The Nature of Law

First published Sun May 27, 2001; substantive revision Fri Aug 7, 2015

Lawyers are typically interested in the question: What is the law on a particular issue? This is always a local question and answers to it are bound to differ according to the specific jurisdiction in which they are asked. In contrast, philosophy of law is interested in the general question: What is Law? This general question about the nature of law presupposes that law is a unique social-political phenomenon, with more or less universal characteristics that can be discerned through philosophical analysis. General jurisprudence, as this philosophical inquiry about the nature of law is called, is meant to be universal. It assumes that law possesses certain features, and it possesses them by its very nature, or essence, as law, whenever and wherever it happens to exist. However, even if there are such universal characteristics of law—which is controversial, as we will later discuss—the reasons for a philosophical interest in elucidating them remain to be explained. First, there is the sheer intellectual interest in understanding such a complex social phenomenon which is, after all, one of the most intricate aspects of human culture. Law, however, is also a normative social practice: it purports to guide human behavior, giving rise to reasons for action. An attempt to explain this normative, reason-giving aspect of law is one of the main challenges of general jurisprudence. These two sources of interest in the nature of law are closely linked. Law is not the only normative domain in our culture; morality, religion, social conventions, etiquette, and so on, also guide human conduct in many ways which are similar to law. Therefore, part of what is involved in the understanding of the nature of law consists in an explanation of how law differs from these similar normative domains, how it interacts with them, and whether its intelligibility depends on other normative orders, like morality or social conventions.

Contemporary legal theories define these two main interests in the nature of law in the following terms. First, we need to understand the general conditions that would render any putative norm legally valid. Is it, for example, just a matter of the source of the norm, such as its enactment by a particular political institution, or is it also a matter of the norm’s content? This is the general question about the conditions of legal validity. Second, there is the interest in the normative aspect of law. This philosophical interest is twofold: A complete philosophical account of the normativity of law comprises both an explanatory and a justificatory task. The explanatory task consists of an attempt to explain how legal norms can give rise to reasons for action, and what kinds of reasons are involved. The task of justification concerns the question of whether people ought to comply—morally speaking or all things considered—with law’s demands. In other words, it is the attempt to explain the moral legitimacy of law and the subjects’ reasons for complying with it. A theory about the nature of law, as opposed to critical theories of law, concentrates on the first of these two questions. It purports to explain what the normativity of law actually consists in. Some contemporary legal philosophers, however, doubt that these two aspects of the normativity of law can be separated. (We will return to this later.)

Thus, elucidating the conditions of legal validity and explaining the normativity of law form the two main subjects of any general theory about the nature of law. In section 1, we will explain some of the main debates about these two issues. In section 2, we will discuss some of the methodological debates about the nature of general jurisprudence. In the course of the last few centuries, two main rival philosophical traditions have emerged about the nature of legality. The older one, dating back to late mediaeval Christian scholarship, is called the natural law tradition. Since the early 19th century, natural law theories have been fiercely challenged by the legal positivism tradition promulgated by such scholars as Jeremy Bentham and John Austin. The philosophical origins of legal positivism are much earlier, though, probably in the political philosophy of Thomas Hobbes. The main controversy between these two traditions concerns the conditions of legal validity. Basically, legal positivism asserts, and natural law denies, that the conditions of legal validity are purely a matter of social facts. In contrast to positivism, natural law claims that the conditions of legal validity are not exhausted by social facts; the moral content of the putative norms also bears on their legal validity. As the famous dictum, commonly attributed to Saint Augustine, has it: lex iniusta non est lex (unjust law is not law). (Augustine, De Libero Arbitrio, I, 5; see also Aquinas, Summa Theologica, I-II, Q. 96, Art. 4.)

1. General Jurisprudence

1.1 The Conditions of Legal Validity

The main insight of legal positivism, that the conditions of legal validity are determined by social facts, involves two separate claims which have been labeled The Social Thesis and The Separation Thesis. The Social Thesis asserts that law is, profoundly, a social phenomenon, and that the conditions of legal validity consist of social—that is, non-normative—facts. Early legal positivists followed Hobbes’ insight that the law is, essentially, an instrument of political sovereignty, and they maintained that the basic source of legal validity resides in the facts constituting political sovereignty. Law, they thought, is basically the command of the sovereign. Later legal positivists have modified this view, maintaining that social rules, and not the facts about sovereignty, constitute the grounds of law. Most contemporary legal positivists share the view that there are rules of recognition, namely, social rules or conventions which determine certain facts or events that provide the ways for the creation, modification, and annulment of legal standards. These facts, such as an act of legislation or a judicial decision, are the sources of law conventionally identified as such in each and every modern legal system. One way of understanding the legal positivist position here is to see it as a form of reduction: legal positivism maintains, essentially, that legal validity is reducible to facts of a non-normative type, that is, facts about people’s conduct, beliefs and attitudes.

Natural lawyers deny this insight, insisting that a putative norm cannot become legally valid unless it passes a certain threshold of morality. Positive law must conform in its content to some basic precepts of natural law, that is, universal morality, in order to become law in the first place. In other words, natural lawyers maintain that the moral content or merit of norms, and not just their social origins, also form part of the conditions of legal validity. And again, it is possible to view this position as a non-reductive conception of law, maintaining that legal validity cannot be reduced to non-normative facts.

The Separation Thesis is an important negative implication of the Social Thesis, maintaining that there is a conceptual separation between law and morality, that is, between what the law is, and what the law ought to be. The Separation Thesis, however, has often been overstated. It is sometimes thought that natural law asserts, and legal positivism denies, that the law is, by necessity, morally good or that the law must have some minimal moral content. The Social Thesis certainly does not entail the falsehood of the assumption that there is something necessarily good in the law. Legal positivism can accept the claim that law is, by its very nature or its essential functions in society, something good that deserves our moral appreciation. Nor is legal positivism forced to deny the plausible claim that wherever law exists, it would have to have a great many prescriptions which coincide with morality. There is probably a considerable overlap, and perhaps necessarily so, between the actual content of law and morality. Once again, the Separation Thesis, properly understood, pertains only to the conditions of legal validity. It asserts that the conditions of legal validity do not depend on the moral merits of the norms in question. What the law is cannot depend on what it ought to be in the relevant circumstances.

Many contemporary legal positivists would not subscribe to this formulation of the Separation Thesis. A contemporary school of thought, called inclusive legal positivism, endorses the Social Thesis, namely, that the basic conditions of legal validity derive from social facts, such as social rules or conventions which happen to prevail in a given community. But, inclusive legal positivists maintain, legal validity is sometimes a matter of the moral content of the norms, depending on the particular conventions that happen to prevail in any given community. The social conventions on the basis of which we identify the law may, but need not, contain reference to moral content as a condition of legality.

The natural law tradition has undergone a considerable refinement in the 20th century, mainly because its classical, popular version faced an obvious objection about its core insight: it is just difficult to maintain that morally bad law is not law. The idea that law must pass, as it were, a kind of moral filter in order to count as law strikes most jurists as incompatible with the legal world as we know it. Therefore, contemporary natural lawyers have suggested different and more subtle interpretations of the main tenets of natural law. For example, John Finnis views natural law (in its Thomist version) not as a constraint on the legal validity of positive laws, but mainly as an elucidation of an ideal of law in its fullest, or highest sense, concentrating on the ways in which law necessarily promotes the common good. As we have noted earlier, however, it is not clear that such a view about the necessary moral content of law is at odds with the main tenets of legal positivism. To the extent that there is a debate here, it is a metaphysical one about what is essential or necessary to law, and about whether the essential features of law must be elucidated in teleological terms or not. Legal positivists do not tend to seek deep teleological accounts of law, along the lines articulated by Finnis, but whether they need to deny such metaphysical projects is far from clear.

The idea that the conditions of legal validity are at least partly a matter of the moral content or merits of norms is articulated in a sophisticated manner by Ronald Dworkin’s legal theory. Dworkin is not a classical natural lawyer, however, and he does not maintain that morally acceptable content is a precondition of a norm’s legality. His core idea is that the very distinction between facts and values in the legal domain, between what the law is and what it ought to be, is much more blurred than legal positivism would have it: Determining what the law is in particular cases inevitably depends on moral-political considerations about what it ought to be. Evaluative judgments, about the content law ought to have or what it ought to prescribe, partly determine what the law actually is.

Dworkin’s legal theory is not based on a general repudiation of the classical fact-value distinction, as much as it is based on a certain conception of legal reasoning. This conception went through two main stages. In the 1970s Dworkin (1977) argued that the falsehood of legal positivism resides in the fact that it is incapable of accounting for the important role that legal principles play in the law. Legal positivism envisaged, Dworkin claimed, that the law consists of rules only. However, this is a serious mistake, since in addition to rules, law is partly determined by legal principles. The distinction between rules and principles is a logical one. Rules, Dworkin maintained, apply in an “all or nothing fashion.” If the rule applies to the circumstances, it determines a particular legal outcome. If it does not apply, it is simply irrelevant to the outcome. On the other hand, principles do not determine an outcome even if they clearly apply to the pertinent circumstances. Principles provide judges with a legal reason to decide the case one way or the other, and hence they only have a dimension of weight. That is, the reasons provided by the principle may be relatively strong, or weak, but they are never “absolute.” Such reasons, by themselves, cannot determine an outcome, as rules do.

The most interesting, and from a positivist perspective, most problematic, aspect of legal principles, however, consists in their moral dimension. According to Dworkin’s theory, unlike legal rules, which may or may not have something to do with morality, principles are essentially moral in their content. It is, in fact, partly a moral consideration that determines whether a legal principle exists or not. Why is that? Because a legal principle exists, according to Dworkin, if the principle follows from the best moral and political interpretation of past judicial and legislative decisions in the relevant domain. In other words, legal principles occupy an intermediary space between legal rules and moral principles. Legal rules are posited by recognized institutions and their validity derives from their enacted source. Moral principles are what they are due to their content, and their validity is purely content dependent. Legal principles, on the other hand, gain their validity from a combination of source-based and content-based considerations. As Dworkin put it in the most general terms: “According to law as integrity, propositions of law are true if they figure in or follow from the principles of justice, fairness, and procedural due process that provide the best constructive interpretation of the community’s legal practice” (Dworkin 1986, 225). The validity of a legal principle then, derives, from a combination of facts and moral considerations. The facts concern the past legal decisions which have taken place in the relevant domain, and the considerations of morals and politics concern the ways in which those past decisions can best be accounted for by the correct moral principles.

Needless to say, if such an account of legal principles is correct, the Separation Thesis can no longer be maintained. But many legal philosophers doubt that there are legal principles of the kind Dworkin envisaged. There is an alternative, more natural way to account for the distinction between rules and principles in the law: the relevant difference concerns the level of generality, or vagueness, of the norm-act prescribed by the pertinent legal norm. Legal norms can be more or less general, or vague, in their definition of the norm-act prescribed by the rule, and the more general or vague they are, the more they tend to have those quasi-logical features Dworkin attributes to principles. More importantly, notice that if you make the legal validity of norms, such as legal principles, depend on moral argument, you allow for the possibility that an entire legal community may get its laws wrong. Any moral mistake in the reasoning leading to a legal principle might render the conclusion about the principle unsound, and the principle itself thus not legally valid. Since there is nothing to prevent judges and other legal actors from making moral mistakes, there is nothing to prevent a result whereby an entire legal community, and for a long time, gets its laws wrong (Marmor 2011, chapter 4). Perhaps Dworkin would have not found this problematic, but others might; the idea that an entire legal community can be systematically mistaken about its own laws might strike legal theorists as deeply problematic.

In the 1980s Dworkin radicalized his views about these issues, striving to ground his anti-positivist legal theory on a general theory of interpretation, and emphasizing law’s profound interpretative nature. Despite the fact that Dworkin’s interpretative theory of law is extremely sophisticated and complex, the essence of his argument from interpretation can be summarized in a rather simple way. The main argument consists of two main premises. The first thesis maintains that determining what the law requires in each and every particular case necessarily involves interpretative reasoning. Any statement of the form “According to the law in \(S\), \(x\) has a right/duty etc., to \(y\)” is a conclusion of some interpretation or other. Now, according to the second premise, interpretation always involves evaluative considerations. More precisely, perhaps, interpretation is neither purely a matter of determining facts, nor is it a matter of evaluative judgment per se, but an inseparable mixture of both. Clearly enough, one who accepts both these theses must conclude that the Separation Thesis is fundamentally flawed. If Dworkin is correct about both theses, it surely follows that determining what the law requires always involves evaluative considerations.

Notably, the first premise of Dworkin’s general argument is highly contestable. Some legal philosophers have argued that legal reasoning is not as thoroughly interpretative as Dworkin assumes. Interpretation, according to this view, long maintained by H.L.A. Hart (1961, chapter 7), is an exception to the standard understanding of language and communication, rendered necessary only when the law is, for some reason, unclear. However, in most standard instances, the law can simply be understood, and applied, without the mediation of interpretation (Marmor 2011, chapter 6).

Dworkin’s legal theory shares certain insights with the Inclusive version of legal positivism. Note, however, that although both Dworkin and inclusive legal positivists share the view that morality and legal validity are closely related, they differ on the grounds of this relationship. Dworkin maintains that the dependence of legal validity on moral considerations is an essential feature of law that derives from law’s profoundly interpretative nature. Inclusive positivism, on the other hand, maintains that such a dependence of legal validity on moral considerations is a contingent matter; it does not derive from the nature of law or of legal reasoning as such. Inclusive positivists accept the Social Thesis; they claim that moral considerations affect legal validity only in those cases where this is dictated by the social rules or conventions which happen to prevail in a given legal system. The relevance of morality is determined in any given legal system by the contingent content of that society’s conventions. As opposed to both these views, traditional, or as it is now called, exclusive legal positivism maintains that a norm’s legal validity is never dependent on its moral content. Legal validity, according to this view, is entirely dependent on the conventionally recognized factual sources of law.

It may be worth noting that those legal theories maintaining that legal validity partly depends on moral considerations must also share a certain view about the nature of morality. Namely, they must hold an objective stance with respect to the nature of moral values. Otherwise, if moral values are not objective and legality depends on morality, legality would also be rendered subjective, posing serious problems for the question of how to identify what the law is. Some legal theories, however, do insist on the subjectivity of moral judgements, thus embracing the skeptical conclusions that follow about the nature of law. According to these skeptical theories, law is, indeed, profoundly dependent on morality, but, as these theorists assume that morality is entirely subjective, it only demonstrates how the law is also profoundly subjective, always up for grabs, so to speak. This skeptical approach, fashionable in so-called post-modernist literature, crucially depends on a subjectivist theory of values, which is rarely articulated in this literature in any sophisticated way.

1.2 The Normativity of Law

Throughout human history the law has been known as a coercive institution, enforcing its practical demands on its subjects by means of threats and violence. This conspicuous feature of law made it very tempting for some philosophers to assume that the normativity of law resides in its coercive aspect. Even within the legal positivist tradition, however, the coercive aspect of the law has given rise to fierce controversies. Early legal positivists, such as Bentham and Austin, maintained that coercion is an essential feature of law, distinguishing it from other normative domains. Legal positivists in the 20th century have tended to deny this, claiming that coercion is neither essential to law, nor, actually, pivotal to the fulfillment of its functions in society. Before we unpack the various issues involved in this controversy, it might be worth noting that the debate about law’s coercive aspect is one good example of debates in jurisprudence that focus on what might be an essential or a necessary feature of law, regardless of its particular manifestations in this or that legal system. How to understand these claims about the essence of law, and the question of whether these claims are about metaphysics or something else, perhaps about morality, will be discussed in section 2.1.

Returning to law’s coercive aspect, there are several issues entangled here, and we should carefully separate them. John Austin famously maintained that each and every legal norm, as such, must comprise a threat backed by sanction. This involves at least two separate claims: In one sense, it can be understood as a thesis about the concept of law, maintaining that what we call “law” can only be those norms which are backed by sanctions of the political sovereign. In a second, though not less problematic sense, the intimate connection between the law and the threat of sanctions is a thesis about the normativity of law. It is a reductionist thesis about law’s normative character, maintaining that the normativity of law consists in the subjects’ ability to predict the chances of incurring punishment or evil and their presumed desire to avoid it.

In addition to this particular controversy, there is the further question, concerning the relative importance of sanctions for the ability of law to fulfill its social functions. Hans Kelsen, for instance, maintained that the monopolization of violence in society, and the law’s ability to impose its demands by violent means, is the most important of law’s functions in society. Twentieth century legal positivists, like H.L.A. Hart and Joseph Raz, deny this, maintaining that the coercive aspect of law is much more marginal than their predecessors assumed. Once again, the controversy here is actually twofold: is coercion essential to what the law does? And even if it is not deemed essential, how important it is, compared with the other functions law fulfills in our lives?

Austin’s reductionist account of the normativity of law, maintaining that the normative aspect of law simply consists in the subjects’ desire to avoid sanctions, was discussed extensively, and fiercely criticized, by H.L.A. Hart. Hart’s fundamental objection to Austin’s reductionist account of law’s normativity is, on his own account, “that the predictive interpretation obscures the fact that, where rules exist, deviations from them are not merely grounds for prediction that hostile reactions will follow…. but are also deemed to be a reason or justification for such reaction and for applying the sanctions” (Hart 1961, 82). This emphasis on the reason-giving function of rules is surely correct, but perhaps not enough. Supporters of the predictive account could claim that it only begs the further question of why people should regard the rules of law as reasons or justifications for actions. If it is, for example, only because the law happens to be an efficient sanction-provider, then the predictive model of the normativity of law may turn out to be correct after all. In other words, Hart’s fundamental objection to the predictive model is actually a result of his vision about the main functions of law in society, holding, contra Austin and Kelsen, that those functions are not exclusively related to the ability of the law to impose sanctions.

It is arguable, however, that law’s functions in our culture are more closely related to its coercive aspect than Hart seems to have assumed. Contemporary use of “game theory” in the law tends to show that the rationale of a great variety of legal arrangements can be best explained by the function of law in solving problems of opportunism, like the so called Prisoner’s Dilemma situations. In these cases, the law’s main role is, indeed, one of providing coercive incentives for the mutual benefit of all parties concerned. Be this as it may, we should probably refrain from endorsing Austin’s or Kelsen’s position that law’s only function in society is essentially tied to its coercive aspects. Solving recurrent and multiple coordination problems, setting standards for desirable behavior, proclaiming symbolic expressions of communal values, resolving disputes about facts, and such, are important functions which the law serves in our society, and those have very little to do with law’s coercive aspect and its sanction-imposing functions.

The extent to which law can actually guide behavior by providing its subjects with reasons for action has been questioned by a very influential group of legal scholars in the first half of the 20th century, called the Legal Realism school. American Legal Realists claimed that our ability to predict the outcomes of legal cases on the basis of the rules of law is rather limited. In the more difficult cases which tend to be adjudicated in the appellate courts, legal rules, by themselves, are radically indeterminate as to the outcome of the cases. The Legal Realists thought that lawyers who are interested in the predictive question of what the courts will actually decide in difficult cases need to engage in sociological and psychological research, striving to develop theoretical tools that would enable us to predict legal outcomes. Thus Legal Realism was mainly an attempt to introduce the social sciences into the domain of jurisprudence for predictive purposes. To what extent this scientific project succeeded is a matter of controversy. Be this as it may, Legal Realism paid very little attention to the question of the normativity of law, that is, to the question of how the law does guide behavior in those cases in which it seems to be determinate enough.

A much more promising approach to the normativity of law is found in Joseph Raz’s theory of authority, which also shows how such a theory about the normativity of law entails important conclusions with respect to the conditions of legal validity (Raz 1994). The basic insight of Raz’s argument is that the law is an authoritative social institution. The law, Raz claims, is a de facto authority. However, it is also essential to law that it must be held to claim legitimate authority. Any particular legal system may fail, of course, in its fulfillment of this claim. But law is the kind of institution which necessarily claims to be a legitimate authority.

According to Raz, the essential role of authorities in our practical reasoning is to mediate between the putative subjects of the authority and the right reasons which apply to them in the relevant circumstances. An authority is legitimate if and only if it helps its putative subjects to comply better with the right reasons relevant to their actions—i.e., if they are more likely to act in compliance with these reasons by following the authoritative resolution than they would be if they tried to figure out and act on the reasons directly (without the mediating resolution). For example, there may be many reasons that bear on the question of how fast to drive on a particular road—the amount of pedestrian traffic, impending turns in the road, etc.—but drivers may comply better with the balance of those reasons by following the legal speed limit than if they tried to figure out all the trade-offs in the moment. The legitimacy of the legal speed limit would thus be derived from the way in which it aids people in acting in better compliance with the balance of the right reasons.

Now, it follows that for something to be able to claim legitimate authority, it must be of the kind of thing capable of claiming it, namely, capable of fulfilling such a mediating role. What kinds of things can claim legitimate authority? There are at least two such features necessary for authority-capacity: First, for something to be able to claim legitimate authority, it must be the case that its directives are identifiable as authoritative directives, without the necessity of relying on those same reasons which the authoritative directive replaces. If this condition is not met, namely, if it is impossible to identify the authoritative directive as such without relying on those same reasons the authority was meant to rely on, then the authority could not fulfill its essential, mediating role. In short, it could not make the practical difference it is there to make. Note that this argument does not concern the efficacy of authorities. The point is not that unless authoritative directives can be recognized as such, authorities could not function effectively. The argument is based on the rationale of authorities within our practical reasoning. Authorities are there to make a practical difference, and they could not make such a difference unless the authority’s directive can be recognized as such without recourse to the reasons it is there to decide upon. In other words, it is pointless to have an authoritative directive if, in order to discover what the directive is, you have to engage in the same reasoning that reliance on the directive is supposed to replace. Secondly, for something to be able to claim legitimate authority, it must be capable of forming an opinion on how its subjects ought to behave, distinct from the subjects’ own reasoning about their reasons for action; authority requires some authorship.

Raz’s conception of legal authority provides very strong support for exclusive legal positivism because it requires that the law, qua an authoritative resolution, be identifiable on its own terms, that is, without having to rely on those same considerations that the law is there to resolve. Therefore a norm is legally valid (i.e., authoritative) only if its validity does not derive from moral or other evaluative considerations that the law is intended to replace. Notably, Raz’s theory challenges both Dworkin’s anti-positivist legal theory, and the inclusive version of legal positivism. This challenge, and the controversies it gave rise to, form one of the main topics discussed in contemporary general jurisprudence.

Explaining the rationale of legal authority, however, is not the only component of a theory about the normativity of law. If we hold the legal positivist thesis that law is essentially founded on social conventions, another important question arises here: how can a conventional practice give rise to reasons for action and, in particular, to obligations? Some legal philosophers claimed that conventional rules cannot, by themselves, give rise to obligations. As Leslie Green observed, Hart’s “view that the fundamental rules [of recognition] are ‘mere conventions’ continues to sit uneasily with any notion of obligation,” and this Green finds troubling, because the rules of recognition point to the “sources that judges are legally bound to apply” (Green 1996, 1697). The debate here is partly about the conventional nature of the rules of recognition, and partly about the ways in which conventions can figure in our reasons for action. According to one influential theory, inspired by David Lewis (1969) conventional rules emerge as solutions to large-scale and recurrent coordination problems. If the rules of recognition are, indeed, of such a coordination kind, it is relatively easy to explain how they may give rise to obligations. Coordination conventions would be obligatory if the norm subjects have an obligation to solve the coordination problem which initially gave rise to the emergence of the relevant convention. It is doubtful, however, that the conventions at the foundations of law are of a coordinative kind. In certain respects the law may be more like a structured game, or an artistic genre, which are actually constituted by social conventions. Such constitutive conventions are not explicable as solutions to some pre-existing recurrent coordination problem. The conventional rules constituting the game of chess, for example, are not there to solve a coordination problem between potential players. Antecedent to the game of chess, there was no particular coordination problem to solve. The conventional rules of chess constitute the game itself as a kind of social activity people would find worthwhile engaging in. The constitutive conventions partly constitute the values inherent in the emergent social practice. Such values, however, are only there for those who care to see them. Constitutive conventions, by themselves, cannot ground an obligation to engage in the practice they constitute.

From a moral point of view, the rules of recognition, by themselves, cannot be regarded as sources of obligation to follow the law. Whether judges, or anybody else, should or should not respect the rules of recognition of a legal system, is ultimately a moral issue, that can only be resolved by moral arguments (concerning the age old issue of political obligation). And this is more generally so: the existence of a social practice, in itself, does not provide anyone with an obligation to engage in the practice. The rules of recognition only define what the practice is, and they can say nothing on the question of whether one should or should not engage in it. But of course, once one does engage in the practice, playing the role of judge or some other legal official, as it were, there are legal obligations defined by the rules of the game. In other words, there is nothing special in the idea of a legal obligation to follow the rules of recognition. The referee in a soccer game is equally obliged to follow the rules of his game, and the fact that the game is conventional poses no difficulty from this, let us say, “internal-player’s” perspective. But again, the constitutive rules of soccer cannot settle for anyone the question of whether they should play soccer or not. Similarly, the rules of recognition cannot settle for the judge, or anyone else for that matter, whether they should play by the rules of law, or not. They only tell us what the law is. Unlike chess or soccer, however, the law may well be a kind of game that people have an obligation to play, as it were. But if there is such an obligation, it must emerge from external, moral, considerations, that is, from a general moral obligation to obey the law. The complex question of whether there is such a general obligation to obey the law, and whether it depends on certain features of the relevant legal system, is extensively discussed in the literature on political obligation. A complete theory about the normativity of law must encompass these moral issues as well. (See the entries on political obligation and legal obligation.)

Recent challenges to general jurisprudence, and particularly to legal positivism, have taken an interesting methodological turn. This methodological turn gained momentum with the publication of Dworkin’s Law’s Empire (1986), arguing that not only the law, as a social practice, is a profoundly interpretative (and thus partly, but necessarily, evaluative in nature), but that any theory about the nature of law is also interpretative in a similar way, and thus, equally evaluative. Many of those who do not necessarily share Dworkin’s views about the interpretative nature of legal practice, or the specifics of his theory of interpretation, have joined him in this methodological skepticism about the traditional aims of general jurisprudence, that is, about the possibility of developing a theory about that nature of law that would have general application and remain morally neutral. These, and other resultant methodological challenges to traditional general jurisprudence are taken up in the next section.

2. The Methodology of Jurisprudence

When it comes to the methodology of jurisprudence, we find two main issues. While one is not directly concerned with normativity, the second is. The first asks about the aims and success criteria for philosophical theories about the nature of law:

What is the target that first-order theories of law aim to capture, and when do they succeed in doing so?

The second asks about the role of evaluation in jurisprudential methodology:

Are first-order legal theories inherently or necessarily evaluative or can they be purely descriptive?

Each of these questions will be discussed in turn.

2.1 The Target of a Theory of Law

The first important class of methodological questions in jurisprudence concerns the target of first-order theories of law—that is, what phenomenon such theories aim to provide an account of. In taking a stand on what the proper target of a first-order legal theory is, one incurs a number of other methodological commitments. These include adopting a view about when such theories are successful, taking a stand on what sort of data such theories aim to systematize and explain, and determining what sorts of arguments are legitimately used in deciding between one of these theories and its competitors.

There are four main families of views on this question. One view takes jurisprudence to be a form of conceptual analysis, which is to say that theories of law aim to provide an account of some concept of law. This approach is often associated with Hart’s influential work, The Concept of Law (1994). A second sort of view adopts a more skeptical stance towards the methodology of conceptual analysis and takes theories of law to be in the business of offering a reductive explanation of law itself, not some concept of it. Third, the prescriptive view takes it that the aim of a theory of law is to specify the notion of law that it would be most desirable for us to adopt. A fourth kind of view, associated with Dworkin’s work, takes it that legal theories are in the business of offering a constructive interpretation of legal practice. In what follows, each of these four views, as well as some of the main issues they face, will be discussed in more depth.

2.1.1 Conceptual Analysis Views

On conceptual analysis views, theories of law aim to capture the concept of law and they succeed to the extent that they provide a coherent account of the relevant data about that concept and related concepts. In particular, the data to be systematized are taken to be people’s intuitions involving some shared concept of law (or cognate concepts like legal validity or legal obligation). In their simplest form, such intuitions can be thought of as judgments about whether the relevant concept does or does not apply to particular cases. Accordingly, on this sort of view, a theory of law aims to provide an account of the conditions under which the target concept of law (or one of its cognates) applies.

What’s more, such a theory can be arrived at by employing the method of conceptual analysis, undertaken from the proverbial armchair. The idea is that the theorist starts with a putative set of criteria for the correct application of the target concept, and then she tests this account against her intuitions about that concept. If the account entails that the concept applies to particular cases that it intuitively does not apply to, then this provides reason to reject or revise the account in question. By contrast, if the account entails that the target concept applies to certain cases and this is the intuitively correct result, this tends to provide affirmative support for the account. The account successfully captures the target concept to the extent that it yields intuitively correct results about particular cases, and does so in an explanatorily satisfying way (as opposed to an ad hoc manner). (For a more in depth discussion of the methodology of conceptual analysis as applied to the concept of law, see Shapiro 2011, 16–22.)

Jurisprudence has been influenced by two main ways of understanding the relevant intuitions (or data) that theories of law aim to systematize. This, in turn, is due to the fact that one might understand concepts themselves, and our intuitions about them, in two different ways. Accordingly, we find two main varieties of the conceptual analysis view of methodology.

The first understanding of concepts takes concept possession to be mainly a matter of linguistic competence. That is, to possess the concept of law is to know when the word “law” as used in its juridical sense (not the scientific sense) applies. Thus, intuitions about the concept of law are to be understood as linguistic intuitions about how to use the word “law.” On the present view, then, conceptual analysis is a mode of linguistic analysis. This sort of view was famously discussed in chapters 1 and 2 of Dworkin’s Law’s Empire (Dworkin 1986, 32, 43–46). It arguably traces back to the kind of ordinary language philosophy associated with J.L. Austin and Gilbert Ryle (Marmor 2013, 210–212).

However, this understanding of concept possession has drawbacks. Perhaps the biggest source of concern in the present context is that this sort of view fuels a version of Dworkin’s “semantic sting” argument (Dworkin 1986, 43–46). The argument may be summarized as follows. Suppose legal theories aim to capture the concept of law and that concept possession just is a matter of knowing when the word “law” applies. If so, the argument runs, legal theories cannot explain disagreement about the grounds of law, that is, about the conditions of legal validity. After all, if legal theories are in this way semantic in nature, then disagreement about what the grounds of law are must boil down to disagreement about when the word “law” applies—at least assuming the parties to the disagreement are not merely talking past one another. But now a dilemma arises. Either legal practitioners possess the same concept of law or they do not. If they do possess the same concept, then it seems they cannot fail to agree about what it takes for a norm to count as law. After all, they all know when the word expressing their shared concept of law applies. But this is implausible, since legal practice in fact is rife with disagreement about what the grounds of law are (and thus, what counts as law or as legal). On the other hand, if legal practitioners do not share the same concept of law, then their disagreement about what the grounds of law are must just be due to the fact that they are talking past one another. But that, too, is implausible. Legal practice, as Dworkin puts it, is not “a grotesque joke” (Dworkin 1986, 44). Accordingly, there must be something wrong with construing legal theories as mere semantic accounts of when the word “law” applies.

If, in light of this argument, we are to abandon the idea that first-order legal theories are semantic theories, there are two obvious ways to proceed. First, one might simply abandon the idea that legal theories are exercises in conceptual analysis. This was Dworkin’s preferred response, though, as we’ll see, one can reject conceptual analysis without adopting Dworkin’s own favored methodology. (More on that in sub-section 2.1.2.) Second, if one wants to still say that legal theories are in the business of analyzing the concept of law, then the obvious response to the semantic sting argument is to deny that concept possession just is a matter of knowing how the word “law” in its juridical sense is to be applied. This suggests a second, richer form of conceptual analysis that legal theorists might be engaged in.

The basic idea behind the richer view is to take it that concept possession, rather than merely being a matter of knowing when words apply, involves something meatier: namely, the possession of a wide range of substantive beliefs or intuitions about the concept, its essential features and its proper application. The assumption is that the intuitions one is disposed to have in virtue of possessing the concept of law will be fertile enough to constitute a particular substantive conception of what the law is and how it functions. The aim of a theory of law, then, would be to systematize these pre-theoretic judgments about the concept of law in order to provide an account of some substantive conception of law. (This sort of richer view of concept possession is discussed, e.g., in Raz 2004, 4–7; Stravopoulos 2012, 78–79; Shapiro 2011, 16–22. It is perhaps also the sort of view presupposed by Hart.) On this view, legal disagreement remains possible because while practitioners might all be using the same concept of law, the richness of the concept allows that they nonetheless might not possess the concept determinately enough, or understand its application conditions thoroughly enough, to guarantee consensus on theoretical questions about what the grounds of law actually are.

However, also this richer understanding of concept possession, and the meatier picture of conceptual analysis it gives rise to, has been widely criticized (Marmor 2013, 215–217; Raz 2004, 10; Leiter 2007, 177–79). One question that immediately arises is which concept of law, exactly, constitutes the proper target of a theory of law. Is it the concept of law that is possessed by the legal practitioners in a particular jurisdiction? Or is it some universally shared concept of law? Worries loom either way. If a legal theory only aims to capture the concept of law employed in a particular jurisdiction, then that would render the theory parochial and it might lose its interest for those who are not concerned with that particular jurisdiction. On the other hand, one might doubt that there really is a universally shared concept of law that is employed by practitioners in all jurisdictions—or if there is one, it is doubtful that it is anything more than the sort of thin concept that one possesses in virtue of knowing what the word “law” in its juridical sense means.

A deeper worry about all forms of conceptual analysis is the question of why we should care about anybody’s concept of law in the first place (Marmor 2013, 216–217; Leiter 2007, 177–79). After all, as philosophers, it seems that it is the nature of law itself that we care about understanding (Raz 2004, 7, 10). Granted, there are interesting sociological questions to be asked about what various groups of people believe to be the case about how law functions. But it is not obvious that there is anything distinctively philosophical about such questions. Insofar as philosophers (qua philosophers) are interested in what people believe about a given concept, this would be because understanding people’s beliefs about the concept is a route to understanding that which it is a concept of (Raz 2004, 4, 10). Accordingly, one might think that what theories of law aim to capture is not anybody’s concept of law in particular, but rather the nature of law itself. (See also the entry on concepts, section 5.2.)

A possible response to this objection is to assert that since law is a social phenomenon and is in part constituted by practitioners’ own understanding of the practice they are engaged in, collecting evidence about the concept of law possessed by legal practitioners is an especially useful way to investigate law itself (Stravopoulos 2012, 79). Still, one might wonder whether this route to investigating the nature of law itself would be the most effective strategy to employ, given its indirectness. Why limit ourselves to asking questions about concepts if law can be studied directly?

A very different response would be to adopt a Platonist account of concepts, according to which they are not mental representations at all, but rather abstract objects akin to the objects of mathematical inquiry. The concept of law, then, would be the abstract object one must grasp in order to think about law. Accordingly, it is this abstract object—the concept of law—that philosophers care about and aim to investigate using the method of conceptual analysis (cf. Bealer 1998). Nonetheless, this view of concepts faces familiar objections. For one, an account is needed of how we can have access to the concept of law, conceived of as an independently existing abstract object. Moreover, even if we can access it, a puzzle arises about how different people who all determinately grasp the concept of law could possibly end up disagreeing about its nature (Sarch 2010, 468–73). Finally, while it might be plausible that a priori disciplines like mathematics and logic aim to investigate abstract objects (see the entry on platonism in the philosophy of mathematics), it is not clear that the investigation of a social phenomenon like the law, which is heavily dependent on human beliefs, attitudes and behavior, can be understood analogously. While mathematicians might be investigating the nature of abstract objects like numbers or sets, it seems more doubtful that legal philosophers are investigating the abstract object law.

2.1.2 Investigating Law Itself

Given the above doubts about conceptual analysis, several views have been suggested according to which first-order legal theories are primarily in the business of describing and explaining the nature of law itself, not any concept of it. Reductionist and naturalistic views fall into this category. (As noted below, such views need not completely eschew the armchair methods just sketched, but to the extent these methods remain viable, a very different explanation of their defensibility would have to be given.)

In particular, reductionist views take it that illuminating the nature of law is a matter of explaining what the law is, and how it operates, in terms of more foundational facts. As a result, first-order theories of law succeed to the extent that they accomplish this in an explanatorily powerful way (Marmor 2013). The goal of a first-order theory, on this sort of view, is to offer a metaphysical reduction of law: that is, to show that the phenomenon of law is actually constituted by, and fully reducible to, some other more foundational type of phenomenon (in the way that chemistry could in principle be reduced to particle physics). Thus construed, positivism, for example, would seek to explain the nature of law by reducing facts about what the law is, how it functions and what it requires, to more foundational social facts—e.g., about people’s behavior, beliefs and dispositions. By providing a reduction of this kind, a theory like positivism purports to illuminate the phenomenon of law itself by breaking it down into its constituents and explaining how they together make up the complex social practice that is the law. (For more on metaphysical reduction in general, see Schroeder 2007, 61–83; see also the entry on scientific reduction.)

One well-known type of reductionist view is naturalized jurisprudence. Brian Leiter has been the most prominent defender of this position (Leiter 2007). Like other reductionist views, naturalized jurisprudence takes the aim of legal theories to be to explain the nature of law itself (not anybody’s concept of it). But what is characteristic of naturalized jurisprudence is that it also insists that a purely empirical methodology should be used in doing so (Leiter 2007, 180–81, 183–99). (See also the entry on naturalism in legal philosophy.)

Naturalists might part company with adherents of other reductionist views over whether or not the armchair methods of philosophers, and related appeals to intuitions, thought experiments and the like, are misguided. The naturalist is likely to reject this mode of inquiry, while other reductionists may be more amenable to using it. A reductionist could in principle defend this sort of inquiry, for instance, by claiming that our particular-case intuitions involve a concept that we have acquired from experience with legal practice, and so such intuitions can be one useful source of information about the nature of law itself. Moreover, if legal practice (as a social phenomenon) is partially constituted by practitioners’ own beliefs and attitudes towards the practice they are engaged in, then evidence about legal practitioners’ concept of law might prove especially relevant as evidence about the law itself (Stravopoulos 2012, 79).

By contrast, naturalists tend not to endorse the armchair method of testing theories of law against intuition, given their aim of making “philosophical theorizing continuous with and dependent upon scientific theorizing” (Leiter 2007, 35). Leiter argues that our intuitions about law are too unreliable to be afforded much epistemic weight (as others have argued with respect to intuitions in other areas of philosophy) (Leiter 2007, 180, 184; cf. Cummins 1998). On Leiter’s view, philosophers generally should aim to unpack the “concepts that have been vindicated by their role in successful explanation and prediction of empirical phenomena” (Leiter 2007, 184). Thus, he suggests a methodology that “tak[es] seriously the…social scientific literature on law…to see what concept of law figures in the most powerful explanatory and predictive models of legal phenomena such as judicial behavior” (Leiter 2007, 184). This methodological view, however, raises questions about why the legal philosopher should study only judicial behavior and not something else. More generally, the naturalist owes an account of what features of law are most in need of explication and why.

A different sort of concern that arises for reductionist views (and perhaps naturalistic views as well) is that it may pose particular problems for positivism. Specifically, if law is a normative phenomenon that gives rise to legal obligations, one might worry that it is not possible to reduce legal facts (i.e., facts about what our legal obligations are) to a set of purely non-normative facts, e.g., social ones. One might think that this would impermissibly transgress the familiar (though not uncontroversial) is-ought gap. (For a discussion of this sort of worry about positivism, see Shapiro 2011, 47–49.)

In response, one route that positivists who want to be reductionists could take is to maintain that legal facts really are descriptive in nature, not genuinely normative. In particular, such positivists might claim that facts about what legal obligations we have simply are descriptive facts about what the law holds that we ought to do—not normative facts about what we really ought to do (Shapiro 2011, 188; see also Hart 1994, 110).

2.1.3 The Prescriptive View

A different sort of approach to methodology in jurisprudence takes it that the proper aim of a legal theory is to specify a substantive conception of law that it would be especially desirable for people to adopt. Moreover, even if the conception of law that this inquiry ends up supporting departs radically from our pre-theoretical understanding of law, then the resulting theory would recommend abandoning that prior understanding of law. Accordingly, if jurisprudence is chiefly a prescriptive endeavor, then theories of law might end up being radically revisionist in nature (though, of course, not necessarily).

As explained in the next sub-section, Dworkin’s methodological view incorporates some prescriptive elements. But one prominent advocate of an exclusively prescriptive project is Neil MacCormick (MacCormick 1985; see also Campbell 1996; Murphy 2001; Postema 1989; Schauer 1996; Waldron 2001). MacCormick argues that there are compelling normative arguments in favor of adopting a positivist conception of law. In particular, he suggests that values like autonomy and freedom of conscience demand that the law not regulate with a heavy hand “the sphere of aspirational values, of duties of self-respect and of duties of love,” a sphere that concerns “questing for the good beyond duty, or for the right lines of development of a self, or for the proper regard to bestow upon one’s family, friends or neighbors” (MacCormick 1985, 35–36). Values like autonomy and freedom of conscience, McCormack thinks, support the claim that at least within this sphere of conduct, it is desirable to keep the question of what the law requires entirely separate from the question of what morality requires. (However, MacCormick also allows that the law properly can regulate the sphere of “duties of justice,” as these duties are in some sense weightier (MacCormick 1985, 35).) Accordingly, at least in some spheres of conduct, the question of what the law is ought to be held distinct from the question of what morality requires. Thus, MacCormick seems to be offering a normative argument for a claim that has often been associated with positivism, namely a version of the Separation Thesis. (Though, as seen earlier, it is not clear that all positivists must be committed to a strong version of this thesis.)

While the question of what conception of law it is most desirable that people adopt is surely a significant one, it is important to note that the prescriptive view of methodology in jurisprudence is not genuinely in competition with either the conceptual analysis view or the reductionist approach. After all, it might turn out, for example, that positivism provides the best account of our concept of law, or perhaps is the best reductive account of the phenomenon of law itself, even though there are compelling normative arguments for changing the practice or adopting a new concept of it that, say, comports with natural law theory. Accordingly, accounts of the concept of law, or reductive theories of law, are not necessarily inconsistent with prescriptive accounts of what legal theory it would be most desirable from the moral point of view to adopt.

2.1.4 Constructive Interpretation of Legal Practice

A fourth methodological view, which deserves separate treatment both because of its influence and sophistication, is Dworkin’s (Dworkin 1986). This view takes it that (i) the target of a first-order theory of law is existing legal practice and (ii) these theories succeed to the extent that they offer a defensible constructive interpretation (in Dworkin’s sense) of that practice. According to the constructive interpretation view, the aim of a first-order theory of law is not to analyze any concept or to reduce legal facts to other more foundational facts. Rather, the aim of a legal theory is to reconstruct the behavior and self-understandings of participants in legal practice and, moreover, to do so in a way that casts this practice in its best moral light. As a result, a theory of law is more successful the better it both fits with the data about how legal practitioners understand the practice they are engaged in, while also normatively justifying that practice (Dworkin 1986; Perry 1995, 129–31; see also the entry on legal interpretivism).

One concern about the constructive interpretation view of methodology in jurisprudence is that it may not be in genuine competition with either the conceptual analysis or reductive views of methodology. After all, one sort of project is to explain what law actually is and how it operates (perhaps according to our concept of it). But it is a very different sort of project to explain how we should conceive of the law in order for legal practice to be normatively justified. It seems possible that our account of what law actually is tells us one thing (e.g., that certain features of it are essential and others not), while our account of what law should be like in order for the practice to be as justified as possible tells us to think of law in a rather different way (e.g., as having different essential features). Accordingly, some have argued that the constructive interpretation view engages with the other methodological views mentioned above only if it denies what they assert: viz., that legal theories attempt to provide an explanation (perhaps of some particular kind—e.g., reductive) of the actual nature of law (or perhaps our concept of it).

One way that adherents of the constructive interpretation view might deny what certain other methodological views assert is by denying that it is even possible to give a reductive explanation of law. (For discussion, see Marmor 2013, 218.) The thought would be to claim that law is a normative practice, and normative facts cannot be reduced to purely non-normative facts without losing something essential. In response, the reductionist might either deny that legal facts are genuinely normative (in which case the sought-after reduction would be unproblematic), or she might assert that any successful reduction will have to reduce legal facts to a set of facts that includes normative facts (in which case a version of natural law theory might appear attractive).

2.2 Is Legal Theory Inherently Evaluative?

A second widely-discussed question about jurisprudential methodology is whether first-order legal theories are inherently evaluative. The above views about the proper target of first-order theories of law have different implications about this second question. But before explaining that, we must first get the relevant question more clearly in view.

2.2.1 Preliminaries

To begin with, one might wonder where the interest in the question of whether legal theory is inherently evaluative comes from. Some of this interest likely traces to the skeptical worry that legal theories purporting to be purely descriptive in fact are pushing some hidden ideological or political agenda. (For more on this, see, e.g., John Gardner’s introduction to Dickson 2004.) A second source of the interest in this question may be the suspicion (or hope) that if legal theory proves to be inherently evaluative, that would be an independent reason to adopt some version of natural law theory. Whether this is so remains doubtful, however, since meta-questions about the methodology of legal theory prima facie seem to be independent of questions in first-order legal theory like what the determinants of the content of law are. What is more, legal scholars might be drawn to the present issue through consideration of Dworkin’s argument that there is a very tight connection between the evaluative nature of theorizing about the law and the evaluative nature of law itself, rendering the content of law inevitably dependent, at least in part, on moral-political considerations. Regardless of the motivations for engaging in the debate about whether legal theory is inherently evaluative, however, this debate has taken on independent significance and has been a fruitful source of insight in its own right.

To avoid confusion, the question we are concerned with here must be clarified in several ways. For there are a number of uncontroversial ways in which legal theory plausibly is or might be evaluative, and these do not go to the heart of the methodological debates in jurisprudence.

First, there are several trivial ways in which legal theory, like theories about any topic, plausibly cannot be entirely value-free. In particular, it seems that one cannot engage in the business of theorizing about law without evaluating the extent to which various theories are coherent, simple, clear, elegant, comprehensive, and so on (Dickson 2004, 32–33). Granted this means that legal theorists must engage in a form of evaluation. But there is nothing special about legal theory in this regard. After all, these meta-theoretical virtues are criteria for the success of theories about any subject matter.

A second seemingly uncontroversial way in which legal theory is evaluative is that one cannot begin to develop a theory of law without determining which of its central features are to be accounted for (Dickson 2001, 38–45). John Finnis, for example, argues that one cannot do first-order legal theory without taking a stand on what the important features of law are that adequate theories must explain (e.g., the law’s claim to authority). However, this seems to require evaluation (Finnis 1980, 9–15).

Nonetheless, it is not likely to be especially controversial that legal theory is evaluative in this way. To see why, distinguish between (a) thick evaluative claims, which predicate some kind of moral goodness, or perhaps all-things-considered value, of an item and (b) thin evaluative claims, which do not. (This distinction roughly tracks Julie Dickson’s distinction between directly evaluative propositions and indirectly evaluative propositions. See Dickson 2001, 51–55.) Thus, the simplest thick evaluative claims have the form: \(X\) is morally [all-things-considered] good [bad]. Such claims might also be comparative in nature, such that they have the form: \(X\) is morally [all-things-considered] better [worse] than \(Y\). By contrast, thin evaluative claims judge how well some item fares relative to a standard that is neither moral nor all-things-considered normative. Such claims do not entail any thick evaluative claims either. Examples of thin evaluative claims thus would include “\(X\) is important” and “\(X\) is interesting”. Accordingly, even if legal theorists must make thin evaluative claims in order to be able to begin the project of developing a first-order legal theory, this does not mean that they must make thick evaluative claims in order to do so. After all, one might construct a theory that captures a range of legal phenomena that are deemed central or important, while still remaining agnostic about whether these phenomena are themselves valuable.

A third way in which legal theory could in principle be evaluative, though uncontroversially so, is suggested by the prescriptive view discussed in section 2.1.3. If the job of a first-order theory of law is to identify the concept of law it would be most desirable for us to employ, then there is a sense in which the resulting theory of law would of course be evaluative. Nonetheless, as seen above, prescriptive theories aim to answer a different question from theories in the conceptual analysis, reductive or interpretive categories. Thus, what matters to the debate about whether legal theory is evaluative is not whether legal theory in principle could be evaluative, but whether it is inevitably or necessarily so.

Now we are in a position to fully appreciate the question of primary interest here. In particular, it is whether theories about the nature of existing legal practice (or perhaps our concept of it) necessarily involve or entail thick evaluative claims about the law. That is, does offering a first-order theory of law of either the conceptual analysis, reductive or constructive interpretation varieties require one to accept claims about how valuable the law, or some feature of it, is? This is the question to be discussed in the remainder of this entry.

2.2.2 Is Legal Theory Evaluative in the Relevant Sense?

Some answers to the question that was discussed in section 2.1 suggest that theories of law are inherently evaluative in the sense of committing advocates of these theories to thick evaluative claims about the law. As we will see, this is most plausibly the case on the constructive interpretation view of methodology. By contrast, other answers to the question discussed in section 2.1 do not obviously entail that first-order legal theories commit their proponents to thick evaluative claims. In particular, this is the case for the conceptual analysis and reductive views of jurisprudential methodology. At least on their face, both these views seem to allow that there can be purely descriptive accounts of law—i.e., accounts that capture the central features of law without being committed to any moral or all-things-considered evaluation of the law. After all, one might think that a particular account does a good job of capturing some widely shared concept of law, but this does not obviously commit one to saying that law, on this concept of it, is good. Likewise, one might endorse a reduction of legal facts to some more foundational set of facts (e.g., certain social facts) without this committing one to thinking that the law is valuable or morally justified.

As a result, at least on their face, both the conceptual analysis and reductive views seem to allow that there can be first-order theories of law that are purely descriptive. Some argument would be needed if one is to endorse the opposite conclusion. Accordingly, let us consider some prominent arguments for thinking that legal theory must be inherently evaluative in nature. (For an overview, see Marmor 2011, 122–35.)

The argument from legal functions

One central argument to the effect that legal theory must be evaluative in the relevant sense begins from the idea that understanding what the law is requires taking a view about what functions it serves (Finnis 1980, 12–17; Perry 1995, 114–20). Moreover, one might think that functions are evaluative in the sense that attributing a function to something is to endorse a standard by which that thing may be judged as successful or unsuccessful. In this way, one might think that legal theory, too, is inherently evaluative.

While this line of thinking plausibly shows that legal theory requires accepting some evaluative claims, it does not obviously show that legal theory necessarily involves thick evaluative claims (Dickson 2001, 114–125). Claims of the form “the function of \(X\) is \(F\)” are naturally classified together with “\(X\) is important” (or more precisely, “\(X\) is important for some purpose \(Y\)”) as thin evaluative claims. Accordingly, asserting that the function of law is \(F\) does not obviously entail any thick evaluative claims about law. After all, it is not obvious why attributing a function to something requires believing that performing that function is either all-things-considered or morally good. Thus, attributing a function to law need not entail any thick evaluative claims.

The argument from the internal point of view

A second natural argument in favor of seeing legal theory as inherently evaluative in the relevant sense relies on the idea that any adequate theory of law must take account of the internal point of view that legal practitioners tend to adopt towards the law. More specifically, taking the internal point of view towards the law is a matter of adopting some kind of attitude of endorsement towards it, seeing it as in some sense justified or as providing reasons for action (Shapiro 2011, 96–97; Perry 1995, 99–100; see also the entry on legal positivism). Moreover, it is common to think that a critical mass of the participants in legal practice must adopt the internal point of view towards the practice in order for the practice to genuinely count as law. This is a fact that any adequate theory of law must account for, one might think. Accordingly, since the internal point of view involves a positive evaluation of the law, and since any adequate legal theory must account for this point of view, one might infer that any adequate theory of law must itself be inherently evaluative. (One finds versions of such an argument, e.g., in Perry 1995, 121–25; Waldron 2001, 423–28.)

It is unclear whether this argument succeeds, however. After all, it seems in principle possible to explain what kinds of considerations legal practitioners endorse, and why, without oneself endorsing those considerations. Similarly, a first-order legal theory might be able to plausibly explain the truism that legal practitioners tend to take the internal point of view towards (i.e., endorse) the law in their respective jurisdictions without the theory thereby being committed to the claim that the law in any particular jurisdiction (or the law in general) is valuable or justified. Accordingly, it is not obvious why a theory of law cannot in principle capture the internal point of view taken by legal practitioners towards the law without itself being committed to any thick evaluative claims about the law.

The argument from interpretation

Probably the most influential argument for thinking that legal theory is inherently evaluative proceeds from the idea that legal theory is an interpretive endeavor in Dworkin’s sense (Dworkin 1986; for criticism, see Dickson 2001, 105; Marmor 2011, 126–30). To say that legal theory is an interpretive project is to claim that fully understanding what the law is requires construing it as the best instance it can be of the type of thing that it is. Moreover, one might think that in order to construe legal practice as the best instance of the kind of thing that it is requires making thick evaluative claims about the law. (See the entry on legal interpretivism.)

One might attempt to respond to this argument in two ways. A natural, though ultimately unsuccessful, reply is that construing something as the best instance of its kind that it can be does not require taking that kind to be good. Saying that Bernie Madoff was (for a time) the best fraudster in history does not entail that one approves of fraud. As a result, saying that the law must be thus-and-so in order to be a good instance of its kind does not commit one to any thick evaluative claims. Nonetheless, there is a deeper or more interesting sense in which Dworkin’s view renders legal theory inherently evaluative. For Dworkin, legal theory is an interpretive enterprise, and offering a constructive interpretation of legal practice requires construing it in its best moral light. Thus, offering an interpretation of legal practice would require taking a stand on which of the available ways of construing that practice is morally better than the others. Of course, this does not necessarily require asserting that the law, on any particular construal, is good—full stop. But it does seem to require at least saying that some construals of legal practice are morally better than other construals would be. This looks to be a thick evaluative claim, albeit a comparative one. Moreover, one cannot make such comparative judgments without having a view about what would make one construal of legal practice morally better than another. Thus, in at least this sense, taking legal theory to be an endeavor that is interpretive in Dworkin’s sense would make legal theory count as inherently evaluative in the sense we are concerned with here.

Accordingly, if one wants to maintain the possibility of purely descriptive first-order legal theories, a more promising strategy for responding to the argument from interpretation would be to question its key premise—viz., that legal theory necessarily is an interpretive endeavor in Dworkin’s sense. In order for a proponent of the argument from interpretation to assert this premise, some rationale would have to be given for it. That is, some argument would be needed to explain why we should think that understanding law requires giving a constructive interpretation of it. A critic of the argument from interpretation, then, might claim that the argument’s proponents have not carried their burden of providing a rationale for this premise, on which the argument crucially depends.

One possible rationale that might be offered here is that since social practices essentially involve communication, and understanding any form of communication necessarily involves interpreting speakers’ claims, understanding the social practice of law necessarily involves interpreting it. However, this rationale is too quick. Even if it is true that understanding any social practice requires interpretation of some kind or other, it does not follow that doing so requires a constructive interpretation in Dworkin’s sense—i.e., identifying a construal of the practice that casts it in its best moral light (Marmor 2011, 127–28). But the latter claim, of course, is what proponents of the argument from interpretation need to establish in order to reach their desired conclusion that legal theory is inherently evaluative.

Accordingly, we seem to be left in the following dialectical situation. Whether or not legal theory is inherently evaluative in the relevant sense depends on whether the argument from interpretation succeeds. Whether that argument succeeds, in turn, depends on its key premise, i.e., the claim that understanding the law necessarily requires giving a constructive interpretation of it. If a non-question begging argument can be given for this claim, then there would be reason to think that legal theory necessarily is evaluative in nature. By contrast, if no non-question begging argument can be given for thinking that understanding law requires a constructive interpretation, then one would be free to maintain that there can be purely descriptive first-order legal theories.

Of course, even if the argument from interpretation fails and purely descriptive legal theories remain possible, it could still be a worthwhile project to attempt to give a constructive interpretation of legal practice, and the output of this project would indeed be a partially evaluative theory. Nonetheless, these two types of theory would not genuinely be in conflict, as they would be addressed to answering different questions. In the end, therefore, “methodological pluralism” may be the most apt characterization of the state of play in jurisprudence.

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Alexander Sarch <sarcha@usc.edu>

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