William David Ross

First published Thu Aug 12, 2010; substantive revision Tue Jun 19, 2012

Sir William David Ross (1877–1971) made significant contributions to the translation and interpretation of the works of Aristotle and to moral philosophy. His work in ancient philosophy, especially his various commentaries on Aristotle, is still considered to be of the highest caliber. Many believe that Ross's work in this area is his most valuable contribution to philosophy. However, his main writings in moral philosophy are of lasting if not equal value. His The Right and the Good is arguably one of the most important works of moral philosophy published in the twentieth century. Although Ross's view appeared to suffer at the hands of critics in the middle and late parts of the last century, recent interest in normative and meta-ethical intuitionism has sparked a renewed respect for and admiration of his unique contribution to ethics, which is the focus of this entry.

1. Ross's Life

William David Ross was born on 15 April 1877 in Thurso, Scotland. He spent the bulk of the first six years of his life in Travancore, India, where his father, John Ross, was the Principal of the Maharaja's College. Ross returned to Scotland for his formal education. He attended the Royal High School in Edinburgh and Edinburgh University. In 1895, he graduated from the latter with first-class honours in classics. He then went to Balliol College, Oxford, where he obtained first-class honours in classical honour moderations in 1898 and in literae humaniores in 1900. He was then appointed lecturer at Oriel College, Oxford and at the same time he was elected to a fellowship by examination at Merton College. In 1902, he dropped the latter when he was elected tutor in philosophy and fellow at Oriel College, a position which he held until 1929. Ross joined the army in 1915, and by the time World War I ended he was Deputy Secretary in the Ministry of Munitions, with the rank of Major. He left the army with an OBE. Following the war he remained in public service on a part-time basis, and for his efforts he was made a KBE in 1938. From 1923 to 1928 he was the Deputy White's Professor of Moral Philosophy while John Alexander Stewart was ill. When the position became vacant in 1927, Ross refused to stand because he thought H. A. Prichard a better moral philosopher and because (interestingly) he said that he would ‘prefer working on metaphysics, ancient and the most modern’ (Clark 1971, 534). Two years later, in 1929, he became Provost of Oriel College, a position he held until he retired in 1947. In 1927, he was elected Fellow of the British Academy, and he served as its president from 1936 to 1940. During this time he played a role in helping foreign scholars fleeing less liberal climates in Europe. In World War II he again played an essential role in the public service, serving on an Appeal Tribunal for Conscientious Objectors (1940–41) and on the National Arbitration Tribunal (1941–1952). He served as Vice-Chancellor of Oxford from 1941 to 1944. Following the war, in 1947, he became President of the Union Académique Internationale, and, until 1949, the Chairman of the Royal Commission on the Press. In his retirement Ross continued his work in philosophy. He died in Oxford on 25 May 1971.

Ross's contributions to various administrative positions and to public service were of no small importance. But it is his work in philosophy which is the basis of his reputation. He made numerous contributions to the translation and interpretation of Aristotle and to moral philosophy. In his lifetime, Ross was considered a major figure in the study of Aristotle (Wiggins 2004). He was the General Editor of the Oxford Aristotle translation series, first with J. A. Smith and then alone, and to this series he contributed translations of Aristotle's Metaphysics and his Nicomachean Ethics. Ross edited a number of Aristotle's works in Greek for the Oxford Classical Texts series, including the Rhetoric, Physics, De Anima, and Politics, and he produced editions of the Metaphysics, Physics, Parva Naturalia, Analytics and De Anima with long introductions and detailed commentaries. On the basis of this work he produced two full-length books, Aristotle and Plato's Theory of Ideas (1951). In ethics, Ross wrote only a small number of articles. His books The Right and the Good and Foundations of Ethics comprise his main offerings in this area. To these he added a critical commentary on Immanuel Kant's Groundwork, Kant's Ethical Theory: A Commentary on the Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten, and a chapter on Aristotle's ethics in Aristotle.

In the introduction to the sixth edition of Aristotle, J. L. Ackrill maintains that Ross ‘made his mark in public life and as a university teacher and administrator, and he wrote influential books on ethics. But it is as the leading Aristotelian of the first half of the century that he will be most remembered’ (AT ix). Indeed, many argue that Ross was one of the most influential Aristotelians of the twentieth century. Although some of Ross's translations now have formidable competitors, they are still highly regarded, and his editions of Aristotle's work with commentaries continue to be an important source for scholars working in ancient philosophy. One should not, however, overlook the fact that he now has an equally strong reputation in ethics. Despite the fact that Ross received rather short shrift from rival moral philosophers in the last century (e.g., Warnock 1960; Rawls 1971; Raphael 1981), his moral philosophy is now considered a serious contender and in recent years many of Ross's main moral and meta-ethical doctrines have received sustained defenses (see, e.g., Hurka 2004; Stratton-Lake 2002a, 2002b, 2011a, 2011b; McNaughton 1988, 1996; Shaver 2007; Audi 1996, 2004; Gaut 2002; Parfit 2011). Therefore, it is not unreasonable to think that Ross's legacy will depend both on his work in ethics and on his work in ancient philosophy.

Ross was part of a group of thinkers dubbed the British Intuitionists. H. A. Prichard was its main figure, and Ross was heavily influenced by his views (see Prichard 1912, 1932). He was also influenced by G. E. Moore (Moore 1903, 1912). Ross subjected Moore's ideal utilitarianism to sustained attack. But he was more sympathetic to Moore's methodology for soliciting intuitions about goodness and with some of Moore's ideas about the nature of intrinsic value and moral semantics. Finally, he could not have helped being influenced by Aristotle's treatment of ethical topics. He was in particular impressed with Aristotle's methodology.

2. The Data of Ethics

Ross writes that the ‘moral convictions of thoughtful and well-educated people are the data of ethics just as sense-perceptions are the data of a natural science’ (RG 41). The verdicts that this body of moral convictions comprises represent ‘the moral reflection of many generations, which has developed an extremely delicate power of appreciation of moral distinctions’ (RG 41). These moral distinctions are employed to test moral theories; these are cases of knowledge that the philosopher neither proves nor disproves (RG 20–21n1, 40). Ross takes the requirement to capture these main common-sense convictions to be more important than simplicity or systematisation (RG 19; FE 83). This puts him at odds with moral philosophers who take the systematization, the explanation, and the correction of common-sense morality as the main function of moral philosophy. Henry Sidgwick, for instance, claims that ‘the philosopher seeks unity of principle, and consistency of method’ and that the role of the moral philosopher is to ‘enunciate, in full breadth and clearness, those primary intuitions of Reason, by the scientific application of which the common moral thought of mankind may be at once systematised and corrected’ (Sidgwick 1907 373–374).

The precise degree to which Ross and Sidgwick are in disagreement is less than clear. Ross sometimes writes as though what he cares about is the opinions of the ‘thoughtful and well-educated’ (RG 41) or, what comes to the same thing, what ‘we’ think (RG 40; FE 102, 104, 134, 172). At others times he suggests that what he cares about is the opinions of the ‘plain man’ (RG 17, 20–21n1, 28, 57; FE 186, 187, 188; KT 31). If the opinions of the thoughtful and well-educated are distinct from those of the plain man, and Ross (with some justification) cares more about the former than the latter, he may have a moral view that is closer on the matter of reform (though not of system) to Sidgwick's. This is not without certain costs. Ross faults rival moral views for not being close enough to what ‘plain men’ think about moral questions. If he is open to revising a substantial portion of the moral views that are ‘commonly recognized’, then he loses part of his case against rivals. He does acknowledge that there are errors in our moral thinking and that we are not required to accept ‘as absolute all the claims that are commonly recognised’ (FE 190; also 2–3; RG 41), though he thinks that most disputes concern media axiomata rather than fundamental moral principles (FE 18–19, 190). However, he seems to invite more drastic possibilities. He notes that inquiry into the ‘historical origin of…[our moral] beliefs and practices’ may show that ‘the most strongly felt repulsions towards certain types of conduct are relics of a bygone system of totems and fetishes, their connexion with which is little suspected by those who feel them’ (RG 13). This may lead to significant revision (Singer 2005). Whatever the case may be, the precise nature of Ross's view will emerge only after a thorough account of its content is provided. About this data a number of questions emerge. What is its metaphysical status? How is it known? What is its precise content? The answers that Ross offers to these questions and his sensitivity to the dictates of common-sense morality together make up his unique contribution to moral theory.

3. The Case Against Ideal Utilitarianism and Kant's Moral Theory

Armed with an account of the main convictions of common-sense morality, Ross attacked ideal utilitarianism and Kantianism, though ideal utilitarianism, the view that the only basic moral requirement is to maximally promote a plurality of intrinsic goods, was his main opponent.[1]

Ross's basic complaint about his rivals is that each, in a different way, ‘over-simplifies the moral life’ (FE 189). Both Kant and ideal utilitarians fail to capture some salient element of the ‘main moral convictions of the plain man’ (RG 20–21n1). Ross contends that Kant oversimplifies the moral life in a number of distinct ways. First, Kant is wrong to think that ‘the rightness or wrongness of an individual act can be inferred with certainty from its falling or not falling under a rule capable of being universalised’ (FE 189; also KT 25). Second, Kant is wrong to think that there is only one motive that has value, and that the moral life consists in a ‘contest between one element which alone has worth [i.e., the good will] and a multitude of others which have none; the truth is rather that it is a struggle between a multiplicity of desires having various degrees of worth’ (FE 206; also KT 3, 18, 93). Third, Kant is wrong to think that moral rules have ‘absolute authority admitting of no exception’ (FE 313; also 134, 173; KT 24, 95). The ideal utilitarianism of both Moore and Hastings Rashdall is guilty of a number of distortions of common-sense thinking (Moore 1903, 1912; Rashdall 1907, 1913; Skelton 2011). First, it wrongly assumes that there is a ‘general character which makes right acts right’, that of maximising a plurality of intrinsic goods (RG 16). Second, in virtue of presupposing that there is only one thing that we ought all things considered to do it distorts our understanding of moral deliberation. For example, when deciding whether to fulfil a promise we think much more of the fact that in the past we have made a promise than of the consequences we might realise by fulfilling it (RG 17). Third, ideal utilitarianism wrongly implies that the only morally significant relation ‘in which my neighbours stand to me is that of being possible beneficiaries by my action’ (RG 19; OJ 125).

4. Ross's Distinctive Moral Framework: The Right and the Good

Out of these criticisms emerges a distinct moral position, emphasizing the complexity of moral life. In a review of Foundations of Ethics, C. D. Broad writes that The Right and the Good was ‘much the most important contribution to ethical theory made in England for a generation’ (Broad 1940 228). The best explanation of Broad's praise is that the book presents a unique and compelling form of deontology, according to which there are a plurality of both moral requirements and intrinsic goods. There is no one master principle that explains why the particular things that we believe are wrong/right are in fact wrong/right. Instead, there are a number of basic moral requirements which cannot be reduced to some more fundamental principle. These are relied upon in making decisions about what we ought to do all things considered, though there is no sense in which this is deduced from principles. There is no one intrinsic good/evil that explains why the particular things we think are good/evil are in fact good/evil. Instead, there are a number of goods which cannot be reduced to some more fundamental good. These are relied upon in making decisions about the goodness or badness of a state of affairs all things considered, though there is no sense in which this is deduced from these claims. It is his articulation of this particular view that makes Ross's work a lasting philosophical contribution.

4.1 The Right

There is some dispute as to the precise number of principles to which Ross subscribes. It seems that he holds that there are five duties each of which rests on a separate and distinct ground and each of which specifies a factor which counts in favour of or against an act (Stratton-Lake 2002a, 2011a; Pickard-Cambridge 1932b; McNaughton 1996; cf. Jack 1971). Ross believes that we have a duty of fidelity, that is, a duty to keep our promises (RG 21; FE 76–77; KT 21); a duty of reparation or a duty to act to right a previous wrong we have done (RG 21; FE 76; KT 21); a duty of gratitude, or a duty to return services to those from whom we have in the past accepted benefits (RG 21; FE 76; KT 21); a duty to promote a maximum of aggregate good (RG 25, 27, 30; FE 67, 99, 130, 252, 257, 271, 313; KT 21); and finally a duty of non-maleficence, or a duty not to harm others (RG 21; FE 75, 130n1, 272).

He does not see these duties as equally important. He holds that the duty of non-maleficence is more important than the duty to promote a maximum of aggregate good (RG 21, 22; FE 75, 130n1), and he suggests that the duties of fidelity, reparation, and gratitude are in general more weighty than the duty to promote the good (RG 19, 30, 41–42; FE 77, 76, 90, 187). Unlike the duty to promote the good, the duties of fidelity, reparation and gratitude rest on personal relations with others, which generate special rather than general duties (FE 76, 186). It is important to Ross that we can stand in the obligation-generating relations ‘of promisee to promiser, of creditor to debtor, of wife to husband, of child to parent, of friend to friend, of fellow countryman to fellow countryman, and the like’ (RG 19; also 22; FE 76; OJ 124, 126). Rival views, as noted, ignore these morally significant relations, or the ‘highly personal character of duty’, at their peril (RG 22). Finally, although he does not say it, his view would surely be that the duty of non-maleficence is weightier than the duties of reparation, gratitude, and fidelity: it is (unless much is at stake) wrong to harm others in order to fulfil these duties.

Ross's major innovation is that these principles state prima facie rather than absolute obligations. This is an idea that simply had not occurred to critics of deontological theories (e.g., Mill 1863; Sidgwick 1907; Moore 1903, 1912; Rashdall 1907, 1913), and therefore represented at the time a major advance in the dialectic existing between utilitarians and non-utilitarians. Ross claims that ‘prima facie’ is an unfortunate phrase on which to rely (RG 20; FE 84–85). It suggests that these only appear to be duties which further reflection might reveal to be illusory. This is not the view: these principles express real facts (RG 20; FE 85). There is a further worry, for these are not really duties of any kind (FE 84–85; RG 20). He thinks instead that these principles simply specify factors or features of a situation that speak in favour of or against, morally speaking, an act or what to set ourselves to do.[2] The fact that an act fails to fulfil a promise is a fact that counts against it, morally. The fact that an act promotes a maximum of aggregate good is a fact that counts in favour of it, morally. One way to state what Ross has in mind, though this is controversial, is to say that each principle specifies a fact that counts as a moral reason for or against an act (Stratton-Lake 2002a xx, 2011a; also KT 21). Ross suggests another, equally plausible view, that each of the principles specifies a responsibility (FE 85). Therefore, we have responsibilities to express gratitude, to compensate for past wrongs, to promote the good, and so on. These responsibilities are what we are required to draw on to determine what we ought all things considered to do.

Is this list of responsibilities complete? Ross intimates that this list is the best representation of the core commitments of common-sense morality (RG 20; FE 190). He is confident that we have these responsibilities. He states, for example, that ‘the existence of an obligation arising from the making of a promise is so axiomatic that no moral universe can be imagined in which it would not exist’ (FE 77; also KT 42). He is not entirely confident that there exist only these responsibilities; he offers this list ‘without claiming completeness or finality for it’ (RG 20; also 23). His view is not meant to be hostile to the idea that we might recognise a ‘new duty’ in light of new circumstances (FE 189). However, he does hold that ‘the general principles which it [i.e., intuitionism] regards as intuitively seen to be true are very few in number and very general in character’ (FE 190). He seems to think that most disputes about the above list would revolve around what should be added rather than what should be subtracted or reduced, since the responsibilities listed above are ‘authentic…duties’ (RG 23). But if new circumstances can lead to the recognition of new duties, why may they not lead to the recognition that there are fewer duties than we might otherwise have supposed? This seems to be the nub of the issue between Ross and his ideal utilitarian foes.

Ideal utilitarians and others are keen to argue that Ross's view is problematic because it is not systematic enough. In Some Problems in Ethics, H. W. B. Joseph suggested that views like Ross's go wrong, since ‘our obligations are not a heap of unrelated obligations’ (Joseph 1931 92; also 67–68). Forty years later, Rawls registered the same complaint: without some account of how the plurality of normative principles are to be weighed against one another using ‘reasonable ethical criteria, the means of rational discussion have come to an end. An intuitionist conception of justice [and by extension ethics] is, one might say, but half a conception' (Rawls 1971 41).

Ross is moved in part by this sort of worry. He initially lists what appear to be seven responsibilities, including a responsibility of justice (a responsibility to bring about ‘a distribution of happiness between other people in proportion to merit’ (RG 26)) and a responsibility of self-improvement (a responsibility to improve oneself in respect of virtue and knowledge (RG 21)). He argues that these can be subsumed by the responsibility ‘that we should produce as much good as possible’ (RG 27; also 30; FE 288–89). But beyond this reduction Ross will travel no further: ‘loyalty to the facts is worth more than a symmetrical architecture or a hastily reached simplicity’ (RG 23; also FE 83; OJ 125). Indeed, he has a very strong case against many of his critics, including Moore, Rashdall, and Joseph, since they adopt a form of value pluralism for similar reasons. He has a further argument against Rawls. Rawls's theory contains two principles of justice, lexically ordered. His first principle outlining a set of basic rights takes priority over his second principle outlining the correct distribution of social benefits and burdens. Rawls does not think it is ever right to violate rights in order to produce just distributions. This gets him a theory that is as systematic as his classical average utilitarian rival and more systematic than Ross's theory, but Ross can argue that Rawls achieves system at the expense of absolutism, which many acknowledge to have counterintuitive results.

But it is not clear that Ross has a lock on the best representation of common-sense morality. It is relatively clear that most hedonistic utilitarians are reformers of common-sense morality (e.g., Bentham 1789; Mill 1863, 1843; Sidgwick 1907). These philosophers may not be moved (at the level of moral foundations) by claims that their view conflicts with common-sense morality. For their aim in part is to revise it. Ross gives hedonism short shrift because he thinks it obvious that pleasure is not the only thing that is intrinsically valuable (RG 17, 99; FE 65). He often argues that ideal utilitarianism, like hedonistic utilitarianism, can be dismissed because it is at odds with common-sense morality (RG 17–19, 38). Yet, it is far from clear that ideal utilitarianism is reformist like hedonistic or classical utilitarianism. The better way to represent the dispute between ideal utilitarians and Ross is over which view best represents common-sense moral thinking. It is certainly the case that the main proponents of ideal utilitarianism took themselves to be aiming to best represent common-sense morality (e.g., Rashdall 1907; Pickard-Cambridge 1932b 152; Johnson 1953).

As Ross conducts it, the main dispute between the two revolves around the issue of whether ideal utilitarians can make sense of the obligation to keep one's promises. Ross's view is that ‘to make a promise is not merely to adapt an ingenious device for promoting the general well-being; it is to put oneself in a new relation to one person in particular, a relation which creates a specifically new prima facie duty to him, not reducible to the duty of promoting the general well-being of society’ (RG 38). He employs the following example to illustrate his initial case (RG 34–35). Suppose that by fulfilling a promise to Edward you will produce 100 units of good for him but that by breaking the promise and doing something else that you have not promised to do you will produce 101 units of good for James. The ideal utilitarian view entails that it is wrong to fulfil the promise: we must benefit James. But this is not the verdict of common-sense morality. According to Ross, it takes a much greater disparity in value between the two to justify begging off on the promise (RG 35; FE 77, 90). In reply, the ideal utilitarian argues that the common-sense verdict may be captured by noting that breaking promises erodes mutual confidence and that keeping promises increases mutual confidence (RG 38). These goods and evils tip the balance in favour of keeping the promise. But Ross thinks this a lame response. There will no doubt be cases where all the benefits of breaking the promise will outweigh (though only very slightly) all the costs associated with breaking it, and in this case the ideal utilitarian will have to admit that it is obligatory to break the promise (RG 38). Ross thinks that this is not the verdict of common-sense morality.

In a set of engaging essays, W. A. Pickard-Cambridge pressed Ross on the issue of whether ideal utilitarianism was actually as at odds with common-sense morality as Ross suggested (Pickard-Cambridge 1932a, 1932b, 1932c). Pickard-Cambridge first argues that there are strong direct and indirect reasons for taking promises very seriously (Pickard-Cambridge 1932b 153–157). He further argues that ideal utilitarianism accounts better for our intuitions about the following kinds of cases:

  1. Chuck has promised Peter that he will replace a string on his violin by 4:00 tomorrow, but just before Chuck intends to fulfil the promise Peter contracts an illness that makes it impossible for him ever to use his violin. There appears to be no responsibility on Chuck's part to fulfil the promise. This is the verdict of the plain man and the verdict of the ideal utilitarian, but it is not the verdict that seems entailed by Ross's view (Pickard-Cambridge 1932b 158).
  2. A rich miser pretends to be a pauper in order to get Richard to agree to pay him $100. Richard takes pity on him, and he agrees to pay him the money in six month's time. Richard discovers a few months later through newspapers reports that the miser is a fraud. There again appears to be no responsibility to fulfil the promise. Again, this is the verdict of the plain man and the verdict of the ideal utilitarian, but it is not the verdict that seems entailed by Ross's view (Pickard-Cambridge 1932b 165–166).
  3. A poor man contacts Anne via the Internet asking her to please pay him $100.00 in six month's time. Anne agrees to give him the money. Three months later, before Anne has paid the money, the poor man wins the lottery and is rich. The ideal utilitarian says that there is now no reason to fulfil the promise and the plain man agrees, but this is not the verdict that is entailed by Ross's view (Pickard-Cambridge 1932b 166).

In response to (1), Ross argues that we must insist on ‘some common sense in the interpretation of the promise’ (FE 94; also 95, 96). Both Peter and Chuck assume that if by 3:00 Peter is rendered unable ever to use his violin, then the promise is null and void. But the ideal utilitarian may see a weakness here and urge that she can provide an interpretation and that her interpretation and its explanation fits more easily with common-sense morality. Peter and Chuck assume what they do because no good would otherwise come from insisting on the promise being fulfilled.

In reply to (2), Ross contends that the promise ‘arose out of conversation with the miser, which was conducted under the implied contract to tell each other the truth’ (FE 97). Therefore the promise is null and void. The difficulty with this reply is that to secure it Ross has to contend that the implied contract stipulates that we are to tell each other the whole truth or all of the truth, and it is not clear that this requirement is one to which the plain man subscribes. It is not obvious that when I sell you something I am required to tell you all the truths about the item for sale. The ideal utilitarian is in a better position to explain why in the case of the miser the implied contract to tell the truth requires that one not state that one is a beggar when one is not and why it does not require us to tell all of the truth in other cases. The contract is specified this way because this produces good outcomes.

In reply to (3), Ross contends initially that if Anne has ‘a very delicate sense of honour’, then she ought to consider paying the poor man on account of her carelessness in agreeing unconditionally in the first place (FE 97). This is not plausible. There is no reason to enrich an already rich person simply because of carelessness (of this sort). Ross further argues that what is promised is not that Anne pay $100.00; rather, what is promised is that she pay a poor man $100.00, and since the man in question is no longer poor, there is therefore no need to fulfil the promise (FE 97–98). But what drives this interpretation of the promise? The ideal utilitarian may argue that the reason we interpret the promise this way is that doing so promotes the good. Furthermore, the ideal utilitarian can argue that even without thinking of this interpretation of the promise we still believe that we have no or only very weak reasons to pay, and that they can offer the best explanation of this fact. They can also explain why this is (as Ross notes) a difficult issue to decide: there are utilitarian reasons on either side.

Pickard-Cambridge further argues that ideal utilitarianism gives the best explanation of the strength of a promise (1932b 159–163). Ross agrees that some promises are more binding than others, e.g., the promise to visit a sick friend is stronger than the promise to attend the theatre with friends (FE 100). He suggests that the former is stronger because of the value of what is being promised (FE 100). In discussing his view that a casual promise is less binding and a recent promise is more binding he adds that this is due to the fact that the way in which and the time at which a promise has been made ‘intensify the promiser's awareness of its existence and the promisee's expectation of its fulfilment’ (FE 101). These responses seem to play right into the hands of the ideal utilitarian: the promise is more binding in the first case because of the greater value at stake and in the second case because the expectation and the disappointment are greater, all of which are goods of the sort that the ideal utilitarian claims we need to balance in deciding what we ought all things considered to do.

Ross has one final reply to Pickard-Cambridge, using the following example. A is dying. He entrusts his property to B, on the strength of B's promise to give it to C. C does not know of A's intentions or B's promise. B's activities will not disappoint A or C, nor will his activities negatively effect the general mutual confidence. Suppose that D could make better use of the property than C. It follows on ideal utilitarianism that B ought to give the property to D. Ross thinks this breach of trust ‘outrageous’ (FE 105).

The version of ideal utilitarianism to which Pickard-Cambridge subscribes seems to entail that B has no reason to fulfil the promise to A. This is a problem for the view. However, Ross's own view seems to imply revision in this case. He argues that ‘when we consider ourselves bound…to fulfil a promise, we think of the fulfilment of the promise as the bringing into existence of some source of pleasure or satisfaction for the person to whom we have made the promise’ (RG 162). This suggests that the rightness of the promise depends on it producing some pleasure or satisfaction for A. But since A is dead when B fulfils the promise no pleasure or satisfaction can be brought into existence for A, implying that B has no obligation by Ross's lights to fulfil the promise. Ross might drop this requirement and suggest only that the fulfilment of a promise be ‘bonific’ for someone (e.g., C) (RG 36). This seems to put him at odds with the plain man in other cases. Consider a death-bed promise with a different content, that A be buried with C, his wife. Suppose that this promise is not bonific. Ross will have to say that there is no reason to fulfil it. Hence, he'll have to advocate revision to common-sense morality. Perhaps he can argue that his revision is more conservative than the revisions required by ideal utilitarianism. But this is a very thin difference, and may not be enough to give Ross the edge. Given these worries and the fact that ideal utilitarianism seems quite close to the plain man or common-sense morality in many of the other important cases, that it would entail that it is right to break the promise in the initial case above can hardly be considered a death blow.

The ideal utilitarian may not be satisfied with this outcome. Perhaps the more appropriate route for her is not to opt for revision to common-sense morality. For this may in the end give Ross a philosophical advantage, especially if he drops the claim that it is a necessary condition of act of promise keeping being right that it be ‘bonific’ or promote some good and if he can find satisfactory replies to Pickard-Cambridge's objections. Instead, perhaps the better strategy is to suggest that they can capture the importance of promise keeping to common-sense morality by holding that promise keeping is intrinsically valuable or at least that promise breaking is intrinsically evil (Johnson 1953, 1959; Ewing 1957, 1959; Brennan 1989; Shaver 2011). The general strategy is to subsume all of Ross's non-utilitarian duties in this way. This is a compelling response. To assess it, it is important to examine his theory of value.

4.2 The Good

In RG, Ross contends that four things are intrinsically good: justice (happiness apportioned to merit), pleasure[3], knowledge and virtue (or, ‘virtuous disposition and action, i.e. action, or disposition to act, from any one of certain motives, of which at all events the most notable are the desire to do one's duty, the desire to bring into being something that is good, and the desire to give pleasure or save pain to others’ (RG 134)) (RG 134–141). Virtue, knowledge and pleasure are states of mind, while justice is a relation between states of mind (RG 140).[4] These values are not of the same importance. Ross holds that virtue is the most important and that some virtuous motives are more important than others (e.g., the desire to do one's duty is more valuable than the desire to promote others’ pleasure) (RG 152, 153, 164, 166). Knowledge is the next most important of the values.[5] Knowledge is more important than right opinion, since the former has certainty which the latter lacks (RG 138–139, 146), and ‘knowledge of general principles is intellectually more valuable than knowledge of isolated matters of fact’ (RG 147). The least most valuable is pleasure (RG 152). It is not clear where to place justice in this hierarchy, since Ross says only that it is less valuable than virtue (RG 153–154). It is not implausible to think that it should be placed between (virtuous) knowledge and pleasure, and therefore that the values are ranked as follows: virtue, (virtuous) knowledge, justice and pleasure.

In FE, Ross defends a slightly different view. He appears to maintain again that there are four values: virtue, intellectual and aesthetic activities, justice and (others’) pleasure (FE 19, 73, 180, 262, 278, 288–289). In RG, Ross maintains that all intrinsic values are valuable in the same way: the goodness of good things is intrinsic to them (RG 115, 118, 132; also KT 11–12; OJ 119). But in FE he revises this view. He contends that virtue and intellectual activities are ‘fit objects of admiration’ or objects ‘worthy of admiration’ (FE 282–283). The goodness of these things is a ‘quality intrinsic to them’ (FE 278). The values of justice and pleasure are ‘worthy objects of satisfaction’ or things in which it is right to take satisfaction or an interest (FE 275, 278, 282, 283, 289). The goodness of these things is not intrinsic to them; rather, it is a relational property, which depends on our rightly taking an interest or rightly finding (some kind of) satisfaction in them (FE 278). This appears to follow from the fact that ‘while it is self-evident that the only ground on which a thing is worthy of admiration is that it is good in itself, it is not self-evident that the only ground on which a thing is worthy of our interest or liking is that it is good in itself’ (FE 279).[6] This distinction allows Ross to explain why only innocent pleasures or pleasures that are not undeserved or taken in the misfortune of others or in lust or in cruelty are good (RG 136–137; FE 271–272), and why only the pleasure of others is good and hence why we think that we have to promote only them (FE 74–75, 272, 276, 279, 283, 322).[7] The reason that only innocent pleasure is valuable is that only it is worthy of satisfaction, and the reason that only the pleasure of others is valuable is that only it is an object of ‘sympathetic satisfaction’ (FE 276). One's own pleasure is not an object of sympathetic satisfaction, since one cannot feel sympathy for oneself; instead, one's own pleasure is merely an inevitable object of satisfaction (FE 75).

That in FE Ross holds that there are four goods is controversial. It has been suggested that in FE Ross rejects the view that pleasure is intrinsically good (Stratton-Lake 2002a xli–xlii, 2002b 130). This is hard to accept. He repeatedly claims that the pleasure of others is good (FE 278, 279, 282, 283, 322; KT 11–12; AT 232).[8] He thinks we have a duty to promote the pleasure of others and that the basis of this judgement is that their pleasure is good (FE 283, 284, 288). Finally, it really would be contrary to the plain man's view and to reflective thinking to deny that pleasure is a good and that pain is an evil.[9] The view that Ross thinks that justice is good is also less clear. He often states that there are only three non-instrumental goods (FE 19, 180, 262, 278; KT 11–12; OJ 119, 120, 121). In early writings, he claims that justice is a requirement of duty not a value (OJ 123). However, since he suggests quite clearly at one point that he thinks that justice is good in the same sense that the pleasure of others is good it is not unreasonable to think that he holds that justice is a good (FE 288–289). He also suggests at one point that promise keeping is good in the same way that justice and pleasure are good (FE 289). But he more often rejects the claim that promise keeping is good (FE 141, 142), suggesting that not all things that are objects worthy of satisfaction are valuable.[10]

It is now possible to assess the second ideal utilitarian reply to Ross mentioned above. Some ideal utilitarians contend that his objections to the view may be overcome by arguing that promise keeping, reparation, and gratitude are non-instrumentally valuable. The most plausible argument of this variety states that Ross must accept that promise keeping is valuable (or at least that promise breaking is evil) because he accepts that knowledge and justice are valuable and there is no real distinction between these values and the value of keeping promises or the disvalue of breaking promises (Shaver 2011). The characterisation provided above of Ross's theory of value provides him with a defence. He seems to insist on any occasions that only states of mind or relations between states of mind have value. Promise keeping, reparation, and gratitude are not merely states of mind or relations between states of mind. Therefore, they cannot be good.

One worry is that knowledge is not merely a state of consciousness. In RG, Ross insists that knowledge has intrinsic value. He sometimes suggests this in FE. However, his considered view is that it is not knowledge but intellectual and aesthetic activities that have value (FE 19, 27, 73, 180, 262, 266, 267, 278, 282–283, 284, 290, 296; also OJ 119, 120, 121; KT 11-12). It is not unreasonable to think that Ross moved away from thinking that it is knowledge that has value and to thinking that it is intellectual (and aesthetic) activity that has value because only the latter is properly called a state of consciousness. This might be problematic for Ross. If he rejects the idea that knowledge is intrinsically valuable while accepting that intellectual activities are intrinsically valuable, he cannot account for the fact that knowledge appears to be more important than justified opinion (Shaver 2011). But Ross can argue that knowledge is more important because of its instrumental properties, e.g., it helps us better promote justice or morality or pleasure. A fortiori the claim that it is intellectual activities that are intrinsically good explains why some instances of knowledge are more important than others. Ross says that ‘different instances of this [intellectual] activity are good in proportion as they are conducted according to these principles’ (FE 270), i.e., principles discovered by logic. Because more philosophical or more general knowledge requires greater and more sophisticated use of ‘the principles discovered by logic’ (FE 270), it is better. The value of the intellectual activities explains the value of the knowledge.

But what about the fact that justice is an intrinsic value? It is not a state of consciousness; it is a relation between states of mind(RG 140). If Ross is willing to accept this as a good, why not accept that promise keeping, and so on, are good? It might be that he can still insist that justice is different from promise keeping, reparation, and gratitude because it is compounded from states of consciousness and that is why it and not these other things are good. However, perhaps the better reply is simply to drop justice from his list of values. He repeatedly contends that it is only states of mind that have value (OJ 118; RG 122, 106–107, 140; FE 259, 270; KT 21), and justice is not a state of mind. He can insist on this view and block the ideal utilitarian response. He is open to characterising justice as a requirement of duty rather than a value (FE 319), and he loses little by dropping it as a value. Further, he might argue that understanding justice as a moral requirement is the best way to think of it if one wants to capture what we think.[11] In this case, the burden of proof is on the ideal utilitarian.

Ross relies quite heavily on the Moorean isolation method to defend his value theory (Moore 1903). His value theory came under much less scrutiny than did his deontic theory, and therefore he did not see fit to consider monistic responses to it. This may in part be due to the fact that there is agreement amongst his main rivals—Moore, Rashdall, Pickard-Cambridge, Ewing, and Johnson—that value pluralism is true. This may also be due in part to the fact that he considered the main monistic rival—that is, hedonism—a dead end (RG 98; FE 65). But hedonism lives on (Feldman 2004; Mendola 2006; Crisp 2006; Bradley 2009). Therefore, it may be that Ross's value theory is in for a challenge that neither he nor his ideal utilitarian critics anticipated.

To get a taste of what this challenge may look like consider the following hedonistic reply to Ross's argument for the idea that virtue is intrinsically valuable. Hedonists hold pace Ross that while it is obvious that virtue is instrumentally good and vice is instrumentally bad, it is far from clear that the former is intrinsically good and the latter is intrinsically bad. In response, Ross asks us to imagine two worlds, W1 and W2. W1 and W2 include the same quantity of pleasure. However, W1 contains agents that are virtuous, who act from or who are disposed to act from the right motives, while W2 contains agents who are vicious, who act from or who are disposed to act from the wrong motives. Is not W1 preferable to W2? Ross thinks it is, and he says that what explains this is that virtue is intrinsically good (RG 134).

But the hedonist has a reply. The situation envisaged is impossible, for surely W1 would have more pleasure than W2 because typically virtuous people produce more pleasure than vicious people. Indeed, would not a world with virtuous people be more likely to continue to be filled with pleasure and lack the possibility of descending into chaos than a world with vicious people? Is not this ultimately the reason why we desire or prefer it? In response, Ross reminds us that not all pleasure springs from the actions of virtuous people and not all pain springs from actions of vicious (RG 134). Some issues from ‘the operation of natural laws’ (RG 134). Suppose, then, that there are two worlds, W1 and W2. W1 contains virtuous people and W2 contains vicious people, and that the two worlds contain equal amounts of pleasure, because although W1-type worlds usually contain more pleasure than W2-type worlds, W1's extra virtue-generated pleasure is offset by ‘a much greater incidence of disease’, making the worlds equal in pleasure. Ross contends that it is still the case that the virtuous world, W1, is better than W2.

This is a good response, but the hedonist has a rejoinder. Would not W1 be on the whole better (hedonistically speaking) in the long run because of the virtuous people? Would not W1 be a place where it is more likely to be the case that a cure is found or where it is more likely that pain is treated effectively and sympathetically or where it is more likely to remain stable enough to handle the disease and illness? Ross may rely on strategies that are similar to the ones he adopts against the ideal utilitarian's attempt to show that she can explain the importance of promise keeping (RG 38). But it is clear that proponents of Ross's view of value may well have to contend with arguments of this variety given the recent resurgence of hedonism.

5. Moral Epistemology

How do we acquire moral and axiological knowledge? Ross maintains that ‘both in mathematics and in ethics we have certain crystal-clear intuitions from which we build up all that we can know about the nature of numbers and the nature of duty’ (FE 144). Our knowledge of the basic moral and axiological propositions which are the object of our moral intuitions is non-inferential (OJ 121, 123; RG 29, 146; FE 144, 172, 262, 320). They are non-inferentially knowable because they are self-evident or knowable on the basis of an understanding alone (RG 20n1, 29; FE 320). For example, that we have a responsibility to keep our promises is self-evident. It is by a process of reflection on this proposition that we come to apprehend that we have this responsibility. Ross thinks we can trust our moral apprehensions, and since apprehension is a matter of knowledge, and knowledge implies certainty, he is certain that we have the above responsibilities and that certain things are intrinsically valuable (RG 146, 29, 30; KT 42; cf. Audi 2004).

That our responsibilities are self-evident does not entail that they are obvious to everyone who reflects on them. Ross maintains that a responsibility is self-evident ‘not in the sense that it is evident from the beginning of our lives, or as soon as we attend to the proposition for the first time, but in the sense that when we have reached sufficient mental maturity and have given sufficient attention to the proposition it is evident without any need of proof, or of evidence beyond itself. It is self-evident just as a mathematic axiom, or the validity of a form of inference, is evident’ (RG 29; also 12, 32; KT 42). The analogy with mathematics is instructive, for we acquire our moral knowledge in the same way we acquire knowledge of mathematical axioms. We apprehend that 2+2 = 4 by apprehending that 2+2 matches makes 4 matches and that 2+2 balls makes 4 balls, and so on. We apprehend the algorithm in the particular cases after repeated exposure to particular instances of its application, by a process of intuitive induction (FE 170). We apprehend that it is prima facie right to keep promises by apprehending that it is prima facie right to fulfill this or that particular promise. ‘What comes first in time is the apprehension of the self-evident prima facie rightness of an individual act of a particular type. From this we come by reflection to apprehend the self-evident general principle of prima facie duty’ (RG 33; also FE 170).

How do we decide what we ought to do, all things considered, in some particular circumstance? What is the relationship between the responsibilities we have and the ‘actual or absolute duty to do one particular act in particular circumstances’ (RG 28)? Our self-evident responsibilities are not ‘principles by the immediate application of which our duty in particular circumstances can be deduced’ (FE 84; also 169; OJ 122, 127). Rather, one determines what one ought to do all things considered, that is, one's actual duty or one's duty proper, by reference to ‘all the morally significant kinds it [the act] is an instance of’ (RG 20; italics in original; also FE 84, 186; OJ 126–127). What one has most responsibility to do or what is most suitable all things considered ‘belongs to an act in virtue of its whole nature and of nothing less than this’ (RG 28; also 33, 132).

We never know what we ought to do all things considered. Instead, we have a ‘considered opinion’ or ‘probable opinion’ regarding what we ought all things considered to do in a particular situation (RG 19, 30, 31, 33; FE 189, 190, 191; OJ 122, 123, 127). An example will help us here. Imagine that I can help my neighbour with his gardening project and this will produce a lot of good for both of us. I have also promised you that I will meet you to discuss an assignment, but this produces less good than helping my neighbour. Ross says that in this case we have to balance the two responsibilities. He thinks that typically the requirement to keep one's promises is more stringent than the requirement to benefit other people (RG 19). In such situations what you ought to do is that thing ‘of all those possible for the agent in the circumstances, [that has]…the greatest balance of prima facie rightness, in those respects in which they are prima facie right, over their prima facie wrongness, in those respects in which they are prima facie wrong’ (RG 41; also RG 46). The act which is one's actual duty or duty proper is the one for which one is most responsible or to which the weightier of one's responsibilities attach (FE 85; RG 41–42). ‘This sense of our particular duty in particular circumstances, preceded and informed by the fullest reflection we can bestow on the act in all its bearings, is highly fallible, but it is the only guide we have to our duty’ (RG 42). In the end, the decision regarding what to do, to use Aristotle's phrase, ‘rests with perception’ (RG 42; OJ 127; Aristotle1109b23, 1126b4). It is important to note that all of the responsibilities have a valence, positive or negative, and this valence persists even when a responsibility is outweighed by weightier responsibilities.

This epistemology has been attacked from a variety of different angles. One main worry is that there is very little agreement in intuitions, and this suggests that there is no fact of the matter as to what has value or what one is responsible for. Ross concedes that there is a lot of disagreement. His response begins by noting that a lot of moral diversity rests not on ‘disagreement about fundamental moral principles, but partly on differences in the circumstances of different societies, and partly on different views which people hold, not on moral questions but on questions of fact’ (FE 18). He thinks that most of the differences concern media axiomata, i.e., attempts to apply general principles to particular circumstances, which rest on different circumstances or different factual beliefs (FE 18–19). About these, he says that intuitionists must have an open mind (FE 190).

There are many differences that cannot be explained away in this fashion, however (FE 19). There are differences as to the ‘comparative worth of different goods’ (FE 19) and as to the stringency of the responsibilities Ross endorses (FE 186–188). These disagreements should not, he thinks, undermine our confidence that there is objective moral truth. It is very hard to see a resolution to these problems. He says that despite changes in scientific theories there is a sense that science progresses toward the truth. The same is true in ethics. There is no reason to ‘doubt that man progresses fairly steadily towards moral truth as he does towards scientific’ (FE 20). The difficulty with this response is that whereas in scientific matters there is an independent way of establishing progress, there is no such independent or seemingly independent way of establishing this in ethics. Recent research in the social sciences on moral judgement should not leave us confident (Greene 2008; Singer 2005).

The problems with Ross's moral epistemology are compounded by the fact that he thinks that the principles of his framework best reflect the main elements of common-sense moral thinking, and that this is necessary to an acceptable moral theory. This threatens to make his position appear parochial (Hare 1971). He is aware of this worry. He replies by noting that the number of principles that intuitionism endorses is small in number and general in content and that this leaves room to reject much of what is commonly taken to be right (FE 190). This seems like the right kind of move to make. However, it puts him in a rather awkward position. If it really is true that the number is small and that it is possible therefore to reject much of what is commonly recognized to be morally required, then the position has a more reformist edge, and to the extent that it is reformist it is more rather than less like the other views that Ross rejects. In this case, it makes it much more difficult for him to fault his rivals for not capturing common-sense morality. If he attempts to move more toward the plain man's view, then although he can more easily raise objections to ideal utilitarianism and other views, he is much more likely to lose his critical element and therefore fend off the charge of parochialism. The point may be made another way. The more general and less robust his list of responsibilities and goods the less likely the charge of parochialism may stick, but it is also less likely that the view is as close to common sense as he suggests, in which case that his opponents deviate from it to some extent is not a mark against them or at least cannot be used by Ross as a mark against them.

6. Moral Metaphysics

Like many in his time, Ross took pains to undermine various definitions of moral terms. He draws a distinction between naturalistic and non-naturalistic definitions. The former are ‘definitions which claim to define an ethical term without using any other ethical term’ (FE 6). The latter are definitions which attempt ‘to define one ethical term by the aid of another’ (FE 6; cf. 42). Ross rejects all naturalistic definitions of moral terms, including ‘right’ and (intrinsic) ‘good’. In RG, he argues (following Moore 1912 and Sidgwick 1907) that the moral terms ‘right’ and ‘ought’ are incapable of definition: ‘right’ is an ‘irreducible notion’ (RG 12). In FE, he suggests again that ‘right’ is indefinable (FE 42), though he is sympathetic to the idea that ‘right’ is definable in terms of ‘suitable’ (FE 52–55). On this view, ‘this act is right’ means ‘this act has “the greatest amount of suitability possible in the circumstances”’ (FE 53; also 55). This is not a naturalist definition, since ‘suitability’ is itself a ‘unique and indefinable’ ethical notion (FE 146; also 159). In RG, Ross appears to reject all naturalistic attempts to define ‘good’ (RG 78ff.). He is in particular keen to impugn views that provide relational accounts of ‘good’; that is, views that define it in terms of some relation to a mental state, e.g., desire. His view appears to be that ‘goodness is a quality which can no more be defined in terms of anything other than itself, than can the quality of the sensation which we describe as being one of “seeing yellow”’(RG 86). In FE, he seems to affirm the view that ‘good’ is indefinable (FE 262), though again he seems sympathetic to a non-naturalistic definition, according to which ‘good’ is definable in terms of ‘admirable’ or ‘commendable’ (FE 271, 283). He says that this sense of ‘good’ applies only to things that are intrinsically good in the sense of being objects worthy of admiration, and (as noted above) only virtue and intellectual activity are worthy of admiration (FE 283). The notion of ‘good’ as applied to the goods of pleasure and justice can be defined relationally. These goods are not objects worthy of admiration but rather fit objects of satisfaction. Both notions of good are in a sense definable, but the definitions are non-natural: in both cases ‘good’ is defined in terms of ‘worthiness’ or ‘rightness’ (FE 279, 282).

Ross suggests a number of arguments against various (naturalistic and non-naturalistic) definitions of moral terms. He relies in part on the following kind of argument, which is directed at Moore (RG 8). If ‘right’ and ‘being productive of the greatest good in the circumstances’ mean the same thing, then it is not the case that it is intelligible that the proposition ‘the “right act” just is “the act productive of the greatest good in the circumstances”’ should have been denied and maintained ‘with so much fervour; for we do not fight for or against analytic propositions’ (RG 8). It is intelligible that these propositions should have been denied and maintained with so much fervour. Therefore, it is not the case that ‘right’ and ‘productive of the greatest good in the circumstances’ mean the same thing. This argument can be generalised to reject the usual suspects, e.g., ‘right’ means ‘approved of by me’ or ‘right’ means ‘approved of by the majority of society’, and so on. But it is not the best argument, since we may well fight over analytic propositions, especially when they are opaque or unobvious.

Ross seems to acknowledge this sort of worry. He writes that ‘the fact that we accept some definition as correct shows that the term did somehow stand for a complex of elements; yet the fact that we are for some time in doubt about whether the term is analysable, and if so, what the correct analysis is, shows that this complex of elements was not distinctly present to our mind before, or during, the search for a definition’ (RG 92–93). In reply, he says that the only way to rebut the claim that ‘right’ and ‘good’ are definable (naturalistically) is to examine ‘all the definitions that possess any initial plausibility’ (RG 93). To these we should apply two tests (FE 259; RG 93). First, we should determine whether ‘the definition applies to all things to which the term applies, and to no others’ (FE 259; also RG 93). Second, we should ask whether the proposed definition expresses ‘explicitly what we had implicitly in mind when we used the term’ (FE 259; also RG 93). Using these tools, Ross rejects (among others) the position that ‘this act is right’ means ‘all or most men…react to the act with a feeling of approval’ (FE 24). We often judge that an act is right even when we know that we are alone in holding this view (FE 25).

These are not the only arguments on which Ross relies. Against the claim that ‘right’ means ‘awakes in me the emotion of approval’ (FE 22), he argues that it is unable to explain ‘the possibility of difference of opinion on the rightness of acts’ (FE 24). On this view, if I say ‘incest is impermissible’ and you say ‘incest is permissible’ we are not disagreeing, since all I am saying is ‘incest awakes in me the emotion of disapproval’ and all you are saying is ‘incest awakes in me the emotion of approval’, two statements that appear to be ‘perfectly compatible’ with each other (FE 24). But we want to say that the two statements are not compatible. Ross gives the same argument against the claim that ‘X is good’ means ‘I have a certain feeling toward X’. If I say ‘X is good’ and you say ‘X is bad’, then you are saying that you have a certain (negative) feeling toward X and I am saying that I have a certain (positive) feeling toward X, two statements that seem to be compatible with each other. Yet, he urges, ‘if anything is clear, it is that we do suppose ourselves to be making incompatible statements about the object’ (RG 83).

Ross also appears to reject various analyses of moral terms in order to preserve a certain way of conducting moral philosophy (Shaver 2007 286, 295). He notes that ‘there is a system of moral truth, as objective as all truth must be, which, and whose implications, we are interested in discovering’ (RG 15; also 20, 29; KT 60). The discovery of these truths is not a matter of scientific (empirical) investigation. Ethical truths are not discovered by ‘mere observation’ (FE 7; also 168). Instead, they are ‘grasped by an intuitive act of human reason’ (FE 3). ‘The use of the senses, and the physical sciences, give us no propositions in which ‘right’ or ‘obligatory’ occurs as a term’ (KT 87). There are ‘two types of predicate—those that can be discovered by experience to belong to their subjects, and those that can be discovered by insight, and let us grant that rightness belongs to the second class’ (KT 81). In science, ‘sense-experience…furnishes…real data’ (RG 40). In ethics, ‘no such appeal is possible. We have no more direct way of access to the facts about rightness and goodness and about what things are right or good, than by thinking about them’ (RG 40; emphasis added; also 82). To entrench this idea he draws analogies between mathematic and logical knowledge and ethical knowledge (RG 29, 30, 32; KT 42, 85; FE 320). He is fan of synthetic a priori truths in ethics (and elsewhere) (FE 35–36; also 320). Since it might be possible to arrive at ethical knowledge by means of (mere) experience if moral terms were reducible to natural terms, this provides Ross with an incentive to show that no such reduction is possible. He wants in short to protect a moral methodology that prizes appeal to what ‘we’ think, the thoughts of the ‘best and most enlightened’ (FE 172), consensus amongst experts (OJ 119–120; FE 191) and various kinds of thought experiments. Indeed, it has been suggested that through the use of these tools it is possible to demonstrate that though ‘right’ is not synonymous with a natural property it nonetheless refers to some natural property, e.g., what has the greatest balance of justice, beneficence, fidelity, and so on, over injustice, non-maleficence and infidelity, and so on (Shaver 2007 289). (This may be controversial if such notions as ‘justice’ are incapable of complete naturalization. If complete naturalization is not an option, then Ross may be forced to endorse a less palatable metaphysics.)

Ross holds that the basic claims of morality express ‘facts which are self-evidently necessary’ (FE 320; also 262). Are these objective facts of a special kind? The standard suggestion is that for Ross moral facts are non-natural facts or non-natural properties (Stratton-Lake 2002a xxi; Frankena 1963 86–87; 1973 103). It is not clear that he actually holds this view. He says very little about the nature of moral facts except (perhaps unhelpfully) to compare them to mathematical and logical facts. He does not appear to infer from the fact that naturalistic definitions of moral terms fail that therefore the terms refer to distinct properties. His focus is almost entirely on definitions of ‘right’ and (intrinsic) ‘good’. His concern is with what ‘we have in mind’ not with properties (FE 13, 42), though, problematically, he often refers to ‘good’ as a ‘quality’ or ‘characteristic’ or ‘property’ (RG 82, 87, 88, 110, 122; FE 278, 279). He writes that ‘the difference between goodness or value and such attributes as yellowness is there whereas the latter are differentiae…of their possessors, the former is a property (i.e. a consequential attribute) of them’ (RG 121; italics in original). It is not clear that Ross intends this view to be an inference from his arguments against naturalistic or other analyses. That he offers no explicit argument to this effect suggests that he likely did not intend the inference (cf. Stratton-Lake 2002a), and he nowhere rules out that moral properties are natural properties. At any rate, he does not need to make this inference to achieve the aims he has in rebutting the various definitions he discusses. The arguments he uses are sufficient to preserve (in his view) plausible moral semantics, moral disagreement, and his moral methodology. This should please the adherents of this view, though it still leaves Ross with the task of making sense of the nature of moral truth if it is not to be understood as correspondence to the moral facts.

Ross's appeal to self-evidence and his defence of the synthetic a priori may seem problematic to many, though recent defences of these views suggest that their fortunes are improving (Stratton-Lake 2002a, 2002b; Audi 1996, 2004; Crisp 2002; Parfit 2011). To defend himself, Ross might simply eschew appeal to self-evidence and certainty with respect to intuitions about general principles and replace them with appeal to moral beliefs of high reliability or to considered convictions about moral claims (Griffin 1996; Rawls 1971; Hooker 2000). This seems to give him what he needs methodologically. The appeal to considered convictions allows him the ability to say, for example, that we know directly that pain is bad and that it is wrong to harm others without good reason; in addition, he can avoid the defects of coherence theories of justification (FE 141). This (importantly) puts him on the same level as almost all moral theorists working today. It is less clear that Ross is able to divest himself of synthetic a prior truths. But if his endorsement of the synthetic a priori truths is one way of securing the standard way of doing moral philosophy, which involves appeal to thought-experiments, intuition, what we think, and so on, it is more difficult to reject. It is more difficult to reject still if we accept such claims in areas outside ethics and if we are not keen on (radical forms of) empiricism.

7. Ross's Contemporary Importance

Ross's contemporary importance in ethics rests on the fact that he articulates one of the most plausible forms of deontology. He outlines a view that attempts to avoid the alleged deficiencies of utilitarianism without embracing the alleged excesses of Kantianism. Indeed, it serves as an important source of inspiration for those dissatisfied with these positions. That these are found by many to be uninspiring explains the recent resurgence of Ross's view in ethics and applied ethics (Audi 2004; Beauchamp and Childress 2008; Stratton-Lake 2011b). Ross also outlines a moral epistemology that is distinct from the coherentist reflective equilibrium that has held sway over moral philosophy for the last forty years. He relies on the idea that at the core of ethics there are certain self-evident propositions that are made true by moral facts, and which can be discovered by reflection on what we think about moral and axiological questions. Those dissatisfied with the standard model for doing moral philosophy but who at the same time find themselves attracted to the idea that ethical theories should capture the main elements of common-sense morality do well to consult Ross's unique contribution to moral epistemology.


Primary Sources

[OJ] “The Basis of Objective Judgements in Ethics,” International Journal of Ethics, 37 (1927): 113–127.
[RG] The Right and the Good, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1930.
[FE] Foundations of Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1939.
[KT] Kant's Ethical Theory, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1954.
[AT] Aristotle, sixth edition, London: Routledge, 1995.

Other Papers (in ethics) by Ross

  • Ross, W. D., 1928, “Is There a Moral End?,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society: Supplementary Volumes, 8: 91–98.
  • Ross, W. D., 1928–29, “The Nature of a Morally Good Action,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 29: 251–279.
  • Ross, W. D., 1929, “The Ethics of Punishment,” Journal of Philosophical Studies, 4: 205–211.

Secondary Sources

  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, W. D. Ross, trans., in The Basic Works of Aristotle, R. McKeon (ed.), New York: Random House, 1941.
  • Audi, Robert, 1996, “Intuitionism, Pluralism, and the Foundations of Ethics,” in Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, W. Sinnott-Armstrong and M. Timmons (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 101–136.
  • –––, 2004, The Good in the Right: A Theory of Intuition and Intrinsic Value, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Beauchamp, Tom L. & Childress, James F., 2008, Principles of Biomedical Ethics, sixth edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bentham, Jeremy, 1996 [1789], An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, J. H. Burns & H. L. A. Hart (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bradley, Ben, 2009, Well-being and Death, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brennan, Susan, 1989, “Ross, Promises, and the Intrinsic Value of Acts,” Lyceum, 1: 43–56.
  • Broad, C. D., 1940, Review of Foundations of Ethics by W. D. Ross, Mind, 49: 228–239.
  • Clark, G. N., 1971, “Sir David Ross: 1877–1971,” Proceedings of the British National Academy, 57: 525–543.
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consequentialism | ethics: deontological | Moore, George Edward | moral non-naturalism | pluralism | Prichard, Harold Arthur


The author wishes to thank Robert Shaver, Thomas Hurka, David Phillips, and John Cooper for helpful written comments on previous drafts of this entry.

Copyright © 2012 by
Anthony Skelton <askelto4@uwo.ca>

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