Torture

First published Tue Feb 7, 2006; substantive revision Fri Apr 29, 2011

This entry is in four parts. The first part addresses the question what is torture?; the second part, what is wrong with torture?; the third part, is torture ever morally justifiable?; and the last part, should torture ever be legalised or otherwise institutionalised?[1]

In relation to the definition of torture, there are now a number of contemporary philosophical accounts on offer, notably those of Davis (2005) and Sussman (2005). Moreover, there are numerous detailed discussions of what is wrong with torture (Shue (1978); Miller (2005) and (2009); Waldron (2005); Luban (2005); Sussman (2005); Matthews (2008); Brecher (2008)). Useful collections of essays on this and related topics are Levinson (2004) and Rodin (2007). This contemporary debate concerning the justifiability of torture principally concerns the torture of terrorists and is dominated by two groups. There are those who argue in the affirmative and point to so-called ticking bomb scenarios to support their case. These theorists often adhere to some form of consequentialism, such as utilitarianism. They include Allhoff (2003), and Bagaric and Clarke (2007). Then there are those who argue in the negative and point to the inherent immorality of torture and also to the damage to liberal institutions consequent upon the legalisation and institutionalisation of torture (Luban (2005); Waldron (2005); Brecher (2008); Matthews (2008)). These theorists tend to eschew consequentialism in favour of a deontological or pluralist theoretical stance. A qualified version of the affirmative answer is offered by Alan Dershowitz who argues for torture warrants in extreme emergencies (2003: Chapter 4). A qualified version of the negative answer is offered by Michael Davis (2005) who argues that in practice, if not in abstract theory, there is no justification for torture.[2] A third perspective combines elements of both of these two groups, namely, that torture can in some extreme emergencies be morally justified, but that torture ought never to be legalised or otherwise institutionalised. This position has been argued for by Machan (1990) and more recently by Miller (2005) and McMahan (2008). Steinhoff (2006) occupies an intermediate position in that he appears to believe that torture could be legalised without being institutionalised.

Before proceeding to the question, or questions, of the moral justifiability of torture we need some understanding of what torture is. We also need some account of what is morally wrong with torture.

1. Definition of Torture

Torture includes such practices as searing with hot irons, burning at the stake, electric shock treatment to the genitals, cutting out parts of the body, e.g. tongue, entrails or genitals, severe beatings, suspending by the legs with arms tied behind back, applying thumbscrews, inserting a needle under the fingernails, drilling through an unanesthetized tooth, making a person crouch for hours in the ‘Z’ position, waterboarding (submersion in water or dousing to produce the sensation of drowning), and denying food, water or sleep for days or weeks on end.[3]

All of these practices presuppose that the torturer has control over the victim's body, e.g. the victim is strapped to a chair.

Most of these practices, but not all of them, involve the infliction of extreme physical pain. For example, sleep deprivation does not necessarily involve the infliction of extreme physical pain. However, all of these practices involve the infliction of extreme physical suffering, e.g. exhaustion in the case of sleep deprivation. Indeed, all of them involve the intentional infliction of extreme physical suffering on some non-consenting and defenceless person. If A accidentally sears B with hot irons A has not tortured B; intention is a necessary condition for torture. Further, if A intentionally sears B with hot irons and B consented to this action, then B has not been tortured. Indeed, even if B did not consent, but B could have physically prevented A from searing him then B has not been tortured. That is, in order for it to be an instance of torture, B has to be defenceless.[4]

Is the intentional infliction of extreme mental suffering on a non-consenting, defenceless person necessarily torture? Michael Davis thinks not (2005: 163). Assume that B's friend, A, is being tortured, e.g. A is undergoing electric shock treatment, but that B himself is untouched—albeit B is imprisoned in the room adjoining the torture chamber. (Alternatively, assume that B is in a hotel room in another country and live sounds and images of the torture are intentionally transmitted to him in his room by the torturer in such a way that he cannot avoid seeing and hearing them other than by leaving the room after having already seen and heard them.) However, A is being tortured for the purpose of causing B to disclose certain information to the torturer. B is certainly undergoing extreme mental suffering. Nevertheless, B is surely not himself being tortured. To see this, reflect on the following revised version of the scenario. Assume that A is not in fact being tortured; rather the ‘torturer’ is only pretending to torture A. However, B believes that A is being tortured; so B's mental suffering is as in the original scenario. In this revised version of the scenario the ‘torturer’ is not torturing A. In that case surely he is not torturing B either.[5]

On the other hand, it might be argued that some instances of the intentional infliction of extreme mental suffering on non-consenting, defenceless persons are cases of torture, albeit some instances (such as the above one) are not. Consider, for example, a mock execution or a situation in which a victim with an extreme rat phobia lies naked on the ground with his arms and legs tied to stakes while dozens of rats are placed all over his body and face. The difference between the mock execution and the phobia scenario on the one hand, and the above case of the person being made to believe that his friend is being tortured on the other hand, is that in the latter case the mental suffering is at one remove; it is suffering caused by someone else's (believed) suffering. However, such suffering at one remove is in general less palpable, and more able to be resisted and subjected to rational control; after all, it is not my body that is being electrocuted, my life that is being threatened, or my uncontrollable extreme fear of rats that is being experienced. An exception to this general rule might be cases involving the torture of persons with whom the sufferer at one remove has an extremely close relationship and a very strong felt duty of care, e.g. a child and its parent. At any rate, if as appears to be the case, there are some cases of mental torture then the above definition will need to be extended, albeit in a manner that does not admit all cases of the infliction of extreme mental suffering as being instances of torture.

In various national and international laws, e.g. Convention against Torture and Other Cruel, Inhuman and Degrading Treatment or Punishment (United Nations 1984—see Other Internet Resources), a distinction is made between torture and inhumane treatment, albeit torture is a species of inhumane treatment. Such a distinction needs to be made. For one thing, some treatment, e.g. flogging, might be inhumane without being sufficiently extreme to count as torture. For another thing, some inhumane treatment does not involve physical suffering to any great extent, and is therefore not torture, properly speaking (albeit, the treatment in question may be as morally bad as, or even morally worse than, torture). Some forms of the infliction of mental suffering are a case in point, as are some forms of morally degrading treatment, e.g. causing a prisoner to pretend to have sex with an animal.

So torture is the intentional infliction of extreme physical suffering on some non-consenting, defenceless person. Is this an adequate definition of torture? Perhaps not.

It is logically possible that torture could be undertaken simply because the torturer enjoys making other sentient beings endure extreme physical suffering, i.e., quite independently of whether or not the victim suffers a loss of autonomy. Consider children who enjoy tearing the wings off flies. Nevertheless, in the case of the torture of human beings it is in practice impossible to inflict extreme physical suffering of the kind endured by the victims of torture without at the same time intentionally curtailing the victim's exercise of his autonomy during the torturing process. At the very least the torturer is intentionally exercising control over the victim's body and his attendant physical sensations, e.g. extreme pain. Indeed, in an important sense the victim's body and attendant physical sensations cease to be his own instrument, but rather have become the instrument of the torturer. Moreover, by virtue of his control over the victim's body and physical sensations, the torturer is able to heavily influence other aspects of the victim's mental life, including his stream of consciousness; after all, the victim can now think of little else but his extreme suffering and the torturer. In short, torturers who torture human beings do so with the (realised) intention of substantially curtailing the autonomy of their victims.

So torture is: (a) the intentional infliction of extreme physical suffering on some non-consenting, defenceless person, and; (b) the intentional, substantial curtailment of the exercise of the person's autonomy (achieved by means of (a)). Is this now an adequate definition of torture? Perhaps not.

Here we need to consider the purpose or point of torture.

The above-mentioned U.N. Convention identifies four reasons for torture, namely: (1) to obtain a confession; (2) to obtain information; (3) to punish; (4) to coerce the sufferer or others to act in certain ways. Certainly, these are all possible purposes of torture.[6]

It seems that in general torture is undertaken for the purpose of breaking the victim's will.[7] If true, this distinguishes torture for the sake of breaking the victim's will from the other four purposes mentioned above. For with respect to each one of these four purposes, it is not the case that in general torture is undertaken for that purpose, e.g. in most contemporary societies torture is not generally undertaken for the purpose of punishing the victim.

One consideration in favour of the proposition that breaking the victim's will is a purpose central to the practice of torture is that achieving the purpose of breaking the victim's will is very often a necessary condition for the achievement of the other four identified purposes. In the case of interrogatory torture of an enemy spy, for example, in order to obtain the desired information the torturer must first break the will of the victim. And when torture—as opposed to, for example, flogging as a form of corporal punishment—is used as a form of punishment it typically has as a proximate, and in part constitutive, purpose to break the victim's will. Hence torture as punishment does not consist—as do other forms of punishment—of a determinate set of specific, pre-determined and publicly known acts administered over a definite and limited time period.

A second consideration is as follows. We have seen that torture involves substantially curtailing the victim's autonomy. However, to substantially curtail someone's autonomy is not necessarily to break their will. Consider the torture victim who holds out and refuses to confess or provide the information sought by the torturer. Nevertheless, a proximate logical endpoint of the process of curtailing the exercise of a person's autonomy is the breaking of their will, at least for a time and in relation to certain matters.

These two considerations taken together render it plausible that in general torture has as a purpose to break the victim's will.

So perhaps the following definition is adequate. Torture is: (a) the intentional infliction of extreme physical suffering on some non-consenting, defenceless person; (b) the intentional, substantial curtailment of the exercise of the person's autonomy (achieved by means of (a)); (c) in general, undertaken for the purpose of breaking the victim's will.

Note that breaking a person's will is short of entirely destroying or subsuming their autonomy. Sussman implausibly holds the latter to be definitive of torture: “The victim of torture finds within herself a surrogate of the torturer, a surrogate who does not merely advance a particular demand for information, denunciation or confession. Rather, the victim's whole perspective is given over to that surrogate, to the extent that the only thing that matters to her is pleasing this other person who appears infinitely distant, important, inscrutable, powerful and free. The will of the torturer is thus cast as something like the source of all value in his victim's world” (Sussman 2005: 26). Such self-abnegation might be the purpose of some forms of torture, as indeed it is of some forms of slavery and brainwashing, but it is certainly not definitive of torture.

Consider victims of torture who are able to resist so that their wills are not broken. An example from the history of Australian policing is that of the notorious criminal and hard-man, James Finch: “He [Finch] was handcuffed to a chair and we knocked the shit out of him. Siddy Atkinson was pretty fit then and gave him a terrible hiding….no matter what we did to Finch, the bastard wouldn't talk” (Stannard 1988: 40). Again, consider the famous case of Steve Biko who it seems was prepared to die rather than allow his torturers to break his will (Arnold 1984: 281–2).[8]

Here breaking a person's will can be understood in a minimalist or a maximalist sense. This is not to say that the boundaries between these two senses can be sharply drawn.

Understood in its minimal sense, breaking a person's will is causing that person to abandon autonomous decision-making in relation to some narrowly circumscribed area of life and for a limited period.[9] Consider, for example, a thief deciding to disclose or not disclose to the police torturing him where he has hidden the goods he has stolen (a torturing practice frequently used by police in India).[10] Suppose further that he knows that he can only be legally held in custody for a twenty-four hour period, and that the police are not able to infringe this particular law. By torturing the thief the police might break his will and, against his will, cause him to disclose the whereabouts of the stolen goods.

Understood in its maximal sense, breaking a person's will involves reaching the endpoint of the kind of process Sussman describes above, i.e., the point at which the victim's will is subsumed by the will of the torturer. Winston Smith in George Orwell's 1984 is, as Sussman notes, an instance of the latter extreme endpoint of some processes of torture. Smith ends up willingly betraying what is dearest and most important to him, i.e., his loved one Julia.

Moreover, there are numerous examples of long term damage to individual autonomy and identity caused by torture, to some extent irrespective of whether the victim's will was broken. For example, some victims of prolonged torture in prisons in authoritarian states are so psychologically damaged that even when released they are unable to function as normal adult persons, i.e. as rational choosers pursuing their projects in a variety of standard interpersonal contexts such as work and family.

Given the above definition of torture, we can distinguish torture from the following practices.

Firstly, we need to distinguish torture from coercion. In the case of coercion, people are coerced into doing what they don't want to do. This is consistent with their retaining control over their actions and making a rational decision to, say, hand over their wallet when told to do so by a robber who threatens to shoot them dead (albeit painlessly) if they don't do so. As this example shows, coercion does not necessarily involve the infliction of physical suffering (or threat thereof). So coercion does not necessarily involve torture. Nor does coercion, which does involve the infliction of physical suffering as a means, necessarily constitute torture. Consider, for example, a South African police officer in the days of apartheid who used a cattle prodder which delivers an electric shock on contact as a means of controlling an unruly crowd of South African blacks. Presumably, this is not torture because the members of the crowd are not under the police officer's control; specifically, they are not defenceless in the face of the cattle prodder. On the other hand, if—as also evidently took place in apartheid South Africa—a person was tied to a chair and thereby rendered defenceless, and then subjected to repeated electric shocks from a cattle prodder this would constitute torture.

Does torture necessarily involve coercion? No doubt the threat of torture, and torture in its preliminary stages, simply functions as a form of coercion in this sense. However, torture proper has as its starting point the failure of coercion, or that coercion is not even going to be attempted. As we have seen, torture proper targets autonomy itself, and seeks to overwhelm the capacity of the victims to exercise rational control over their decisions—at least in relation to certain matters for a limited period of time—by literally terrorising them into submission. Hence there is a close affinity between terrorism and torture. Indeed, arguably torture is a terrorist tactic. However, it is one that can be used by groups other than terrorists, e.g. it can be used against enemy combatants by armies fighting conventional wars and deploying conventional military strategies. In relation to the claim that torture is not coercion, it might be responded that at least some forms or instances of torture involve coercion, namely those in which the torturer is seeking something from the victim, e.g. information, and in which some degree of rational control to comply or not with the torturer's wishes is retained by the victim. This response is plausible. However, even if the response is accepted, there will remain instances of torture in which these above-mentioned conditions do not obtain; presumably, these will not be instances of coercion.

Secondly, torture needs to be distinguished from excruciatingly painful medical procedures. Consider the case of a rock-climber who amputates a fellow climber's arm, which got caught in a crevice in an isolated and inhospitable mountain area. These kinds of case differ from torture in a number of respects. For example, such medical procedures are consensual and not undertaken to break some persons' will, but rather to promote their physical wellbeing or even to save their life.

Thirdly, there is corporal punishment. Corporal punishment is, or ought to be, administered only to persons who have committed some legal and/or moral offence for the purpose of punishing them. By contrast, torture is not—as is corporal punishment—limited by normative definition to the guilty; and in general torture, but not corporal punishment, has as its purpose the breaking of a person's will. Moreover, unlike torture, corporal punishment will normally consist of a determinate set of specific, pre-determined and publicly known acts administered during a definite and limited time period, e.g. ten lashes of the cat-o-nine-tails for theft.

Fourthly, there are ordeals involving the infliction of severe pain. Consider Gordon Liddy who reportedly held his hand over a burning candle till his flesh burnt in order to test his will. Ordeals have as their primary purpose to test a person's will, but are not undertaken to break a person's will. Moreover, ordeals—as the Liddy example illustrates—can be voluntary, unlike torture.

Having provided ourselves with an analytic account of torture and distinguished torture from some closely related practices, we need to turn now to the question, What is Wrong with Torture?

2. What is Wrong with Torture?

In terms of the above definition of torture there are at least two things that are manifestly morally wrong with torture. Firstly, torture consists in part in the intentional infliction of severe physical suffering—typically, severe pain; that is, torture hurts very badly. For this reason alone, torture is an evil thing.

Secondly, torture of human beings consists in part in the intentional, substantial curtailment of individual autonomy. Given the moral importance of autonomy, torture is an evil thing—even considered independently of the physical suffering it involves. (And if torture involves the breaking of someone's will, especially in the maximalist sense, then it is an even greater evil than otherwise would be the case.)

Given that torture involves both the infliction of extreme physical suffering and the substantial curtailment of the victim's autonomy, torture is a very great evil indeed. Nevertheless, there is some dispute about how great an evil torture is relative to other great evils, specifically killing and murder.

Many have suggested that torture is a greater evil than killing or even murder. For example, Michael Davis claims, “Both torture and (premature) death are very great evils but, if one is a greater evil than the other, it is certainly torture” (2005: 165), and David Sussman says, “Yet while there is a very strong moral presumption against both killing and torturing a human being, it seems that we take the presumption against torture to be even greater than that against homicide” (2005: 15).

Certainly, torturing an innocent person to death is worse than murder, for it involves torture in addition to murder. On the other hand, torture does not necessarily involve killing, let alone murder, and indeed torturers do not necessarily have the power of life and death over their victims. Consider police officers whose superiors turn a blind eye to their illegal use of torture, but who do not, and could not, cover-up the murder of those tortured; the infliction of pain in police cells can be kept secret, but not the existence of dead bodies.

On the moral wrongness of torture as compared to killing, the following points can be made.

First, torture is similar to killing in that both interrupt and render impossible the normal conduct of human life, albeit the latter—but not the former—necessarily forever. But equally during the period a person is being tortured (and in some cases thereafter) the person's world is almost entirely taken up by extreme pain and their asymmetrical power relationship to the torturer, i.e. the torture victim's powerlessness. Indeed, given the extreme suffering being experienced and the consequent loss of autonomy, the victim would presumably rather be dead than alive during that period. So, as already noted, torture is a very great evil. However, it does not follow from this that being killed is preferable to being tortured. Nor does it follow that torturing someone is morally worse than killing him.

It does not follow that being killed is preferable to being tortured because the duration of the torture might be brief, one's will might not ultimately be broken, and one might go on to live a long and happy life; by contrast, being killed—theological considerations aside—is always ‘followed by’ no life whatsoever. For the same reason it does not follow that torturing a person is morally worse than killing that person. If the harm brought about by an act of torture is a lesser evil than the harm done by an act of killing then, other things being equal, the latter is morally worse than the former.

A second point pertains to the powerlessness of the victims of torture. Dead people necessarily have no autonomy or power; so killing people is an infringement of their right to autonomy as well as their right to life.[11] What of the victims of torture?

The person being tortured is for the duration of the torturing process physically powerless in relation to the torturer. By “physically powerless” two things are meant: the victim is defenceless, i.e., the victim cannot prevent the torturer from torturing the victim, and the victim is unable to attack, and therefore physically harm, the torturer. Nevertheless, it does not follow from this that the victim is entirely powerless vis-à-vis the torturer. For the victim might be able to strongly influence the torturer's actions, either by virtue of having at this time the power to harm people other than the torturer, or by virtue of having at some future time the power to defend him/herself against the torturer, and/or attack the torturer. Consider the clichéd example of the terrorist who is refusing to disclose to the torturer the whereabouts of a bomb with a timing device which is about to explode in a crowded market-place. Perhaps the terrorist could negotiate the cessation of torture and immunity for himself, if he talks. Consider also a situation in which both a hostage and his torturer know that it is only a matter of an hour before the police arrive, free the hostage and arrest the torturer; perhaps the hostage is a defence official who is refusing to disclose the whereabouts of important military documents and who is strengthened in his resolve by this knowledge of the limited duration of the pain being inflicted upon him.

The conclusion to be drawn from these considerations is that torture is not necessarily morally worse than killing (or more undesirable than death), though in many instances it may well be. Killing is an infringement of the right to life and the right to autonomy. Torture is an infringement of the right to autonomy, but not necessarily of the right to life. Moreover, torture is consistent with the retrieval of the victim's autonomy, whereas killing is not. On the other hand, the period during which the victim is being tortured is surely worse than not being alive during that time, and torture can in principle extend for the duration of the remainder of a person's life. Further, according to our adopted definition, torture is an intentional or purposive attack on a person's autonomy; this is not necessarily the case with killing.[12] Finally, torture can in principle involve the effective destruction of a person's autonomy.

Let us now turn directly to the question of the moral justification for torture. Here we must distinguish between one-off cases of torture, on the one hand, and legalised or institutionalised torture, on the other.

3. The Moral Justification for One-off Acts of Torture in Emergencies

In this section one-off, non-institutionalised acts of torture performed by state actors in emergency situations are considered. The argument is that there are, or could well be, one-off acts of torture in extreme emergencies that are, all things considered, morally justifiable. Accordingly, the assumption is that the routine use of torture is not morally justified; so if it turned out that the routine use of torture was necessary to, say, win the war on terrorism, then some of what is said here would not be to the point. However, liberal democratic governments and security agencies have not even begun to exhaust the political strategies, and the military/police tactics short of the routine use of torture, available to them to combat terrorism.

The most obvious version of the argument in favour of one-off acts of torture in extreme emergencies is consequentialist in form. For example, Bagaric and Clarke (2007: 29) offer a version of the ticking bomb scenario in the context of their hedonistic act utilitarian theoretical perspective. A standard objection to this kind of appeal to consequentialism is that it licenses far too much: torture of a few innocent victims may well be justified, on this account, if it provides intense pleasure for a much larger number of sadists. As it happens, Bagaric and Clarke insist that they want to restrict the practice of torture; only the guilty are to be subjected to torture and only for the purpose of extracting information. However it is far from clear how this desired restriction can be reconciled with consequentialism in any of its various permutations, let alone the relatively permissive version favoured by Bagaric and Clarke. Why, for example, should torture be restricted to the guilty, if torturing a small number of innocent persons would enable the lives of many other innocents to be saved (as presumably it might). Again, why should under-resourced Indian police not torture—as they often do in reality—a repeat offender responsible for a very large number of property crimes, if this proves to be the only available efficient and effective form of retrieving the stolen property in question and, thereby, securing the conviction of this offender, reducing property crime and making a large number of property owners happy? The essential problem confronted by consequentialists participating in the torture debate is that their theoretically admissible moral barriers to torture are relatively flimsy; too flimsy, it seems, to accommodate the strong moral intuitions in play.

Faced with the slippery slope, as they see it, of one-off acts of torture in extreme emergencies transmogrifying into institutionalised torture, and/or simply appalled by the inherent evil of the practice of torture, many theorists (Davis (2005); Luban (2005); Brecher (2008); Matthews (2008)) have opted for the opposite extreme and argued that torture can never be morally justified. Obviously these theorists avoid the problems besetting consequentialists such as Bagaric and Clarke, and they are on strong ground when providing counter-arguments to consequentialist perspectives and/or views that seek to justify torturing the innocent. However, their moral absolutism is not without its own problems: specifically, in relation to torturing the guilty few for the purpose of saving the innocent many.

Before turning in detail to the arguments on this issue, let us consider some putative examples of the justified use of torture. The first is a policing example, the second a terrorist example. Arguably, both examples are realistic, albeit the terrorist ticking bomb scenario is often claimed by moral absolutists to be utterly fanciful. Certainly, the policing example is realistic; indeed, it was provided by a former police officer from his own experience. Moreover, it is widely reported in the media that Al Qaeda, for example, has in the past sought to acquire a nuclear device to detonate in a western city and the 9/11 attacks and bombings in Bali, London, Madrid and Mumbai should leave no doubt whatsoever that Al Qaeda would use such a device if they could get their hands on one. So is it entirely fanciful that there could be such an attack and that an Al Qaeda operative known (on the basis of intercepted communications) to be a member of the cell involved in the planned attack might not be arrested, interrogated and tortured(?) prior to the detonation? At any rate, these are the two most popular kinds of example discussed in the literature. These cases include the real-life Daschner case involving the threat to torture a kidnapper by German police in 2002 which resulted in the kidnapper disclosing the location of a kidnapped child.

3.1 Case Study—The Beating

Height of the antipodean summer, Mercury at the century-mark; the noonday sun softened the bitumen beneath the tyres of her little Hyundai sedan to the consistency of putty. Her three year old son, quiet at last, snuffled in his sleep on the back seat. He had a summer cold and wailed like a banshee in the supermarket, forcing her to cut short her shopping. Her car needed petrol. Her tot was asleep on the back seat. She poured twenty litres into the tank; thumbing notes from her purse, harried and distracted, her keys dangled from the ignition.

Whilst she was in the service station a man drove off in her car. Police wound back the service station's closed-circuit TV camera, saw what appeared to be a heavy set Pacific Islander with a blonde-streaked Afro entering her car. “Don't panic”, a police constable advised the mother, “as soon as he sees your little boy in the back he will abandon the car.” He did; police arrived at the railway station before the car thief did and arrested him after a struggle when he vaulted over the station barrier.

In the police truck on the way to the police station: “Where did you leave the Hyundai?” Denial instead of dissimulation: “It wasn't me.” It was—property stolen from the car was found in his pockets. In the detectives' office: “It's been twenty minutes since you took the car—little tin box like that car—It will heat up like an oven under this sun. Another twenty minutes and the child's dead or brain damaged. Where did you dump the car?” Again: “It wasn't me.”

Appeals to decency, to reason, to self-interest: “It's not too late; tell us where you left the car and you will only be charged with Take-and-Use. That's just a six month extension of your recognizance.” Threats: “If the child dies I will charge you with Manslaughter!” Sneering, defiant and belligerent; he made no secret of his contempt for the police. Part-way through his umpteenth, “It wasn't me”, a questioner clipped him across the ear as if he were a child, an insult calculated to bring the Islander to his feet to fight, there a body-punch elicited a roar of pain, but he fought back until he lapsed into semi-consciousness under a rain of blows. He quite enjoyed handing out a bit of biffo, but now, kneeling on hands and knees in his own urine, in pain he had never known, he finally realised the beating would go on until he told the police where he had abandoned the child and the car.

The police officers' statements in the prosecution brief made no mention of the beating; the location of the stolen vehicle and the infant inside it was portrayed as having been volunteered by the defendant. The defendant's counsel availed himself of this falsehood in his plea in mitigation. When found, the stolen child was dehydrated, too weak to cry; there were ice packs and dehydration in the casualty ward but no long-time prognosis on brain damage.

(Case Study provided by John Blackler, a former New South Wales police officer.)

In this case study torture of the car thief can be provided with a substantial moral justification, even if it does not convince everyone. Consider the following points: (1) The police reasonably believe that torturing the car thief will probably save an innocent life; (2) the police know that there is no other way to save the life; (3) the threat to life is more or less imminent; (4) the baby is innocent; (5) the car thief is known not to be an innocent—his action is known to have caused the threat to the baby, and he is refusing to allow the baby's life to be saved.

The classic, indeed cliché, example used to justify torture is that of the so-called ‘ticking bomb’.[13] Consider the following case.

3.2 Case Study—The Terrorist and the Ticking Bomb

A terrorist group has planted a small nuclear device with a timing mechanism in London and it is about to go off. If it does it will kill thousands and make a large part of the city uninhabitable for decades. One of the terrorists has been captured by the police, and if he can be made to disclose the location of the device then the police can probably disarm it and thereby save the lives of thousands. The police know the terrorist in question. They know he has orchestrated terrorist attacks, albeit non-nuclear ones, in the past. Moreover, on the basis of intercepted mobile phone calls and e-mails the police know that this attack is under way in some location in London and that he is the leader of the group. Unfortunately, the terrorist is refusing to talk and time is slipping away. However, the police know that there is a reasonable chance that he will talk, if tortured. Moreover, all their other sources of information have dried up. Furthermore, there is no other way to avoid catastrophe; evacuation of the city, for example, cannot be undertaken in the limited time available. Torture is not normally used by the police, and indeed it is unlawful to use it.

In this case study there is also a substantial moral justification for torture, albeit one that many moral absolutists do not find compelling. Consider the following points: (1) The police reasonably believe that torturing the terrorist will probably save thousands of innocent lives; (2) the police know that there is no other way to save those lives; (3) the threat to life is more or less imminent; (4) the thousands about to be murdered are innocent—the terrorist has no good, let alone decisive, justificatory moral reason for murdering them; (5) the terrorist is known to be (jointly with the other terrorists) morally responsible for planning, transporting, and arming the nuclear device and, if it explodes, he will be (jointly with the other terrorists) morally responsible for the murder of thousands.

In addition to the above set of moral considerations, consider the following points. The terrorist is culpable on two counts. Firstly, the terrorist is forcing the police to choose between two evils, namely, torturing the terrorist or allowing thousands of lives to be lost. Were the terrorist to do what he ought to do, namely, disclose the location of the ticking bomb, the police could refrain from torturing him. This would be true of the terrorist, even if he were not actively participating in the bombing project. Secondly, the terrorist is in the process of completing his (jointly undertaken) action of murdering thousands of innocent people. He has already undertaken his individual actions of, say, transporting and arming the nuclear device; he has performed these individual actions (in the context of other individual actions performed by the other members of the terrorist cell) in order to realise the end (shared by the other members of the cell) of murdering thousands of Londoners. In refusing to disclose the location of the device the terrorist is preventing the police from preventing him from completing his (joint) action of murdering thousands of innocent people.[14] To this extent the terrorist is in a different situation from a bystander who happens to know where the bomb is planted but will not reveal its whereabouts, and in a different situation from someone who might have inadvertently put life at risk (Miller (2005); Hill (2007)).

In the institutional environment described, torture is both unlawful and highly unusual. Accordingly the police, if it is discovered that they have tortured the terrorist, would be tried for a serious crime and, if found guilty, sentenced. We will return to this issue in the following section. Here simply note that the bare illegality of their act of torture does not render it morally impermissible, given it was otherwise morally permissible. Here it is the bare fact that it is illegal that is in question. So the relevant moral considerations comprise whatever moral weight attaches to compliance with the law just for the sake of compliance with the law, as distinct from compliance for the sake of the public benefits the law brings or compliance because of the moral weight that attaches to the moral principle that a particular law might embody. But even if it is held that compliance with the law for its own sake has some moral weight—and arguably it has none—it does not have sufficient moral weight to make a decisive difference in this kind of scenario. In short, if torturing the terrorist is morally permissible absent questions of legality, the bare fact of torture being illegal does not render it morally impermissible.

Note also that since the terrorist is, when being tortured, still in the process of attempting to complete his (joint) action of murdering thousands of Londoners, and murdering also the police about to torture him, the post factum legal defence of necessity may well be available to the police should they subsequently be tried for torture.[15]

Some commentators on scenarios of this kind are reluctant to concede that the police are morally entitled—let alone morally obliged—to torture the offender. How do these commentators justify their position?

Someone might claim that torture is an absolute moral wrong (Matthews (2008); Brecher (2008)). On this view there simply are no real or imaginable circumstances in which torture could be morally justified.

This is a hard view to sustain, not least because we have already seen that being tortured is not necessarily worse than being killed, and torturing someone not necessarily morally worse than killing him. Naturally, someone might hold that killing is an absolute moral wrong, i.e., killing anyone—no matter how guilty—is never morally justified. This view is consistent with holding that torture is an absolute moral wrong, i.e. torturing anyone—no matter how guilty—is never morally justified. However, the price of consistency is very high. The view that killing is an absolute moral wrong is a very implausible one. It would rule out, for example, killing in self-defence. Let us, therefore, set it aside and continue with the view that torture, but not killing, is an absolute moral wrong.

For those who hold that killing is not an absolute moral wrong, it is very difficult to see how torture could be an absolute moral wrong, given that killing is sometimes morally worse than torture. In particular, it is difficult to see how torturing (but not killing) the guilty terrorist and saving the lives of thousands could be morally worse than refraining from torturing him and allowing him to murder thousands—torturing the terrorist is a temporary infringement of his autonomy, whereas his detonating of the nuclear device is a permanent violation of the autonomy of thousands.

In conclusion, the view that it is, all things considered, morally wrong to torture the terrorist in the scenario outlined faces very serious objections; and it is difficult to see how these objections can be met. It is plausible, therefore, that there are some imaginable circumstances in which it is morally permissible to torture someone.

Let us now turn to the other argument of those opposing the moral permissibility of torture mentioned above. This is not the argument that torture is an absolute moral wrong but rather that, as Michael Davis puts it, “For all practical purposes—and so, for moral agents like us—torture is absolutely morally wrong” (2005: 170). The basic idea is that while torture is not an absolute moral wrong in the sense that the evil involved in performing any act of torture is so great as to override any other conceivable set of moral considerations, nevertheless, there are no moral considerations that in the real world have overridden, or ever will override, the moral injunction against torture; the principle of refraining from torture has always trumped, and will always trump, other moral imperatives. Proponents of this view can happily accept that the offenders in putative examples should be tortured, while simultaneously claiming that the scenarios in these examples are entirely fanciful ones that have never been, and will never be, realised in the real world.

It is important to stress here that the kind of scenario under discussion remains that of the one-off case of torture in an emergency situation; what is not under consideration in this section is legalised, or otherwise institutionalised, torture.

The central claim of the proponents of “practical moral absolutes” seems to be an empirical one; ticking bomb scenarios, such as our above-described terrorist case—and other relevant one-off emergencies such as our above-described police beating case in which torture seems to be justified—have not, and will not, happen.

The first point to be made is simply to reiterate that some of these scenarios—such as police officers beating up kidnappers and other offenders to rescue children—are not only realistic, they are real; they have actually happened. What of the ticking bomb scenario in particular? As stated above, it is by no means self-evident that this kind of scenario is entirely fanciful. Here it can be conceded that there is no guarantee that torture would succeed in saving the lives of (to revert to our specific ticking bomb scenario) thousands of Londoners. This is because the person tortured might not talk or he might talk too late or he might provide false or misleading information. However, it should be noted that the police know that the offender has committed the offence and is in a position to provide the needed information, i.e. the police know that the offender is guilty. Moreover, the information being sought is checkable; if the terrorist gives the correct location of the bomb then the police will find it—if he does not, then they will not find it. Further, the police have no alternative methods by which to avoid the death of the innocent. Given what is at stake and given the fact that the police know the offenders are guilty, the police are, it seems, justified in the use of torture, notwithstanding a degree of uncertainty in relation to the likelihood of success.

The second point is that, practicalities notwithstanding, the proponents of “practical moral absolutes” still need to offer a principled account of the moral limits to torture—an account of torture, so to speak, in the abstract. And these accounts could differ from one advocate of practical moral absolutes to another. For example, one advocate might accept that it would be morally permissible to torture the terrorist to save the lives of ten innocent people threatened by a non-nuclear explosive device, whereas another advocate might reject this on the grounds that ten lives are too few. What the two advocates would have in common is the belief that even the revised ticking-bomb scenario involving only the death of ten innocent people is, nevertheless, a fanciful scenario that has not occurred, and will not ever occur. In short, different advocates of practical absolutism can ascribe different moral weight to different moral considerations, and we need to know what these weightings are for any given advocate. For otherwise it is extremely difficult to assess the validity or plausibility of the associated general empirical claim that in practice no act of torture has ever been, nor ever will be, morally justified. Roughly speaking, the greater the moral weight that is given by the practical moral absolutist to refraining from torture—this moral weight considered both in itself and relative to other moral considerations—the more plausible the associated general empirical claim becomes. On the other hand, the greater the moral weight that is given to the principle of refraining from torture, the less plausible the narrowly moral claims of the practical absolutist become—indeed, at the limit the practical absolutist becomes a moral absolutist tout court.

At any rate, the general point to be made here is that the practical moral absolutist owes us a principled account of the moral weight to be attached to refraining from torture relative to other moral considerations. For without it we are unable to adequately assess whether or not putative counter-examples to this position are really counter-examples or not. It is not good enough for the practical moral absolutist just to give the thumbs down to any putative counter-example that is offered.

The third general point against the practical moral absolutist is to reiterate that it has already been argued that torture is not the morally worst act that anyone could, or indeed has or will, perform. If this is correct, then it is plausible that there will be at least some scenarios in which one will be forced to choose between two evils, the lesser one of which is torture. Indeed, the above-described police beating scenario (certainly) and the ticking bomb scenario (possibly) are cases in point.

4. The Moral Justification for Legalised and Institutionalised Torture

We have seen that there are likely to exist, in the real world, one-off emergency situations in which arguably torture is, all things considered, the morally best action to perform. It may seem to follow that institutional arrangements should be in place to facilitate torture in such situations. However, it is perfectly consistent to concede that torture might be morally justifiable in certain one-off emergency situations and yet oppose any legalization or institutionalization of torture.

Luban (2005) and Waldron (2005), in particular, have drawn attention to the moral inconsistency and inherent danger in liberal democratic states legalising and institutionalising torture, a practice that strikes at the very heart of the fundamental liberal value of individual autonomy. They have also detailed the tendency for a torture culture to develop in organisations in which torture is legalised or tolerated, a culture in which the excesses of torturing the innocent and the like take place, as in the US army detention centres in Abu Ghraib in Iraq and Guantanamo Bay in Cuba, and in the Israeli secret service (General Security Service). Nevertheless, it is useful to sketch a general argument against the legalisation and institutionalisation of torture. The argument is consistent with, indeed at some points it is more or less the same as, the arguments of Luban and Waldron. However, the argument has some novel elements, not the least of which is the claim that the view that torture is morally justified in some extreme emergencies is compatible with the view that torture ought not to be legalised and institutionalised.

Most of the theorists who oppose the legalisation and institutionalisation of torture also (at least implicitly) reject the possibility, let alone actuality, of one-off emergencies in which torture is morally justified. The argument has been put that there are, or could well be, such one-off extreme emergencies in which torture is morally justified. So the first task here is to demonstrate that these two claims are not inconsistent. Specifically, it needs to be shown that it does not follow from the fact that torture is in some extreme emergencies morally justified, that torture ought to be legalised, or otherwise institutionalised. So the claim is that it is just a mistake to assume that what morality requires or permits in a given situation must be identical with what the law requires or permits in that situation. This calls for some explanation.

The law in particular, and social institutions more generally, are blunt instruments. They are designed to deal with recurring situations confronted by numerous institutional actors over relatively long periods of time. Laws abstract away from differences between situations across space and time, and differences between institutional actors across space and time. The law, therefore, consists of a set of generalisations to which the particular situation must be made to fit. Hence, if you exceed the speed limit you are liable for a fine, even though you were only 10 kph above the speed limit, you have a superior car, you are a superior driver, there was no other traffic on the road, the road conditions were perfect, and therefore the chances of you having an accident were actually less than would be the case for most other people most of the time driving at or under the speed limit.[16]

By contrast with the law, morality is a sharp instrument. Morality can be, and typically ought to be, made to apply to a given situation in all its particularity. (This is, of course, not to say that there are not recurring moral situations in respect of which the same moral judgment should be made, nor is it to say that morality does not need to help itself to generalisations.) Accordingly, what might be, all things considered, the morally best action for an agent to perform in some one-off, i.e. non-recurring, situation might not be an action that should be made lawful. Consider the real-life example of the five sailors on a raft in the middle of the ocean and without food. Four of them decide to eat the fifth—the cabin boy—in order to survive.[17] This is a case of both murder and cannibalism. Was it morally justifiable to kill and eat the boy, given the alternative was the death of all five sailors? Perhaps not, given the cabin boy was entirely innocent. However, arguably it was morally excusable, and indeed the sailors, although convicted of murder and cannibalism, had their sentence commuted in recognition of this. But there was no suggestion that the laws against murder and cannibalism admit of an exception in such an extreme case; the sailors were convicted and sentenced for murder and cannibalism. Again, consider an exceptionless law against desertion from the battlefield in time of war. Perhaps a soldier is morally justifiable in deserting his fellow soldiers, given that he learns of the more morally pressing need for him to care for his wife who has contracted some life-threatening disease back home. However, the law against desertion will not, and should not, be changed to allow desertion in such cases.

I will shortly present arguments to the effect that while there may well be morally justifiable one-off cases of torturing the guilty, it does not follow that torture should ever be legalised, even in such cases. However, it has been suggested by Steinhoff (2010) that torturing the guilty can in many cases be understood as torturing the guilty in self-defence. If so, presumably torturing the guilty could reasonably be legalised on the grounds that torturing in self-defence is analogous to killing in self-defence, and self-defence is an explicit legal justification for killing in most jurisdictions. Steinhoff has also suggested (2006) that legalisation would not necessarily lead to institutionalisation in the sense of the creation of the institutional role of a torturer, the routinisation and bureaucratisation of the process of torture, and so on.

Torturing the guilty in self-defence is arguably something of a misnomer. Firstly, it is not really self defence per se, but rather the saving of the lives of others. After all, generally the would-be torturer's life is not at risk, and even if it is at risk in a particular location, as in some terrorist bombing scenarios, then presumably the risk can be averted by the torturer simply abandoning his immobilised victim and fleeing the area. I note that on many accounts self defence is a more readily acceptable moral justification or excuse for killing an attacker than is defending the lives of others (at least, others who are not members of one's family or close friends). Secondly, torturing the guilty to save innocent lives does not typically involve an imminent threat, as must be the case in self-defence. For the threat posed by (say) a terrorist-bomber is either imminent, as in the case of a suicide-bomber, in which case there is no time to torture anyone; or the threat is not imminent in which case there is time to pursue other options, such as intercepting the communications of other members of the terrorist cell and, thereby, locating the bomb. Again, consider typical kidnapping cases. Either the kidnapper is not in custody in which case he or she cannot be tortured; or the kidnapper is in custody in which case the threat to the kidnapped child from the kidnapper in custody is not imminent (the child is either dead or is alive and no longer under threat from the kidnapper in custody). Naturally, as we saw in the last section, there may well be a very small number of exceptional cases in which the threat is more or less imminent and torture is, nevertheless, a realistic option for removing the threat (and, indeed, the only option). Accordingly, this small number of exceptional cases might be analogous to killing in self-defence. Moreover, in some torturing the guilty scenarios the all things considered morally best option might be to torture the guilty party; indeed the general argument for the latter proposition was outlined in the last section. However, this does not demonstrate that justified torturing of the guilty to save the innocent they threaten is essentially a species of justified self-defence and that, therefore, it ought to be legalised.

It is consistent with the rejection of explicit legalisation of the torturing of the guilty that, as noted above, there be some form of legal redress in the very small number of exceptional cases of torturing the guilty in which the threat to the innocent is imminent (and torture is morally justifiable all things considered). These forms of legal redress for the torturer might include the existence of mitigating circumstances or the application of the legal principle of necessity—since the cases in question involve a genuinely dilemmatic situation in which the least harmful of the available options was chosen and chosen to the advantage of the innocent rather than the guilty.

The upshot of this discussion is that torturing the guilty to save the lives of the innocent is not analogous to killing in self-defence. Specifically, the legalisation of torturing the guilty faces the problem of imminence; unlike killing in self-defence it almost never involves an imminent threat. Accordingly, the legalisation of torturing the guilty is likely to be regarded as extremely problematic, since presumably legalisation is likely to result in institutionalisation. Consider in this connection police killing in defence of the lives of innocent citizens. This involves the creation of the institutional role of police sniper with all its attendant training, development and implementation of procedures (including the requirement that the threat be imminent before shots are fired) and, more generally, bureaucratisation. This is, of course, not to say that (as argued above) certain one-off cases of torturing the guilty might not be both morally justifiable and legally excusable (or otherwise be able to avail themselves of mitigating circumstances).

As already noted and contrary to the above-mentioned presumption, Steinhoff insists that legalization does not in fact necessarily lead to institutionalization. Specifically, he argues that the legalization of killing in self-defence has not led to its institutionalization, and he also claims (as we have seen) that torturing in self-defence is akin to killing in self-defence. As we have seen, the proposition that torturing the guilty to save lives is analogous to killing in self-defence is open to question and there is surely at least a presumption that legalisation will lead to institutionalisation. However, there is a further more specific point to be made here in relation to legalisation and institutionalisation. It is true that individualistic killing in self-defence on the part of private citizens has not led to institutionalization, but this is because it is an individual, non-institutional activity which is subject to stringent institutional accountability mechanisms (at least in well-ordered liberal democratic states). But it is extremely doubtful that an individual citizen is ever going to be in a situation where he has to defend his life by torturing his attacker. What we are talking about in this debate is the killing or torturing by institutional actors, e.g. police, of persons who are attacking third parties (whether by killing, kidnapping etc.); the third parties in question are, typically, members of the community. As noted above, the legalized killing by police of third parties has been institutionalized (police snipers). So evidently killing in self-defence does not constitute a relevant case in which there is legalization but not institutionalization.

Whether or not torture is likely to be institutionalised once legalised, or is even likely to be institutionalised if not actively resisted on an ongoing basis, is partly a matter of the the motivational drivers in play. And unfortunately, even in liberal democracies, when the threat to the community is regarded as substantial, institutional actors (such as police and military personnel) have been willing to engage in routinised extra-judicial killing (India, today) and more than willing to engage in routinised torture (use of the third degree by police agencies world-wide). In doing so, they have typically appealed to a self-defence moral justification (‘We had to torture/kill in order to save lives’). Moreover, in the case of the extra-judicial killings they have typically helped themselves to and often been aided by the legal justification of self-defence—‘the Naxalites (in India) shot at us first and we fired back in self-defence’ (albeit what has also been revealed over time is a culture of ‘shoot first and ask questions later’). Torture is much more prevalent than killing in part because (as Steinhoff argues) torture is rightly regarded as not necessarily as bad as killing (criminals tortured by police are typically able to carry on with their lives, even if in prison) and perhaps also in part because torture is less susceptible to the available accountability measures (you cannot hide corpses, at least in liberal democracies). In short, there is good reason to believe that legalizing torture in contexts in which there is a substantial threat to the community will lead to its institutionalization.

It has been noted on a number of occasions that the law and morality can and do come apart. Moreover, it is plausible that sometimes they ought to come apart. A further point to be elaborated here pertains to the nature of the sub-institution of torture within the larger military, police, and correctional institutions. There is a need to begin with a few preliminary remarks about social institutions.[18]

Social institutions, including legal institutions and military, police, and correctional organisations, have both a massive collective inertia and a massive collective momentum by virtue of the participation in them of many agents over a long time who: (a) pursue the same goals; (b) occupy the same roles and, therefore, perform the same tasks and follow the same rules and procedures, and; (c) share the same culture. Accordingly, social institutions and their component organisations are like very large ocean liners that cannot slow down, speed up, or change direction very easily. It follows that very careful thought needs to be given to the establishment of any additional structure of roles and associated practices that is to be woven into the fabric of the institution. For such an additional (embodied) role structure, once it becomes, so to speak, an integrated working part of the larger institution, is likely to be extremely difficult to remove; it is now a beneficiary of the inertia of the institution. Moreover such an additional, but now integrated, role structure participates in, and influences the direction of, the institution; it is now a contributing element to the momentum of the institution.

So what can be said of the likely institutional fit between military, police, and correctional institutions on the one hand, and the sub-institution of torture on the other? The role structure of this sub-institution consists of torturers, torturer trainers, medical personnel who assist torturers, and the like. The core practice of torture has been described in an earlier section.

The practice of torture is endemic in many, perhaps most, military, police, and correctional institutions in the world today, including democracies such as India. It is only in recent times and with great difficulty that torture in Australian prisons and police services, for example, has been largely eliminated, or at least very significantly reduced. The Australian, British, American, and like cases are important not only because they illustrate that torture can be endemic to liberal democratic institutions, but also because they demonstrate that liberal democratic institutions are able—given the political will, suitable re-education and training, stringent accountability mechanisms, etc.—to successfully combat a culture of torture.

Let us look at some of the evidence from the past. Consider police organisations in liberal democracies such as the USA. The influential Report on Lawlessness in Law Enforcement from the National Commission on Law Observance and Enforcement, also know as the Wickersham Commission, in 1931 found that the use of the third degree was widespread throughout police organisations in the USA (National Commission on Law Observance and Enforcement 1931, 4). More recently, we have the Rampart Reports documenting extensive police brutality—including extra-judicial killings (Parks 2000, 87–109; Rampart Independent Review Panel 2000, 11–14) —and, in the wake of the Rodney King beating, the report of the “Christopher Commission” into the Los Angeles Police Department which found that a significant number of LAPD officers “repetitively use excessive force against the public and persistently ignore the written guidelines of the Department regarding force” (Independent Commission on the Los Angeles Police Department 1991, 9–12). In India—another liberal democratic state, albeit one at an earlier stage of economic development—police brutality is institutionalised. According to a recent Human Rights Watch Report (Human Rights Watch 2009: 14), “police violence and misconduct are … widespread and rooted in institutional practice”. Arvind Verma, an authority on policing in India, states that “Misuse of force, false-encounter killings (execution by police) and routine use of torture in extorting confessions are common with the police departments” (Verma 2011: 5).

Now consider prisons in liberal democracies. In the USA in the past widespread beatings and torture of prisoners (e.g. use of electrodes on prisoners' private parts) has been documented in multiple jurisdictions, including Arkansas, Louisiana, Mississippi, Virginia and Florida. See, for example, Murton and Hyams' classic work, Inside Prison, USA (Murton and Hyams 1969). In Australia there was the Nagle Royal Commission into New South Wales Prisons. Nagle reported systematic bashings in NSW prisons. He said of Grafton Gaol, in particular, that it had a “regime of terror”, “…brutal, savage and sometimes sadistic” (Nagle 1978: 108). He concluded thus: “It is the view of the Commission that every prison officer who served at Grafton during the time it was used as a gaol for intractables must have known of its brutal regime. The majority of them, if not all, would have taken part in the illegal assaults on prisoners” (Nagle 1978: 119).

When it comes to authoritarian regimes matters are, of course, much worse. Let us set aside the infamous Soviet Gulags under Stalin and also Hitler's concentration camps, and rather consider some more recent examples. The South African Truth and Reconciliation Commission stated that under the apartheid regime, “torture was used systematically by the Security Branch, both as a means of obtaining information and of terrorising detainees and activists. Torture was not confined to particular police stations, particular regions or particular individual police officers” (TRC 1998: 187). In Chile the National Commission on Truth and Reconciliation (NCTR 1993: 1122) detailed over 2000 victims of human rights violations by the security forces of the Pinochet regime of which victims approximately half were killed (hundreds tortured to death) and the remaining half disappeared after arrest. According to Juan Mendez (a UN Special Advisor who was himself tortured during the Argentinean military dictatorship): “Torture became systematic and pervasive during the military dictatorships of the 1970s and 1980s, but it would be a mistake to trace its origins only as far as this dark era. In fact, torture was used by dictatorial as well as elected but authoritarian governments throughout the twentieth century” (Mendez 2005: 56).

In the light of the evidence it would be a massive understatement to say that historically the sub-institution of torture—whether in a lawful or unlawful form—has been no stranger to military, police, and correctional institutions. Further, there is now a great deal of empirical evidence that in institutional environments in which torture is routinely practised it has a massive impact on other practices and on moral attitudes. For example, in police organisations in which torture is routinely used the quality of investigations and, in particular, of interviewing of suspects, tends to be low. Careful, logically based, questioning on the basis of the available evidence is replaced by beating up suspects. Thus lower echelon police investigators in India often have little or no training in best practice interviewing and (as noted above) they routinely use the third degree. Again, Baldwin's findings based on hundreds of taped interviews indicate that the interviewing skills of UK police during the period of the infamous police use of the third degree against the Birmingham Six, Guildford Four and Maguire Seven would have been quite poor (Baldwin 1993). Police in organisations in which offenders are routinely tortured do not, unsurprisingly, tend to develop respect for the moral rights of offenders, suspects, or even witnesses. This is entirely consistent with the excesses detailed by Luban and Waldron in the US military detention centres in Iraq and elsewhere, e.g., the Abu Ghraib scandal, and in the case of the interrogations of suspected terrorists by the Israeli secret service. Indeed, these excesses are to be expected.

And there is this further point. The prevalence of torture in numerous military, police, and correctional institutions throughout the world has taken place notwithstanding that for the most part it has been both unlawful and opposed by the citizenry.

It is to be concluded from all this that for the most part military, police, and correctional institutions are qua institutions very receptive to the practice of torture—even when it is unlawful—and that these institutions qua institutions would relatively easily incorporate the legalised sub-institution of torture; accordingly, it is very easy to legalise torture and thereby grow and develop a torture culture in military, police and correctional institutions. This does not mean that there are not important differences between, say, police services in authoritarian states and those in contemporary (though not necessarily historical) liberal democratic states; obviously there are and we should want to keep it that way. Nor does it mean that most, or even the majority, of the individuals who occupy roles in these institutions, whether in liberal democracies or elsewhere, are necessarily receptive qua individuals to engaging in the practice of torture; most of them might not be. However, most of them would not be torturing people; that would be done by a distinct minority, as in fact has usually been the case even in institutions in which torture is unlawful and endemic. The question is whether or not as individuals they would initially tolerate, and finally accept, the practice of torture, if it were legally and institutionally established; the suggestion is that the historical and comparative evidence is that they would, including in liberal democracies.

A additional conclusion to be drawn is that should the legalised sub-institution of torture be integrated into any of these institutions it would be very difficult to remove and would, even in liberal democracies, have a major impact on the direction, culture, and practices of these institutions. Again, this is what the historical and comparative empirical evidence tells, notwithstanding the initial and even continuing aversion of many, perhaps most, of the individuals in these institutions to torture as such. Consider the Israeli case. Limited forms of torture were legal in Israel prior to 1999, but illegal post 1999. However, evidently torture has by no means been eradicated post 1999. According to the Public Committee Against Torture in Israel (PCATI), reporting on the period between September 2001 and April 2003: “The affidavits and testimonies taken by attorneys and fieldworkers… support the conclusions …violence, painful tying, humiliations and many other forms of ill-treatment, including detention under inhuman conditions, are a matter of course….The bodies which are supposed to keep the GSS [General Security Service] under scrutiny and ensure that interrogations are conducted lawfully act, instead, as rubberstamps for decisions by the GSS…The State Prosecutor's Office transfers the interrogees' complaints to a GSS agent for investigation and it is little wonder that it has not found in even a single case that GSS agents tortured a Palestinian ‘unnecessarily’” (PCATI 2003).

The deeper explanation for the prevalence of torture cultures and the difficulty of eradicating institutionalised torture is no doubt very complex, but presumably it consists in part in the following elements: (1) moral docility, as opposed to physical docility, is a feature of individuals housed in, and materially dependent upon, large, hierarchical, bureaucratic organisations with strong, relatively homogenous cultures; (2) the roles of soldier, police officer, and prison warder necessarily involve the routine use of coercive, and even deadly, force against dangerous criminals, enemy soldiers, or terrorists, and therefore undertaking these roles inevitably results in a degree of moral de-sensitisation and a sense of moral ambiguity when it comes to torturing criminals and/or terrorists; (3) torture is an exercise of enormous power, and power is deeply seductive to many people (and much less dangerous than shooting at armed enemy combatants or trying to arrest or subdue violent criminals).

Armed with these observations on the difference between law and morality, and on the nature of the sub-institution of torture in military, police, and correctional institutions, what now can be said on the question as to whether or not to legalise and institutionalise torture in contemporary well-ordered liberal democratic states undergoing a lengthy period of attacks from terrorist organisations?

As we saw above, torture is a terrorist tactic. Indeed, arguably it is the terrorist tactic par excellence. Detonating bombs that kill the innocent has come to be regarded as the quintessential terrorist tactic. But this is presumably because terrorism has implausibly come to be identified only with non-state terrorism. At any rate, the point to be made here is that torture is a terrorist tactic, and for a liberal democracy to legalise and institutionalise it, i.e. weave the practice of torture into the very fabric of liberal democratic institutions, would be both an inherent contradiction—torture being an extreme assault on individual autonomy—and, given what we know about the practice of torture in military, police, and correctional institutions, highly damaging to those liberal democratic institutions. It would be equivalent to a liberal democracy legalising and institutionalising slavery on the grounds, say, of economic necessity. Legalised and institutionalised slavery is inconsistent with liberal democracy, as is legalised and institutionalised torture. So if legalised and institutionalised slavery and/or legalised and institutionalised torture are necessary because morally required, then liberal democracy is not possible in anything other than an attenuated form. But of course neither legalised/institutionalised slavery nor legalised/institutionalised torture is morally required, quite the contrary. At best, torture is morally justified in some one-off emergencies—just as murder and cannibalism might be morally excusable in a one-off emergency on the high seas, or desertion from the field of battle might be morally justifiable given a one-off emergency back home—but absolutely nothing follows as far as the legalisation/institutionalisation of torture is concerned.

A final point here concerns the proposition that, absent legalised/institutional torture, unlawful endemic torture in the security agencies of contemporary liberal democracies confronting terrorism is inevitable. The implication here is that unless legalised, torture will become endemic in these agencies. It has already been argued that legalisation/institutionalisation of torture would be profoundly damaging to liberal democratic institutions. Assume this is correct; it does not follow from this that a torture culture will not come to exist in those agencies in the context of torture being unlawful. Nor does it follow that an unlawful torture culture, indeed an unlawful sub-institution of torture, is inevitable. Here there is a tendency to use the kind of argument that is plausible in relation to, say, the prohibition of alcohol. It is better to legalise alcohol, because then it can be contained and controlled. This form of argument used in relation to torture is spurious. Consuming alcohol to excess is not morally equivalent to torture, and we do not legalise the use of alcohol in emergency situations only. Legalising the use of torture in extreme emergencies would be much more akin to legalising perjury in extreme situations. As with torture—and unlike alcohol—perjury is only morally justified in some extreme one-off situations.[19] However, no-one is seriously considering legalising perjury in one-off extreme situations (at least to my knowledge), and with good reason—to do so would strike at the very heart of the legal system.

The fact is that the recent history of police, military, and other organisations in liberal democracies has demonstrated that torture cultures and sub-institutions of torture can be more or less eliminated, albeit with considerable difficulty. The elimination of torture cultures and sub-institutions can only be achieved if torture is unlawful, the community and the political and organisational leadership are strongly opposed to it, police officers and other relevant institutional actors are appropriately educated and trained, and stringent accountability mechanisms, e.g. video-recording of interviews, close-circuit TV cameras in cells, external oversight bodies, are put in place. It is surely obvious that to re-introduce and indeed protect the practice of torture, by legalising and institutionalising it, would be to catapult the security agencies of liberal democracies back into the dark ages from whence they came.

The discussion has focussed on the legalisation and institutionalisation of torture, where the practice of torture is understood in general terms; it ought to be now obvious why torture should not be legalised. However, some commentators, notably Alan Dershowitz, have argued that legalised torture could be justified, if the torture in question was restricted to extreme emergency situations and subjected to appropriate accountability mechanisms. Specifically, he has argued for torture warrants of the kind introduced for a time in Israel.

The notion of torture warrants is supposedly analogous to surveillance and telephone interception warrants issued to police by a magistrate or other judicial officer. The idea is that privacy is a fundamental right but it can be infringed under certain conditions, such as reasonable suspicion that the person whose privacy right is to be infringed is engaged in serious criminal activity, there is no alternative way to acquire the necessary information to convict him/her, and so on. In this kind of set-up the magistrate, not the police, makes the decision as to whether or not these conditions obtain. Consequently, the infringements of privacy rights are restricted, and subject to stringent accountability mechanisms.

However, morally speaking, torture warrants are entirely different from telephone interception or surveillance warrants. First, torture is a far greater evil than the infringement of privacy. For one thing, having one's phone tapped or movements filmed is inherently much less distressing, harmful and morally repugnant than the physical suffering and loss of autonomy involved in being strapped to a chair and, say, having someone drill into an unanesthetised tooth. On the spectrum of evils, torture is closer to murder/killing than it is to the infringement of privacy. For another thing, torture is a far more dangerous practice than infringing privacy. For the degree of the infringement of privacy can be minimised, e.g. the information gained can relatively easily be kept strictly confidential by the police; moreover, there is no inherent reason for the police to illicitly widen a given infringement of privacy by breaching confidentiality. But in practice torture cannot be restricted likewise. The methods of torture and the process of torture exist on a continuum, and there is often an inherent reason to ‘push the envelope’ and inflict ever more severe forms of physical suffering on victims; so-called ‘torture lite’ becomes full-blooded, no holds-barred torture. One of the consequences of this continuum of torture is the ever-present possibility that the victims of torture will not simply be tortured, but rather be murdered; and in point of fact numerous people have died in the course of being tortured.

Second, as has already been argued, there is an inherent institutional receptivity of military, police, and correctional institutions to the practice of torture; a receptivity which is such that torture cultures will grow and flourish, notwithstanding Dershowitz's proposal that only tightly controlled and highly restricted forms of torture are to be legally admissible. This institutional receptivity has the consequence that inevitably large numbers of innocent people will be tortured—as has happened in Israel (see PCATI 2003). Indeed, even under tightly controlled and highly restricted forms of torture some innocent persons will inevitably be tortured—just as the privacy of innocent people is infringed under the existing telephone and surveillance warrant systems. Arguably, the infringement of the privacy of some—in fact, many—innocent persons is a price that we ought to be willing to pay for the sake of preventing serious crimes. However, it would be preposterous to argue that (inadvertently?) torturing numerous innocent people is a reasonable price to pay in return for the information provided by those of the tortured who are in fact guilty.

Third, the information gained by wire-tapping or surveillance has in general far greater utility than that gained by means of the practice of torture—certainly by the tightly controlled and highly restricted forms of torture of the kind envisaged by Dershowitz. Indeed, it is by no means clear that the utility—in terms of saving lives (and leaving aside the costs)—of the system of legalised torture warrants will be very high. (In Israel, to repeat the example, it does not appear to have been particularly high.) This is so for two reasons. One reason is that torture victims typically tell the torturer whatever they think he wants to hear, e.g. they are happy to implicate others who are in fact innocent in order to bring an end to their own agony. And even in relation to desired checkable information there is often the problem of knowing whether or not the victim of torture is holding out or does not really know; this is especially the case with hardened terrorists. So by comparison with telephone and surveillance warrants, torture warrants are likely to yield unreliable information; there is a serious question about the quality of much of the information provided under a system of torture warrants. A further reason to disparage the utility of torture warrants is that, again unlike telephone and surveillance warrants, torture warrants are to be issued only in extreme emergencies. By contrast, telephone interception and surveillance warrants are issued as a matter of routine, albeit only under certain (recurring) conditions. Accordingly, the volume of information capable of being provided under a system of torture warrants is extremely limited. In short, over time the torture warrant system is likely only to yield an extremely small quantity of reliable information. This overall likely lack of utility of the torture warrant system qua institution is important to keep in mind in the context of a protracted struggle against terrorism involving ongoing loss of life on both sides. Here the torture warrant system stands in sharp contrast to telephone interception and surveillance warrant systems. Moreover, it is precisely because the set of conditions under which it is reasonable and effective to infringe privacy rights recurs, that infringements of privacy rights by police can reasonably be legalised and institutionalised, e.g. by means of a warrant system. Arguably, the proponents of the torture warrant system have made the mistake of proposing a legal/institutional solution to what ought to be regarded as a one-off moral problem;[20] hence the inadequacy of their proposal.

At any rate, the conclusion must be that any attempt to compare torture warrants to surveillance or interception warrants is entirely spurious. Torture is a very different beast.

In the light of the above three points concerning torture warrants that have just been made in the comparison between these and surveillance and interception warrants, the inevitable conclusion is that the practice of torture could not be contained under a system of legalised torture warrants and the consequences of its not being contained would be horrific. Moreover, as noted above, and argued by Luban, Waldron and others, the damage to liberal institutions would be incalculable. Finally, the benefits of a system of legalised torture warrants over the longer term are likely to be slight; and certainly easily outweighed by the costs. So Dershowitz is entirely misguided in his advocacy of torture warrants. Indeed, as repeatedly mentioned above, we have the example of Israel's use, or rather abuse, of this system to provide specific empirical evidence against the introduction of torture warrants.

So torture warrants are highly undesirable, indeed a threat to liberal democratic institutions. Moreover, torture warrants are unnecessary. As has been argued above, there may well be one-off emergencies in which the use of torture is morally justifiable. In those cases, the relevant public officials must bite the bullet and do what is morally required, e.g. torture the terrorist to save thousands of innocent people. In such an emergency, the military or police officers involved will need to break the law on this one occasion. But in itself this is a small price to pay; and a price the police, the military and the politicians have shown themselves only too willing to pay in situations that are far from emergencies.

One final matter. What should be done to the military officer, police officer, or other public official who tortures the terrorist if—after saving the city—their crime is discovered? Quite clearly he (or she) should resign or be dismissed from their position; public institutions cannot suffer among their ranks those who commit serious crimes. Further, the public official in question must be tried, convicted, and sentenced for committing the crime of torture.[21] Obviously, there are (to say the least) mitigating circumstances, and the sentence should be commuted to, say, one day in prison. Would public officials be prepared to act to save thousands of innocent lives, if they knew they might lose their job and/or suffer some minor punishment? Presumably many would. But if not, is it desirable to set up a legalised torture chamber and put these people in charge of it?

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Copyright © 2011 by
Seumas Miller <semiller@csu.edu.au>

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