Speech Acts

First published Tue Jul 3, 2007

Speech acts are a staple of everyday communicative life, but only became a topic of sustained investigation, at least in the English-speaking world, in the middle of the Twentieth Century.[1] Since that time “speech act theory” has been influential not only within philosophy, but also in linguistics, psychology, legal theory, artificial intelligence, literary theory and many other scholarly disciplines.[2] Recognition of the importance of speech acts has illuminated the ability of language to do other things than describe reality. In the process the boundaries among the philosophy of language, the philosophy of action, the philosophy of mind and even ethics have become less sharp. In addition, an appreciation of speech acts has helped lay bare an implicit normative structure within linguistic practice, including even that part of this practice concerned with describing reality. Much recent research aims at an accurate characterization of this normative structure underlying linguistic practice.

1. Introduction

One way of appreciating the distinctive features of speech acts is in contrast with other well-established phenomena within the philosophy of language. Accordingly in this entry I will consider the relation among speech acts and: semantic content, grammatical mood, speaker-meaning, logically perfect languages, perlocutions, performatives, presuppositions, and implicature. This will enable us to situate speech acts within their ecological niche.

Above I shuddered with quotation marks around the expression ‘speech act theory’. It is one thing to say that speech acts are a phenomenon of importance for students of language and communication; another to say that we have a theory of them. While, as we shall see below, we are able to situate speech acts within their niche, having a theory of them would enable us to explain (rather than merely describe) some of their most significant features. Consider a different case. Semantic theory deserves its name: For instance, with the aid of set-theoretic tools it helps us tell the difference between good arguments and bad arguments couched in ordinary language. By contrast, it is not clear that “speech act theory” has comparable credentials. One such credential would be a delineation of logical relations among speech acts, if such there be. To that end I close with a brief discussion of the possibility, envisioned by some, of an “illocutionary logic”.

2. Content, Force, and How Saying Can Make It So

Construed as a bit of observable behavior, a given act may be done with any of a variety of aims. I bow deeply before you. So far you may not know whether I am paying obeisance, responding to indigestion, or looking for a wayward contact lens. So too, a given utterance, such as ‘You'll be more punctual in the future,’ may leave you wondering whether I am making a prediction or issuing a command or even a threat. The colloquial question, “What is the force of those words?” is often used to elicit an answer. In asking such a question we acknowledge a grasp of what those words mean. However, given the dizzying array of uses of ‘meaning’ in philosophy and related cognitive sciences, I will here refer instead to content. While different theories of content abound (as sets of possible worlds, sets of truth conditions, Fregean senses, ordered n-tuples, to name a few), the phenomenon is relatively clear: What the speaker said is that the addressee will be more punctual in the future. The addressee or observer who asks, “What is the force of those words?” is asking, of that content, how it's to be taken–as a threat, as a prediction, or as a command. The addressee is not asking for a further elucidation of that content.

Or so it seems. Perhaps whether the utterance is meant as a threat, a prediction or a command will depend on some part of her content that was left unpronounced? According to this suggestion, really what she said was, “I predict you'll be more punctual,” or “I command you to be more punctual,” as the case may be. Were that so, however, she'd be contradicting herself in uttering ‘You'll be more punctual in the future’ as a prediction while going on to point out, ‘I don't mean that as a prediction.’ While such a juxtaposition of utterances is surely odd, it is not a self-contradiction, any more than “It's raining but I don't believe it,” is a self-contradiction when the left conjunct is put forth as an expression of belief. What is more, ‘I predict you'll be more punctual,’ is itself a sentence with a content, and will be being put forth with some force or other when–as per our current suggestion—the speaker says it in the course of making a prediction. So that sentence, ‘I predict you'll be more punctual’ is put forth with some force–say as an assertion. This implies, according to the present suggestion, that really the speaker said, ‘I assert that I predict that you'll be more punctual.’ Continuing this same style of reasoning will enable us to infer that performance of a single speech act requires saying–though perhaps not pronouncing—infinitely many things. That is reason for rejecting the hypothesis that implied it, and for the rest of this entry I will assume that force is no part of content.

2.1 The Independence of Force and Content

In chemical parlance, a radical is a group of atoms normally incapable of independent existence, whereas a functional group is the grouping of those atoms in a compound that is responsible for certain of the compound's properties. Analogously, it is often remarked that a proposition is itself communicatively inert; for instance, merely expressing the proposition that snow is white is not to make a move in a “language game”. Rather, such moves are only made by putting forth a proposition with an illocutionary force such as assertion, conjecture, command, etc. The chemical analogy gains further plausibility from the fact that just as a chemist might isolate radicals held in common among various compounds, the student of language may isolate a common element held among ‘Is the door shut?’, ‘Shut the door!’, and ‘The door is shut’. This common element is the proposition that the door is shut, queried in the first sentence, commanded to be made true in the second, and asserted in the third. According to the chemical analogy, then:

Illocutionary force : propositional content :: functional group : radical

In light of this analogy we may see, following Stenius 1967, that just as the grouping of a set of atoms is not itself another atom or set of atoms, so too the forwarding of a proposition with a particular illocutionary force is not itself a further component of propositional content.

Encouraged by the chemical analogy, a central tenet in the study of speech acts is that content may remain fixed while force varies. Another way of putting the point is that the content of one's communicative act underdetermines the force of that act. That's why, from the fact that someone has said, “You'll be more punctual in the future,” we cannot infer the utterance's force. The force of an utterance also underdetermines its content: Just from the fact that a speaker has made a promise, we cannot deduce what she has promised to do. For these reasons, students of speech acts contend that a given communicative act may be analyzed into two components: force and content. While semantics studies the contents of speech acts, pragmatics studies, inter alia, their force. The bulk of this entry may be seen as an elucidation of force.

Need we bother with such an elucidation? That A is an important component of communication, and that A underdetermines B, do not justify the conclusion that B is an important component of communication. Content also underdetermines the decibel level at which we speak but this fact does not justify adding decibel level to our repertoire of core concepts for the philosophy of language. Why should force be thought any more worthy of admission to this set of core concepts than decibel level? One reason for an asymmetry in our treatment of force and decibel level is that the former, but not the latter, seems to be a component of speaker meaning: Force is a feature not of what is meant but of how it is meant; decibel level, by contrast, is a feature at most of the way in which something is said. This point is developed in Section 6 below.

2.2 Can Saying Make it So?

Speech acts are not to be confused with acts of speech. One can perform a speech act such as issuing a warning without saying anything: A gesture or even a minatory facial expression will do the trick. So too, one can perform an act of speech, say by uttering words in order to test a microphone, without performing a speech act.[3] For a first-blush delineation of the range of speech acts, then, consider that in some cases we can make something the case by saying that it is. Alas, I can't lose ten pounds by saying that I am doing so, nor can I persuade you of a proposition by saying that I am doing so. On the other hand I can promise to meet you tomorrow by uttering the words, “I promise to meet you tomorrow,” and if I have the authority to do so, I can even appoint you to an office by saying, “I hereby appoint you.” (I can also appoint you without making the force of my act explicit: I might just say, “You are now Treasurer of the Corporation.” Here I appoint you without saying that I am doing so.) A necessary and, perhaps, sufficient condition of a type of act's being a speech act is that acts of that type can–whether or not all are—be carried out by saying that one is doing so.

Saying can make it so, but that is not to suggest that any old saying by any speaker constitutes the performance of a speech act. Only an appropriate authority, speaking at the appropriate time and place, can: christen a ship, pronounce a couple married, appoint someone to an administrative post, declare the proceedings open, or rescind an offer. Austin, in How To Do Things With Words, spends considerable effort detailing the conditions that must be met for a given speech act to be performed felicitously. Failures of felicity fall into two classes: misfires and abuses. The former are cases in which the putative speech act fails to be performed at all. If I utter, before the QEII, “I declare this ship the Noam Chomsky,” I have not succeeded in naming anything simply because I lack the authority to do so. My act thus misfires in that I've performed an act of speech but no speech act. Other attempts at speech acts might misfire because their addressee fails to respond with an appropriate uptake: I cannot bet you $100 on who will win the election unless you accept that bet. If you don't accept that bet, then I have tried to bet but have not succeeded in betting.

Some speech acts can be performed–that is, not misfire—while still being less than felicitous. I promise to meet you for lunch tomorrow, but haven't the least intention of keeping the promise. Here I have promised all right, but the act is not felicitous because it is not sincere. My act is, more precisely, an abuse because although it is a speech act, it fails to live up to a standard appropriate for a speech act of its kind. Sincerity is a paradigm condition for the felicity of speech acts. Austin foresaw a program of research in which individual speech acts would be studied in detail, with felicity conditions elucidated for each one.[4]

Here are three further features of the “saying makes it so” condition. First, the saying appealed to in the “saying makes it so” test is not an act of speech: My singing in the shower, “I promise to meet you tomorrow for lunch,” when my purpose is simply to enjoy the sound of my voice, is not a promise, even if you overhear me. Rather, the saying (or singing) in question must itself be something that I mean. We will return in Section 6 to the task of elucidating the notion of meaning at issue here.

Second, the making relation that this “saying makes it so” condition appeals to needs to be treated with some care. My uttering, “I am causing molecular agitation,” makes it the case that I am causing molecular agitation. Yet causing molecular agitation is not a speech act on any intuitive understanding of that notion. One might propose that the notion of making at issue here marks a constitutive relation rather than a causal relation. That may be so, but as we'll see in Section 5, this suggests the controversial conclusion that all speech acts depend for their existence on conventions over and above those that imbue our words with meaning.

Finally, the saying makes it so condition has a flip side. Not only can I perform a speech act by saying that I am doing so, I can also rescind that act later on by saying (in the speech act sense) that I take it back. I cannot, of course, change the past, and so nothing I can do on Wednesday can change the fact that I made a promise or an assertion on Monday. However, on Wednesday I may be able to retract a claim I made on Monday. I can't take back a punch or a burp; the most I can do is apologize for one of these infractions, and perhaps make amends. By contrast, not only can I apologize or make amends for a claim I now regret; I can also take it back. Likewise, you may allow me on Wednesday to retract the promise I made to you on Monday. In both these cases of assertion and promise, I am no longer beholden to the commitments that the speech acts engender in spite of the fact that the past is fixed. Just as one can, under appropriate conditions, perform a speech act by saying that one is doing so, so too one can, under the right conditions, retract that very speech act.

2.3 Seven Components of Illocutionary Force

Searle and Vanderveken 1985 distinguish between those illocutionary forces employed by speakers within a given linguistic community, and the set of all possible illocutionary forces. While a certain linguistic community may make no use of a force such as conjecturing or appointing, these two are among the set of all possible forces. (These authors appear to assume that while the set of possible forces may be infinite, it has a definite cardinality.) Searle and Vanderveken go on to define illocutionary force in terms of seven features, claiming that every possible illocutionary force may be identified with a septuple of such values. The features are:

1. Illocutionary point: This is the characteristic aim of each type of speech act. For instance, the characteristic aim of an assertion is to describe how things are; the characteristic point of a promise is to commit oneself to a future course of action.

2. Degree of strength of the illocutionary point: Two illocutions can have the same point but differ along the dimension of strength. For instance, requesting and insisting that the addressee do something both have the point of attempting to get the addressee to do that thing; however, the latter is stronger than the former.

3. Mode of achievement: This is the special way, if any, in which the illocutionary point of a speech act must be achieved. Testifying and asserting both have the point of describing how things are; however, the former also involves invoking one's authority as a witness while the latter does not. To testify is to assert in one's capacity as a witness. Commanding and requesting both aim to get the addressee to do something; yet only someone issuing a command does so in her capacity as a person in a position of authority.

4. Propositional content conditions: Some illocutions can only be achieved with an appropriate propositional content. For instance, I can only promise what is in the future and under my control. I can only apologize for what is in some sense under my control and already the case. For this reason, promising to make it the case that the sun did not rise yesterday is not possible; neither can I apologize for the truth of Snell's Law.

5. Preparatory conditions: These are all other conditions that must be met for the speech act not to misfire. Such conditions often concern the social status of interlocutors. For instance, a person cannot bequeath an object unless she already owns it or has power of attorney; a person cannot marry a couple unless she is legally invested with the authority to do so.

6. Sincerity conditions: Many speech acts involve the expression of a psychological state. Assertion expresses belief; apology expresses regret, a promise expresses an intention, and so on. A speech act is sincere only if the speaker is in the psychological state that her speech act expresses.

7. Degree of strength of the sincerity conditions: Two speech acts might be the same along other dimensions, but express psychological states that differ from one another in the dimension of strength. Requesting and imploring both express desires, and are identical along the other six dimensions above; however, the latter expresses a stronger desire than the former.

Searle and Vanderveken suggest, in light of these seven characteristics, that each illocutionary force may be defined as a septuple of values, each of which is a “setting” of a value within one of the seven characteristics. It follows, according to this suggestion, that two illocutionary forces F1 and F2 are identical just in case they correspond to the same septuple.

3. Illocutions and Perlocutions, and Indirect Speech Acts

I cannot lose ten pounds by saying that I am doing so, and I cannot convince you of the truth of a claim by saying that I am doing so. However, these two cases differ in that the latter, but not the former, is a characteristic aim of a speech act. One characteristic aim of assertion is the production of belief in an addressee, whereas there is no speech act one of whose characteristic aims is the reduction of adipose tissue. A type of speech act can have a characteristic aim without each speech act of that type being issued with that aim: Speakers sometimes make assertions without aiming to produce belief in anyone, even themselves. Instead, the view that a speech act-type has a characteristic aim is akin to the view that a biological trait has a function. The characteristic role of wings is to aid in flight, but some flightless creatures have wings.

Austin called these characteristic aims of speech acts perlocutions (1962, p. 101). I can both urge and persuade you to shut the door, yet the former is an illocution while the latter is a perlocution. How can we tell the difference? We can do this by noting that one can urge by saying, “I urge you to shut the door,” while there are no circumstances in which I can persuade you by saying, “I persuade you to shut the door.” A characteristic aim of urging is, nevertheless, the production of a resolution to act. (1962, p. 107)

Perlocutions are characteristic aims of one or more illocution, but are not themselves illocutions. Nevertheless, a speech act can be performed by virtue of the performance of another one. For instance, my remark that you are standing on my foot is normally taken as, in addition, a demand that you move; my question whether you can pass the salt is normally taken as a request that you do so. These are examples of so-called indirect speech acts (Searle 1975b).

Indirect speech acts are less common than might first appear. In asking whether you are intending to quit smoking, I might be taken as well to be suggesting that you quit. However, while the embattled smoker might indeed jump to this interpretation, we do well to consider what evidence would mandate it. After all, while I probably would not have asked whether you intended to quit smoking unless I hoped you would quit, I can evince such a hope without suggesting anything. Similarly, the advertiser who tells us that Miracle Cream reversed hair loss in Bob, Mike, and Fred, also most likely hopes that I will believe it will reverse my own hair loss. That does not show that he is (indirectly) asserting that it will. Whether he is asserting this depends, it would seem, on whether he can be accused of being a liar if in fact he does not believe that Miracle Cream will staunch my hair loss.

Whether, in addition to a given speech act, I am also performing an indirect speech act would seem to depend on my intentions. My question whether you can pass the salt is also a request that you do so only if I intend to be so understood. My remark that Miracle Cream helped Bob, Mike and Fred is also an assertion that it will help you only if I intend to be so committed. What is more, these intentions must be feasibly discernible on the part of one's audience. Even if, in remarking on the fine weather, I intend as well to request that you pass the salt, I have not done so. I need to make that intention manifest in some way.

How might I do this? One way is by virtue of inference to the best explanation. All else being equal, the best explanation of my asking whether you can pass the salt is that I mean to be requesting that you do so. All else equal, the best explanation of my remarking that you are standing on my foot, particularly if I use a stentorian tone of voice, is that I mean to be demanding that you desist. By contrast, it is doubtful that the best explanation of my asking whether you intend to quit smoking is my intention to suggest that you do so. Another explanation at least as plausible is my hope that you do so. Bertolet 1994, however, develops an even more skeptical position than that suggested here, arguing that any alleged case of an indirect speech act can be construed just as an indication, by means of contextual clues, of the speaker's intentional state–hope, desire, etc., as the case may be. Postulation of a further speech act beyond what has been (relatively) explicitly performed is explanatorily unmotivated.

These considerations suggest that indirect speech acts, if they do occur, can be explained within the framework of conversational implicature–that process by which we mean more than we say, but in a way not due exclusively to the conventional meanings of our words. Conversational implicature, too, depends both upon communicative intentions and the availability of inference to the best explanation. (Grice, 1989). In fact, Searle's 1979b account of indirect speech acts was in terms of conversational implicature. The study of speech acts is in this respect intertwined with the study of conversations; we return to this connection in Section 7.

4. Force, Fit and Satisfaction

Force is often characterized in terms of the notions of direction of fit and conditions of satisfaction. The first of these may be illustrated with an example derived from Anscombe (1963). A woman sends her husband to the grocery store with a list of things to get; unbeknownst to him he is also being trailed by a detective concerned to make a list of what the man buys. By the time the husband and detective are in the checkout line, their two lists contain exactly the same items. The contents of the two lists is the same, yet they differ along another dimension. For the contents of the husband's list guide what he puts in his shopping cart. Insofar, his list exhibits world-to-word direction of fit: It is, so to speak, the job of the items in his cart to conform to what is on his list. By contrast, it is the job of the detective's list to conform with the world, in particular to what is in the husband's cart. As such, the detective's list has word-to-world direction of fit: The onus is on those words to conform to how things are. Speech acts such as assertions and predictions have word-to-world direction of fit, while speech acts such as commands have world-to-word direction of fit.

Not all speech acts appear to have direction of fit. I can thank you by saying “Thank you,” and it is widely agreed that thanking is a speech act. However, thanking seems to have neither of the directions of fit we have discussed thus far. Similarly, asking who is at the door is a speech act, but it does not seem to have either of the directions of fit we have thus far mentioned. Some would respond by construing questions as a form of imperative (e.g., “Tell me who is at the door!”), and then ascribing the direction of fit characteristic of imperatives to questions. This leaves untouched, however, banal cases such as thanking or even, “Hooray for Arsenal!” Some authors, such as Searle and Vanderveken 1985, describe such cases as having “null” direction of fit. That characterization is evidently distinct from saying such speech acts have no direction of fit at all. (The characterization is thus analogous to the way in which some non-classical logical theories describe some proposition as being neither True nor False, but as having a third truth value, N: Evidently that is not to say that such propositions are bereft of truth value.) It is difficult to discern from such accounts how one sheds light on a speech act in characterizing it as having a null direction of fit, as opposed to having no direction of fit at all.[5]

Direction of fit is also not so fine-grained as to enable us to distinguish speech acts meriting different treatment. Consider asserting that the center of the Milky Way is inhabited by a black hole, as opposed to conjecturing that the center of the Milky Way is so inhabited. These two acts seem subject to norms: The former purports to be a manifestation of knowledge, while the latter does not. This is suggested by the fact that it is appropriate to reply to the assertion with, “How do you know?”, while that is not an appropriate response to the conjecture. (Williamson 1996) Nevertheless, both the assertion and conjecture have word-to-world direction of fit. Might there be other notions enabling us to mark differences between speech acts with the same direction of fit? This is not to say that the difference between assertion and conjecture cannot be expressed as a difference among Searle and Vanderveken's seven components of illocutionary force; for instance that difference might be thought of as a difference in parameter 2, namely the degree of strength of illocutionary point. Rather, what we are seeking is an account of, rather than a label for, that difference.

One suggestion might come from the related notion of conditions of satisfaction. This notion generalizes that of truth. As we saw in 2.3, it is internal to the activity of assertion that it aims to capture how things are. When an assertion does so, not only is it true, it has hit its target; the aim of the assertion has been met. A similar point may be made of imperatives: It is internal to the activity of issuing an imperative that the world is enjoined to conform to it. The imperative is satisfied just in case it is fulfilled. Assertions and imperatives both have conditions of satisfaction–truth in the first place, and conformity in the second. In addition, it might be held that questions have answerhood as their conditions of satisfaction: A question hits its target just in case it finds an answer, typically in a speech act, performed by an addressee, such as an assertion that answers the question posed. Like the notion of direction of fit, however, the notion of conditions of satisfaction is too coarse-grained to enable us to make some valuable distinctions among speech acts. Just to use our earlier case again: An assertion and a conjecture that P have identical conditions of satisfaction, namely that P be the case. May we discern features distinguishing these two speech acts, and that may enable us to make finer-grained distinctions among other speech acts as well? I shall return to this question in Section 7.

5. Mood, Force and Convention

Just as content underdetermines force and force underdetermines content; so too even grammatical mood together with content underdetermine force. ‘You'll be more punctual in the future’ is in the indicative grammatical mood, but as we have seen that fact does not determine its force. The same may be said of other grammatical moods. Although I overhear you utter the words, ‘shut the door’, I cannot infer yet that you are issuing a command. Perhaps instead you are simply describing your own intention, in the course of saying, “I intend to shut the door.” If so, you've used the imperative mood without issuing a command. So too with the interrogative mood: I overhear your words, ‘who is on the phone.’ Thus far I don't know whether you've asked a question. After all, you may have so spoken in the course of stating, “John wonders who is on the phone.” Might either or both of initial capitalization or final punctuation settle the issue? Apparently not: What puzzles John is the following question: Who is on the phone?

Mood together with content underdetermine force. On the other hand it is a plausible hypothesis that grammatical mood is one of the devices we use, together with contextual clues, intonation and so on to indicate the force with which we are expressing a content. Understood in this weak way, it is unexceptionable to construe the interrogative mood as used for asking questions, the imperatival mood as used for issuing commands, and so on. So understood, we might go on to ask how speakers indicate the force of their speech acts given that grammatical mood and content cannot be relied on alone to do so.

5.1 Force Conventionalism

One well known answer we may term force conventionalism. According to a strong version of this view, for every speech act that is performed, there is some convention that will have been invoked in order to make that speech act occur. This convention transcends those imbuing words with their literal meaning. Thus, force conventionalism implies that in order for use of ‘I promise to meet you tomorrow at noon,’ to constitute a promise, not only must the words used possess their standard conventional meanings, there must also exist a convention to the effect that the use, under the right conditions, of some such words as these constitutes a promise. J.L. Austin, who introduced the English-speaking world to the study of speech acts, seems to have held this view. For instance in his characterization of “felicity conditions” for speech acts, Austin holds that for each speech act

There must exist an accepted conventional procedure having a certain conventional effect, that procedure to include the uttering of certain words by certain persons in certain circumstances… (1962, p. 14).

Austin's student Searle follows him in this, writing

…utterance acts stand to propositional and illocutionary acts in the way in which, e.g., making an X on a ballot paper stands to voting. (1969, p. 24)

Searle goes on to clarify this commitment in averring,

…the semantic structure of a language may be regarded as a conventional realization of a series of sets of underlying constitutive rules, and …speech acts are acts characteristically performed by uttering sentences in accordance with these sets of constitutive rules. (1969, p. 37)

Searle espouses a weaker form of force conventionalism than does Austin in leaving open the possibility that some speech acts can be performed without constitutive rules; Searle considers the case of a dog requesting to be let outside (1969, p. 39). Nevertheless Searle does contend that speech acts are characteristically performed by invoking constitutive rules.

5.2. An Objection to Force Conventionalism

Force-conventionalism, even in the weaker form just adumbrated, has been challenged by Strawson, who writes,

I do not want to deny that there may be conventional postures or procedures for entreating: one can, for example, kneel down, raise one's arms, and say, “I entreat you.” But I do want to deny that an act of entreaty can be performed only as conforming to such conventions….[T]o suppose that there is always and necessarily a convention conformed to would be like supposing that there could be no love affairs which did not proceed on lines laid down in the Roman de la Rose or that every dispute between men must follow the pattern specified in Touchstone's speech about the countercheck quarrelsome and the lie direct. (1964, p. 444)

Strawson contends that rather than appealing to a series of extra-semantic conventions to account for the possibility of speech acts, we explain that possibility in terms of our ability to discern one another's communicative intentions. What makes an utterance of a sentence in the indicative mood a prediction rather than a command, for instance, is that it is intended to be so taken; likewise for promises rather than predictions. This position is compatible with holding that in special cases linguistic communities have instituted conventions for particular speech acts such as entreating and excommunicating.

Intending to make an assertion, promise, or request, however, is not enough to perform one of these acts. Those intentions must be efficacious. The same point applies to cases of trying to perform a speech act, even when what one is trying to do is clear to others. This fact emerges from reflecting on an oft-quoted passage from Searle:

Human communication has some extraordinary properties, not shared by most other kinds of human behavior. One of the most extraordinary is this: If I am trying to tell someone something, then (assuming certain conditions are satisfied) as soon as he recognizes that I am trying to tell him something and exactly what it is I am trying to tell him, I have succeeded in telling it to him. (1969, p. 47.)

An analogous point would not apply to the act of sending: Just from the facts that I am trying to send my addressee something, and that he recognizes that I am trying to do so (and what it is I am trying to send him), we cannot infer that I have succeeded in sending it to him. However, while Searle's point about telling looks more plausible at first glance than would a point about sending, it also is not accurate. Suppose I am trying to tell somebody that I love her, and that she recognizes this fact on the basis of background knowledge, my visible embarrassment, and my inability to get past the letter ‘l’. Here we cannot infer that I have succeeded in avowing my love for her. Nothing short of coming out and saying it will do. Similarly, it might be common knowledge that my moribund uncle is trying, as he breathes his last, to bequeath me his fortune; still, I won't inherit a penny if he expires before saying what he was trying to.[6]

The gist of these examples is not the requirement that words be uttered in every speech act–we have already observed that speech acts can be performed silently. Rather, its gist is that speech acts involve intentional undertaking of one or another form of commitment; further, that commitment is not undertaken simply by virtue of my intending to undertake it, even when it is common knowledge that this is what I am trying to do. Can we, however, give a more illuminating characterization of the relevant intentions than merely saying that, for instance, to assert P one must intentionally put forth P as an assertion?[7] Strawson (1964) proposes that we can do so with aid of the notion of speaker meaning–a topic to which I now turn.

6. Speaker-Meaning and Force

As we have seen, that A is an important component of communication, and that A underdetermines B, do not justify the conclusion that B is an important component of communication. One reason for an asymmetry in our treatment of force and decibel level is that the former, but not the latter, seems to be a component of speaker meaning. I intend to speak at a certain volume, and sometimes succeed, but in most cases it is no part of what I mean that I happen to be speaking at the volume that I do. On the other hand, the force of my utterance is part of what I mean. It is not, as we have seen, part of what I say–that notion being closely associated with content. However, whether I mean what I say as an assertion, a conjecture, a promise or something else will be a feature of how I mean what I do.

6.1 Grice's Account of Speaker Meaning

Let us elucidate this notion of speaker meaning (née non-natural meaning). In his influential 1957 article, Grice distinguished between two senses of ‘mean’. One sense is exemplified by remarks such as ‘Those clouds mean rain,’ and ‘Those spots mean measles.’ The notion of meaning in play in such cases Grice dubs ‘natural meaning’. Grice suggests that we may distinguish this sense of ‘mean’ from another sense of the word more relevant to communication, exemplified in such utterances as

In saying “You make a better door than a window”, George meant that you should move,

and

In gesticulating that way, Salvatore means that there's quicksand over there,

Grice used the term ‘non-natural meaning’ for this sense of ‘mean’, and in more recent literature this jargon has been replaced with the term ‘speaker meaning’.[8] After distinguishing between natural and (what we shall heretofore call) speaker meaning, Grice attempts to characterize the latter. It is not enough that I do something that influences the beliefs of an observer: In putting on a coat I might lead an observer to conclude that I am going for a walk. Yet in such a case it is not plausible that I mean that I am going for a walk in the sense germane to speaker meaning. Might performing an action with an intention of influencing someone's beliefs be sufficient for speaker meaning? No: I might leave Smith's handkerchief at the crime scene to make the police think that Smith is the culprit. However, whether or not I am successful in getting the authorities to think that Smith is the culprit, in this case it is not plausible that I mean that Smith is the culprit.

What is missing in the handkerchief example is the element of overtness. This suggests another criterion: Performing an action with the, or an, intention of influencing someone's beliefs, while intending that this very intention be recognized. Grice contends that even here we do not have enough for speaker meaning. Herod presents Salome with St. John's severed head on a charger, intending that she discern that St. John is dead and intending that this very intention of his be recognized. Grice observes that in so doing Herod is not telling Salome anything, but is instead deliberately and openly letting her know something. Grice concludes that Herod's action is not a case of speaker meaning either. The problem is not that Herod is not using words; we have already considered hunters who mean things wordlessly. The problem seems to be that to infer what Herod intends her to, Salome does not have to take his word for anything. She can see the severed head for herself if she can bring herself to look. By contrast, in its central uses, telling requires a speaker to intend to convey information (or alleged information) in a way that relies crucially upon taking her at her word. Grice appears to assume that at least for the case in which what is meant is a proposition (rather than a question or an imperative), speaker meaning requires a telling in this central sense. What is more, this last example is a case of performing an action with an intention of influencing someone's beliefs, even while intending that this very intention be recognized; yet it is not a case of telling. Grice infers that it is not a case of speaker meaning either.

Grice holds that for speaker meaning to occur, not only must one (a) intend to produce an effect on an audience, and (b) intend that this very intention be recognized by that audience, but also (c) one must intend this effect on the audience to be produced at least in part by their recognition of the speaker's intention. The intention to produce a belief or other attitude by means (at least in part) of recognition of this very intention, has come to be called a reflexive communicative intention.

6.2 Objections to Grice's Account

It has, however, been shown that intentions to produce cognitive or other effects on an audience are not necessary for speaker meaning. Davis 1992 offers many cases of speaker meaning in the absence of reflexive communicative intentions. Indeed, he forcefully argues that speaker meaning can occur without a speaker intending to produce any beliefs in an audience.[9] [10] Instead of intentions to produce certain effects in an audience, some authors have proposed that speaker meaning is a matter of overtly indicating some aspect of oneself. (Green, 2007). Compare my going to the closet to take out my overcoat (not a case of speaker meaning), with the following case: After heatedly arguing about the weather, I march to the closet while beadily meeting your stare, then storm out the front door while ostentatiously donning the coat. Here it's a lot more plausible that I mean that it's raining outside, and the reason seems to be that I am making some attitude of mine overt: I am not only showing it, I am making clear my intention to do just that.

6.3 Force as an Aspect of Speaker Meaning

How does this help to elucidate the notion of force? One way of asserting that P, it seems, is overtly to manifest my commitment to P, and indeed commitment of a particular kind: commitment to defend P in response to challenges of the form, “How do you know that?” I must also overtly manifest my liability to be either right or wrong on the issue of P depending on whether P is the case. By contrast, I conjecture P by overtly manifesting my commitment to P in this same “liability to error” way; but I am not committed to responding to challenges demanding justification. I must, however, give some reason for believing P; this much cannot, however, be said of a guess.

We perform a speech act, then, when we overtly commit ourselves in a certain way to a content–where that way is an aspect of how we speaker-mean that content. One way to do that is to invoke a convention for undertaking commitment; another way is overtly to manifest one's intention to be so committed. We may elucidate the relevant forms of commitment by spelling out the norms underlying them. We have already adumbrated such an approach in our discussion of the differences among asserting and conjecturing. Developing that discussion a bit further, compare

  • asserting
  • conjecturing
  • guessing

All three of these acts have word-to-world direction of fit, and all three have conditions of satisfaction mandating that they are satisfied just in case the world is as their content says it is. Further, one who asserts, conjectures, or guesses that P is right or wrong on the issue of P depending on whether P is in fact so. However, as we move from left to right we find a decreasing order of stringency in commitment. One who asserts P lays herself open to the challenge, “How do you know that?”, and she is obliged to retract P if she is unable to respond to that challenge adequately. By contrast, this challenge is inappropriate for either a conjecture or a guess. On the other hand, we may justifiably demand of the conjecturer that she give some reason for her conjecture; yet not even this much may be said of one who makes a guess. (The “educated guess” is intermediate between these two cases.)

We may think of this illocutionary dimension of speaker meaning as characterizing not what is meant, but rather how it is meant. Just as we may consider your remark, directed toward me, “You're tired,” and my remark, “I'm tired,” as having said the same thing but in different ways; so too we may consider my assertion of P, followed by a retraction and then followed by a conjecture of P, as two consecutive cases in which I speaker-mean that P but do so in different ways. This idea will be developed a bit further in Section 9 under the rubric of “mode” of illocutionary commitment.

Speaker meaning, then, applies not just to content but also to force, and we may elucidate that claim with a further articulation of the normative structure characteristic of each speech act: When you overtly display a commitment characteristic of that speech act, you have performed that speech act. Is this a necessary condition as well? That depends on whether I can perform a speech act without intending to do so—a topic for Section 9 below. For now, however, compare the view at which we have arrived with Searle's view that one performs a speech act when others become aware of one's intention, or at least one's attempt, to perform that act. What is missing from Searle's characterization is the notion of overtness: The agent in question must not only make her intention to undertake a certain commitment manifest; she must also intend that that very intention be manifest. There is more to overtness than wearing one's heart (or mind) on one's sleeve.

7. Force, Norms, and Conversation

In elucidating this normative dimension of force, we have brought speech acts into their conversational context. That is not to say that speech acts can only be performed in the setting of a conversation: I can approach you, point out that your vehicle is blocking mine, and storm off. Here I have made an assertion but have not engaged in a conversation. Perhaps I can ask myself a question in the privacy of my study and leave it at that–not continuing into a conversation with myself. However, it might reasonably be held that a speech act's ecological niche is nevertheless the conversation. In that spirit, while we may be able to remove it from its environment and scrutinize it in isolated captivity, doing so may leave us blind to some of its distinctive features.

7.1 Speech Acts and Conversation Analysis

This ecological analogy sheds light on a dispute over the question whether speech acts can profitably be studied in isolation from the conversations in which they occur. An empiricist framework, exemplified in John Stuart Mill's, A System of Logic, suggests attempting to discern the meaning of a word, for instance a proper name, in isolation. By contrast, Gottlob Frege (1884) enjoins us to understand a word's meaning in terms of the contribution it makes to an entire sentence. Such a method is indispensable for a proper treatment of such expressions as quantifiers, and represents a major advance over empiricist approaches. Yet students of speech acts have espoused going even further, insisting that the unit of significance is not the proposition but the speech act. Vanderveken writes,

Illocutionary acts are important for the purpose of philosophical semantics because they are the primary units of meaning in the use and comprehension of natural language. (Vanderveken, 1990, p. 1.)

Why not go even further, since speech acts characteristically occur in conversations? Is the unit of significance really the debate, the colloquy, the interrogation?

Students of so-called conversation analysis have contended precisely this, remarking that many speech acts fall naturally into pairs.[11] For instance, questions pair naturally with assertions when the latter purport to be answers. Likewise, offers pair naturally with acceptances or rejections, and it is easy to multiply examples. Searle, who favors studying speech acts in isolation, has replied to these considerations (Searle 1992). There he issues a challenge to students of conversation to provide an account of conversations parallel to that of speech acts, arguing as well that the prospects for such an account are dim. One of his reasons is that unlike speech acts conversations do not as such have a point or purpose. More recently, Asher and Lascardes 2003 have defended a more systematic treatment of speech acts in their conversational setting that responds to Searle's challenge.

7.2 Speech Acts and Scorekeeping

Much literature concerned with speech acts is curiously disconnected from certain traditions flowing from work in the semantics of natural language emphasizing pragmatic factors. For instance, Stalnaker (1972, 1973, 1974) Lewis (1979, 1980), Thomason (1990) and others have developed models of the evolution of conversations aimed at understanding the role of quantification, presupposition (both semantic and pragmatic), anaphora, deixis, and vagueness in discourse. Such models typically construe conversations as involving an ever-developing set of propositions (construed as the conversational “common ground”) that can be presupposed by interlocutors. (Such propositions may, but need not be, understood as sets of possible worlds.) Other parameters characterizing a conversation at a given point include the domain of discourse, a set of salient perceptible objects, standards of precision, time, world or situation, speaker, addressee, and so forth. The set of all values for these items at a given conversational moment is often referred to as “conversational score”.

“Scorekeeping” approaches to language use typically construe a contribution to a conversation as a proposition: If that “assertion” is accepted, then the score is updated accordingly. Little attention is paid to the question whether that proposition is put forth as a conjecture, guess, assertion, or supposition for the sake of argument. An enrichment of the scorekeeping model would do just this. Accordingly Green 1999 attempts a synthesis of some aspects of this scorekeeping model, Gricean pragmatics, and concepts pertaining to speech acts.

8. Force-Indicators and the Logically Perfect Language

Frege's Begriffschrift constitutes history's first thoroughgoing attempt to formulate a rigorous formal system. However, Frege did not see his Begriffschrift as merely a tool for assessing the validity of arguments. Rather, he appears to have seen it as an organon for the acquisition of knowledge from unquestionable first principles; in addition he wanted to use it in order to help make clear the epistemic foundations on which our knowledge rests. To this end his formal system contains not only symbols indicating the content of propositions (including logical constants), but also symbols indicating the force with which they are put forth. In particular, Frege insists that when using his formal system to acquire new knowledge from proposition already known, we use an assertion sign to indicate our acknowledgment of the truth of the proposition used as axioms or inferred therefrom. Frege thus employs what would now be called a force indicator: an expression whose use indicates the force with which an associated proposition is being put forth. (Green 2002).

Reichenbach expands upon Frege's idea in his 1947. In addition to using an assertion sign, Reichenbach also uses indicators of interrogative and imperatival force. Hare similarly introduces force indicators to lay bare the way in which ethical and cognate utterances are made (Hare 1970). Davidson, however, challenges the value of this entire enterprise, arguing that since natural language already contains many devices for indicating the force of one's speech act, the only interest in a force indicator would be if it could guarantee the force of one's speech act. But nothing could: Any device purporting to be, say, an infallible indicator of assertoric force is liable to being used by a joker or actor to heighten the realism of her performance:

It is easy to see that merely speaking the sentence in the strengthened mood cannot be counted on to result in an assertion; every joker, storyteller, and actor will immediately take advantage of the strengthened mood to simulate assertion. There is no point, then, in the strengthened mood; the available indicative does as well as language can do in the service of assertion (Davidson 1979, p. 311).

Dummett 1993 and Hare 1989 reply to Davidson. Hare in particular remarks that there could be a society with a convention that utterance of a certain expression constituted performance of a certain illocutionary act. Green 1997 questions the relevance of this observation to the issue of illocutionary acts, which, as we have seen, seem to require intentions for their performance. Just as no convention could make it the case that I believe that P (though perhaps a convention could make it the case that people say I believe that P), so too no convention could make it the case that I intend to put forth a certain sentence as an assertion.

On the other hand, Green 1997 and Green 2000 also observe that even if there can be no force indicator in the sense Davidson criticizes, nothing prevents natural language from containing devices that indicate force conditional upon one's performing a speech act: Such a force indicator would not show whether one is performing a speech act, but, given that one is doing so, which speech act one is performing. For instance, parenthetical expressions such as, ‘as is the case’ can occur in the antecedent of conditionals, as in: ‘If, as is the case, the globe is warming, then Greenland will melt.’ Use of the parenthetical cannot guarantee that the sentence or any part of it is being asserted, but if the entire sentence is being asserted, then, Green claims, use of the parenthetical guarantees that the speaker is committed to the content of the antecedent. If that claim is correct, natural language already contains force indicators in this qualified sense. Whether it is worth introducing such force indicators into a logical notation remains an open question.

9. Do Speech Acts Have a Logic?

Students of speech acts contend, as we have seen, that the unit of communicative significance is the speech act rather than the proposition. This attitude prompts the question whether logic itself might be enriched by incorporating inferential relations among speech acts rather than just inferential relations among propositions. Since particulars cannot stand in inferential relations to one another, no such relations could obtain between individual speech acts. However, just as two events E1 and E2 (such as running quickly and running) could be logically related to one another in that it is not possible for one to occur without the other; so too speech act types S1 and S2 could be inferentially related to one another if it is not possible to perform one without performing the other. A warning that the bull is about to charge is also an assertion that the bull is about to charge but the converse is not true. This is in spite of the fact that these two speech acts have the same propositional content: That the bull is about to charge. If, therefore, warning implies asserting but not vice versa, then that inferential relation is not to be caught within the net of inferential relations among propositions.

In their Foundations of Illocutionary Logic (1985), Searle and Vanderveken attempt a general treatment of logical relations among speech acts. They describe their central question in terms of commitment:

A theory of illocutionary logic of the sort we are describing is essentially a theory of illocutionary commitment as determined by illocutionary force. The single most important question it must answer is this: Given that a speaker in a certain context of utterance performs a successful illocutionary act of a certain form, what other illocutions does the performance of that act commit him to? (1985, p. 6)

To explicate their notion of illocutionary commitment, these authors invoke their definition of illocutionary force in terms of the seven values mentioned in Section 2.3 above. On the basis of this definition, they define two notions pertinent to entailment relations among speech acts, namely strong illocutionary commitment and weak illocutionary commitment. According to the former definition, an illocutionary act S1 commits a speaker to another illocutionary act S2 iff it is not possible to perform S1 without performing S2. Whether that relation holds between a pair of illocutionary acts depends on the particular septuples with which they are identified. Thus suppose that S1 is identical with <IP1, Str", Mode1, Cont1, Prep1, Sinc1, Stresinc1> (corresponding to illocutionary point, strength, mode of achievement, propositional content, preparatory condition, sincerity condition, and strength of sincerity condition, respectively); and suppose that S2 is identical with <IP1, Str$, Mode1, Cont1, Prep1, Sinc1, Stresinc1>. Suppose further that Str" and Str$ differ only in that " is stronger than $. Then it will not be possible to perform S1 without performing S2; whence the former strongly illocutionarily implies the latter. (This definition of strong illocutionary commitment generalizes in a straightforward way to the case in which a set of speech acts S1, …, Sn-1 implies a speech act Sn.)

Performance of a speech act or set of speech acts can also commit an agent to a distinct content, and do so relative to some force. If P and Q jointly imply R, then my asserting both P and Q commits me to R. That is not to say that I have also asserted R: If assertion were closed under deduction I would assert infinitely many things just by virtue of asserting one. By contrast, if I conjecture P and Q, then I am once again committed to R but not in the way that I would have been had I asserted P and Q. For instance, in the assertion case, once my further commitment to R is made clear, it is within the rights of my addressee to ask how I know that R holds; this would not have been an acceptable reply to my merely conjecturing P and Q.

To explicate this relation, Searle and Vanderveken define weak illocutionary commitment: S1 weakly illocutionarily implies S2 iff every performance of S1 commits an agent to meeting the conditions laid down in the septuple identical to S2 (1985, p. 24). Searle and Vanderveken infer that this implies that if P logically entails Q, and an agent asserts P, then she is committed to believing that Q. These authors stress, however, that this does not mean that the agent who asserts P is committed to cultivating the belief Q when P implies Q. In lieu of that explication, however, it is unclear just what notion of commitment is at issue. It is unclear, for instance, what it could mean to be committed to believing Q (rather than just being committed to Q) if this is not to be explicated as being committed to cultivating the belief that Q.

Other approaches attempt to circumvent such problems by reductively defining the notion of commitment in terms of obligations to action and liability to error and/or vindication. Let S be an arbitrary speaker, < ⊢lAl, …, ⊢nAn, ⊢B> a sequence of force/content pairs; then:

<⊢lAl, …, ⊢nAn, ⊢B> is illocutionarily valid iff if speaker S is committed to each Ai under mode ⊢i, then S is committed to B under mode ⊢.[12]

Because it concerns what force/content pairs commit an agent to what others, illocutionary validity is an essentially deontic notion: It will be cashed out in terms either of obligation to use a content in a certain way conversationally, or liability to error or vindication depending upon how the world is.

Our discussion of the possibility of an illocutionary logic answers one question posed at the end of Section 6.3, namely whether it is possible to perform a speech act without intending to do so. This seems likely given Searle and Vanderveken's definition of strong illocutionary commitment: We need only imagine an agent performing some large number of speech acts, S1, …, Sn-1, which, unbeknownst to her, jointly guarantee that she fulfills the seven conditions defining another speech act Sn. Evidently such a “strict liability” conception still requires that one performs Sn only by virtue of intentionally performing some other set of speech acts S1, …, Sn-1; it is difficult to see how one can perform Sn while having no intention of performing a speech act at all.

We have also made progress on a question raised in Section 1, namely whether “speech act theory” deserves its name. An appropriate definition of illocutions would enable us to explain, rather than merely describe, some features of speech acts. Vanderveken 1990 offers a set of tableaux depicting inferential relations among speech acts. For instance, the following is a fragment of his tableaux for assertives–speech acts whose illocutionary point is to describe how things are:

castigate  reprimand  accuse  blame  criticize  assert  suggest

where strong illocutionary validity moves from left to right. This is because all these speech acts have the illocutionary point of describing how things are, but the propositional content conditions and degree of strength of illocutionary point conditions become increasingly less stringent as we move from left to right. Accounts of this sort offer hope of our being able informatively answer such questions whether someone who castigates an addressee for some state of affairs is also assertorically committed to the obtaining of that state of affairs. Might we discover “illocutionary tautologies”, “illocutionary absurdities” and other phenomena that could shed light on such utterances as “This very utterance is an assertion”, “I doubt this very claim”? Affirmative answers to such questions will be needed if we are to justify our use of “speech act theory”.

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  • Tsohatzidis, S.L. (ed.) (1994) Foundations of Speech Act Theory: Philosophical and Linguistic Perspectives (Routledge)
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  • Watson, G. 2004: ‘Asserting and Promising,’ Philosophical Studies 117: 57-77
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Further Reading

  • Dummett, M. Origins of Analytic Philosophy (Harvard).
  • Furberg, M. 1971. Saying and Meaning: A Main Theme in J. L. Austin's Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Grewendorf, G. and G. Meggle (eds.) 2002: Speech Acts, Mind and Social Reality (Dordrecht: Kluwer).
  • Holdcroft, D. 1978. Words and Deeds: Problems in the Theory of Speech Acts. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lepore, E. and van Gulick, R. (eds). 1991. John Searle and his Critics. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Warnock, G. Ed. 1973: Essays on J. L. Austin. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Warnock, G. 1989: J. L. Austin. New York: Routledge.

Other Internet Resources

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