interpretations, as well as semantic techniques, such as realisability, Kripke models, Heyting-valued semantics. In fact, in the literature one often witnesses the interplay of proof-theoretic and semantic techniques. We here give a cursory look into some of these topics and suggest further reading.

5.1 Proof-theoretic strength

As discussed in section 1, the step from classical ZF to its intuitionistic variants requires us to choose which formulation of (some of) the set-theoretic axioms to adopt. As it turns out, this choice may considerably affect the proof-theoretic strength of the resulting theory. For example, we already noted that by adding either full separation or power set to CZF (where both of these principles are appropriately restricted) we obtain impredicative theories, while CZF is a predicative theory. It is not surprising, then, that investigations on the proof-theoretic strength of constructive and intutionistic set theories have been a crucial meta-theoretical tool in the attempt to understand these theories and the relations between them. For a definition of the notion of proof-theoretic strength and for surveys on proof theory see for example (Rathjen 1999, 2006b). Here it suffices to recall that a fundamental theme of proof theory (and in particular that part of it which is known as ordinal analysis) is the classification of theories by means of transfinite ordinals that measure their "consistency strength" and "computational power". It is also worth recalling that beyond these goals, investigations on the proof-theoretic strength of a theory are rich and informative. For example, a proof-theoretic analysis may contribute to establish whether a certain theory complies with a given mathematical framework (e.g., predicativity, finitism, etc.) (Feferman 1993). Further, as a by-product of the proof-theoretic analysis we sometimes obtain simple independence proofs. In fact, we can show that a theory cannot prove a specific principle because adding it to the theory would increase the theory's proof-theoretic strength. Proof-theoretic interpretations have also been employed to compare constructive and intuitionistic ZF set theories among each others, as well as with their classical counterparts, and also with other foundational systems for constructive mathematics, such as constructive type theory and explicit mathematics (see e.g. Griffor and Rathjen 1994, Tupailo 2003).

Although CZF and IZF are the most widely studied systems, numerous other systems for constructive and intuitionistic set theory have been considered in the literature so far. The proof-theoretic strength of a number of constructive and intuitionistic set theories has been established by a variety of tools, like, for example, an extension to set theory of the double negation interpretation (originated in (Friedman 1973a)), and a variety of other proof-theoretic interpretations, often resulting from a careful combination of semantic and proof theoretic techniques. In many cases the proof theoretic strength of a system has been determined by a chain of interpretations between constructive and classical systems, and by using a variety of tools, from relisability to more "traditional" proof theoretic techniques, as ordinal analysis (see, for example, Beeson 1985; Griffor and Rathjen 1994; Rathjen 2012b). In particular, realisability has turned out to be very useful, due to its flexibility. As to the outcomes of these investigations, some of the systems analysed turn out to be as weak as arithmetic, as for example Friedman's system B (Friedman 1977); other systems are as strong as full classical ZF, as IZF (Friedman 1973a). There are also systems of intermediate strength, as CZF. The strength of the latter theory, in fact, equals that of a theory of one inductive definition known as ID1. The fact that CZF has the same strength as ID1 confirms the (generalised) predicativity of the set theory, while it shows that it exceeds the limit of strict predicativity.

As a final remark: while the strength of CZF is well below that of second-order arithmetic, the simple addition of excluded middle to CZF gives us (full) ZF. This should be contrasted with IZF, which already has the strength of ZF (Friedman 1973a). The limited proof theoretic strength of CZF compared with IZF has often been considered one of the main advantages of constructive over intuitionistic set theory. In a sense, it would seem that CZF makes the most of its use of intuitionistic logic, by characterising a notion of (generalised) predicative set. Interestingly, when some large set axioms have been added to constructive set theory, a similar pattern has emerged, as the strength of the resulting theory is well below that of the corresponding classical theory.

5.2 Large sets in constructive and intuitionistic ZF

A prominent area of research in classical set theory is that of large cardinals (see the entry on set theory). In constructive contexts, the ordinals are not linearly ordered. (For the notion of constructive ordinal and a brief discussion of its properties, see the supplementary document on: Set-theoretic Principles Incompatible with Intuitionistic Logic.) As a consequence, cardinal numbers do not play the same role as in the classical setting.

One can nonetheless study the impact of “reflection principles” of the form of large set axioms. For example, one can add to constructive and intuitionistic set theories an axiom asserting the existence of inaccessible sets.[3] The addition of large set axioms to intuitionistic ZF was first proposed by Friedman and Scedrov (Friedman and Scedrov 1984). One of their aim was to shed light on the corresponding classical notions; another was to study the impact of these principles on metatheoretical properties of the original set theories. Friedman and Scedrov have shown, for example, that the addition of large set axioms does not compromise the validity of the disjunction and numerical existence properties for IZF.

In the context of constructive set theory, large sets have been introduced by Aczel in the form of so-called regular sets to allow inductive definitions of sets (Aczel 1986). Rathjen and Crosilla have considered inaccessible sets (Rathjen al. 1998; Crosilla and Rathjen 2001) and Mahlo sets (Rathjen 2003a). Nevertheless, an objection could be raised to extensions of constructive set theory by large set axioms. In classical set theory, large cardinals can be seen as an incarnation of higher infinity. How do we justify these principles constructively? The constructive justification of these notions relies again on the type theoretic interpretation. The addition of these principles corresponds in fact to that of universes and W-types within constructive type theory. The justification of extensions by large sets is thus bound up with the question of the limits of Martin-Löf type theory (Rathjen 2005). We also note that as witnessed for example by the case of inaccessible set axioms, their addition to a weak subsystem of CZF (with no set induction) produces a theory of strength Γ0, the ordinal singled out by Feferman and Schütte as the limit of strict predicativity (Crosilla and Rathjen 2001; see also section 1.3). This is a witness to the fact that by working in a constructive, predicative context, we can tame traditionally strong set-theoretic notions.

5.3 Metamathematical properties of constructive and intuitionistic ZF and semantic techniques

A variety of interpretations for intuitionistic logic have been extended to intuitionistic and constructive set theories, such as realisability, Kripke models and Heyting-valued semantics. All these techniques have been applied to obtain metamathematical results about the set theories.

5.3.1 Disjunction and existence properties of constructive and intuitionistic ZF

Some intuitionistic set theories satisfy certain “hallmark” metamathematical properties, such as the disjunction and the existence properties. They can also be shown to be consistent with the addition of principles which go beyond the most usual perception of constructiveness. Among these are for example Church Thesis and Markov's principle. For a description of these principles in the context of intuitionistic logic, the reader may wish to consult sections 4.2 and 5.2 of the entry on intuitionistic logic or Troelstra and van Dalen's Constructivism in Mathematics (Troelstra and van Dalen 1988).

Here we recall the disjunction and existence property, formulated for a set theory T. The informal motivation for the disjunction and the existence property is based on our understanding of the constructive proofs of disjunctive and existential statements. In fact, it seems reasonable to expect that if we constructively prove a disjunction φ∨ψ, then we should also be able to prove φ or prove ψ. Similarly, if we prove an existential statement, then we should be able to prove that a witness to that statement is definable within our theory.

However, although such properties seem quite natural and are fairly easy to establish for arithmetical theories, they turn out to pose considerable technical challenges in the case of set theories, due to their transfinite hierarchies of sets and the extensionality axiom. In fact, some prominent set theories turn out not to possess the existence property, as discussed in the next section.

Let T be a theory whose language, L(T), encompasses the language of set theory. Moreover, for simplicity, we shall assume that L(T) has a constant ω denoting the set of von Neumann natural numbers and for each n a constant cn denoting the n-th element of ω.

A theory T has the disjunction property (DP) if whenever T proves (φ ∨ ψ) for sentences φ and ψ of T, then T proves φ or T proves ψ.

The existence property has two distinct versions in the context of set theory: the numerical existence property (NEP) and the existence property (EP). Let θ(x) be a formula with at most x free. We say that:

(1) T has the NEP if whenever T proves ∃x ∈ ω θ(x), then, for some natural number n, T proves θ(cn).

(2) T has the EP if whenever T proves ∃xθ(x), then there is a formula φ(x) with exactly x free, so that T proves ∃!x(φ(x) ∧ θ(x)).

As realisability techniques have proved crucial in investigations on the existence and disjunction properties for constructive and intuitionistic set theories, we discuss the outcomes of these studies in the next section.

5.3.2 Realisability

Realisability has been one of the first and principal tools in the research surrounding set theories based on intuitionistic logic, starting from the early contributions by Friedman and Myhill (Friedman 1973, Myhill 1973). Realisability semantics for intuitionistic arithmetic were first proposed by Kleene (Kleene 1945) and extended to higher order Heyting arithmetic by Kreisel and Troelstra (Kreisel and Troelstra 1970). For the definition of realisability for arithmetic see section 5.2 of the entry on intuitionistic logic. A realisability similar to Kreisel and Troelstra was applied to systems of higher order arithmetic by Friedman (Friedman 1973). Myhill introduced a variant of this realisability which resembles Kleene's slash (Myhill 1973; Kleene 1962, 1963). He thus proved that a version of IZF with replacement in place of collection (called IZFRep) has the DP, the NEP and the EP. These results were further extended in (Myhill 1975; Friedman and Scedrov 1983). While Friedman and Myhill gave realisability models for extensional set theories, Beeson developed a notion of realisability for non-extensional set theories. He then studied metatheoretical properties of the extensional set theories via an interpretation in their non-extensional counterparts. He thus proved that IZF (with collection) has the DP and NEP (Beeson 1985). Subsequently McCarty introduced realisability for IZF directly for extensional set theory (McCarty 1984; 1986). Realisability semantics for variants of CZF have been considered for example in (Crosilla and Rathjen 2001; Rathjen 2006a). The realisability in the latter article is inspired by McCarty's and has the important feature that, as McCarty's for IZF, it is a self-validating semantics for CZF (that is, this notion of realisability can be formalised in CZF and each theorem of CZF is realised provably in CZF). Rathjen has made use of this notion of realisability to show that CZF (and a number of extensions of it) have the DP and the NEP (Rathjen 2005b).

The question of which set theories satisfy the existence property, however, turned out to be more difficult to solve. (Friedman and Scedrov 1985) used Kripke models to show that IZF (that is, the system with collection) does not have the EP, while as mentioned above, the system IZFRep (which has replacement in place of collection) does have the EP. This prompted Beeson to pose the question [Beeson 1985, IX]:

Does any reasonable set theory with collection have the existence property?

A first answer to Beeson's question came with (Rathjen 2012), where the author introduces the notion of weak existence property, which consists in the requirement of finding a provably definable set of witnesses for every existential theorem. He then introduces a form of realizability based on general set recursive functions where a realizer for an existential statement provides a set of witnesses for the existential quantifier, rather than a single witness. Rathjen combines this notion of realizability with truth to yield that a number of theories with collection do enjoy the weak existence property (while IZF does not). Among them, in particular, the theory CZF without subset collection plus Myhill's exponentiation axiom, CZFEXP. In fact, Rathjen claims that by combining these results with further work he has carried out, he can show that CZFEXP (and a number of other theories) do have the existence property. A striking consequence of these outcome, is that as these theories are formulated with collection, the failure of the existence property in the case of IZF can not be attributed only to collection, but to the interplay between this scheme and unrestricted separation.

As to the prominent question of whether CZF itself has the existence property, this has been solved in the negative by Swan (2014). There the author makes use of three well devised realisability models and embeddings between them, to show that even the weak existence property fails for CZF. In so doing he also shows that CZF's subset collection schema is the culprit. As clearly highlighted in (Swan 2014) the fact that CZF does not have EP does not indicate some weakness in CZF as a constructive theory. While (Swan 2014) shows essentially that CZF asserts the existence of mathematical objects that it does not know how to construct, still CZF does have natural interpretations in which these objects can be constructed, like, for example, Aczel’s interpretation into type theory (Aczel 1978).

For a survey of results in intuitionistic set theory see (Beeson 1985, Chapter IX). For the corresponding developments in CZF, see (Rathjen 2005b, 2006, 2012) and (Swan 2014).

5.3.3 Kripke models and Heyting-valued semantics

Kripke models for intuitionistic set theories have been used in (Friedman and Scedrov 1985) to show that IZF does not have the EP (and combining this with the results in (Myhill 1973) we have that IZFRep does not prove IZF). Kripke models have more recently been applied to clarify the relation between the constructive substitutes of the power set axiom: Myhill's exponentiation axiom and Aczel's subset collection schema. It is clear that the power set axiom implies both of these principles, and that subset collection implies exponentiation. On the other hand, each of the latter two principles does not imply power set, as the theory CZF with power set in place of subset collection is much stronger than CZF and CZFExp (Rathjen 2012b). In fact, CZF and CZFExp have the same proof theoretic strength (Griffor and Rathjen 1994); therefore to investigate the relation between subset collection and exponentiation in constructive set theory one needed to develop tools other then proof theoretic methods. Lubarsky (2005) used Kripke models to show that Myhill's exponentiation axiom does not imply Aczel's subset collection (on the basis of CZF minus subset collection plus full separtion). In (Lubarsky and Rathjen 2007) the authors applied the technique of Kripke models to show that also the consequences of the theories CZF and CZFExp are different. Aczel and Rathjen (2001) had shown that the class of Dedekind real numbers forms a set in CZF, by using subset collection. Lubarsky and Rathjen (2007) showed that CZFExp does not suffice to prove the same statement. For further applications of Kripke models to separating crucial constructive notions, see e.g. (Diener and Lubarsky 2013).

Heyting-valued semantics for intuitionistic set theories were obtained by Grayson (Grayson 1979) as a counterpart for Boolean models for classical set theory. They have been generalized especially via categorical semantics (for an introduction see MacLane and Moerdijk 1992). Heyting-valued semantics have found application to independence results in (Scedrov 1981; 1982). A constructive treatment has been given in (Gambino 2006). See also (Lubarsky 2009).

5.3.4 Categorical models of constructive and intuitionistic set theory

Categorical models of constructive and intuitionistic set theories have flourished over the years. The notions of topos and sheaf play an essential role here (see e.g. Fourman 1980 and Fourman and Scott 1980). For an overview of the main concepts, see the entry on category theory and the references provided there (see in particular the supplement Programmatic Reading Guide). For recent developments that relate more specifically to constructive set theories, see e.g. (Simpson 2005) and (Awodey 2008), as well as the web page: algebraic set theory.

5.4 Variants of Constructive and Intuitionistic Set Theories: Set Theories with Urelements and Non-extensional Set Theories

Sometimes systems of intuitionistic and constructive set theory have been presented with the natural numbers as a separate sort of urelements, that is, primitive objects with no elements (Friedman 1977; Myhill 1975; Beeson 1985). Constructively, this is a natural choice which is in agreement with ideas expressed for example by Bishop (1967) (among others). In Bishop's monograph the natural numbers are taken as a fundamental concept on which all the other mathematical concepts are based. From a technical point of view, if the natural numbers are taken as primitive and distinct from their set-theoretic representations, the axiom of infinity then takes the form: “there is a set of natural numbers (as urelements)”. A more general form of urelements in constructive set theories have been considered in (Cantini and Crosilla 2008). Here a variant of constructive set theory is proposed which combines an intensional and partial notion of operation with CZF's extensional notion of set (see also Cantini and Crosilla 2010).

The axiom of extensionality is a common feature of all the systems discussed so far. However, in a context in which the computational content of a statement is considered to be crucial, an intensional theory might be more appropriate. For example, constructive type theory and explicit mathematics both encapsulate some form of intensionality. Intuitionistic set theories without extensionality have been considered in the literature (Friedman 1973a, Beeson 1985). Their motivation, however, has been not computational but technical in nature, due to the difficulties that extensionality brings about when studying metamathematical properties of intuitionistic set theories.

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Acknowledgments

I thank Andrea Cantini, Michael Rathjen and Peter Schuster for valuable comments on an earlier version of this entry. My thanks also to the referee for helpful suggestions and to the editors for their useful comments and their kind assistance with the html files.

Copyright © 2014 by
Laura Crosilla <matmlc@leeds.ac.uk>

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