First published Mon Jan 22, 2007; substantive revision Wed Dec 31, 2014

An assertion is a speech act in which something is claimed to hold, for instance that there are infinitely many prime numbers, or, with respect to some time t, that there is a traffic congestion on Brooklyn Bridge at t, or, of some person x with respect to some time t, that x has a tooth ache at t. The concept of assertion has occupied a central place in the philosophy of language, since it is often thought that making assertions is the use of language most crucial to linguistic meaning. In recent years, by contrast, most of the interest in assertion has come from epistemology.

The nature of assertion and its relation to other categories and phenomena have been subject to much controversy. Some of the ideas of assertion will be presented below. The article will situate assertion within speech act theory and pragmatics more generally, and then go on to present the current main accounts of assertion.[1]

By an account of assertion is here meant a theory of what it consists in to make an assertion. According to such accounts, there are deep properties of assertion: specifying those properties is specifying what a speaker essentially does in making an assertion (e.g., express a belief). There must also be surface properties, which are the properties by which we can tell whether an utterance is an assertion, for instance that it is made by means of uttering a sentence in the indicative mood. Some accounts specify deep properties only, while others relate deep properties to surface properties, as we shall see.

1. Speech acts

Gottlob Frege characterized the assertoric quality of an utterance as an assertoric force (“behauptende Kraft”; Frege 1918b: 22) of the utterance. This idea was later taken over by J.L. Austin (1962: 99–100), the founding father of the general theory of speech acts. Austin distinguished between several levels of speech act, including these: the locutionary act, the illocutionary act and the perlocutionary act. The locutionary act is the act of “‘saying something’ in the full normal sense” (1962: 94), which is the utterance of certain words with certain meanings in a certain grammatical construction, such as uttering ‘I like ice’ as a sentence of English.

The notion of an illocutionary act was introduced by Austin by means of examples (1962: 98–102), and that is the normal procedure. Illocutionary acts are such acts as asserting, asking a question, warning, threatening, announcing a verdict or intention, making an appointment, giving an order, expressing a wish, making a request. An utterance of a sentence, i.e., a locutionary act, by means of which a question is asked is thus an utterance with interrogative force, and when an assertion is made the utterance has assertoric force (sometimes ‘assertive’ is used instead). Each type of illocutionary act is a type of utterance with the corresponding illocutionary force.

The perlocutionary act is made by means of an illocutionary act, and depends entirely on the hearer's reaction. For instance, by means of arguing the speaker may convince the hearer, and by means of warning the speaker may frighten the hearer. In these examples, convincing and frightening are perlocutionary acts.

The illocutionary act does not depend on the hearer's reaction to the utterance. Still, according to Austin (1962: 116–7) it does depend on the hearer's being aware of the utterance and understanding it in a certain way: I haven't warned someone unless he heard what I said. In this sense, the performance of an illocutionary act depends on the “securing of uptake” (Austin 1962: 117). However, although Austin's view is intuitively plausible for speech acts verbs with speaker-hearer argument structure (like x congratulates y) or speaker-hearer-content argument structure (x requests of y that p), it is less plausible when the structure is speaker-content (x asks whether p). The verb ‘assert’ is of the latter kind, as opposed to, for example, ‘tell’. It may be said that I failed to tell him that the station was closed, since he had already left the room when I said so, but that I still asserted that it was closed, since I believed he was still there. As we shall see, several theories of assertion focus on hearer-directed beliefs and intentions of the speaker, without requiring that those beliefs are true or the intentions fulfilled.

Austin had earlier (1956) initiated the development of speech act taxonomy by means of the distinction between constative and performative utterances. Roughly, whereas in a constative utterance you report an already obtaining state of affairs—you say something—in a performative utterance you create something new: you do something (Austin 1956: 235). Paradigm examples of performatives were utterances by means of which actions such as baptizing, congratulating and greeting are performed. Assertion, by contrast, is the paradigm of a constative utterance. However, when developing his general theory of speech acts, Austin abandoned the constative/performative distinction, the reason being that it is not so clear in what sense something is done, for instance by means of an optative utterance, whereas nothing is done by means of an assertoric one. Austin noted, for example, that assertions are subject both to infelicities and to various kinds of appraisal, just like performatives (Austin 1962: 13–66). For instance, an assertion is insincere in case of lying as a promise is insincere when the appropriate intention is lacking (Austin 1962: 40). This is an infelicity of the abuse kind. Also, an assertion is, according to Austin, void in case of a failed referential presupposition, such as in Russell's

  • (1) The present King of France is bald. (Austin 1962: 20)

This is then an infelicity of the same kind—flaw-type misexecutions—as the use of the wrong formula in a legal procedure (Austin 1962: 36), or of the same kind—misinvocations—as when the requirements of a naming procedure aren't met (Austin 1962: 51), or again when I try to sell you something that isn't mine (Austin 1962: 137).

Further, Austin noted that when it comes to appraisals, there is not a sharp difference between acts that are simply true and false, and acts that are assessed in other respects (Austin 1962: 140–7). On the one hand, a warning can be objectively proper or improper, depending on the facts. On the other hand, assertions (statements) can be assessed as suitable in some contexts and not in others, and are not simply true or false. An example is

  • (2) France is hexagonal.[2]

As an alternative, Austin suggested five classes of illocutionary types (or illocutionary verbs): verdictives, exercitives, commissives, behabitives and expositives (Austin 1962: 151–64). You exemplify a verdictive, for example, when as a judge you pronounce a verdict; an exercitive by appointing, voting or advising; a commissive by promising, undertaking or declaring that you will do something; a behabitive by apologizing, criticizing, cursing or congratulating; an expositive by acts appropriately prefixed by phrases like ‘I reply’, ‘I argue’, ‘I concede’ etc., of a general expository nature.

In this classification, assertion would best be placed under expositives, since the prefix ‘I assert’ is or may be of an expository nature. However, an assertion need not in itself be expository. As a classification of illocutionary types Austin's taxonomy is thus not completely adequate.

Other taxonomies have been proposed, for instance by Stephen Schiffer (1972), John Searle (1975b), Kent Bach and Robert M. Harnish (1979), and Francois Recanati (1987). In Bach and Harnish's scheme, similar to Searle's, there are four top categories: constatives, directives (including questions and prohibitives), commissives (promises, offers) and acknowledgments (apologize, condole, congratulate) (1979: 41). The category of constatives includes the subtypes, in Bach and Harnish's terms, of assertives, predictives, retrodictives, descriptives, ascriptives, informatives, confirmatives, concessives, retractives, assentives, dissentives, disputatives, responsives, suggestives and suppositives (1979: 41).

In this list, predictives are distinguished by concerning the future and retrodictives by concerning the past, dissentives by the fact that the speaker is disagreeing with what was earlier said by the hearer, and so on. Assertives, according to this taxonomy, is not distinguished from other constatives by any such feature. As Bach and Harnish point out (1979: 46), most of the specialized types of constatives satisfy the definition of assertives (see section 3.1). This type then stands out as a higher category, including most but not all of the constatives; not for instance suggestives (suggesting, conjecturing) and suppositives (assuming, stipulating).

A leading idea in the taxonomies of Searle (1975a) and Recanati (1987) is to distinguish between between types according to direction of fit. Constative utterances have a word-world direction of fit (what is said is supposed to conform to what the world is like), while performative utterances have world-word direction of fit (the world is supposed to be changed to fit what is said). Again, assertion is the paradigmatic constative type, if not the constative type itself.

2. Pragmatics

Assertion is generally thought of being open, explicit and direct, as opposed for instance to implying something without explicitly saying it. In this respect, assertion is contrasted with presupposition and implicature. The contrast is, however, not altogether sharp, partly because of the idea of indirect speech acts, including indirect assertions.

2.1 Presupposition

A sentence such as

  • (3) Kepler died in misery.

is not true unless the singular term ‘Kepler’ has reference. Still, Frege argued that a speaker asserting that Kepler died in misery, by means of (3) does not also assert that ‘Kepler’ has reference (Frege 1892: 574). That Kepler had reference is not part of the sense of the sentence. Frege's reason was that if it had been, the sense of its negation

  • (4) Kepler did not die in misery.

would have been that Kepler did not die in misery or ‘Kepler’ does not have reference, which is absurd. According to Frege, that ‘Kepler’ has reference is rather presupposed, both in an assertion of (3) and in an assertion of its negation.

The modern treatment of presupposition has followed Frege in treating survival under negation as the most important test for presupposition. That is, if it is implied that $p$, both in an assertion of a sentence $s$ and in an assertion of the negation of $s$, then it is presupposed that $p$ in those assertions (unless that $p$ is entailed by all sentences). Other typical examples of presupposition (Levinson 1983: 178–81) include

  • (5) John managed [didn't manage] to stop in time.

implying that John tried to stop in time, and

  • (6) Martha regrets [doesn't regret] drinking John’s home brew.

implying that Martha drank John's home brew.

In the case of (3), the presupposition is clearly of a semantic nature, since the sentence ‘Someone is identical with Kepler’, which is true just if ‘Kepler’ has reference, is a logical consequence both of (3) and of (4). By contrast, in the negated forms of (5) and (6), the presupposition can be cancelled by context (e.g., as in (7))

  • (7) John didn't manage to stop in time. He didn't even try.

This indicates that in this case the presupposition is rather a pragmatic phenomenon; it is the speaker or speech act rather than the sentence or the proposition expressed that presupposes something. However, the issue of separating semantic from pragmatic aspects of presupposition is complex, and regarded differently in different approaches to presupposition (for an overview, see Simons 2006).[3]

In either case, presupposing should be kept distinct from asserting. One further reason is that the presupposition occurs in other illocutionary types as well. For instance, in asking

  • (8) Did John [didn't John] manage to stop in time?

the speaker normally assumes that John tried and is only asking about the success. Still, it is not easy to distinguish assertion from presupposition in pure speech act terms. Typically, the distinction is based either on the meaning properties of the sentence used, or on properties of the conversational setting, that is on what is taken for granted (cf. section 5, regarding Stalnaker's account).

For instance, by

  • (9) We regret that the pool will be closed today.

a concierge may inform a group checking in to a hotel about the state of the pool.[4] Formally, in (9) it is presupposed rather than asserted that the pool will be closed, but the information is conveyed equally well by means of the presupposition as by means of a more direct assertion with

  • (10) The pool will be closed today.

given that the guests did not already know that the pool would be closed, and given that the guests were able to compute the presupposition (both taken for granted by the concierge). By contrast, assuming that the concierge believes that a guest does know that the pool will be closed, (9) will not be used to convey information about the pool, only about the attitude of the staff, while a sincere utterance of (10) is an assertion that the pool will be closed, whatever is assumed about the hearer's prior knowledge. The contrast between (9) and (10) highlights a common intuition about a central feature of assertion: explicitness. On this intuition, only the content that is explicitly expressed is asserted, while further contents may be indirectly conveyed, relying on background knowledge and reasoning. This idea is controversial, however, and the opposite intuition is that indirect ways of conveying information can be assertoric in their own right. More on this theme below.

2.2 Implicature

Frege noted (1879: 20) that there is no difference in truth conditional content between sentences such as

  • (11) a. John works with real estate and likes fishing.
  • b. John works with real estate but likes fishing.

‘And’ and ‘but’ contribute the same way to truth and falsity. However, when using (11b), but not when using (11a), the speaker indicates that there is a contrast of some kind between working with real estate and liking fishing. The speaker is not asserting that there is a contrast. For instance, forming a conditional with (11b) in the antecedent preserves the contrast rather than make it hypothetical:

  • (12) If John works with real estate but likes fishing, I think we can bring him along.

It is usually said that the speaker in cases like (11b) and (12) implicates that there is a contrast. These are examples of implicature. H. Paul Grice (1975, 1989) developed a general theory of implicature. Grice called implicatures of the kind exemplified conventional, since it is a standing feature of the word ‘but’ to give rise to them.

Most of Grice's theory is concerned with the complementing kind, the conversational implicatures. These rely on general conversational maxims, not on features of expressions. These maxims are thought to be in force in ordinary conversation. For instance, the maxim Be orderly! requires of the speaker to recount events in the order they took place. This is meant to account for the intuitive difference in content between

  • (13) a. John took off his shoes and sat down.
  • b. John sat down and took off his shoes.

According to Grice's account, the speaker doesn't assert, only implicates that the events took place in the order recounted. What is asserted is just that both events did take place.

Real or apparent violations of the maxims generate implicatures, on the assumption that the participants obey the over-arching Cooperative Principle. For instance, in the conversation

  • (14) A: Where does John spend the summer?
  • B: Somewhere in Canada.

B implicates that he doesn't know where in Canada John spends the summer. The reasoning is as follows: B violates the Maxim of Quantity to be as informative as required. Since B is assumed to be cooperative, we can infer that he cannot satisfy the Maxim of Quantity without violating some other maxim. The best candidate is the sub-maxim of the Maxim of Quality that requires you not to say anything for which you lack sufficient evidence. Hence, one can infer that B doesn't know. Again, B has not asserted that he doesn't know, but still managed to convey it in an indirect manner.

The picture is more complex because of a distinction Grice made within the domain of conversational implicatures, between particularized and generalized implicatures (Grice 1975: 37–8). Generalized implicatures do not depend on contextual features, but are default inferences associated with ways of including or not including explicit information. One of Grice's own examples is

  • (15) X is meeting a woman this evening. (Grice 1975: 37)

carrying the generalized implicature that the woman is not “X's wife, mother, sister or perhaps even close platonic friend”.[5]

2.3 Indirect speech acts

The clear distinction between assertion and implicature, as Grice thought of it, is to some extent undermined by acknowledging indirect assertion as a kind of assertion proper. A standard example of an indirect speech act is given by

  • (16) Can you pass the salt?

By means of uttering an interrogative sentence the speaker requests the addressee to pass the salt. The request is indirect. The question, literally concerning the addressee's ability, is direct. As defined by John Searle (1975b: 59–60), and also by Bach and Harnish (1979: 70), an indirect illocutionary act is subordinate to another, more primary act and depends on the success of the first. An alternative definition, given by Sadock (1974: 73), is that an act is indirect just if it has a different illocutionary force from the one standardly correlated with the sentence-type used.

Examples of indirect assertions by means of questions and commands/requests are given by

  • (17) a. May I tell you that, obviously, the square root of a quarter is a half?
  • b. Let me tell you that, obviously, the square root of a quarter is a half! (Levinson 1983: 266)

Rhetorical questions also have the force of assertions:

  • (18) Is not Switzerland a peace-loving nation?

Another candidate type is irony:

  • (19) Switzerland is known for its aggressive foreign policy.

assuming the speaker does mean the negation of what is literally said. However, although in a sense the act is indirect, since the speaker asserts something different from what she would do on a normal, direct use of the sentence, and relies on the hearer to realize this, it is not an indirect assertion by either definition. It isn't on the first, since the primary act (the literal assertion) isn't even made, and it isn't on the second, since there is no discrepancy between force and sentence type.

Irony does, however, qualify as indirect assertion on the definition given by Recanati (1987: 125). According to Recanati, an indirect speech act is a special kind of conversational implicature, where the speaker not only implicates some proposition $p$, but also intends to convey that $p$. In the case of (19), there is an apparent flagrant violation of the Quality principle to say only what is true. On the assumption that the speaker is cooperative, together with background knowledge of her political awareness, the hearer can infer that she does not mean what she literally says, but rather the opposite, that is, that what she wants to communicate is the negation of what she says. For Recanati, the communicative intention is what brings this act under the category of assertion proper (see section 3.1).

Although Searle's definition of indirect speech acts is different, Searle too thinks that they work by means of an inferential mechanism, including that of conventional implicature. The hearer is supposed to understand that the speaker cannot merely be performing the primary act, since that would violate conversational principles, and then again conclude by conversational reasoning what other act has been performed.

The very idea of indirect speech acts is, however, controversial. It is not universally agreed that an ordinary utterance of (16) is indirect, since it has been denied (e.g., by Levinson 1983: 273–6) that a question has really been asked, over and above the request. Similarly, Levinson have questioned the idea of a standard correlation between force and sentence form, by which a request would count as indirect on Sadock's criterion.

The notion of an indirect assertion is controversial, and in need of further clarification. What is common to all ideas is that indirect assertions are not explicit: what is expressed, or literally said, is not the same as what is asserted. One question is whether an utterance is an assertion proper that $p$ if that content is not exactly what is expressed, or whether it is an act of a related kind, perhaps an implicature. Another question is how far an utterance may deviate from explicitness and yet be counted as an assertion, proper or indirect. This question comes up in discussion of proposed counterexamples to certain theories (cf. sentence (21) in subsection 3.2).[6]

3. Social character

Many accounts of assertion emphasize, one way or another, its social character. Some do it from a normative, and some from a descriptive, perspective. In this section and the next, we shall focus on the descriptive versions. These fall into two broad types: the communicative intentions type and what we shall here call the commitment type. According to the former, it is the intentions a speaker has with respect to the mind of the hearer that constitutes assertion, while according to the latter, assertion is constituted by the change of the social relation between speaker and addressee that the utterance brings about.

By an utterance we shall here understand any physical item, event or state of affairs by means of which a speaker communicates. This may be an oral utterance (vocalizing), a physical gesture or sequence of gestures (as in sign languages), an inscription (analogue or digital), or the intentional creation or preservation of some state of affairs (e.g., a configuration of objects). A hearer is someone who observes the utterance and who can understand its communicative significance (exactly what this modal qualification amounts to will not be an issue here). We will need to distinguish between being an addressee, that is the intended receiver of an utterance, and being an actual hearer. There may be other hearers of the utterance than the addressee, some known by the speaker to be hearers (as when speaking to one member of a group of people) and perhaps some unknown (e.g., eaves-droppers). It may also be that the addressee is in fact not a hearer (i.e., does not in fact notice the utterance), only intended to be so by the speaker. We shall first be concerned with the intentions variety.

3.1 Communicative intentions

Typically, the speaker who makes an assertion has addressee-directed intentions in performing a speech act. The speaker may intend the hearer to come to believe something or other about the speaker, or about something else, or intend the hearer to come to desire or intend to do something. Such intentions can concern institutional changes, but need not. Intentions that are immediately concerned with communication itself, as opposed to ulterior goals, are called communicative intentions.

The idea of communicative intentions derives from Grice's (1957) article ‘Meaning’, where Grice defined what it is for a speaker to non-naturally mean something. Grice's idea can be set out as follows:

S non-naturally means something by an utterance $u$ if, and only if, there is a hearer $H$ such that i) $S$ intends u to bring about a response $R$ in $H$, and ii) $S$ intends $H$ to recognize that (i), and iii) $S$ intends at least part of $H$’s reason for $R$ to be that (i).

(cf. Strawson (1964: 28); here ‘that (i)’ is short for ‘that S intends $u$ to bring about a response R in H). That is, the speaker intends the hearer to react in a certain way because of recognizing that the speaker wants him to react in that way. Often, for instance in Grice's original examples, the intended reaction is one of coming to believe something, and that is a reaction that typically fits the speaker's intention or at least desire when making an assertion. Although Grice did not explicitly attempt to define assertion, the idea can be straightforwardly applied to provide one:

  • (Gr-A) S asserts that p by the utterance u iff there is a hearer H such that
  • i. S intends u to produce in H the belief that p
  • ii. S intends H to recognize that i)
  • iii. S intends H to believe that p at least partly for the reason that i)

In the early to mid 1960s Austin's speech act theory and Grice's account of communicative intentions began to merge. The connection is discussed in Strawson 1964. Strawson inquired whether illocutionary force could be made overt by means of communicative intentions. He concluded that when it comes to highly conventionalized utterances, communicative intentions are largely irrelevant, but that on the other hand, convention does not play much role for ordinary illocutionary types. Strawson also pointed out a difficulty with Grice's analysis: it may be the case that all three conditions are fulfilled, but that the speaker intends the hearer to believe that they aren't, for instance by intending the hearer to believe that the speaker wants him to believe that $p$ for an entirely different reason.

Such intentions to mislead came to be called sneaky intentions (Grice 1969), and they constituted a problem for speech act analyses based on communicative intentions. The idea was that genuine communication is essentially open: the speaker's communicative intentions are meant to be fully accessible to the hearer. Sneaky intentions violate this requirement of openness, and therefore apparently they must be ruled out one way or another. Strawson's own solution was to add a fourth clause about the speaker's intention that the hearer recognize the third intention. However, that solution only invited a sneaky intention one level up (cf. Schiffer 1972: 17–42).

Another solution was to make the intention reflexive. This was proposed by Searle (1969), in the first full-blown analysis of illocutionary types made by appeal to communicative intentions. Searle combined this with an appeal to social institutions as created by rules. We return to these in the following subsection.

Searle criticized Grice for requiring the speaker to intend perlocutionary effects, such as what the speaker shall come to do or believe, pointing out that such intentions aren't essential (1969: 46–7). Instead, according to Searle, the speaker intends to be understood, and also intends to achieve this by means of the hearer's recognition of this very intention itself. Moreover, if the intention is recognized, it is also fulfilled: ‘we achieve what we try to do by getting our audience to recognize what we try to do’ (Searle 1969: 47). This reflexive intention is formally spelled out as follows:

  • (Srl-I) S utters sentence T and means it (i.e., means literally what he says) = S utters T and
  • a) S intends (i-1) the utterance U of T to produce in H the knowledge (recognition, awareness) that the states of affairs specified by (certain of) the rules of T obtain. (Call this the illocutionary effect, IE)
  • b) S intends U to produce IE by means of the recognition of i-1
  • c) S intends that i-1 will be recognized in virtue of (by means of) H's knowledge of (certain of) the rules governing (the elements of) T. (Searle 1969: 49–50)

The illocutionary effect IE is the effect of generating the state specified in the constitutive rule. In the case of assertion, the speaker intends that her utterance counts as an undertaking that p represents an actual state of affairs, depending on the constitutive rule (see next subsection).

Bach and Harnish follow Searle in appealing to reflexive communicative intentions. On their analysis (Bach & Harnish 1979: 42), assuming a speaker S and a hearer H,

  • (BH-A) S asserts that p iff S expresses
  • i) the belief that p, and
  • ii) the intention that H believe that p.

According to Bach and Harnish's understanding, a speaker S expresses an attitude just in case S R-intends (reflexively intends) the hearer to take S's utterance as reason to think S has that attitude. They understand the reflexive nature of the intention pretty much like Searle. They say (1979: 15) that the intended effect of an act of communication is not just any effect produced by means of recognition of the intention to produce a certain effect, it is the recognition of that intention.

These appeals to reflexive intentions were later criticized, in particular by Sperber and Wilson (1986: 256–7). Their point is that if an intention I has as sub-intentions both the intention J and the intention that the hearer recognize I, this will yield an infinitely long sequence: the intention that: J and the hearer recognize the intention that: J and the hearer recognize the intention that: J and …). If this is an intention content at all, it is not humanly graspable.

Another variant of the communicative intention analysis is Recanati's. Part of Recanati's solution to the sneaky intention problem, following Grice (1969), consists in simply demanding that sneaky intentions be absent. This is what it is for an intention to be open, or default-reflexive (Recanati 1987: 191–207). He also follows Sperber and Wilson's idea of making something manifest, i.e., perceptible or inferable (1987: 120, 180; Sperber & Wilson 1986: 38). Putting the various ingredients together (including prototypicality conditions of assertion—Recanati 1987: 183), we get:

  • (Re-A) To assert that p is to make an utterance u by which it is made manifest that the speaker has an open (default-reflexive) intention that
  • (a) u gives the audience reason to believe that the speaker knows that p and wishes to share that knowledge with the audience, and
  • (b) the audience recognize (a), and recognize it as open.

This is another complex analysis. The complexity of these accounts is itself a problem, since it assumed that ordinary speakers are in the habit of making assertions, and thereby to have the required intentions for doing it. But since it requires detailed analytic work to come up with the accounts, and there even are competing accounts, it is unlikely that ordinary speakers have the intentions required. If they do, they are clearly not aware of having them as agents usually are aware of their intentions. Postulating such intentions in ordinary speakers is clearly problematic.

The difficulty is made more severe, because there are speakers with a demonstrated inability to understand belief and other cognitive attitudes. Some speakers with autism, who are clearly by everyday standards using language for making assertions, fail so-called false-belief tests. Thereby they reveal an inability to distinguish between a proposition being believed and being true, and hence (since they do distinguish between truth and falsity), reveal a lack of understanding of what it is to believe something. If you cannot understand what it is to believe something, you cannot intend someone to believe something either (cf. Glüer & Pagin 2003). All in all, the complexity and sophistication required of asserters by these communication-intentions accounts, gives a reason to suspect that they do not provide necessary conditions for making assertions.

Normative and commitment accounts of assertion do not seem in general to suffer from these problems.

3.2 Communicative commitments

The other aspect of the social character of assertion concerns what the speaker does by means of making an assertion. The idea is often stated in terms of making a commitment/undertaking, or taking responsibility. This was emphasized by C.S. Peirce:

What is the nature of assertion? We have no magnifying-glass that can enlarge its features, and render them more discernible; but in default of such an instrument we can select for examination a very formal assertion, the features of which have purposely been rendered very prominent, in order to emphasize its solemnity. […] This ingredient, the assuming of responsibility, which is so prominent in solemn assertion, must be present in every genuine assertion. For clearly, every assertion involves an effort to make the intended interpreter believe what is asserted, to which end a reason for believing it must be furnished. But if a lie would not endanger the esteem in which the utterer was held, nor otherwise be apt to entail such real effects as he would avoid, the interpreter would have no reason to believe the assertion. (Peirce 1934: 547)

We can distinguish three ideas in the quote from Peirce, and add a fourth that has been proposed by later authors. Firstly, as a matter of socio-linguistic observation, speakers in fact in some sense take responsibility for, or commit themselves to, being right in what they say. The speaker puts her cognitive authority behind it, so to speak, and has to suffer some measure of social humiliation if what she says turns out false. This idea of commitment can also serve to distinguish between assertion proper and weaker constative forms, such as guesses and conjectures, since these differ from assertion with respect to commitment.

Secondly, there is the further idea that the commitment is made to the addressee or the hearers in general. The speaker who makes an incorrect assertion opens himself to criticism by his addressee, perhaps for misleading him, in a way similar to a subject who fails to live up to a promise. In this respect, the social relation between speaker and addressee has changed because of the assertion. Typically, the addressee will hold the speaker accountable for the correctness of the assertion, and the speaker accept to be held so accountable. This is again a socio-linguistic observation: it does not follow that the speaker actually is accountable.

Thirdly, Peirce has the idea that it is the responsibility-taking that gives the addressee the reason to believe what is asserted. It is unclear whether Peirce speaks of reasons in the descriptive sense (a person's actual reason, good or bad) or in the normative sense (a good reason, actual or not). It is again probably socio-linguistically true that hearers are more prone to believe the speaker when they perceive him as sincere, thereby as taking responsibility. However, a speaker may be sincere but unreliable (prone to error) and also reliable but insincere (for instance, conveying messages without caring about their accuracy). As regards having a good reason, it seems that the reliability of the speaker is the crucial factor, not sincerity (but see Moran 2005 for the opposite view).

Fourthly, we might take the commitment idea to be what essentially characterizes assertion: on this idea, asserting that $p$ consists in committing oneself to the truth of $p$. This is the leading idea of commitment accounts of assertion.[7]

Commitment-making is a central idea in Searle's (1969) account. In Searle's view, there are five rules for the use of force indicating devices, that is, devices that exhibit the utterance as having a particular force. In the case of assertion, they are as follows. Here S is the speaker and H the hearer:

  • (Srl-A) 1. The propositional content rule: what is to be expressed is any proposition p.
  • 2. First preparatory rule: S has evidence (reasons etc.) for the truth of p.
  • 3. Second preparatory rule: It is not obvious to both S and H that H knows (does not need to be reminded of, etc.) p.
  • 4. Sincerity rule: S believes p.
  • 5. Constitutive rule: Counts as an undertaking to the effect that p represents an actual state of affairs.

The fifth rule is the crucial one, and it is held to be constitutive of assertion. Constitutive rules are contrasted with regulative rules rules (the terminology is taken from Kant). Roughly, whereas regulative rules regulate a pre-existing activity, such as traffic regulations regulate traffic, constitutive rules in a sense create a new activity. Paradigm examples are rules of games, taken as defining the games, and thus making it possible to play them. The distinction was introduced by Rawls (1955), and also suggested by C.G.B. Midgley (1959), in the same terms and format as later by Searle (1969: 33–42; cf. Glüer & Pagin 1999).

That is, according to Searle, without rule 5, the practice of assertion would not exist. Once the rule is in force, an utterance with the relevant assertion-indicating device creates the undertaking, and thereby also the assertion itself. According to Searle (1969: 65), the speaker expresses the state required by the sincerity rule, i.e., in the case of assertion, expresses a belief. Also, the speaker implies that the preparatory conditions are met.

The analysis is completed by first requiring that normal input and output conditions obtain, second that the conditions of Rules 1–4 are met, and finally that the semantical rules of the dialect spoken by S and H are such that T is correctly and sincerely uttered if and only if the the aforementioned conditions are met. Searle's account is thus a complicated combination of appeals to linguistic conventions, social relations, and reflexive communicative intentions (see previous subsection).

Later social accounts have tended to focus either on the conventional/institutional or on the intentional features. An example is Kotatko (1998: 236–9), who like Searle stresses the importance of social conventions about what counts as making a commitment or undertaking. Another example is Alston (2000: 120):

  • (Als-A) U asserted that p in uttering S iff
  • 1. U R'd that p
  • 2. S explicitly presents the proposition that p, or S is uttered as elliptical for a sentence that explicitly presents the proposition that p.

Here the locution “$R$'d that $p$” is short for “$U$ took responsibility for its being the case that $p$” (2000: 7).

There is in such accounts a question of what it exactly consists in to make a commitment or undertaking to the truth of a proposition. One elaboration of this idea is provided by Brandom (1994). According to Brandom (1994: 173–5), the nature of assertion consists in the fact that in asserting, the speaker achieves two different social results at the same time: on the one hand she authorizes the hearer to claim anything that follows from what is asserted and on the other she undertakes the responsibility of justifying it.

Another suggestion is given in MacFarlane (2005):

  • (MF1-A) (W*) In asserting that p at $C_{1}$, one commits oneself to withdrawing the assertion (in any future context $C_{2}$) if p is shown to be untrue relative to context of use $C_{1}$ and context of assessment $C_{2}$.

This is the idea that assertion is partly characterized by a commitment to take back, withdraw, or (in later writings) retract, the assertion in later adverse contexts. MacFarlane's framework is relativist, with the idea that the truth of a sentence, as well as the evaluation of an assertion, for some particular kinds of sentences (e.g., concerning future contingents) must be judged with respect to both the original context of use, and a separate independent context of assessment (e.g., by an assessor at a future time). As we shall see, later MacFarlane restates the idea in terms of norms of assertion, but then too, the idea of retraction of an assertion is central.

It may be noted here that Dummett in passing expresses a related idea in saying that “an assertion is a kind of gamble that the speaker will not be proved wrong” (Dummett 1976: 84). Should it turn out that the speaker was wrong, he “may subsequently be compelled to withdraw it as incorrect” (Dummett 1991: 165).

Both Searle and Brandom took an analysis of promising as the role model for analysing assertion. There are clear similarities. For instance, by means of a sincere utterance of

  • (20) I promise to call the repair shop

the speaker has committed herself, in relation to the addressee, to do something. Both speaker and hearer will regard the speaker as having incurred an obligation to the addressee. The relation between asserting and promising is discussed in detail in Watson 2004. Watson elaborates on the similarities in commitments made with assertions and with promises: both involve a secondary commitment of what to do in case things go wrong (2004: 67). But he also emphasizes the basic difference: that in the case of assertion, but not in the case of promises, the commitment is to something that is independent of the speaker. According to Watson, this is not the truth of what is asserted, but its defensibility (2004: 68). A consequence of this is that the speaker is obliged to to defend the assertion if challenged (2004: 70).

Sandy Goldberg (2013) has recently drawn attention to the phenomenon of anonymous assertion, which is exemplified in particular in anonymous posts in comment threads or discussion forums on the Internet. He remarks that in such circumstances, hearers cannot hold speakers responsible for their utterances, and have no means of assessing the epistemic credentials of the speakers, which leaves them without warrant to trust the speakers, and speakers know this. As a result,

when it is mutually known by all parties that a claim was made under conditions of anonymity, this has a diminishing affect on the sort of (assertion-generated) expectations that speakers and hearers are entitled to have of one another. (2013: 135)

The question is how much of the commitment remains. If utterances in these circumstances are still recognizably assertions, there seem to be assertions without, or with hardly any, speaker commitments. Although this is not an issue raised by Goldberg, it seems hard for a commitment account to accommodate.

Suppose, nonetheless, that it is true that in general (or perhaps even always), that speakers do make commitments when asserting. Suppose, similarly, that in general, or perhaps always, speakers do have communicative intentions of some kind when asserting. Would either assumption directly provide an account of assertion in these terms? The answer is no, for the assumptions are only that committing oneself, or having certain communicative intentions, is a necessary condition for making an assertion. It is a further step to infer that the respective conditions are sufficient as well, that is, that there are no other ways of expressing the relevant commitments or communicative intentions that are not assertions.

Are there other ways? It is argued in Pagin (2004) that there are, since one can use the very statement of a social character account itself to construct an utterance type that isn't assertoric, but that would be assertoric by the account in question. A simple example is given by

  • (21) I hereby commit myself to the truth of the proposition that there are black swans.

Intuitively, a sincere utterance of (21) would not be an assertion that there are black swans. What is said does not entail that there are black swans. It seems to be no more than a declaration of the speaker's stand on the issue, and that declaration may be accurate even if there are no black swans. Still, it does incur a commitment to the truth of the proposition that there are black swans. If this is right, then incurring a commitment to truth is not sufficient for asserting. Similar constructions can be made out of other accounts, for instance by letting the speaker declare herself to have certain complex intentions.

Pagin's arguments have been criticized. For instance, Pegan (2009) argues, among other things, that the proposed counterexamples can be blocked by carefully amending the theory (cf. Pagin (2009) for a reply). Both MacFarlane (2011) and García-Carpintero (2013) argue that we should distinguish between what is said and what is asserted, and that this allows us to maintain that an indirect assertion that swans are black are made by means of directly saying that the speaker commits himself. According to both, Pagin's attempt to block the indirect assertion route fails.

4. Self-representation

According to Frege (1918a: 22), an assertion is an outward sign of a judgment (Urteil). The term ‘judgment’ has been used in several ways. If it is used to mean either belief, or act by which a belief is formed or reinforced, then Frege's view is pretty close to the view that assertion is the expression of belief.

How should one understand the idea of expressing here? It is natural to think of a belief state, that is, a mental state of the speaker, as causally co-responsible for the making of the assertion. The speaker has a belief and wants to communicate it, which motivates an assertoric utterance. But what about the cases when the speaker does not believe what he asserts? Can we still say, even of insincere assertions, that they express belief? If so, in what sense?

Within the communicative intentions tradition, Bach and Harnish have emphasized that an assertion gives the hearer evidence for the corresponding belief, and that what is common to the sincere and insincere case is the intention of providing such evidence:

For S to express an attitude is for S to R-intend the hearer to take S's utterance as reason to think S has that attitude. (Bach & Harnish 1979: 15), italics in the original)

(‘R-intend’ is, as above, short for ‘reflexively intend’). On this view, expressing is wholly a matter of hearer-directed intentions.

This proposal has the advantage of covering both the sincere and the insincere case, but has the drawback of requiring a high level of sophistication. By contrast, Bernard Williams (2002: 74) has claimed that a sincere assertion is simply the direct expression of belief, in a more primitive way. Insincere assertions are different. According to Williams (2002: 74), in an assertion, the speaker either gives a direct expression of belief, or he intends the addressee to “take it” that he has the belief (cf. Owens 2006).

Presumably, the intention mentioned is an intention about what the addressee is to believe about the speaker. In this case the objection that too much sophistication is required is less pressing, since it only concerns insincere assertions. However, Williams's idea (as in Grice 1969) has the opposite defect of not taking more sophistication into account. The idea that the alternative to sincerity is the intention to make the addressee believe that the speaker believes what he asserts, is not general enough. An insincere speaker $S$ who asserts that $p$ may know that the addressee $A$ knows that $S$ does not believe that $p$, but may still intend to make $A$ believe that $S$ does not know about $A$'s knowledge, precisely by making the assertion that $p$. There is no definitive upper limit to the sophistication of the deceiving speaker's calculations (cf. Pagin 2011: Section 7). In addition, the speaker may simply be stonewalling, reiterating an assertion without any hope of convincing the addressee of anything.

A more neutral way of trying to capture the relation between assertion and believing was suggested both by Max Black (1952) and by Davidson (1984a: 268): in asserting that p the speaker represents herself as believing that p. This suggestion appears to avoid the difficulties with the appeal to hearer-directed intentions.

A somewhat related approach is taken by Mitchell Green (2007), who appeals to “expressive conventions”. Grammatical moods can have such conventions (2007: 150). According to Green (2007: 160), an assertion that $p$ invokes a set of conventions according to which the speaker “can be represented as bearing the belief-relation to $p$”.

As one represent oneself as believing, one can also represent oneself as knowing. Inspired by Davidson's proposal, Peter Unger (1975: 253–70) and Michael Slote (1979: 185) made the stronger claim that in asserting that p the speaker represents herself as knowing that p. To a small extent this idea had been anticipated by G.E. Moore when claiming that the speaker implies that she knows that p (1966: 63).

However, it is not so clear what representing oneself amounts to. It must be a sense different from that in which one represents the world as having certain features. The speaker who asserts

  • (22) There are black swans.

does not also claim that she believes that there are black swans. It must apparently be some weaker sense of ‘represent’, since it is not just a matter of being, as opposed to not being, fully explicit. By means of answering the question what I believe with an utterance of (22) I do represent myself as believing that there are black swans, equivalently with asserting it. What I assert then is wrong if I don't have the belief, despite the existence of black swans.

On the other hand, it must also be stronger than the sense of ‘represent’ by which an actor can be said to represent himself as believing something on stage. The actor says

  • (23) I’m in the biology department.

thereby representing himself as asserting that he is in the biology department, since he represents himself as being a man who honestly asserts that he is in the biology department. By means of that, he in one sense represents himself as believing that he is in the biology department. But the audience is no way invited to believe that the speaker, that is, the actor, has that belief.

Apparently, the relevant sense of ‘represent’ is not easy to specify. That it nevertheless tracks a real phenomenon is often claimed to be shown by Moore's Paradox. This is the paradox that assertoric utterances of sentences such as

  • (24) It is raining but I don’t believe that it is raining.

(the omissive type of Moorean sentences) are distinctly odd, and even prima facie self-defeating, despite the fact that they may well be true. Among the different types of account of Moore's Paradox, Moore's own emphasizes the connection between asserting and believing. Moore's idea (1944: 175–6; 1966: 63) was that the speaker in some sense implies that she believes what she asserts. So by asserting (24) the speaker induces a contradiction between what she asserts and what she implies. This contradiction is then supposed to explain the oddity.

An analogous move has been made as regards knowledge-varieties of Moorean sentences, such as

  • (25) It is raining, but I don't know that it is raining.

Clearly, utterances of sentences like (25) are bad, and some think that they are as bad as the paradigmatic Moorean sentences like (24). It is then argued that their badness show that a speaker who asserts that $p$ also represents himself as knowing that $p$ (cf. Unger 1975: 256–60; Slote 1979: 179, and Williamson 2000: 253–5 with application to the knowledge norm).

Linguistic arguments of this kind in general, explicitly or implicitly, have the form of an inference to the best explanation. As such, they are problematic, since there are competing explanations of the badness of Moorean utterances. We return to this topic at end of subsection 6.2.

A definition proposed by Dummett (1981: 300) may be seen as a way of cashing in the talk of self-representation:

  • (D-A) A man makes an assertion if he says something in such a manner as deliberately to convey the impression of saying it with the overriding intention of saying something true.

Dummett's proposal is presumably intended to give necessary as well as sufficient conditions, but there are problems with both. With the necessary conditions because of the possibility of direct expressions of belief, as urged by Williams, and with sufficiency for reasons of the same kind as discussed at the end of the previous section: a speaker may try to convey the Dummett-type impression in deviant ways.

5. Cognition

Communicative intentions accounts, commitment accounts, and self-representation accounts are all descriptive: they say nothing about what ought to be done, about the existence of norms, or about the propriety/correctness of assertions. However, except for the idea that a sincere assertion is the expression of a belief that a speaker actually has, none of these types of account focuses on the cognitive features of representing the world and judging the representation to be true as a main characteristic. A few more cognitively oriented accounts do that.

5.1 Relation to truth

As noted above, Frege held (1918a: 22) that an assertion is an outward sign of a judgment (Urteil). A judgment in turn, in Frege's view, is a step from a Thought, that is, a representational content, to the acknowledgment of its truth (Frege 1892: 34; translation in Frege 1960: 64, with ‘admission’ instead of ‘acknowledgment’ for Anerkennung). Since for Frege, the truth value is the Reference (Bedeutung) of a sentence, a judgment is an advance from Sense to Reference. In case the subject makes a mistake, it is not the actual Reference, but anyway the Reference the subject takes it to have.

We can transform Frege's view slightly, in the following way: in judging that $p$, the subject advances from the content that $p$ to the relevant point of evaluation, with respect to which this content is either true or false. Frege countenanced exactly one point of evaluation: the World. In a sense, judging is applying a content to the World.

In this form, the idea generalizes. If contents are possible-worlds propositions, the points of evaluation are possible worlds. All actual judgments are then applications of propositions to the actual world. If contents are temporal propositions, true or false with respect to world-time pairs, then all actual judgments are applications to the ordered pair of the actual world and a relevant time, usually the time at which the judgment is made. This is the point with respect to which a sentence, used in a context of utterance, has its truth value (cf. Kaplan 1989: 522). Again, the relation is general: if the content of a judgment is a function from indices of some type to truth values, then a judgment is the very step of applying that content to the relevantly actual index.

On this picture, what holds for judgment carries over to assertion. It is in the force of an utterance that the step is taken from the content to the actual point of evaluation. This view has been stated by Recanati with respect to the actual world:

a content is not enough; we need to connect that content with the actual world, via the assertive force of the utterance, in virtue of which the content is presented as characterizing that world. (Recanati 2007: 37)

Essentially, this is Frege's view: the speaker gives an outer sign of taking the proposition to be true. The question is whether this view can be given a non-metaphorical rendering that improves on the idea of expressing a belief.

One phrase that is often used in this context that of “presenting a proposition as true” (cf. Wright 1992: 34). Prima facie, it characterizes assertion well. However, there are two problems with the idea. The first is that it should generalize to other speech act types, but does not seem to do so. For instance, presenting the proposition that Elsa is at home as a proposition that the speaker would like to know the truth value of, leaves it open whether the utterance is interrogative, optative, or imperative:

  • (26) a. Is Elsa at home?
  • b. I would like to know whether Elsa is at home.
  • c. Inform me whether Elsa is at home!

Secondly, it is unclear what “presenting” amounts to. It must be a sense of the word different from that in which the word ‘heterological’ is presented as long in

  • (27) ‘Heterological’ is a long word.

For if the word is presented as long in the sentence (27), then also the proposition that snow is white is presented as true in the sentence

  • (28) The proposition that snow is white is true.

even if the sentence is not uttered assertorically. There is therefore a weak sense of ‘present’, which does not require that the presentation itself is made with assertoric force (like an obsolete label on a bottle), and that sense is too weak. It would be instantiated by conjectures, assumptions, and perhaps also by forceless utterances. There is clearly also a stronger sense of ‘present’ which does require assertoric force (for cases when the label is taken to apply), but that is just what we want to have (non-circularly) explained. Simply using the phrase “present as true” does not by itself help.

Another idea for characterizing assertion in terms of truth-related attitudes is that assertion aims at truth. This is stated, for instance, both by Bernard Williams (1966) and by Michael Dummett (1981). It can be understood in two rather different ways, the one intended by Williams and the other by Dummett (for some ways of understanding what it could be for belief to aim at truth, see Engel (2004), Glüer & Wikforss (2013).

On Williams's view, the property of aiming at truth is what characterizes fact-stating discourse, as opposed to, e.g., evaluative or directive discourse. It is natural to think of

  • (29) The moon is about 384.000 km from the Earth

as stating a fact, and of

  • (30) Bardot is good

as expressing an evaluation, not corresponding to any fact of the matter. On Williams's view, to regard a sincere utterance of

  • (31) It is wrong to steal

as a moral assertion, is to take a realistic attitude to moral discourse: there are moral facts, making moral statements objectively true or false. This view again comes in two versions. On the first alternative, the existence of moral facts renders the discourse fact-stating, whether the speaker thinks so or not, and the non-existence renders it evaluative, again whether the speaker thinks so or not. On the second alternative, an utterance of (31) is an assertion if the speaker has a realistic attitude towards moral discourse and otherwise not.

On these views, it is assumed that truth is a substantial property (Williams 1966: 202), not a concept that can be characterized in some deflationary way. As a consequence, the sentence

  • (32) ‘Bardot is good’ is true.

is to be regarded as false, since (30) is objectively neither true nor false; there is no fact of the matter.

Pointing to the difference between fact-stating and evaluative discourse may help to distinguish assertions from evaluations, but does not, again, help to distinguish assertion from other acts within the fact-stating family, such as conjectures and assumptions. In fact, unless we read a lot into “stating”, it is not enough even to distinguish assertion from other acts that concern facts, or states of affairs, such expressing a wish that a fact obtains.

In addition, recent years have seen a broadening of the use of the terms ‘truth’ and ‘assertion’ that runs counter to characterizing assertion by means of the fact-value dichotomy. In various forms of relativism, expressions of judgments of personal taste, such as

  • (33) Licorice is tasty.

are characterized as assertions, and the semantic treatments use truth as the basic sentence property. Common to varieties of relativism with respect to predicates of personal taste is the idea that there is an extra parameter of evaluation, a standard of taste, over and above, say, possible world and time. Despite the lack of objectivity in a more ordinary sense, such a semantics is typically coupled with treating utterances of sentences such as as assertions (cf. Kölbel 2004: 71; Lasersohn 2005; Egan 2012; MacFarlane 2014: Chpt. 7). There is, of course, a further question whether such a treatment is appropriate.

5.2 Models of communication

Perhaps the best way of capturing the cognitive nature of assertion is to to give a theory of the cognitive features of normal communication by means of assertion. A classic theory is Stalnaker's (1974, 1978). Stalnaker provides a model of a conversation in which assertion and presupposition dynamically interact. On Stalnaker's model, propositions are presupposed in a conversation if they are on record as belonging to the common ground between the speakers. When an assertion is made and accepted in the conversation, its content is added to the common ground, and the the truth of the proposition in question will be presupposed in later stages. What is presupposed at a given stage has an effect on the interpretation of new utterances made at that stage. Stalnaker uses a possible worlds framework, and characterizes the common ground as a set of possible worlds (the worlds where all that is presupposed is true), the context set.

In this framework Stalnaker (1978: 88–89) proposes three rules for assertion:

  • (Stal) i. A proposition is always true in some but not in all of the possible worlds in the context set.
  • ii. Any assertive utterance should expresses a proposition, relative to each possible world in the context set, and that proposition should have truth value in each possible world in the context set.
  • iii. The same proposition is expressed relative to each possible world in the context set.

Stalnaker comments on the first rule:

To assert something incompatible with what is presupposed is self-defeating […] And to assert something which already presupposed is to attempt to do something that is already done.

On such an approach, the satisfaction of a presupposition is an admittance condition of an assertion (cf. Karttunen 1974; Heim 1983). This idea connects with Austin's more general pragmatic idea of felicity conditions of speech acts.

However, as was already pointed out by Stalnaker (1974: 55), and later stressed in Lewis (1979), an assertion that intuitively presupposes the truth of another proposition need not fail, but can instead have the effect of adjusting the common ground. In so-called accommodation, the hearer adds background assumptions that would be required for interpretation. For instance, upon hearing Lewis utter

  • (34) The cat has gone upstairs

the hearer who didn't know may accommodate by adding the assumption that there is a unique, contextually salient cat. Accommodation is further discussed in Stalnaker (2002), where it is stressed, among other things, that it works, when it works, because of what is already presupposed. For example (34), it is presupposed that the speaker knows whether or not he has a cat.

Whatever the truth about presupposition accommodation, Stalnaker offers a model of the cognitive features of communication and the role of assertion therein. Does it thereby also offer an account of assertion? The answer is no, for the role of assertion is shared by other speech acts such as assuming and conjecturing. What is added to the common ground is only for the purpose of conversation, and need not be actually believed by the participants. It is only required that it be accepted (cf. Stalnaker 2002: 716).

Stalnaker has not (as far as I am aware) attempted to add a distinguishing feature of assertion to the model. This has, however, been attempted by Jonathan Schaffer (2008) and by Max Kölbel (2011: 68–70). Schaffer proposes to add a topic-sensitive knowledge norm (cf. subsection 6.2) to the Stalnakerian picture. Kölbel focuses on commitments instead. According to Kölbel, assumptions differ from assertion in two respects. Firstly, they are temporary, which means that they can be revoked when they have served their purpose. Secondly, they do not have the same commitment properties. On Kölbel's view, an assertion that $p$ is made with the (Brandomian) undertaking of the “obligation to justify that $p$ on request”. This undertaking, according to Kölbel, also distinguishes assertion from presupposition, although in a more subtle way. It is not, however, clear why in Kölbel's view, Stalnaker's account would be needed in addition to the obligation property.

Another cognitive account is offered by Pagin (2011). The account is summarized by the phrase: “an assertion is an utterance that is prima facie informative”. For an utterance to be informative is for it to be made in part “because it is true”. What this amounts to is different, but complementary, for speaker and hearer. For the speaker, part of the reason for using a particular sentence is that it is true (in context); that is, the speaker believes, with a sufficient strength, that the sentence expresses a true proposition. For the hearer, taking the utterance as informative, means, by default, to update his credence in the proposition as a response to the utterance, both in the upwards direction and to a level above 0.5.

The prima facie element of the account means that the typical properties on the speaker and hearer side are only default properties associated with surface features of the utterance: the declarative sentence type, a typical intonation pattern, etc. There are many possible reasons why a speaker my utter such a sentence without believing the proposition, and why a hearer may not adjust his credence in the typical manner. For example, the speaker may be lying, the hearer may distrust the speaker, or may already have given the proposition a very high credence before the utterance. On Pagin's picture, it is the cognitive patterns associated with surface features, on the production and comprehension sides, that characterize assertion. This way of dividing the account between speaker and hearer is somewhat controversial.

Yet another cognitive account is elaborated in Jary (2010). Jary's account is situated within Relevance Theory, a more general account of cognition and communication. As a typical ingredient of this general framework, when an assertion is made, the proposition expressed by the utterance is presented as “relevant to the hearer” (2010: 163), where ‘relevant’ is a technical term (Sperber & Wilson 1995: 265).

What distinguishes assertion from other speech act types is something different:

Assertion cannot be defined thus, though. In order for an utterance to have assertoric force, it must also be subject to the cognitive and social safeguards that distinguish assertion. […] It is the applicability of these safeguards that distinguishes assertion both from other illocutionary acts and from other forms of information transfer. (Jary 2010: 163–4)

Social safeguards consist in sanctions against misleading assertions, while cognitive safeguards consist in the ability of the hearer to not simply accept what is said but meta-represent the speaker as expressing certain beliefs and intentions (2010: 160). It is part of a full account of assertion, according to Jary, that assertions are subject to these safeguards. This also distinguishes assertions from promises and commands, where the proposition is not presented as subject to the hearer's safeguards; “rejection is not presented as an option for the hearer” (2010: 73).

Although Jary's account no doubt captures some of the cognitive ingredients in producing and comprehending assertions, it seems also to be a fairly liberal mixture of social character accounts and communicative intentions accounts. One wonders whether it is impossible to make assertions without the existence of social sanctions, and how plausible it is to suppose the average speaker to intend his utterance to be subject to the hearer's ability to meta-represent the speaker.

6. Norms

The idea that language use in general is governed by rules or norms is old and widespread. That speech acts, as speech acts, are governed by norms, is again a well established idea. It is also currently (2014) a very popular idea: by far most of the literature on assertion over the past fifteen years has concerned the question of the so-called “norms of assertion”, often simply taking for granted that there are such norms, and that they play a central and fundamental role. The task is then to identify them.

In the literature, two very different types of norm have been discussed. One type concerns the decision whether or not an assertion has been made by means of an utterance. These norms are usually characterized as conventions. The other type concerns conditions of propriety, or correctness, of assertion (in some cases actions following an assertion). These are typically called “norms”, and are sometimes characterized as “constitutive” of assertion as a speech act type. We shall discuss these two types separately.

6.1 Conventions

Austin held that illocutionary acts as opposed to perlocutionary acts are conventional, in the sense that they can be made explicit by the so-called performative formula (Austin 1962: 103). According to Austin, one can say ‘I argue that’ or ‘I warn you that’ but not ‘I convince you that’ or ‘I alarm you that’. Presumably, the idea was that a speech act type is conventional just if there exists a convention by which an utterance of a sentence of a certain kind ensures (if uptake is secured) that a speech act of that type is performed. Austin probably thought that in virtue of the performative formulas this condition is met by illocutionary but not by perlocutionary act types.

The more general claim that illocutionary force is correlated by convention with sentence type has been advocated by Michael Dummett (1981: 302, 311). On this view, it is a convention that declarative sentences are used for assertion, interrogative for questions and imperative for commands and requests. Similar views have been put forward by Searle (1969) and Kotatko (1998), and the idea has been more recently defended by Kölbel (2010). According to Searle (1969: 38, 40), illocutionary acts are conventional, and the conventions in question govern the use of so-called force-indicating devices (Searle 1969: 64) specific to each language. Searle does not claim that the standard sentence types are force indicating devices (but speculates that a representation of illocutionary type would be part of the syntactic deep structure).

However, the view that illocutionary acts types are conventional in this sense has met with much opposition. Strawson (1964: 153–4) objected early on that ordinary illocutionary acts can be performed without relying on any convention to identify the force, for instance when using a declarative sentence like ‘The ice over there is very thin’ for a warning. This kind of criticism, now directed against Dummett, has later been reinforced by Robert J. Stainton (1997, 2006), stressing that in appropriate contexts, sub-sentential phrases like ‘John's father’ (pointing at a man) or ‘very fast’ (looking at a car) can be used to make assertions, and gives linguistic arguments why not all such uses can be treated as cases of ellipsis, that is, as cases of leaving out parts of a well-formed sentence that speaker and hearer tacitly aware of. If Strawson and Stainton are right, convention isn't necessary for making assertions.

Moreover, Donald Davidson (1979, 1984a) stressed that no conventional sign could work as a force indicator in this sense, since any conventional sign could be used (and would be used) in insincere utterances, where the corresponding force was missing, including cases of deception, jokes, impersonation and other theatrical performances. Basically the same point is made by Bach and Harnish (1979: 122–7). If Davidson, and Bach and Harnish are right, then conventions are also not sufficient.

Kölbel (2010) argues against this that in certain circumstances misuse is impossible. For instance, according to Kölbel (2010: 125) in a situation of contract signing, you cannot just pretend to be signing a contract; if you write your name at the appropriate place, you have thereby signed the contract, whatever went on in your mind. This is no doubt correct, but if Davidson and Bach and Harnish are right, it is possible to fake an entire contract signing situation, as a joke or as part of a performance. Within a fake situation, you can also fake the signing, by performing an action that looks just as the genuine signing itself.

The situation is complicated by the fact that the general question of when a convention, or rule of any kind, is in force for a speaker, is substantial and complex (cf. Pagin 1987: Chpt. 1). For instance, it may be fully determined by purely public features of a linguistic context $c$ whether according to a convention $R$ an assertion was made, but yet not itself settled by purely public features whether convention $R$ was in force for the speaker in $c$. This would still leave it a non-public issue whether an assertion was made.

6.2 Norms of assertion

Most of the discussion of norms during the past fifteen years has concerned the propriety, or correctness, of assertions, not conventional means of recognizing them (Kölbel (2010) is one of few to discuss both).

In general, an account of assertion in terms of norms is an account that invokes the existence, or the being in force, of norms that uniquely govern assertions. This is not just a sociological observation. I can note that $S$ has committed himself to doing $F$, in the sense of accepting such a commitment, without myself thinking that $S$ is obligated to do it, just as well as I can think that $S$ is obligated although he himself does not recognize it. By contrast, if I both say that assertions are actions governed by such and such norms, and that furthermore assertions are in fact made, I have myself taken a normative stance, acknowledging the force of norms.

Does such an acknowledgment come already with classifying assertions as correct or incorrect? Is correctness an inherently normative notion, or is it just descriptive? According to, for instance, (an earlier view of) Paul Boghossian (1989: 513), the mere fact that we can evaluate assertions as correct or incorrect shows that words are governed by norms of use. According to Kathrin Glüer, Anandi Hattiangadi, and Åsa Wikforss, and to a later view of Boghossian's, on the other hand, there is no reason to see in the notions of correctness and incorrectness anything more than a descriptive classification, which may then be coupled with certain a preference for correct assertions over incorrect ones, both in making and in taking (cf. Glüer 2001: 60–5; Hattiangadi 2010; Wikforss 2001; Boghossian 2003; Glüer & Wikforss 2009a, 2009b). Those preferences may then be explained by wholly external factors, for instance by appeal to social psychology, or the desire for knowledge, but is not internal to the idea of assertion itself. Moreover, even if we are using a genuinely normative notion of correctness, it may well be that the norm in question is not unique to assertion, but governs a broader range of actions, perhaps actions in general, as in the case of moral norms. We shall return to this latter point.

As has often been noted, an assertion can be correct in different respects. For instance, a speaker can say something true but be impolite in saying it, thereby making an assertion that is incorrect with respect to norms of etiquette. It may also have been immoral, or imprudent, tactically or strategically bad. Moreover, an assertion may have, for instance an implicature that is incorrect, even though the primary act considered in isolation is to be deemed correct.

Sometimes, a distinction is made between aspects of badness that can be eliminated by means of retracting an assertion, and aspects that can't be. I can take back a claim if I find I was wrong, but I cannot eliminate for instance a breach of confidence. According to Dummett (1976: 48), this distinction is drawn between aspects that concern what is said and aspects that concern the saying of it, respectively (compare Kvanvig 2009: 148). The relevant notion of correctness, according to Dummett, concerns only what is said. He adds that

an undifferentiated concept of the acceptability of an utterance—of an utterance's not being open to criticism of any kind—would be of little use for our purposes.

Clearly, it is the epistemic aspects of assertions that have been the concern in the literature when characterizing assertions as “correct”, “justified”, “proper”, “warranted”, “assertible”, or “warrantedly assertible”. Such a notion was taken on board in pragmatism, and in later forms of anti-realism. John Dewey (1938) seems to have been the first to characterize truth in terms of assertoric correctness, with his notion of warranted assertibility, even though this idea had a clear affinity with the verifiability principle of Moritz Schlick (1936). Dewey was later followed by, notably, Dummett (1976) and Hilary Putnam (1981). Common to them is the position that there cannot be anything more to truth than being supported by the best available evidence. Dewey, following Peirce, regarded truth as the ideal limit of scientific inquiry (Dewey 1938: 345), and a proposition warrantedly asserted only when known in virtue of such an inquiry. Warranted assertibility is the property of a proposition for which such knowledge potentially exists (1938: 9).

Putnam (1981: 54–6) operated with an idea of assertibility under ideal epistemic conditions. Under normal conditions, a speaker can be justified in making an assertion even though what she asserts is false. The evidence is enough for truth under normal circumstances, but because of abnormal interference the evidence falls short. For instance, improbable changes, say because of a fire, may have taken place after the speaker's observation. However, in ideal epistemic conditions evidence that is sufficient for justifying an assertion is also conclusive.

On Dummett's view, we do get a notion of truth distinct from the notion of a correct assertion only because of the semantics of compound sentences (1976: 50–2). In particular, the conditions of correctly assertorically uttering a conditional $\phi {\ \rightarrow\ }\psi$ may depend on the truth-conditions of $\phi$ rather than the conditions of correct assertions by uttering $\phi$. This is the case in particular in the future tense, as in ‘If it will rain, the ceremony will take place indoors’. In this case, whether it is correct or not, at the time of utterance, to assert that it will rain, or that it will not rain, is irrelevant to the correctness of an assertoric utterance of the conditional itself.

In these early discussions, the strategy was that of getting a handle on truth by means of an appeal to the notion of the correctness of an assertion, which was taken as more fundamental. The question of what the correctness of an assertion consists in was not itself much discussed, although Dummett (1976: 77–8) is careful to distinguish between the case where a speaker makes an assertion on the basis of adequate evidence, and the case where adequate evidence is available, but the speaker makes the assertion without being aware of it. In the latter case, according to Dummett, the speaker was not correct, but the assertion was.

In recent discussions, by contrast, the general strategy has been to get a handle on knowledge, and most of the contributors have been concerned with assertion in the context of investigations in epistemology, often from different epistemological standpoints. Nevertheless, the scope of the discussion of assertion has increased, with more of a focus on the very question itself: under what conditions is an assertion correct, or proper.

The recent wave of discussion was started by Timothy Williamson (1996, 2000), who proposed that assertion is governed by a norm of assertion. Williamson proposed what has come to be known as the knowledge norm, or knowledge rule:

  • (K-A) One must: assert p only if one knows p. (Williamson 2000: 243)

(K-A) is proposed as part of an account of assertion. Other norms have been proposed, and some ideas about the role and status of the norm proposed are usually shared. Let's use $N$ as schematic for a norm of assertion.

  • (N1) N applies specifically to assertion.

By (N1), the norm is a norm only for the making of assertions. As a norm of assertion, the norm is in place to govern the making of assertions in general, and to govern nothing else.

  • (N2) The condition of N uniquely identifies assertion.

If (N2) holds of (K-A), then there is one unique speech act type, or even one unique action type such that the agent is permitted in general to perform actions of this type, with respect to a proposition $p$, only of the agent knows that $p$. Knowing what the condition of permissibility is, we will also know what the action type is. This is different from (N1), for (N1) leaves it open that another norm with exactly the same condition (knowledge that $p$) would hold for some other action type than assertion. This is ruled out by (N2).

  • (N3) Being subject to N is essential to assertion as an action type.

(N3) goes beyond (N2) insofar as (N2) leaves it open that assertion is only actually individuated by $N$, and that assertion could have been governed by some other norm. It should be emphasized here that on the norm view, it is being subject to the norm that characterizes assertion, not conforming to the norm. An assertion that violates the norm is still an assertion. Nothing but an assertion could violate the norm, if the (N2) and (N3) properties hold.

  • (N4) Assertion is constituted by N.

This is a stronger property than (N3), but several of the theorists do claim that their proposed norm has this property. We return below to what constitutivity amounts to.

  • (N5) A particular assertion can be subject also to other rules with different areas of application, such that the all-thing-considered outcome is that an assertion ought not to be done, even though not a violation of N.

As we shall see, although this is a property everyone agrees on, it has been used in the debate over the intuitive support of some candidate norms over others.

  • (N6) Norms are related to evaluations of assertions. An assertion that violates N is incorrect/improper. An assertion that satisfies all relevant norms is correct/proper.

On some understandings of the matter, (N6) is simply trivial. However, it is perfectly possible to see some candidate norms as ideals, while the evaluations of individual assertions may take into account various relations between the assertion and the norm over and above conformity. In fact, this has been an issue in the debate, as we shall also see.

The positive evaluation requires satisfaction of all relevant norms. If there is only one, this norm cannot be only prohibitive, that is, specify necessary conditions, as does (K-A), but should be biconditional, and also give sufficient conditions as well. A biconditional strengthening of (K-A) is

  • (K2-A) It is permissible for S to assert that p iff S knows that p.

Williamson gives only the prohibitive version. The biconditional version is discussed in Hawthorne 2004: 23 and Lackey 2011: 251–75, as well as in Brown 2010 and 2011 (Brown (2010) argues against the sufficiency part by means proposed counterexamples).

It may be noted that (K2-A) is prima facie inconsistent with (N5): if the norm says that an assertion is permissible while another norm says that it is not, we have a contradiction, unless we specify a separate respect in which assertions are assessed with respect to the norm of assertion. As long as the norm is couched in neutral deontic terms, there is a problem. Merely prohibitive norms do not have this problem, unless in relation to other norms that are themselves biconditional.

For the most part, the literature on norms of assertion has concerned the question which the norm of assertion is. That is, it is in general not asked whether there are norms of assertion (in some sense or other), what status such norms have, whether they are constitutive, or what constitutivity amounts to. It is normally taken for granted that there is a norm that holds for all assertions and for assertions specifically (the property). The question is which, and what the reasons are for favoring this or that answer.

Over and above Williamson himself, the knowledge norm (K-A) (or (K2-A)) has been favored by Keith DeRose (2002), Steven Reynolds (2002), Jonathan Adler (2002: 275), John Hawthorne (2004), Jason Stanley (2005), Pascal Engel (2008), Jonathan Schaffer (2008), and John Turri (2010).

Some have proposed norms that are similar to (K-A), but instead sets the condition in relation to the transmission of knowledge to the hearer. An example is Manuel García-Carpintero (2004: 156):

  • (TK-A) One must (assert p only if one's audience comes thereby to be in a position to know that p)

Similar norms have also been proposed by Pelling (2013) and by Hinchman (2013). Carpintero suggests that his version is preferable to Williamson's because it brings out the social, communicative function of language (2004: 157). He argues that only (TK-A) could be expected to be a convention, and takes that to speak in its favor.

Most alternatives to the knowledge norm that have been proposed are weaker, in requiring less than knowledge. It has been proposed that assertion goes just with truth, just with knowledge, or just with justification. Matthew Weiner (2005) proposed a truth norm:

  • (T-A) Assert only what is true.

(this formulation is close to what Weiner says. Cf. also the survey article Weiner (2007). MacFarlane (2014: 103) also proposes a truth rule, but requires it to be qualified as being reflective: this means, in the context of MacFarlane's relativism, that the proposition should be true in the context of utterance, as assessed from the same context of utterance.[8] According to MacFarlane, the truth rule needs to be complemented by a retraction rule (see below).

A corresponding statement of a belief norm would be

  • (B-A) Assert only what you believe.

With ‘say’ instead of belief, this is close to a reformulations of Grice's second submaxim of Quality (“Do not say what you believe to be false.” Grice 1989: 27). The belief norm is explicitly stated by Bach (2008: 77). Bach directly infers that the norm of assertion is the belief norm from the fact that an assertion is sincere if, and only if, the speaker believes what she asserts.

A justifed belief norm requires more than (B-A):

  • (JB-A) Assert only what you believe with justification.

Exactly what justification amounts to varies between authors. Igor Douven (2006, 2009) argues for a norm of rational belief.

Several authors have argued that it is the justification itself that is the key to evaluating assertions. A standard formulation would be

  • (J-A) Assert only that for which you have proper justification.

This view has been taken by Jonathan Kvanvig (2009: 145; 2011: 249–50). Kvanvig proposes that the relevant concept of justification is such that it is sufficient for knowledge, provided the proposition is both believed and true (and the justification is undefeated). Justification is also emphasized by Jennifer Lackey (2007: 608), who proposes a Reasonable to Believe norm, according to which belief is not required; what is required is that it is reasonable to believe that $p$, and that the speaker asserts that $p$ for this reason (even if in fact not believing that $p$). Lackey backs this idea up with thought experiments about so-called “selfless” assertions, where speakers make assertion in accordance with their evidence but against their beliefs. Also, Ishani Maitra and Brian Weatherson (2010: 112) propose what they call The Evidence Responsiveness Rule, that one assert that p only if one's attitude towards $p$ is properly responsive to the evidence (they also propose to complement it with an action rule, that it is proper to assert that $p$ only if acting as if $p$ is “the thing for you to do”.)

These alternatives to the knowledge norm all propose norms with weaker requirements. But a stronger requirement has also been suggested by Stanley (2008):

  • (EC-A) Assert only what is epistemically certain.

Here one is epistemically certain of a proposition $p$ is

if and only if one knows that $p$ (or is in a position to know that $p$) on the basis of evidence that gives one the highest degree of justification for one's belief that $p$. (2008: 35)

Stanley also considers as an alternative a subjective certainty norm, where it is the degree of confidence of the speaker that matters, but in the end opts for regarding this norm as derivable from the epistemic certainty norm.

Some authors have proposed norms for what to do after an assertion. MacFarlane (2014: 108) holds that a speaker is required to retract an assertion if it turns out not be true, in a context of assessment:

  • (R-A) Retract an (unretracted) assertion if it turns out not to be true.

Again, in MacFarlane's case, this rule is stated in the context of his relativism, with respect to a context of use and a context of assessment. In MacFarlane's theory, assertion is governed jointly by the (reflective) truth norm and the retraction norm. According to Michael Rescorla (2009), there is no norm at all for proper making of assertions. There are only norms that govern later reactions. He proposes three similar alternatives, which share the idea that when a speaker is challenged with respect to an assertion he has made, he must either defend the assertion or else retract it (Rescorla 2009: 103–5).

Many authors have noted that standards for judging assertions vary between contexts, and have proposed to work that into the account. The first to do so was Keith DeRose (2002). DeRose argued from the knowledge norm and the varying standards for assertion as premises, to the conclusion that epistemic contextualism is true (2002: 182). Epistemic contextualism is the view that ‘know’ is semantically context dependent. The truth value of a knowledge attribution ‘X knows that $p$ depends on standards of knowledge in the context of the knowledge attributor.

DeRose's argument has been challenged by several authors. For instance, Brown (2010) points out that the argument depends on the biconditional version (K2-A) of the knowledge norm, and argues that the sufficiency part is less well supported. Stanley also criticizes DeRose, despite accepting that the standards of proper assertion vary between contexts. According to Stanley, the reason this does not lead to contextualism about knowledge is that assertion is governed by the certainty norm (2008: 55–6). According to Stanley, the varying standards of proper assertion depends on the context dependence of ‘certain’, not on any context dependence of ‘know’ (which Stanley rejects). According to Schaffer (2008), on the other hand, knowledge itself is relative to a question under discussion, which is reflected in his version of the knowledge norm (Schaffer 2008: 10).

Some authors who note that standards of proper assertion appears to vary between context suggest that there is not a single norm with a contextual parameter, but rather that different norms apply in different contexts, still governing one and the same speech act type, assertion. This line has been taken by Jim Stone (2007) and by Janet Levin (2008). In some contexts knowledge is required, in some contexts something less demanding, such as justified belief. Patrick Greenough (2011) takes this line even further by proposing norm-relativism: what norm is relevant for an assertion in a context is relative to a perspective.

One question that arises with respect to such views is this: if the speech act type is individuated by the norm governing it, and norms of utterances vary between contexts, is it then still the case that one and the same (illocutionary) speech act type is performed across contexts. One who has denied this is John Turri (2010). Turri suggests a class of “alethic” speech acts, including conjecturing, asserting, and guaranteeing. The first is weaker and the third stronger than assertion. They are ranked on a so-called “credibility index” (2010: 85), depending on what degree of credibility is required by the speech act type. In contexts with different demands on credibility, different speech acts are performed. For assertion itself, the standard is invariant, it is simply knowledge. Turri uses this view to counter DeRose's argument for epistemic contextualism. The view itself, however, seems not to conform to the standard view concerning which utterances belong in the extension of ‘assertion’.

A more radical conclusion from the assumed normative variation has been drawn by Herman Cappelen (2011). According to Cappelen, the proper conclusion is that assertion as a speech act type doesn't exist. In Cappelen's words, the term ‘assertion’

fails to pick out an act-type that we engage in and it is not a category we need in order to explain any significant component of our linguistic practice. (2011: 21)

The picture is complicated even further by the fact that many accounts recognize more than one evaluation of assertions. This is proposed by Williamson himself (2000: 256–7), who speaks of a case where it is reasonable to assert that $p$ if one reasonable believes that one knows that $p$. He goes on to say

There may be other evidential norms for assertion, if they can be derived from the knowledge rule and considerations not specific to assertion. The reasonableness of asserting $p$ when one reasonably believes that one knows $p$ has just been derived in exactly that way (Williamson 2000: 257).

The same distinction between what the norm requires and what is reasonable in its light has been drawn by DeRose. In the terminology of DeRose (2002: 180), it is known as the distinction between primary and secondary propriety. It is primarily improper but secondarily proper to assert what you reasonably believe that you know but you in fact don't. Similarly, Adler (2002: 235, 275) distinguishes between proper assertions, requiring knowledge, and warranted assertions, requiring full belief. Equally, Turri (2014) distinguishes between good assertions, requiring knowledge, and permissible assertions, requiring reasonable belief.

In these cases, a weaker secondary norm is derived from a stronger primary norm. Others have proceeded in the opposite direction. Both Bach (2008: 77) and Frank Hindriks (2007: 403–4) derive a knowledge norm from a belief norm by means of appealing to a knowledge norm for belief: since you should assert only what you believe and believe only what you know, you should also assert only what you know. In a somewhat similar fashion, Weiner derives a reasonable belief norm from the truth norm by appeal to Gricean cooperation: the requirement that one's utterance have some point is part and parcel of Grice's Cooperative Principle. An assertion does not satisfy this requirement just by be being true (2005: 232–8) or by being based on facts equally available to the hearer. The speaker must have additional reasons, and in some cases knowledge.

Some authors reject this distinction between primary and secondary propriety. Examples are Lackey (2007: 604), Engel (2004: 56), and Kvanvig (2011: 242). They all think that what we need is an unequivocal notion of when a speaker has acted appropriately and when not: if one has acted in an inappropriate way, then one is subject to legitimate criticism, and otherwise not.[9]

Accepting the distinction between primary and secondary propriety induces a problem for the intuitive support for the various theories. A large part of the intuitions that serve to support one or the other norm theory relies on raw intuitions about what one should or shouldn't assert in some situation, or what is proper or improper to assert there. If there are several ways an assertion can be proper or improper, then it is not easy to see what concept of propriety is being tracked by these intuitions.

Indeed, the distinction was introduced precisely in order deflect counterintuitive consequences. Several authors have objected to the knowledge norm that it is too demanding: many assertions seem not improper even in case the speaker does not know what he asserts. As noted above, Williamson discusses such cases. The idea is that a particular intuition that seems to disconfirm a particular normative theory can be explained away by saying that it does not in fact track the primary propriety, but instead only some secondary propriety. The problem with this move is that for the theory to be supported by intuitions of correctness/propriety, the application of the primary/secondary distinction should itself be based on these very intuitions. Since intuitions don't come labeled as “primary” and “secondary”, there is a risk of a substantial underdetermination of theory by data: two theorists need not agree about whether or not an intuition about a particular case supports a certain theory. Hawthorne and Stanley (2008: 585–6) remark that

[…] intuitions go a little hazy in any situation that some candidate normative theory says is sufficient to make it that one ought to $F$ but where, in the case described, one does not know that situation obtains.

The situation is not solved by rejecting the primary/secondary distinction. As noted, everyone agrees that assertions are governed by various norms: moral, prudential, conversational, rules of etiquette. When does an intuition track the intended notion of a proper assertion, and when something else altogether? Kvanvig (2011: 235) and Engel (2008: 52–4) have drawn attention to this situation. According to Kvanvig, intuitions typically concern whether assertions are all-things-considered appropriate. Kvanvig points out that an assertion may be all-things-considered appropriate without being appropriate from the epistemic point of view. However, although this is an important distinction, the question is how intuition does support the idea that the epistemic point of view is what is relevant.

Virtually throughout the discussion, authors have simply appealed to their own intuitions. However, this is an area where experimental philosophy would be highly relevant, since the question largely seems to concern what norms ordinary asserters accept. The situation is about to change. Recently, John Turri (2013) has published results from a series of survey studies, where the aim was to determine whether speakers accept a factive or a non-factive norm: the norm is factive in case an assertion is proper only if what is asserted is true, otherwise non-factive. Turri reports six studies, where subjects are presented with written scenarios and are given multiple choice questions in relation to them. Turri concludes that they all showed that speakers apply a factive norm. A story character Maria has strong evidence for a proposition $p$, but knows that the evidence is inconclusive (an inventory that is only almost complete). In one particular case, the evidence is misleading, and subjects are asked whether Maria “should” assert the false but well supported proposition. A clear majority answer no. However, when given a choice between alternatives of what to say in the same evidential situation where it is false that $p$ (Experiment 4), almost as many answer prefer “$p$” or “probably $p$” as prefer “probably not $p$”, “not $p$”, or “definitely not $p$”. Furthermore, when asked to evaluate an assertion in a situation of blameless mistake, where the speaker had every reason to expect the evidence not to be misleading (Experiment 5), the outcome was also not straightforward. With respect to the question “Is there a sense in which it is incorrect for Robert to make the statement?”, a little more than half answered no. These results indicate that it is not so clear exactly what properties the subjects' intuitions track, nor to what extent there is intersubjective agreement. Further studies may help to clarify the picture.

In addition to direct intuitions about propriety, proponents of the knowledge norm have adduced indirect evidence in the form of intuitions about conversational patterns, claiming that these patterns are best explained by the acceptance of the knowledge norm. Williamson himself appeals to such patterns, two of which concern utterances of like

  • (35) It is raining, but I don't know that it is raining.
  • (36) Your ticket did not win.

Concerning the first, it is claimed (Williamson 2000: 253) that an utterance of (35) is as odd as ordinary belief-related Moorean sentences such as (24) above. The oddity is explained by appeal to the knowledge norm. If the assertion is proper, the speaker knows that the proposition expressed by (35) is true. Since knowledge distributes over conjunction, she knows that it is raining and she knows that she does not know that it is raining. As knowledge is factive, since she knows that she does not know that it is raining, she does not know that it is raining. So we have a contradiction. Hence, the assumption that the assertion is proper leads, on the knowledge account, to a contradiction. An assertion that cannot be proper is odd. Since the oddity is explained by the knowledge account, it supports the knowledge account.

(36) is imagined uttered by speaker A in the following situation. The draw of a (fair) lottery with a large number of tickets has been held. It is known that only one ticket wins. B has a ticket, but neither A nor B knows the result. A asserts (36) on merely probabilistic grounds. The probability that the ticket has won is very low (and one can get it arbitrarily low, short of zero, by increasing the number of tickets in the lottery). According to the argument, an assertion of (36) in such a case is intuitively incorrect. According to Williamson (2000: 246–49), A is criticizable, since A represented himself as having an authority for the assertion which he lacked. The conclusion is that only knowledge provides proper warrant, since no probability short of 1 escapes the criticism for lack of authority. Hence, the knowledge account explains the unacceptability of A's utterance.

Both arguments have been criticized by a number of authors. The most common line is that the data can be equally well or better explained by other competing accounts, extraneous principles, or a combination of these. For instance, Kvanvig (2009: 149–50) presents a derivation to show that the oddity of (35) can be explained by appeal to a justification norm. Similarly, Douven (2009), with respect to his rational belief account. According to Stanley (2008), since the certainty norm requires more than just knowledge, everything that can be explained by appeal to the knowledge norm can also be explained by appeal to the certainty norm. Others have pointed to the general pragmatic/rhetorical infelicity of (35) as a fact extraneous to norms of assertion, including Douven (2006: 474–5), Maitra & Weatherson (2010: 110), and Cappelen (2011: 38–40). Maitra and Weatherson claim that there need be nothing wrong with first asserting that $p$, and later, in response to a question, deny that one knows that $p$, but without retracting the assertion. What is strange is just conjoining the two statements. The opposite view on the matter was taken by Paolo Casalegno (2009: 246).

Concerning the lottery example (36), Weiner (2005: 236) explains the apparent unacceptability of the utterance by appeal to Grice's maxim of Manner: putting it categorically, as in (36), instead of in terms of high probability, legitimizes the inference that A has more information than what was known before the draw. Kvanvig (2009: 156) claims that the oddity is explained by the justification account, since for a belief to be justified, in Kvanvig's sense, requires that there is no need of further investigation. This is a condition that is not met for the utterance of (36) in the lottery scenario. In lotteries, you always have to wait for the draw in order to close the inquiry.

Further conversational patterns have been adduced in favor of the knowledge norm, by Williamson and others. For an overview, see Turri (2014: 565–6). A general problem with the appeal to conversational patterns is that they don't seem to favor specifically normative views over corresponding non-normative views. For instance, it appears that any linguistic phenomenon that can be explained by appeal to a knowledge norm can be equally well explained by appeal to the view that asserters represent themselves as knowing what they say (although there is no norm). Combine this with extraneous, non-assertion-specific norms. That A's utterance of (36) is bad can then be explained by appeal to self-representation of knowledge, together with the general moral norm that it is wrong the mislead hearers, for instance by representing oneself as having knowledge.

Let's finally turn to the question of the normative status of the proposed norms. In much of the literature, this question is not touched upon, but when it is, authors tend to favor the idea that the norm is constitutive of assertion. Williamson himself (2000: 238–41) is an example, and so are Stanley (2008: 52), Rescorla (2009: 99–101), Kölbel (2010: 109–11), and MacFarlane (2014: 101–2). Typically, norms of assertion are held to be constitutive of assertion as a speech act type as rules of a game define the game and are constitutive of game action types. Thus, proponents take their preferred norms of assertion to have properties (N1)–(N4) above (by contrast, Dummett's view (1976: 89) was that convention settles what warrants assertion in a community).

Against the constitutivity claim, Pagin (2011) has argued that insofar as there are norms of assertion, their status among speakers do not much resemble rules of games. Firstly, players of a game rarely disagree about what the rules of the game are. If there is a disagreement, it is settled either by appeal to a generally recognized authority, such as a rule-book, or by stipulation, if it concerns a new case to be covered by rules. We don't find players appealing to intuition or the oddity of certain conversational patterns to convince each other of claims about what the rules are. By contrast, in the literature on norms of assertion itself, (as is evident from the presentation above) authors disagree widely about what the norm is, and they appeal to both intuition and linguistic arguments to support their own view. It seems that these authors, and perhaps speakers in general, find it easier to agree about whether an utterance was an assertion than about whether it was or was not proper.

Secondly, for a constituted game action type, like castling in chess, to be performable at all, the rules of chess must by some decision be in force; if the rules of chess are not in force for a person at a particular time, her moving two pieces of wood at that time does not constitute castling (cf. Pagin 1987: Chpt. 3; Glüer & Pagin 1999). But this again seems very unlike the relation of norms to assertion. It does not seem that an utterance is recognizable as an assertion in virtue of a decision to regard it as subject to this or that norm. Rather, it seems that recognizing an utterance as an assertion precedes seeing it as subject to evaluation.

Maitra (2011) also criticizes the game analogy. Maitra claims that proposed norms fail to be properly constitutive:

By contrast, neither the knowledge nor the truth norm tells us what it is to assert something. Rather, they each assume that there is something that counts as asserting, and tell us at what an asserter ought to be aiming when performing the speech act (Maitra 2011: 282).

According to Maitra, the reason for this failure on the part of the truth and knowledge norms is that they don't tell us what counts as asserting. They cannot be rewritten in that format either, because that would leave them incomplete. If we try “A speaker asserts $p$ when he utters a sentence appropriately related to $p$ and is criticizable for not knowing $p$”, this leaves out a required specification of the kind of criticizability at issue (2011: 282, note 12). We might add a specification of this as well, but as I have understood Maitra, this information was supposed to be provided by the norm itself, and if it doesn't, the game analogy is of no help. A similar point, that we don't get the relevant specific notion of correctness from the general concept of a rule, is argued in Pagin (1987: Chpt. 2).

Finally, there is a fundamental question that is not discussed at all: In virtue of what is a norm of assertion in force for a speaker or a speech community, if it is in force? Is it because of a collective acceptance? If so, it must be tacit, and, because of the wide disagreement among theorists, usually not accessible to introspection. Is it because of some metaphysical fact that assertions are essentially governed by this or that norm whenever they are performed, and whatever speakers think about it? That would indeed make sense of the debate, since it can be construed as an investigation into normative reality. But there remains a question of what influence normative reality has on linguistic practice. Probably none, or at best a pretty haphazard one, judging from the disagreement. Is it perhaps something internal to each speaker, and not intersubjectively shared? That can explain the differences among the participants in the debate. But it is hard to square this with the assumption that we share a practice of making and understanding assertions. If you and I accept different norms, then I simply misapply my norm to your utterances when interpreting them, and consequently systematically misinterpret your utterances. But for all we can tell, this does not generally seem to happen. All in all, the norm approach to assertion seems to have rather many challenges.


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