Ludwig Wittgenstein

First published Fri Nov 8, 2002; substantive revision Mon Mar 3, 2014

Considered by some to be the greatest philosopher of the 20th century, Ludwig Wittgenstein played a central, if controversial, role in 20th-century analytic philosophy. He continues to influence current philosophical thought in topics as diverse as logic and language, perception and intention, ethics and religion, aesthetics and culture. Originally, there were two commonly recognized stages of Wittgenstein's thought—the early and the later—both of which were taken to be pivotal in their respective periods. In more recent scholarship, this division has been questioned: some interpreters have claimed a unity between all stages of his thought, while others talk of a more nuanced division, adding stages such as the middle Wittgenstein and the third Wittgenstein. Still, it is commonly acknowledged that the early Wittgenstein is epitomized in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. By showing the application of modern logic to metaphysics, via language, he provided new insights into the relations between world, thought and language and thereby into the nature of philosophy. It is the later Wittgenstein, mostly recognized in the Philosophical Investigations, who took the more revolutionary step in critiquing all of traditional philosophy including its climax in his own early work. The nature of his new philosophy is heralded as anti-systematic through and through, yet still conducive to genuine philosophical understanding of traditional problems.


1. Biographical Sketch

Wittgenstein was born on April 26, 1889 in Vienna, Austria, to a wealthy industrial family, well-situated in intellectual and cultural Viennese circles. In 1908 he began his studies in aeronautical engineering at Manchester University where his interest in the philosophy of pure mathematics led him to Frege. Upon Frege's advice, in 1911 he went to Cambridge to study with Bertrand Russell. Russell wrote, upon meeting Wittgenstein: “An unknown German appeared … obstinate and perverse, but I think not stupid” (quoted by Monk 1990: 38f). Within one year, Russell was committed: “I shall certainly encourage him. Perhaps he will do great things … I love him and feel he will solve the problems I am too old to solve” (quoted by Monk 1990: 41). Russell's insight was accurate. Wittgenstein was idiosyncratic in his habits and way of life, yet profoundly acute in his philosophical sensitivity.

During his years in Cambridge, from 1911 to 1913, Wittgenstein conducted several conversations on philosophy and the foundations of logic with Russell, with whom he had an emotional and intense relationship, as well as with Moore and Keynes. He retreated to isolation in Norway, for months at a time, in order to ponder these philosophical problems and to work out their solutions. In 1913 he returned to Austria and in 1914, at the start of World War I (1914-1918), joined the Austrian army. He was taken captive in 1918 and spent the remaining months of the war at a prison camp. It was during the war that he wrote the notes and drafts of his first important work, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. After the war the book was published in German and translated into English.

In 1920 Wittgenstein, now divorced from philosophy (having, to his mind, solved all philosophical problems in the Tractatus), gave away his part of his family's fortune and pursued several ‘professions’ (gardener, teacher, architect, etc.) in and around Vienna. It was only in 1929 that he returned to Cambridge to resume his philosophical vocation, after having been exposed to discussions on the philosophy of mathematics and science with members of the Vienna Circle, whose conception of logical empiricism was indebted to his Tractatus account of logic as tautologous, and his philosophy as concerned with logical syntax. During these first years in Cambridge his conception of philosophy and its problems underwent dramatic changes that are recorded in several volumes of conversations, lecture notes, and letters (e.g., Ludwig Wittgenstein and the Vienna Circle, The Blue and Brown Books, Philosophical Grammar). Sometimes termed the ‘middle Wittgenstein’, this period heralds a rejection of dogmatic philosophy, including both traditional works and the Tractatus itself.

In the 1930s and 1940s Wittgenstein conducted seminars at Cambridge, developing most of the ideas that he intended to publish in his second book, Philosophical Investigations. These included the turn from formal logic to ordinary language, novel reflections on psychology and mathematics, and a general skepticism concerning philosophy's pretensions. In 1945 he prepared the final manuscript of the Philosophical Investigations, but, at the last minute, withdrew it from publication (and only authorized its posthumous publication). For a few more years he continued his philosophical work, but this is marked by a rich development of, rather than a turn away from, his second phase. He traveled during this period to the United States and Ireland, and returned to Cambridge, where he was diagnosed with cancer. Legend has it that, at his death in 1951, his last words were “Tell them I've had a wonderful life” (Monk: 579).

2. The Early Wittgenstein

2.1 Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus

Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus was first published in German in 1921 and then translated—by C.K. Ogden, with F. P. Ramsey's help—and published in English in 1922. It was later re-translated by D. F. Pears and B. F. McGuinness. Coming out of Wittgenstein's Notes on Logic (1913), “Notes Dictated to G. E. Moore” (1914), his Notebooks, written in 1914-16, and further correspondence with Russell, Moore and Keynes, and showing Schopenhauerian and other cultural influences, it evolved as a continuation of and reaction to Russell and Frege's conceptions of logic and language. Russell supplied an introduction to the book claiming that it “certainly deserves … to be considered an important event in the philosophical world.” It is fascinating to note that Wittgenstein thought little of Russell's introduction, claiming that it was riddled with misunderstandings. Later interpretations have attempted to unearth the surprising tensions between the introduction and the rest of the book (or between Russell's reading of Wittgenstein and Wittgenstein's own self-assessment)—usually harping on Russell's appropriation of Wittgenstein for his own agenda.

The Tractatus's structure purports to be representative of its internal essence. It is constructed around seven basic propositions, numbered by the natural numbers 1-7, with all other paragraphs in the text numbered by decimal expansions so that, e.g., paragraph 1.1 is (supposed to be) a further elaboration on proposition 1, 1.22 is an elaboration of 1.2, and so on.

The seven basic propositions are:

Ogden translation Pears/McGuinness translation
1. The world is everything that is the case. The world is all that is the case.
2. What is the case, the fact, is the existence of atomic facts. What is the case—a fact—is the existence of states of affairs.
3. The logical picture of the facts is the thought. A logical picture of facts is a thought.
4. The thought is the significant proposition. A thought is a proposition with sense.
5. Propositions are truth-functions of elementary propositions. A proposition is a truth-function of elementary propositions.
(An elementary proposition is a truth function of itself.) (An elementary proposition is a truth function of itself.)
6. The general form of truth-function is [p, ξ, N(ξ)]. The general form of a truth-function is [p, ξ, N(ξ)].
This is the general form of proposition. This is the general form of a proposition.
7. Whereof one cannot speak, thereof one must be silent. What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence.

Clearly, the book addresses the central problems of philosophy which deal with the world, thought and language, and presents a ‘solution’ (as Wittgenstein terms it) of these problems that is grounded in logic and in the nature of representation. The world is represented by thought, which is a proposition with sense, since they all—world, thought, and proposition—share the same logical form. Hence, the thought and the proposition can be pictures of the facts.

Starting with a seeming metaphysics, Wittgenstein sees the world as consisting of facts (1), rather than the traditional, atomistic conception of a world made up of objects. Facts are existent states of affairs (2) and states of affairs, in turn, are combinations of objects. “Objects are simple” (TLP 2.02) but objects can fit together in various determinate ways. They may have various properties and may hold diverse relations to one another. Objects combine with one another according to their logical, internal properties. That is to say, an object's internal properties determine the possibilities of its combination with other objects; this is its logical form. Thus, states of affairs, being comprised of objects in combination, are inherently complex. The states of affairs which do exist could have been otherwise. This means that states of affairs are either actual (existent) or possible. It is the totality of states of affairs—actual and possible—that makes up the whole of reality. The world is precisely those states of affairs which do exist.

The move to thought, and thereafter to language, is perpetrated with the use of Wittgenstein's famous idea that thoughts, and propositions, are pictures—“the picture is a model of reality” (TLP 2.12). Pictures are made up of elements that together constitute the picture. Each element represents an object, and the combination of elements in the picture represents the combination of objects in a state of affairs. The logical structure of the picture, whether in thought or in language, is isomorphic with the logical structure of the state of affairs which it pictures. More subtle is Wittgenstein's insight that the possibility of this structure being shared by the picture (the thought, the proposition) and the state of affairs is the pictorial form. “That is how a picture is attached to reality; it reaches right out to it” (TLP 2.1511). This leads to an understanding of what the picture can picture; but also what it cannot—its own pictorial form.

While “the logical picture of the facts is the thought” (3), in the move to language Wittgenstein continues to investigate the possibilities of significance for propositions (4). Logical analysis, in the spirit of Frege and Russell, guides the work, with Wittgenstein using logical calculus to carry out the construction of his system. Explaining that “Only the proposition has sense; only in the context of a proposition has a name meaning” (TLP 3.3), he provides the reader with the two conditions for sensical language. First, the structure of the proposition must conform to the constraints of logical form, and second, the elements of the proposition must have reference (bedeutung). These conditions have far-reaching implications. The analysis must culminate with a name being a primitive symbol for a (simple) object. Moreover, logic itself gives us the structure and limits of what can be said at all.

“The general form of a proposition is: This is how things stand” (TLP 4.5) and every proposition is either true or false. This bi-polarity of propositions enables the composition of more complex propositions from atomic ones by using truth-functional operators (5). Wittgenstein supplies, in the Tractatus, a vivid presentation of Frege's logic in the form of what has become known as ‘truth-tables’. This provides the means to go back and analyze all propositions into their atomic parts, since “every statement about complexes can be analyzed into a statement about their constituent parts, and into those propositions which completely describe the complexes” (TLP 2.0201). He delves even deeper by then providing the general form of a truth-function(6). This form, [p, ξ, N(ξ)], makes use of one formal operation (N(ξ)) and one propositional variable (p) to represent Wittgenstein's claim that any proposition “is the result of successive applications” of logical operations to elementary propositions.

Having developed this analysis of world-thought-language, and relying on the one general form of the proposition, Wittgenstein can now assert that all meaningful propositions are of equal value. Subsequently, he ends the journey with the admonition concerning what can (or cannot) and what should (or should not) be said (7), leaving outside the realm of the sayable propositions of ethics, aesthetics, and metaphysics.

2.2 Sense and Nonsense

In the Tractatus Wittgenstein's logical construction of a philosophical system has a purpose—to find the limits of world, thought and language; in other words, to distinguish between sense and nonsense. “The book will … draw a limit to thinking, or rather—not to thinking, but to the expression of thoughts …. The limit can … only be drawn in language and what lies on the other side of the limit will be simply nonsense” (TLP Preface). The conditions for a proposition's having sense have been explored and seen to rest on the possibility of representation or picturing. Names must have a bedeutung (reference/meaning), but they can only do so in the context of a proposition which is held together by logical form. It follows that only factual states of affairs which can be pictured can be represented by meaningful propositions. This means that what can be said are only propositions of natural science and leaves out of the realm of sense a daunting number of statements which are made and used in language.

There are, first, the propositions of logic itself. These do not represent states of affairs, and the logical constants do not stand for objects. “My fundamental thought is that the logical constants do not represent. That the logic of the facts cannot be represented” (TLP 4.0312). This is not a happenstance thought; it is fundamental precisely because the limits of sense rest on logic. Tautologies and contradictions, the propositions of logic, are the limits of language and thought, and thereby the limits of the world. Obviously, then, they do not picture anything and do not, therefore, have sense. They are, in Wittgenstein's terms, senseless (sinnlos). Propositions which do have sense are bipolar; they range within the truth-conditions drawn by the propositions of logic. But the propositions of logic themselves are neither true nor false “for the one allows every possible state of affairs, the other none” (TLP 4.462).

The characteristic of being senseless applies not only to the propositions of logic but also to mathematics or the pictorial form itself of the pictures that do represent. These are, like tautologies and contradictions, literally sense-less, they have no sense.

Beyond, or aside from, senseless propositions Wittgenstein identifies another group of statements which cannot carry sense: the nonsensical (unsinnig) propositions. Nonsense, as opposed to senselessness, is encountered when a proposition is even more radically devoid of meaning, when it transcends the bounds of sense. Under the label of unsinnig can be found various propositions: “Socrates is identical”, but also “1 is a number” and “there are objects”. While some nonsensical propositions are blatantly so, others seem to be meaningful—and only analysis carried out in accordance with the picture theory can expose their nonsensicality. Since only what is “in” the world can be described, anything that is “higher” is excluded, including the notion of limit and the limit points themselves. Traditional metaphysics, and the propositions of ethics and aesthetics, which try to capture the world as a whole, are also excluded, as is the truth in solipsism, the very notion of a subject, for it is also not “in” the world but at its limit.

Wittgenstein does not, however, relegate all that is not inside the bounds of sense to oblivion. He makes a distinction between saying and showing which is made to do additional crucial work. “What can be shown cannot be said,” that is, what cannot be formulated in sayable (sensical) propositions can only be shown. This applies, for example, to the logical form of the world, the pictorial form, etc., which show themselves in the form of (contingent) propositions, in the symbolism, and in logical propositions. Even the unsayable (metaphysical, ethical, aesthetic) propositions of philosophy belong in this group—which Wittgenstein finally describes as “things that cannot be put into words. They make themselves manifest. They are what is mystical” (TLP 6.522).

2.3 The Nature of Philosophy

Accordingly, “the word ‘philosophy’ must mean something which stands above or below, but not beside the natural sciences” (TLP 4.111). Not surprisingly, then, “most of the propositions and questions to be found in philosophical works are not false but nonsensical” (TLP 4.003). Is, then, philosophy doomed to be nonsense (unsinnig), or, at best, senseless (sinnlos) when it does logic, but, in any case, meaningless? What is left for the philosopher to do, if traditional, or even revolutionary, propositions of metaphysics, epistemology, aesthetics, and ethics cannot be formulated in a sensical manner? The reply to these two questions is found in Wittgenstein's characterization of philosophy: philosophy is not a theory, or a doctrine, but rather an activity. It is an activity of clarification (of thoughts), and more so, of critique (of language). Described by Wittgenstein, it should be the philosopher's routine activity: to react or respond to the traditional philosophers' musings by showing them where they go wrong, using the tools provided by logical analysis. In other words, by showing them that (some of) their propositions are nonsense.

“All propositions are of equal value” (TLP 6.4)—that could also be the fundamental thought of the book. For it employs a measure of the value of propositions that is done by logic and the notion of limits. It is here, however, with the constraints on the value of propositions, that the tension in the Tractatus is most strongly felt. It becomes clear that the notions used by the Tractatus—the logical-philosophical notions—do not belong to the world and hence cannot be used to express anything meaningful. Since language, thought and the world, are all isomorphic, any attempt to say in logic (i.e., in language) “this and this there is in the world, that there is not” is doomed to be a failure, since it would mean that logic has got outside the limits of the world, i.e. of itself. That is to say, the Tractatus has gone over its own limits, and stands in danger of being nonsensical.

The “solution” to this tension is found in Wittgenstein's final remarks, where he uses the metaphor of the ladder to express the function of the Tractatus. It is to be used in order to climb on it, in order to “see the world rightly”; but thereafter it must be recognized as nonsense and be thrown away. Hence: “whereof one cannot speak, thereof one must be silent” (7).

2.4 Interpretative Problems

The Tractatus is notorious for its interpretative difficulties. In the decades that have passed since its publication it has gone through several waves of general interpretations. Beyond exegetical and hermeneutical issues that revolve around particular sections (such as the world/reality distinction, the difference between representing and presenting, the Frege/Russell connection to Wittgenstein, or the influence on Wittgenstein by existentialist philosophy) there are a few fundamental, not unrelated, disagreements that inform the map of interpretation. These revolve around the realism of the Tractatus, the notion of nonsense and its role in reading the Tractatus itself, and the reading of the Tractatus as an ethical tract.

There are interpretations that see the Tractatus as espousing realism, i.e., as positing the independent existence of objects, states of affairs, and facts. That this realism is achieved via a linguistic turn is recognized by all (or most) interpreters, but this linguistic perspective does no damage to the basic realism that is seen to start off the Tractatus (“The world is all that is the case”) and to run throughout the text (“Objects form the substance of the world” (TLP 2.021)). Such realism is also taken to be manifested in the essential bi-polarity of propositions; likewise, a straightforward reading of the picturing relation posits objects there to be represented by signs. As against these readings, more linguistically oriented interpretations give conceptual priority to the symbolism. When “reality is compared with propositions” (TLP 4.05), it is the form of propositions which determines the shape of reality (and not the other way round). In any case, the issue of realism (vs. anti-realism) in the Tractatus must address the question of the limits of language and the more particular question of what there is (or is not) beyond language. Subsequently, interpreters of the Tractatus have moved on to questioning the very presence of metaphysics within the book and the status of the propositions of the book themselves.

‘Nonsense’ became the hinge of Wittgensteinian interpretative discussion during the last decade of the 20th century. Beyond the bounds of language lies nonsense—propositions which cannot picture anything—and Wittgenstein bans traditional metaphysics to that area. The quandary arises concerning the question of what it is that inhabits that realm of nonsense, since Wittgenstein does seem to be saying that there is something there to be shown (rather than said) and does, indeed, characterize it as the ‘mystical’. The traditional readings of the Tractatus accepted, with varying degrees of discomfort, the existence of that which is unsayable, that which cannot be put into words, the nonsensical. More recent readings tend to take nonsense more seriously as exactly that—nonsense. This also entails taking seriously Wittgenstein's words in 6.54—his famous ladder metaphor—and throwing out the Tractatus itself, including the distinction between what can be said and what can only be shown. The Tractatus, on this stance, does not point at ineffable truths (of, e.g., metaphysics, ethics, aesthetics, etc.), but should lead us away from such temptations. An accompanying discussion must then also deal with how this can be recognized, what this can possibly mean, and how it should be used, if at all.

This discussion is closely related to what has come to be called the ethical reading of the Tractatus. Such a reading is based, first, on the supposed discrepancy between Wittgenstein's construction of a world-language system, which takes up the bulk of the Tractatus, and several comments that are made about this construction in the Preface to the book, in its closing remarks, and in a letter he sent to his publisher, Ludwig von Ficker, before publication. In these places, all of which can be viewed as external to the content of the Tractatus, Wittgenstein preaches silence as regards anything that is of importance, including the ‘internal’ parts of the book which contain, in his own words, “the final solution of the problems [of philosophy].” It is the importance given to the ineffable that can be viewed as an ethical position. “My work consists of two parts, the one presented here plus all that I have not written. And it is precisely this second part that is the important point. For the ethical gets its limit drawn from the inside, as it were, by my book; … I've managed in my book to put everything firmly into place by being silent about it …. For now I would recommend you to read the preface and the conclusion, because they contain the most direct expression of the point” (ProtoTractatus, p.16). Obviously, such seemingly contradictory tensions within and about a text—written by its author—give rise to interpretative conundrums.

There is another issue often debated by interpreters of Wittgenstein, which arises out of the questions above. This has to do with the continuity between the thought of the early and later Wittgenstein. Again, the ‘standard’ interpretations were originally united in perceiving a clear break between the two distinct stages of Wittgenstein's thought, even when ascertaining some developmental continuity between them. And again, the more recent interpretations challenge this standard, emphasizing that the fundamental therapeutic motivation clearly found in the later Wittgenstein should also be attributed to the early.

3. The Later Wittgenstein

3.1 Transition and Critique of Tractatus

The idea that philosophy is not a doctrine, and hence should not be approached dogmatically, is one of the most important insights of the Tractatus. Yet, as early as 1931, Wittgenstein referred to his own early work as dogmatic (“On Dogmatism” inVC, p. 182. Wittgenstein used this term to designate any conception which allows for a gap between question and answer, such that the answer to the question could be found at a later date. The complex edifice of the Tractatus is built on the assumption that the task of logical analysis was to discover the elementary propositions, whose form was not yet known. What marks the transition from early to later Wittgenstein can be summed up as the total rejection of dogmatism, i.e., as the working out of all the consequences of this rejection. The move from the realm of logic to that of ordinary language as the center of the philosopher's attention; from an emphasis on definition and analysis to ‘family resemblance’ and ‘language-games’; and from systematic philosophical writing to an aphoristic style—all have to do with this transition towards anti-dogmatism in its extreme. It is in the Philosophical Investigations that the working out of the transitions comes to culmination. Other writings of the same period, though, manifest the same anti-dogmatic stance, as it is applied, e.g., to the philosophy of mathematics or to philosophical psychology.

3.2 Philosophical Investigations

Philosophical Investigations was published posthumously in 1953. It was edited by G. E. M. Anscombe and Rush Rhees and translated by Anscombe. It comprised two parts. Part I, consisting of 693 numbered paragraphs, was ready for printing in 1946, but rescinded from the publisher by Wittgenstein. Part II was added on by the editors, trustees of his Nachlass. In 2009 a new edited translation, by P. M. S. Hacker and Joachim Schulte, was published; Part II of the earlier translation was here labeled “Philosophy of Psychology - A Fragment” (PPF).

In the Preface to PI, Wittgenstein states that his new thoughts would be better understood by contrast with and against the background of his old thoughts, those in the Tractatus; and indeed, most of Part I of PI is essentially critical. Its new insights can be understood as primarily exposing fallacies in the traditional way of thinking about language, truth, thought, intentionality, and, perhaps mainly, philosophy. In this sense, it is conceived of as a therapeutic work, viewing philosophy itself as therapy. (Part II (PPF), focusing on philosophical psychology, perception etc., was not as critical. Rather, it pointed to new perspectives (which, undoubtedly, are not disconnected from the earlier critique) in addressing specific philosophical issues. It is, therefore, more easily read alongside Wittgenstein's other writings of the later period.)

PI begins with a quote from Augustine's Confessions which “give us a particular picture of the essence of human language,” based on the idea that “the words in language name objects,” and that “sentences are combinations of such names” (PI 1). This picture of language cannot be relied on as a basis for metaphysical, epistemic or linguistic speculation. Despite its plausibility, this reduction of language to representation cannot do justice to the whole of human language; and even if it is to be considered a picture of only the representative function of human language, it is, as such, a poor picture. Furthermore, this picture of language is at the base of the whole of traditional philosophy, but, for Wittgenstein, it is to be shunned in favor of a new way of looking at both language and philosophy. The Philosophical Investigations proceeds to offer the new way of looking at language, which will yield the view of philosophy as therapy.

3.3 Meaning as Use

“For a large class of cases of the employment of the word ‘meaning’—though not for all—this way can be explained in this way: the meaning of a word is its use in the language” (PI 43). This basic statement is what underlies the change of perspective most typical of the later phase of Wittgenstein's thought: a change from a conception of meaning as representation to a view which looks to use as the crux of the investigation. Traditional theories of meaning in the history of philosophy were intent on pointing to something exterior to the proposition which endows it with sense. This ‘something’ could generally be located either in an objective space, or inside the mind as mental representation. As early as 1933 (The Blue Book) Wittgenstein took pains to challenge these conceptions, arriving at the insight that “if we had to name anything which is the life of the sign, we should have to say that it was its use” (BB 4). Ascertainment of the use (of a word, of a proposition), however, is not given to any sort of constructive theory building, as in the Tractatus. Rather, when investigating meaning, the philosopher must “look and see” the variety of uses to which the word is put. An analogy with tools sheds light on the nature of words. When we think of tools in a toolbox, we do not fail to see their variety; but the “functions of words are as diverse as the functions of these objects” (PI 11). We are misled by the uniform appearance of our words into theorizing upon meaning: “Especially when we are doing philosophy!” (PI 12)

So different is this new perspective that Wittgenstein repeats: “Don't think, but look!” (PI 66); and such looking is done vis a vis particular cases, not generalizations. In giving the meaning of a word, any explanatory generalization should be replaced by a description of use. The traditional idea that a proposition houses a content and has a restricted number of Fregean forces (such as assertion, question and command), gives way to an emphasis on the diversity of uses. In order to address the countless multiplicity of uses, their un-fixedness, and their being part of an activity, Wittgenstein introduces the key concept of ‘language-game’. He never explicitly defines it since, as opposed to the earlier ‘picture’, for instance, this new concept is made to do work for a more fluid, more diversified, and more activity-oriented perspective on language.

3.4 Language-games and Family Resemblance

Throughout the Philosophical Investigations, Wittgenstein returns, again and again, to the concept of language-games to make clear his lines of thought concerning language. Primitive language-games are scrutinized for the insights they afford on this or that characteristic of language. Thus, the builders' language-game (PI 2), in which a builder and his assistant use exactly four terms (block, pillar, slab, beam), is utilized to illustrate that part of the Augustinian picture of language which might be correct but which is, nevertheless, strictly limited. ‘Regular’ language-games, such as the astonishing list provided in PI 23 (which includes, e.g., reporting an event, speculating about an event, forming and testing a hypothesis, making up a story, reading it, play-acting, singing catches, guessing riddles, making a joke, translating, asking, thanking, and so on), bring out the openness of our possibilities in using language and in describing it.

Language-games are, first, a part of a broader context termed by Wittgenstein a form of life (see below). Secondly, the concept of language-games points at the rule-governed character of language. This does not entail strict and definite systems of rules for each and every language-game, but points to the conventional nature of this sort of human activity. Still, just as we cannot give a final, essential definition of ‘game’, so we cannot find “what is common to all these activities and what makes them into language or parts of language” (PI 65).

It is here that Wittgenstein's rejection of general explanations, and definitions based on sufficient and necessary conditions, is best pronounced. Instead of these symptoms of the philosopher's “craving for generality”, he points to ‘family resemblance’ as the more suitable analogy for the means of connecting particular uses of the same word. There is no reason to look, as we have done traditionally—and dogmatically—for one, essential core in which the meaning of a word is located and which is, therefore, common to all uses of that word. We should, instead, travel with the word's uses through “a complicated network of similarities overlapping and criss-crossing” (PI 66). Family resemblance also serves to exhibit the lack of boundaries and the distance from exactness that characterize different uses of the same concept. Such boundaries and exactness are the definitive traits of form—be it Platonic form, Aristotelian form, or the general form of a proposition adumbrated in the Tractatus. It is from such forms that applications of concepts can be deduced, but this is precisely what Wittgenstein now eschews in favor of appeal to similarity of a kind with family resemblance.

3.5 Rule-following and Private Language

One of the issues most associated with the later Wittgenstein is that of rule-following. Rising out of the considerations above, it becomes another central point of discussion in the question of what it is that can apply to all the uses of a word. The same dogmatic stance as before has it that a rule is an abstract entity—transcending all of its particular applications; knowing the rule involves grasping that abstract entity and thereby knowing how to use it.

Wittgenstein begins his exposition by introducing an example: “… we get [a] pupil to continue a series (say ‘+ 2’) beyond 1000—and he writes 1000, 1004, 1008, 1012 (PI 185)”. What do we do, and what does it mean, when the student, upon being corrected, answers “But I did go on in the same way”? Wittgenstein proceeds (mainly in PI 185-243, but also elsewhere) to dismantle the cluster of attendant questions: How do we learn rules? How do we follow them? Wherefrom the standards which decide if a rule is followed correctly? Are they in the mind, along with a mental representation of the rule? Do we appeal to intuition in their application? Are they socially and publicly taught and enforced? In typical Wittgensteinian fashion, the answers are not pursued positively; rather, the very formulation of the questions as legitimate questions with coherent content is put to the test. For indeed, it is both the Platonistic and mentalistic pictures which underlie asking questions of this type, and Wittgenstein is intent on freeing us from these assumptions. Such liberation involves elimination of the need to posit any sort of external or internal authority beyond the actual applications of the rule.

These considerations lead to PI 201, often considered the climax of the issue: “This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule. The answer was: if everything can be made out to accord with the rule, then it can also be made out to conflict with it. And so there would be neither accord nor conflict here.” Wittgenstein's formulation of the problem, now at the point of being a “paradox”, has given rise to a wealth of interpretation and debate since it is clear to all that this is the crux of the general issue of meaning, and of understanding and using a language. One of the influential readings of the problem of following a rule (introduced by Fogelin 1976 and Kripke 1982) has been the interpretation, according to which Wittgenstein is here voicing a skeptical paradox and offering a skeptical solution. That is to say, there are no facts that determine what counts as following a rule, no real grounds for saying that someone is indeed following a rule, and Wittgenstein accepts this skeptical challenge (by suggesting other conditions that might warrant our asserting that someone is following a rule). This reading has been challenged, in turn, by several interpretations (such as Baker and Hacker 1984, McGinn1984, and Cavell 1990), while others have provided additional, fresh perspectives (e.g., Diamond, “Rules: Looking in the Right Place” in Phillips and Winch 1989, and several in Miller and Wright 2002).

Directly following the rule-following sections in PI, and therefore easily thought to be the upshot of the discussion, are those sections called by interpreters “the private-language argument”. Whether it be a veritable argument or not (and Wittgenstein never labeled it as such), these sections point out that for an utterance to be meaningful it must be possible in principle to subject it to public standards and criteria of correctness. For this reason, a private-language, in which “words … are to refer to what only the speaker can know—to his immediate private sensations …” (PI 243), is not a genuine, meaningful, rule-governed language. The signs in language can only function when there is a possibility of judging the correctness of their use, “so the use of [a] word stands in need of a justification which everybody understands” (PI 261).

3.6 Grammar and Form of Life

Grammar, usually taken to consist of the rules of correct syntactic and semantic usage, becomes, in Wittgenstein's hands, the wider—and more elusive—network of rules which determine what linguistic move is allowed as making sense, and what isn't. This notion replaces the stricter and purer logic, which played such an essential role in the Tractatus in providing a scaffolding for language and the world. Indeed, “Essence is expressed in grammar … Grammar tells what kind of object anything is. (Theology as grammar)” (PI 371, 373). The “rules” of grammar are not mere technical instructions from on-high for correct usage; rather, they express the norms for meaningful language. Contrary to empirical statements, rules of grammar describe how we use words in order to both justify and criticize our particular utterances. But as opposed to grammar-book rules, they are not idealized as an external system to be conformed to. Moreover, they are not appealed to explicitly in any formulation, but are used in cases of philosophical perplexity to clarify where language misleads us into false illusions. Thus, “I can know what someone else is thinking, not what I am thinking. It is correct to say ‘I know what you are thinking’, and wrong to say ‘I know what I am thinking.’ (A whole cloud of philosophy condensed into a drop of grammar.)” (Philosophical Investigations 1953, p.222).

Grammar is not abstract, it is situated within the regular activity with which language-games are interwoven: “… the word ‘language-game’ is used here to emphasize the fact that the speaking of language is part of an activity, or of a form of life” (PI 23). What enables language to function and therefore must be accepted as “given” are precisely forms of life. In Wittgenstein's terms, “It is not only agreement in definitions but also (odd as it may sound) in judgments that is required” (PI 242), and this is “agreement not in opinions, but rather in form of life” (PI 241). Used by Wittgenstein sparingly—five times in the Investigations—this concept has given rise to interpretative quandaries and subsequent contradictory readings. Forms of life can be understood as changing and contingent, dependent on culture, context, history, etc; this appeal to forms of life grounds a relativistic reading of Wittgenstein. On the other hand, it is the form of life common to humankind, “shared human behavior” which is “the system of reference by means of which we interpret an unknown language” (PI 206). This might be seen as a universalistic turn, recognizing that the use of language is made possible by the human form of life.

3.7 The Nature of Philosophy

In his later writings Wittgenstein holds, as he did in the Tractatus, that philosophers do not—or should not—supply a theory, neither do they provide explanations. “Philosophy just puts everything before us, and neither explains nor deduces anything.—Since everything lies open to view there is nothing to explain” (PI 126). The anti-theoretical stance is reminiscent of the early Wittgenstein, but there are manifest differences. Although the Tractatus precludes philosophical theories, it does construct a systematic edifice which results in the general form of the proposition, all the while relying on strict formal logic; the Investigations points out the therapeutic non-dogmatic nature of philosophy, verily instructing philosophers in the ways of therapy. “The work of the philosopher consists in marshalling reminders for a particular purpose” (PI 127). Working with reminders and series of examples, different problems are solved. Unlike the Tractatus which advanced one philosophical method, in the Investigations “there is not a single philosophical method, though there are indeed methods, different therapies, as it were” (PI 133d). This is directly related to Wittgenstein's eschewal of the logical form or of any a-priori generalization that can be discovered or made in philosophy. Trying to advance such general theses is a temptation which lures philosophers; but the real task of philosophy is both to make us aware of the temptation and to show us how to overcome it. Consequently “a philosophical problem has the form: ‘I don't know my way about.’” (PI 123), and hence the aim of philosophy is “to show the fly the way out of the fly-bottle” (PI 309).

The style of the Investigations is strikingly different from that of the Tractatus. Instead of strictly numbered sections which are organized hierarchically in programmatic order, the Investigations fragmentarily voices aphorisms about language-games, family resemblance, forms of life, “sometimes jumping, in a sudden change, from one area to another” (PI Preface). This variation in style is of course essential and is “connected with the very nature of the investigation” (PI Preface). As a matter of fact, Wittgenstein was acutely aware of the contrast between the two stages of his thought, suggesting publication of both texts together in order to make the contrast obvious and clear.

Still, it is precisely via the subject of the nature of philosophy that the fundamental continuity between these two stages, rather than the discrepancy between them, is to be found. In both cases philosophy serves, first, as critique of language. It is through analyzing language's illusive power that the philosopher can expose the traps of meaningless philosophical formulations. This means that what was formerly thought of as a philosophical problem may now dissolve “and this simply means that the philosophical problems should completely disappear” (PI 133). Two implications of this diagnosis, easily traced back in the Tractatus, are to be recognized. One is the inherent dialogical character of philosophy, which is a responsive activity: difficulties and torments are encountered which are then to be dissipated by philosophical therapy. In the Tractatus, this took the shape of advice: “The correct method in philosophy would really be the following: to say nothing except what can be said, i.e. propositions of natural science … and then whenever someone else wanted to say something metaphysical, to demonstrate to him that he had failed to give a meaning to certain signs in his propositions” (TLP 6.53) The second, more far- reaching, “discovery” in the Investigations “is the one that enables me to break off philosophizing when I want to” (PI 133). This has been taken to revert back to the ladder metaphor and the injunction to silence in the Tractatus.

3.8 After the Investigations

It has been submitted that the writings of the period from 1946 until his death (1951) constitute a distinctive phase of Wittgenstein's thought. These writings include, in addition to the second part of the first edition of the Philosophical Investigations, texts edited and collected in volumes such as Remarks on Colour, Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, Zettel, On Certainty, and parts of The Foundations of Mathematics. Besides dealing with mathematics and psychology, this is the stage at which Wittgenstein most seriously pursued questions traditionally recognized as epistemological. On Certainty tackles skeptical doubts and foundational solutions but is, in typical Wittgensteinian fashion, a work of therapy which discounts presuppositions common to both. This is intimately related to another of On Certainty's themes—the primacy of the deed to the word, or, in Wittgenstein's PI terminology, of form of life to grammar. The general tenor of all the writings of this last period can thence be viewed as, on the one hand, a move away from the critical (some would say destructive) positions of the Investigations to a more positive perspective on the same problems that had been facing him since his early writings; on the other hand, this move does not constitute a break from the later period but is more properly viewed as its continuation, in a new light.

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Secondary Sources

Biographies and Historical Background

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Collections of Essays

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analysis | certainty | Frege, Gottlob | logical form | logical truth | mental representation | private language | Russell, Bertrand | Vienna Circle | Wittgenstein, Ludwig: aesthetics | Wittgenstein, Ludwig: logical atomism | Wittgenstein, Ludwig: philosophy of mathematics

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