Intuitionism in Ethics

First published Mon Dec 15, 2014

Ethical Intuitionism was one of the dominant forces in British moral philosophy from the early 18th century till the 1930s. It fell into disrepute in the 1940s, but towards the end of the twentieth century Ethical Intuitionism began to re-emerge as a respectable moral theory. It has not regained the dominance it once enjoyed, but many philosophers, including Robert Audi, Jonathan Dancy, David Enoch, Michael Huemer, David McNaughton, and Russ Shafer-Landau, are now happy to be labelled intuitionists.

The most distinctive features of ethical intuitionism are its epistemology and ontology. All classical intuitionists maintain that basic moral propositions are self-evident,[1] and that moral properties are non-natural properties. So the discussion of intuitionism will focus on just these two features. Some philosophers claim that ethical pluralism (the view that there is an irreducible plurality of basic moral principles, and that there is no strict priority of any one principle over another) is an essential feature of intuitionist thought, but not all intuitionists are pluralists, e.g., Sidgwick and Moore, so this feature will not be discussed here.

1. Intuitionist epistemology

1.1 Intuition

One of the most distinctive features of Ethical Intuitionism is its epistemology. All of the classic intuitionists maintained that basic moral propositions are self-evident—that is, evident in and of themselves—and so can be known without the need of any argument. Price distinguishes intuition from two other grounds of knowledge—namely, immediate consciousness or feeling on the one hand, and argumentation, on the other. Argumentation, or deduction, is knowledge that is ultimately derived from what is immediately apprehended, either by sensation or by the understanding. Immediate consciousness, or feeling, is the mind's awareness of its own existence and mental states (Price, 1758/1969, 159). It shares immediacy with intuition, but unlike intuition does not have as its object a self-evident proposition. Such immediate self-consciousness is immediate apprehension by sensation. Intuition is immediate apprehension by the understanding. It is the way that we apprehend self-evident truths, general and abstract ideas, “and anything else we may discover, without making any use of any process of reasoning” (1758/1969, 159).

The claim that intuition is immediate apprehension by the understanding suggests a notion of intuition in Price that is more akin to current accounts of intuitions as intellectual seemings or presentations (Bealer 1998; Chudnoff 2013). Intellectual seemings are the intellectual analogue of perceptual seemings. Just as certain things can seem perceptually to be a certain way, e.g., coloured, or straight, so certain propositions can seem to be true, or present themselves to the mind as true. These seemings are not beliefs, for something can seem true even though one does not believe it, e.g., it may seem true that there are more natural numbers than even numbers, but we know that is false, so do not believe it.

Similarly, on Price's view, an intuition isn't a belief with certain characteristics, such as being pre-theoretical, non-derivative, firmly held, etc. Beliefs aren't immediate apprehensions of anything, though they may be based on such apprehensions. One might be tempted to think that perceptual beliefs, such as the belief that there is a cat asleep in front of me, are immediate apprehensions, but that would be to confuse the perceptual apprehension of the cat with the belief based on that apprehension. Beliefs like this, perceptual beliefs, are based on the immediate experience (sensory intuition) I have of a cat sleeping in front of me; they are not the sensory intuition itself. As Price understands it, then, an intellectual intuition is something closely akin to an experiential presentation, or seeming.

The main difference between early intuitionists' notion of intuition and intellectual seemings is that the latter is standardly regarded as non-factive—that is, an intuition that $p$ in this sense does not entail that $p$. An apprehension that $p$ does sound factive, however. One cannot apprehend something that is not there to be apprehended. What is present to the mind in apprehension is the thing itself, not our representation of it. So whereas modern epistemologists regard intuition, understood as an intellectual seeming or presentation, as something analogous to the non-factive notion of a perceptual experience, it looks like some classic intuitionists regarded intuition as analogous to the factive notion of a perception. The virtue of the modern, more modest notion of intuition is that it allows that intuition is fallible. But in doing this it loses the appeal of the direct realist account Price seems to work with of certain propositions or facts being immediately present to the mind.

There is scope for intuitionists to be disjunctivist about such intuitions. They could maintain that some intuitions are apprehensions, and some are intellectual seemings. Subjectively we cannot tell one from the other, but they are, one might argue, very different states.

It is not clear that all intuitionists understand intuitions on this perceptual or quasi-perceptual model, as many do not use this notion at all. W. D. Ross, for example, uses the notion of apprehension, but he tends to base his moral theory largely on our considered moral convictions. “[T]he moral convictions of thoughtful and well-educated people are the data of ethics, just as sense-perceptions are the data of natural science” (1930/2002, 41). Convictions are, however, a certain type of belief rather than an intellectual apprehension, or seeming. So it looks like we can find two notions of intuition in intuitionist thought—one understood as an intellectual seeming or apprehension, and the other as a pre-theoretical, non-inferred, firmly held belief or conviction.[2] Which one they opt for makes a difference to their epistemology.

Like other epistemic foundationalists, Price insists that all reasoning and knowledge must ultimately rest on propositions that are not inferred from other premises. For ethical intuitions this non-inferred basis of knowledge is self-evident truth grasped by intuition.[3] It is, however, important to keep intuition and self-evidence separate for a number of reasons. First, a conscious intuition is a certain mental state, either a non-inferential belief or an intellectual seeming. But a self-evident proposition is not a conscious mental state. Second, intuition is a way in which we are aware of self-evident propositions, whereas self-evident propositions are the things that can be known in this way. Such propositions could (pace Price) be believed without an intuition of them. As I will explain later, one might have some argument that leads one to believe a self-evident proposition, or one may believe it on the basis of authoritative testimony. Thirdly, it may turn out that things other than self-evident propositions can be grasped by intuition. For instance, we may have moral intuitions about concrete cases, such as various trolley cases (see below) and various anti-consequentialist counter-examples. But it is not obvious that the contents of these intuitions are self-evident propositions; whether they are may depend on how self-evidence is understood.

Price claims that self-evident truths are “incapable of proof” (1758/1969, 160).[4] Most classical intuitionists endorse this view, although Ross is arguably an exception. This is easily missed, for he states at one point that self-evident moral propositions “cannot be proved, but … just as certainly need no proof” (1930/2002, 30). But elsewhere in The Right and the Good he makes only the more restricted claim that such propositions do not need any proof,[5] and despite the fact that he sometimes makes the further claim that they cannot receive any proof by means of argument, this further claim does not seem to reflect his considered view.[6] Evidence that it does not can be found in an article written three years before the publication of The Right and the Good where he explicitly states that “the fact that something can be inferred does not prove that it cannot be seen intuitively” (1927, 121). If he thinks that some proposition can be inferred from (justified by) other propositions and be self-evident, he clearly thinks that its being self-evident does not rule out the possibility of a proof. In any case there is nothing in the notion of a self-evident proposition that rules out justification or argument for that proposition. A self-evident proposition is one that we can be justified in believing without an argument, but this does not rule out the possibility that there may be such an argument, or justification, or that the proposition may be believed on that basis.[7] Since such arguments are not needed for us to be justified in believing a self-evident proposition, they are what may be called epistemically supererogatory.

Although there can be an argument for a self-evident proposition, if intuitions are understood as intellectual seemings, then intuitions cannot be justified. This is easily missed, as we tend to identify intuitions with the beliefs based on them, rather than with the intellectual seemings on which those beliefs are based. But if we take an intuition to be an intellectual seeming, then intuitions cannot be justified any more than a perceptual seeming can. Take a perceptual seeming, such as it's seeming that the wall is green. This perceptual seeming could be explained in various ways, but it is odd to suppose that this experience could be justified by anything (which is not to rule out the possibility that the belief based on it could be justified). This is because we are in a certain sense passive in relation to such seemings. Similarly, if some proposition presents itself to the mind as true, then this presentation cannot be justified, although the belief based on it can be (and we might add, the proposition intuited can be), for its seeming to be true is not a conclusion we could arrive at: it's just how certain propositions present themselves to the mind.

It may be that the reason that Ross switches between making the stronger claim that self-evident propositions cannot be justified, and the weaker claim that they need no justification, is that he had in mind a belief in some self-evident proposition when he said they could be justified, and our intuition (apprehension) of that proposition when he said that they could not.

1.2 Self-evidence

The notion of a self-evident proposition is a term of art in intuitionist thought, and needs to be distinguished from certain common sense understandings with which it may easily be conflated. The first thing to note is that a self-evident proposition is not the same as an obvious truth. To begin with, obviousness is relative to certain individuals or groups. What is obvious to you may not be obvious to me. But self-evidence is not relative in this way. Although a proposition may be evident to one person but not to another, it could not be self-evident to one person, but not to another. A proposition is just self-evident, not self-evident to someone. Secondly, there are many obvious truths that are not self-evident. Certain well-known empirical truths, for example, that if I drop a heavy object it will fall, or that the world is bigger than a football, are obvious but not self-evident. There are also self-evident propositions that may not be obvious to everyone, at least prior to reflection, e.g., that if all $A$s are $B$s and no $B$s are $C$s then no $C$s are $A$s.

What then is it for a proposition to be self-evident? Locke says that a self-evident proposition is one that “carries its own light and evidence with it, and needs no other proof: he that understands the terms, assents to it for its own sake” (1969, 139). Price tells us that a self-evident proposition is immediate, and needs no further proof, and goes on to say that self-evident propositions need only be understood to gain assent 1758/1969, 187). Ross writes, a self-evident proposition is “evident without any need of proof, or of evidence beyond itself” (1930/2002, 29), and Broad describes self-evident propositions as being “such that a rational being of sufficient insight and intelligence could see it to be true by merely inspecting it and reflecting on its terms and their mode of combination” (1936, 102–3). These passages may have led to the standard understanding of a self-evident proposition that one finds in Shafer-Landau (2003, 247) and Audi (2001, 603; see also Audi 2008, 478). Audi, for instance, writes that self evident propositions are “truths such that (a) adequately understanding them is sufficient justification for believing them …, and (b) believing them on the basis of adequately understanding them entails knowing them” (2008, 478).

One should distinguish knowing a self-evident proposition from knowing that that proposition is self-evident. The former does not imply the latter. Someone might know some self-evident proposition, such as that if $A$ is better than $B$ and $B$ is better than $C$ then $A$ is better than $C$, but lack the concept of self-evidence, so couldn't know that that proposition is self-evident. One might even know a self-evident proposition whilst endorsing a theory according to which no propositions are self-evident.

Given that a proposition may seem to be self-evident when it is not, we have to have some way of discriminating the merely apparent from the real ones. Sidgwick's criteria may be regarded as helping us do this. To be sure that a proposition is self-evident it must:

  • (1) be clear and distinct
  • (2) be ascertained by careful reflection
  • (3) be consistent with other self-evident truths
  • (4) attract general consensus (1874/1967, 338)

If some apparent self-evident proposition does not have all of these features then we should reduce our confidence that it is a genuine self-evident proposition. It is a striking feature of Sidgwick's own principles that they do not pass this test. But whether we can come to know that some proposition is self-evident in this, or some other way, the point is that we do not need to know that some proposition is self-evident to know that it is true.

According to the standard account, a self-evident proposition is one which an adequate understanding of the proposition justifies us in believing it. But all that Locke and Price say is that we need an understanding of a self-evident proposition in order to believe it, and presumably to be justified in believing it. They do not say that our understanding provides that justification, or that when we believe it, we believe it on the basis of our understanding. Indeed the idea that it is our understanding of a self-evident proposition that justifies us in believing it may sound odd to many people. Certainly if one assumes that if $p$ justifies belief in $q$, then $p$ is a reason to believe $q$, it is hard to see how our understanding justifies us in believing the proposition understood, for no one can claim that their understanding of a proposition gives them a reason to believe it. This is because the sort of thing that can provide reasons to believe that $p$ are either evidence that $p$ or, more controversially, pragmatic considerations, such as that believing that $p$ will have certain good consequences. An adequate understanding of a proposition is neither of these things. The fact that I understand some proposition is not something that would make believing that proposition have any good consequences, and my understanding is not evidence for the truth of the proposition understood. Evidence is standardly understood as something that makes the proposition it is evidence for more probable. But an adequate understanding of a proposition does not make that proposition more probable, so is not evidence for it. Since an understanding of a proposition is neither a pragmatic nor an evidential consideration, it is not the right sort of thing to give us a reason to believe that proposition, and so not the right sort of thing to justify that belief.

But the oddity of supposing that it is our understanding that justifies us in believing a self-evident proposition does not rest on the assumption that justification is to be defined as reason to believe, or that what gives us reason to believe that $p$ is evidence for the truth of $p$ or some benefit of believing this. If you ask someone why they believe some apparently self-evident proposition, such as that agony is bad, it would be very surprising if they replied by saying “I believe it because I understand it”.

Given these worries about whether our understanding can justify us in believing the proposition understood, we should ask whether there is anything else that might justify us in believing a self-evident proposition. If intuitions are beliefs, then our intuition that p cannot justify us in believing $p$. The same is true if intuitions are inclinations to believe, as Williamson (2000) and Sosa (2007) (see also Earlenbaugh and Molyneux, 2009) claim, for the fact that I am inclined to believe some proposition is no justification for believing it. But if intuitions are intellectual seemings, then they may be able to justify the beliefs based on them. For with this understanding of an intuition we can say that what justifies our belief in a self-evident proposition is that it seems true, just as we might say that what justifies us in having some experiential belief is that perceptually, the world seems to be that way. Why do you believe the wall is green? Because it seems green. Why do you think that agony is bad? Because it seems bad.

If intuitions rather than our understanding of their content justify us in believing that content, then intuitionists should understand a self-evident proposition as follows:

A self-evident proposition is one of which a clear intuition is sufficient justification for believing it, and for believing it on the basis of that intuition.

An adequate understanding is necessary for one to be justified in this way, but this is not because understanding provides justification; rather, it is because it is needed to get the proposition clearly in view, and so enables a clear intuition of it. But it is the intuition that justifies, not the understanding.

Whether this account helps intuitionists will depend on a more general metaphilosophical debate about the role of intuitions in philosophy, and whether intuitions justify. There is a difference, though. The more general debate is about whether intuitions provide evidence for believing or rejecting certain theories, whereas the intuitionist needs intuitions to justify beliefs with the same content. Secondly, there might be reason to think that although intuitions can provide justification in other areas of philosophy, they cannot do that in morality. For instance, one might think that people's moral intuitions vary too much to be reliable indicators of truth, or that in morality emotions can distort our intuitions.

Some recent intuitionists have shied away from the view that certain moral propositions are self-evident and have, instead, argued that all the intuitionist needs is the claim that intuitions, understood as intellectual seemings, provide non-inferential justification for some of our moral beliefs (Huemer 2005, 106 and Bedke 2008—though Bedke rejects intuitionism). As these authors view things, claiming that some at least of the propositions intuited are self-evident does not gain intuitionists anything.

1.3 Disagreement

Many philosophers think that pervasive moral disagreement casts doubt on the intuitionists' claim that certain moral propositions are self-evident. If there were certain moral propositions that can be known if adequately understood, then, it is argued, people with an adequate understanding of them would believe them, and there would be universal assent amongst mature, comprehending people. But there is no such universal assent. So there are no self-evident moral propositions.

Sidgwick took disagreement seriously, and thought that if there was significant disagreement about the truth of some apparently self-evident moral proposition, then that casts doubt on whether that proposition really is self-evident. Intuitionists could defend themselves from this objection by downplaying the amount of moral disagreement. They might claim that a lot of moral disagreement stems from disagreement about non-moral facts, such as what the consequences of a certain act will be. For instance, two people might disagree about whether it is permissible to boil lobsters alive just because they disagree about whether lobsters can feel pain. Since the basis of their moral disagreement is this disagreement about the relevant neurological fact, if they agreed on this non-moral fact, we could expect them to agree about the permissibility of boiling lobsters alive.

Furthermore, although people might disagree about the permissibility of boiling lobsters alive, we may assume that they agree that pain is a bad thing, and the infliction of undeserved pain is prima facie wrong. If this assumption is correct, then the disputants agree about the moral facts here. They disagree only about the empirical, non-moral facts.

Another factor that might explain moral disagreement is disagreement about the strength of certain moral reasons. Many disputants might agree about the non-moral facts, and about what is morally relevant, but disagree about the weight that should be given to the different moral considerations. So, for example, two people might disagree about whether they ought to push a large man onto the rail tracks to derail a trolley that would otherwise kill five people, but this is quite consistent with them agreeing that the fact that this act would save five people counts in favour of pushing the man off the bridge, and that the fact that he would die if this were done counts against doing it. In such a case there is agreement about what is relevant, and how it is relevant, but disagreement about the weight of the competing moral considerations—one person regards the evil of killing one person as weightier than the good of saving five, while the other regards the evil of killing one as outweighed by the good of saving the five. There is still moral disagreement here, but it is simply a difference in judgement about the application of agreed moral principles.

This fits with the intuitionist view held, e.g., by Ross, that causing good outcomes is prima facie right, and that causing harm is prima facie wrong, for Ross held that both of these propositions are self-evident. He denied, however, that the stringency, or weight, of these different prima facie duties is self-evident (1939, 188). About this, he maintained, we could only have a probable opinion.

It is worth noting that moral disagreement does not imply that people have different intuitions. Ross, for example, had the strong intuition that it is permissible to miss an opportunity to enjoy some innocent pleasure, but at the time he wrote The Right and the Good he did not believe this. (Later, in the Foundations of Ethics, he changed his mind.) He believed it would be wrong to pass up such an opportunity because pleasure is good, and we ought to maximise the good. So although he would disagree with someone who believed that it is permissible to pass up an opportunity to enjoy some innocent pleasure, he would share their intuition that this is permissible. Similarly, it is plausible to suppose that many act consequentialists still have the intuition that it is wrong to harvest organs from a healthy but non-consenting donor to save five other lives. But because they have persuaded themselves of the truth of act consequentialism, they would not believe this act is wrong.

One of the theoretical advantages of thinking of intuitions as intellectual seemings is that we can allow for this mismatch between our intuitions and our beliefs. Just as something can seem perceptually to be a certain way while we don't believe it is that way, as in Müller-Lyer cases, so a proposition can seem intellectually to be true even though we do not believe it. Since such seemings are not beliefs, this does not commit intuitionists to the view that a conflict between our intuitions and beliefs entails contradictory beliefs.

Intuitionists like Ross could still allow that their non-believed intuitions provide pro-tanto justification for believing them. It's just that this justification is outweighed by opposing intuitions, and the theory based on them. A consequentialist with non-consequentialist intuitions could think the same. She may regard her deontological intuitions as giving her some justification for believing that it would be wrong to harvest the organs to save five, but presumably would regard the appeal of the consequentialist theory as a whole as outweighing this justification. She may even regard her deontological intuition as providing sufficient reason to believe that such acts are wrong, even though she thinks that on balance she has more reason to believe that such acts are permissible.

Finally, Ethical Intuitionists allowed that various other factors can lead to disagreement. Clarke, for instance, allowed that stupidity, corruption, or perverseness may make one doubt self-evident propositions (1706/1969, 194). John Balguy also acknowledges that self-evident moral principles, like many other plain and evident truths, may be, and have been, doubted, “even by philosophers and men of letters” whom, presumably, he did not regard as stupid or corrupt (1728/1969, 406). And Price maintained that all forms of knowledge, including intuitive knowledge, may be evident in different degrees (1758/1969, 160). Intuition may be clear and perfect, but may sometimes be faint and obscure. Such variance in degrees of clarity allows that a self-evident proposition may be imperfectly and obscurely grasped, and this may lead someone to deny its truth. Similarly, Moore claimed that “every way in which it is possible to cognise a true proposition, it is also possible to grasp a false one” (1903/1993, 36), and Ross notes that self-evident propositions may only be evident to us once we reach a certain moral maturity (1930/2002, 29). Given all these ways in which the truth of a self-evident proposition may be missed, it is no surprise that there is no universal assent.[8] But the absence of universal assent is quite consistent with self-evidence, as long as one does not regard ‘self-evidence’ to mean, or imply, obviousness.[9]

But despite what has been said above, critics of intuitionism can claim that the fact that there is disagreement between moral philosophers and even intuitionists themselves undermines the view that certain propositions are self-evident. These philosophers will have thought long and hard about the relevant propositions, and (we would hope) have a very clear understanding of them. One would, therefore, expect that if there were certain moral propositions the truth of which could be apprehended by intuition, then moral philosophers would converge on these truths. Persistent disagreement amongst reflective, thoughtful, and comprehending moral philosophers may cast doubt on the view that any of these propositions are self-evident.

Furthermore, if intuitions are intellectual seemings, one might ask why certain moral propositions seem true whereas others do not. If moral facts are non-natural facts, as intuitionists maintain, and non-natural properties lack causal powers, then moral intuitions cannot be caused by the corresponding moral facts, as, e.g., certain perceptual seemings are caused by certain natural facts. Critics would argue that certain things seem right and good to us, not because of some inherent value they have, but because we have evolved to react to certain types of act with approval or disapproval (Singer 2005; Street 2006; and Joyce 2007, ch. 6).

We have evolved to feel instant approval of acts that benefit our group, such as those that exemplify reciprocal trust, and honesty, and thus enhance our chances of survival, and to feel disapproval of acts such as deceit, and betrayal, that undermine trust and the benefits that brings. Intuitionists need to find some way of responding to this sort of objection without abandoning their non-naturalism.

1.4 Trolley cases and the reliability of moral intuitions

Empirical psychology has recently cast doubt on the reliability of at least some of our moral intuitions. Since a self-evident proposition is one of which a clear intuition justifies us in believing it, these doubts call into question the claim that our moral intuitions justify us in believing them, and thus whether there are any self-evident moral propositions. The experiments that cast doubt on our intuitions tend to focus on our intuitions about trolley cases. Consider the following three cases:

Switch: there are five people on the rail track, and an out of control trolley that will kill all five of them. There is a lever that would divert the trolley onto a different track. But there is a single person on that track who would be killed if you pull the lever and divert the trolley.

Bridge: there are five people on the rail track, and an out of control trolley that will kill all five of them. There is a large man standing on the bridge over the track. If you pushed him off the bridge onto the track, he would be killed. But he would derail the trolley and so the five people on the track would be saved.

Trap door: there are five people on the rail track, and an out of control trolley that will kill all five of them. There is a man standing on the bridge over the track. If he fell onto the track he would be killed, but would derail the trolley thus saving the five people on the track. He is standing on a trap door that would open and drop him onto the track if you pulled a lever.

People tend to say that they should pull the lever in Switch, but that they ought not to push the man off the bridge in Bridge. Bridge looks similar to Switch in that you would be killing one person to save five. So why the different intuitions? One could try to explain away these apparently conflicting intuitions with the doctrine of double effect. According to this doctrine, we may produce some good that involves a bad outcome, so long as the bad outcome is not intended. If the bad outcome is a means to the good end, then it is intended (as a means), and is not merely foreseen. So such acts are wrong according to the doctrine of double effect.

Switch seems to be a case where the bad outcome is foreseen, but not intended. Bridge seems to be a case where the bad outcome is intended as a means of saving the five. So one way to explain the different intuitions in Switch and Bridge is with reference to the doctrine of double effect. But this explanation is unsettled by a variant of Switch, according to which the large man is on the spur track, and that track now loops back onto the main one. Here it looks like by pulling the lever we would be using the large man merely as a means to saving the five, for unless he stops the trolley it will loop round and kill the five from the other direction. But it still seems permissible to pull the lever, yet wrong to push the man off the bridge.

Furthermore, this explanation of people's different intuitions is called into question by Trap Door. For Trap Door is like Bridge in the sense that the bystander is killed as a means of saving the five, but many more people tend to have the intuition that it is permissible to pull the lever in Trap Door (Greene et al. 2009).

The difference in people's intuitions between Bridge and Trap Door casts serious doubt on the deontologist's explanation of the difference in their intuitions about Switch and Bridge. An alternative explanation of the difference is that the Bridge case is ‘up close and personal’ in the sense that it involves physical contact, whereas in Switch and Trap Door the agent is remote from the person they have to kill to save the five (Singer, 2005). But this difference is morally irrelevant, so if this explanation is right, then our intuitions are distorted by at least one morally irrelevant factor.

Also it seems that our intuitions are subject to framing effects. For instance, our intuitions seem to be affected by whether we word our scenario in terms of killing or saving, and by the order in which the trolley examples are considered. If people are asked to consider Switch first, and Bridge second, they tend to say that it is permissible to pull the lever in Switch but not permissible to push the man onto the track in Bridge. If, however, they are given the Bridge case first they tend to say that it would be wrong to pull the lever in Switch. So it looks like the order in which the cases are given affects people's intuitions about the cases. But the order in which one considers the cases is morally irrelevant. So it looks like our intuitions can be distorted by a second source.[10]

One thing worthy of note is that these cases test intuitions about our overall moral judgements—that is, about what we should, or may do in certain circumstances. But not all intuitionists claim that principles about what we ought to do are self-evident. W. D. Ross for example claimed that only principles of prima facie duty are self-evident, and principles of prima facie duty are, roughly, principles stating that certain facts count in favour of an act and others count against. So these principles state, for instance, that the fact that one's act would produce some good, or the fact that it would be the keeping of a promise, or the expression of gratitude, etc., counts in favour of it, and the fact that, for example, it would involve the infliction of harm on someone counts against it. What we ought to do is determined by all of these facts, and how they weigh up against each other. Ross denied that we can ever know what we ought to do, and rejected the view that there could be strictly universal, self-evident principles specifying what we ought to do.

It would be interesting to hear the outcome of experiments to see whether people's intuitions about prima facie duty are subject to change on morally irrelevant grounds. This is something that requires empirical testing, but it is hard to imagine someone thinking that the fact that one would have to kill an innocent person in order to save five didn't count against it, or that the fact that their act would save five innocent people didn't count in favour of it, regardless of their overall verdict about whether they should kill the one or let the five die. That their act involved physically pushing someone in front of the trolley, or pulling a lever that would release a trap door dropping them onto the track would plausibly make no difference to such intuitions. Nor would framing effects introduced by the order of presentation of the cases. If such a priori expectations are correct—and they would need to be empirically tested—then empirical psychology would raise no problems for a Rossian intuitionism that claims only that principles of prima facie duty are self-evident.

Critics of intuitionism may, however, object that in so far as Ross's theory does not tell us what we ought to do, it does not give us what we want from a moral theory. Being told that various features count for or against certain actions, and that one just has to decide for oneself in each case what one should do, may be a very disappointing result even if it is self-evident which features count for or against.

A further point about the findings of such experiments is whether the subjects' answers to the experimenters' questions express their intuitions (Bengson 2013). When subjects have considered Bridge first, they are more likely to say that it would be wrong to pull the lever in Switch. This is taken to show that their intuitions are vulnerable to framing effects. But once we remember that one's beliefs and judgements may conflict with one's intuitions it is not at all clear that the subjects lack the intuition that it would be permissible to pull the lever in the switch case when they say that it would be wrong. A perfectly plausible alternative is that they have reasoned that, because it would be wrong to kill someone to save five in Bridge, it must be wrong to kill someone to save five in Switch. That is quite consistent with their having the intuition that it would be permissible to pull the lever in the switch case, since intuiting is not believing.

1.5 Non-inferential justification?

Sinnott-Armstrong claims that results from empirical psychology show that most of our moral beliefs are false, because they have been formed by an unreliable process (2006, 353). The unreliable process is basing them on intuitions that are systematically distorted by morally irrelevant factors, such as order or wording. Sinnott-Armstrong doesn't deny that some moral intuitions can justify moral beliefs. But given that the default justification provided by so many of them is undermined by distorting factors, we need to check that some moral intuition is not one of the undermined ones before we can take it to provide justification. But then, he argues, the intuitions that do provide justification do so only inferentially. Since moral intuitions either don't provide justification at all, or do so only inferentially, there is no non-inferential justification for our moral beliefs and intuitionism is false.

Nathan Ballantyne and Joshua C. Thurow (2013) maintain that this argument does not work. They outline their point in terms of undercutting defeaters and defeaters of those defeaters. The distorting factors that Sinnott-Armstrong mentions are the undercutting defeaters of the justification of most of our moral beliefs. If we have evidence that a subclass of our moral beliefs is not subject to these undercutting defeaters, then that evidence defeats the defeater, and justification is restored.

With this jargon in hand they argue that Sinnott-Armstrong's argument conflates the belief's justification being supported by an inference with the belief itself being supported by an inference. Let $U$ signify the undercutting defeaters for a moral belief, $D$ the evidence that defeats these defeaters, and $B$ the moral belief. Sinnott-Armstrong argues that for $D$ to defeat $U$ and thus restore the justification for $B$, $D$ must provide the agent with a reason to believe that $B$ was formed reliably. But, Ballantyne and Thurow maintain, $D$ can defeat $U$ independently of the agent's ability to provide arguments for his belief. My belief is justified only on the basis of the following argument:

  • $D$,
  • $D$ defeats $U$,
  • therefore, $U$ is defeated.

So this inference supports $B$'s justification. But $B$ itself is not supported by that inference. $B$ is, they claim, supported by the relevant intuition alone. (414). Being able to argue that the original, non-inferential justification for $B$ has not been undermined, does not entail being able to argue for $B$. All this argument does is restore the original non-inferential justification for the belief.

Ballantyne and Thurow illustrate this point with the following non-moral example.

McCoy visits the local widget factory and sees what seems to be a red widget being carried along a conveyor belt. He believes that the widget is red…. Soon enough, a stranger approaches McCoy and says that the widgets are actually white but are illuminated by red lights… Upon seeing this conversation, another stranger—who seems to McCoy to be a factory employee—tells McCoy not to listen to the other stranger: he is a trickster, McCoy is told, who likes to mess around with visitors. (2013, 413)

Sinnott-Armstrong would say that in order for the undercutting defeater (the 1st stranger's comment) to be defeated by the factory worker's claim that the stranger is a trickster, the factory worker's comment must provide McCoy with a reason to think that his belief was formed reliably. But, Ballantyne and Thurow claim, all that has happened is that the original, non-inferential justification has been restored. “Whatever initially made $B$ justified continues to justify $B$ once the defeater has been defeated. McCoy's belief that the widget is red is justified by his perceptual experience or seeming” (414). The same can be said of moral intuitions. I may regard my moral belief as justified by an intuition with the same content if I am justified in believing that potential undercutting defeaters have been defeated (or are absent). In such a case I have an inferential argument for the justification of my moral belief, but that does not mean that I have an inferential justification for my moral belief. All that has happened, is that the original, non-inferential justification (provided by the intuition) has been restored.

Nonetheless, Ballantyne and Thurow do not question the first part of Sinnott- Armstrong's argument—that is, the claim that because of partiality, bias, emotion and disagreement, we have good reason to think that most of our moral beliefs are false. If it is true, as Sinnott-Armstrong claims, that most of our moral beliefs are false, then intuitionists' trust in our ordinary moral thought will look undermined regardless of whether they can salvage a few sound moral beliefs from the wreckage. So intuitionists would not only have to argue that some intuitions justify non-inferentially, but that there is a significantly large group of reliable intuitions to validate their methodology, and Ballantyne and Thurow's argument does not help with that.

2. Intuitionist metaphysics

2.1 Indefinable, non-natural properties

Along with its moral epistemology, a distinctive feature of intuitionist thought is its non-naturalist realism. Intuitionists maintain that moral judgements are cognitive states, and that some at least of these judgements are true. They are true when the things referred to have the moral property that is ascribed to them by the judgement. The moral properties that intuitionists tended to focus on were the thin moral properties of goodness and rightness. These properties are, they maintained, simple, non-natural properties. It is not always clear how they understood the notion of a non-natural property (more on this below), but for now we can say that they denied that moral properties can be defined wholly in terms of psychological, sociological, or biological properties. Some intuitionists allowed that goodness can be defined in terms of rightness (Sidgwick and Ewing) or rightness in terms of goodness (early Moore). But all intuitionists maintained that at least one of these moral properties is simple, or indefinable.

Although their view is about the nature of moral properties, they often put their point in terms of moral concepts or ideas, and maintained that these concepts are either unanalysable, or if analysable, not analysable wholly in terms of natural concepts. It seems they assumed that if a concept was indefinable then its corresponding property would be unanalysable, and vice versa. Many philosophers today would deny this assumption.

The simplicity of moral properties, such as rightness and goodness, and our ideas of them, was important for early intuitionists such as Price, as he accepted the empiricist doctrine that simple ideas cannot be invented but must be acquired by immediate intuition, as all simple ideas must “be ascribed to some power of immediate perception in the human mind” 1758/1969, 141), i.e., either sensibility or the understanding.[11] Consequently, the ideas of right and wrong must be immediate perceptions of either sensibility or the understanding.[12]

If right and wrong are just feelings of approval or disapproval caused in us by natural properties or objects, then the idea of right and wrong will be given by our senses, for these ideas will be merely the effect that the perception of certain things has on sensibility. If, however, right and wrong were real properties of actions, then they could not be apprehended by any empirical sense, for we have no such sensation of right and wrong when we apprehend right or wrong actions. Rather, what we see is that these actions are right, or wrong.[13] This seeing still counts as intuition, as it is an immediate apprehension, but it is intellectual rather than sensible intuition.[14]

It is scarcely conceivable that anyone can impartially attend to the nature of his own perceptions, and determine that, when he thinks gratitude and beneficence to be right, he perceives nothing true of them, and understands nothing, but only receives an impression from sense. (Price, 1758/1969, 144–5)

Price concedes that certain feelings may attend our apprehension of right and wrong, but these impressions are merely the consequence of our perception of right and wrong. They are not what is perceived. For Price I approve of some act because I see that it is right or good.

But even if Price is right that the ideas of right and wrong are simple, and are grasped by the understanding, that does not imply that they are non-natural. For he allows that there are simple ideas of natural properties, and that some of these, such as causality and equality, are grasped by the understanding rather than sensibility. So a separate argument is needed for the non-natural nature of moral properties.

Moore is the intuitionist who laid most stress on the non-natural nature of moral properties, though his focus was on goodness rather than rightness. In Principia Ethica Moore defines a natural property as one that can exist by itself in time and not merely as a property of some natural object (1903/1993a, 93). The idea is, then, that natural properties, such as the pleasantness or squareness of an object, can exist independently of that object, whereas the goodness of a good thing cannot exist independently of that thing.

This definition can be understood in terms of particular instances of some property or in terms of the universal—the property itself. Either way it does not distinguish natural from non-natural properties as Moore thought. It does not seem that the particular instance of redness in some particular red object could exist apart from that object any more than the particular instance of goodness of some good thing could. A particular instance of any property is a way that something is, and the way that some particular thing is cannot be separated from the particular thing that is that way.

But things are no better if we understand Moore's definition in terms of universals, for on any plausible theory of properties the universal could exist independently of any particular instance of it. Since this is true of any property, it does not pick out what distinguishes the natural from the non-natural. So if we are talking of property instances then no properties can be separated from the things that instantiate them, and if we are talking of property types (properties as universals), then all of them can be separated.

Moore himself later abandoned this definition of the distinction between natural and non-natural properties, and described his earlier account of a natural property as “utterly silly and preposterous” (1942, 582). In the Preface to the second edition of Principia Moore offers an alternative definition that is suggested in chapter two of Principia. According to this definition, a natural property is one “with which it is the business of the natural sciences or of Psychology to deal” (13). Since the term to be defined (‘natural’) appears in the definition, this definition may not seem very informative. But we can replace the term ‘natural sciences’ with ‘empirical sciences’ (understood to include psychology and sociology) to get a useful and workable epistemological definition of a natural property. On this account, then, natural facts can be known by purely empirical means, whereas non-natural moral facts cannot be known in this way. Such facts involve an essentially a priori element.

Intuitively the intuitionists seem right. Empirical investigation can tell us many things about the world, but it does not seem that it can tell whether certain acts are right or wrong, good or bad. This is not to say that our moral views are not revisable in the light of empirical findings. For instance if science told us that a lobster's neurological system is sufficiently advanced for it to feel pain, we'd revise our view about the permissibility of boiling them alive. But all that science would have told us is that lobsters feel pain when boiled alive. Science does not inform us that boiling them alive is wrong. That seems to be something that cannot be known empirically.

Moore's open question argument can be regarded as giving form to this intuition. If the moral property of being good, for instance, could be defined in wholly psychological, biological, or sociological terms, then moral truths would turn out to be either psychological, biological or sociological truths, which could then be discovered by empirical research by the appropriate science. But, Moore argues, all such definitions must fail, for it is always an open question whether the thing that has the relevant empirical property is good. Moore's argument can be captured as follows:

  • 1) If some property $F$ could be defined in terms of some other property $G$, then the question “is something which is $G$, $F$?” would be closed.
  • 2) For any naturalistic definition of goodness, it would always be an open question whether something that has the relevant natural property is good.
  • 3) Therefore, goodness cannot be naturalistically defined.

An open question is one that is not closed, and a closed question is one the asking of which betrays a lack of understanding of the concepts involved. For instance, if I asked “Jones is a widow, but was she ever married?”, this would show that I don't really understand the term “widow”. So this question is closed. Moore claims that we can test any naturalistic definition of goodness by asking whether something that has those natural properties is good, and then seeing whether this question is open or closed. If the definition is true, then the question must be closed, so if it is open, the definition must be false.

Suppose, for instance, someone proposes that goodness can be defined in terms of causality and pleasure. To be good, they claim, is just to cause pleasure. Moore's view is that if this definition were correct, it would be a closed question whether something that causes pleasure is good. For in effect one would be asking whether something that causes pleasure causes pleasure, and that is clearly a closed question. But, Moore insists, the question “is something that causes pleasure good?” is an open question. One could, without conceptual confusion, debate whether something that causes pleasure is good. So goodness cannot be defined as causes pleasure.

Moore assumes that this will be true of every putative naturalistic definition of goodness, whether it be in terms of second-order desires, social approval, being more evolved, or whatever. All of these naturalistic definitions would fail the open question argument. If he is right, and goodness cannot be defined wholly with reference to concepts from the empirical sciences, then goodness is a sui generis notion, i.e., is one that can only be understood in its own, evaluative terms.

Moore's argument has a great deal of intuitive force, but has been subject to various objections, and it is not clear that all of them can be answered. One of the first was that it just begs the question against the naturalist. Moore only considers a few very crude naturalistic definitions of goodness, and concludes from these that all naturalistic definitions will fail the open question argument. Frankena (1939) objected that this was premature. We cannot know in advance that every naturalistic definition will fail this test. We just have to wait and consider the proposals. To conclude from a few crude examples that all naturalistic definitions will fail is just bad induction.

Another objection is that the open question argument does not tell us anything distinctive about the concept of goodness, but is simply an instance of the paradox of analysis. According to this paradox any true analysis will be uninformative, because it will be reducible to a tautology, and any informative analysis will be false, because it can't be reduced to a tautology. According to earlier versions of what Moore called ‘the open question argument’, and on one interpretation of Moore's argument, the reason that good cannot be analysed in naturalistic terms is that it turns what sounds like a substantive moral claim, e.g., that pleasure is good, into the empty tautology that pleasure is pleasure. But then this looks like a particular instance of the paradox of analysis. To see this, consider the following analysis of the concept ‘mammal’:

  • (M) A mammal is a member of a species of which the females suckle their young.

This looks informative as it can tell us why whales and duck-billed platypuses are mammals when they are so different in seemingly significant ways from other mammals. But if the analysis is true, and ‘mammal’ just means ‘member of a species of which the females suckle their young’, then (M) means:

  • (T) A member of a species of which the females suckle their young is a member of a species of which the females suckle their young

(T) is, however, just an uninformative tautology. This is a quite general problem in the theory of analysis, so if it applies to seemingly informative analyses of goodness, then that would reveal nothing distinctive about naturalistic analyses of moral terms.

Furthermore, some analyses are not obvious. The analysis of the concept of a mammal is an example of a non-obvious analysis. It is for that reason that the question “$A$ is a member of a species the female of which suckle their young, but is $A$ a mammal?” will seem open, even though it is a true analysis. Similarly, a non-obvious naturalistic definition of good may fail the open question test even though it is true.

2.2 Analyses of concepts and property identity claims.

A naturalist might accept that the open question argument works in relation to moral concepts, but deny that we can make any inferences about the way the world is from the fact that we think of it in certain ways.[15] For the way in which we think about the world is determined by our understanding of the concepts we use to describe it, and we cannot reliably infer that the world is a certain way from the fact that we conceive of it in that way. To think that one can make such inferences is to confuse predicates or concepts with properties,[16] analytical identities with synthetic identities. We know what we mean by certain concepts by a priori reflection, but the nature of the things to which these concepts refer can only be discovered by empirical investigation. We did not discover that water is H$_2$O or that heat is mean kinetic molecular energy by a priori reflection on what we mean by ‘water’ and ‘heat’, but by empirical investigation. Furthermore, we could not object to the view that heat is mean kinetic energy on the ground that this is not what we mean when we think of something as hot. But the intuitionists seem to object to naturalistic accounts of moral properties in precisely this way.

There is, however, reason to think that intuitionists such as Moore and Ross did not confuse concepts and properties. For they were careful to distinguish an elucidation of the meaning of words and an account of the nature of the world with their distinction between proper verbal definitions and the sort of definitions they are interested in (viz., metaphysical ones).[17] A proper verbal definition of ‘good’ is simply an account of how most people use the word, whereas a metaphysical definition is one that tells us the nature of the thing of which the concept is a concept.[18] This is not quite the distinction between an analysis of a concept and an account of the nature of a corresponding property, but it is close enough to give us reason to suppose that intuitionists such as Moore and Ross were aware of the distinction between concepts and properties that many think they simply conflate.

But although intuitionists may not have confused concepts and properties, they did seem to believe that there is a certain isomorphism between the structure of our concepts and the nature of the world, such that a proper analysis of our concepts would reveal to us the nature of the corresponding property or thing. This belief is not obviously confused, but the examples of heat and water seem to show that it cannot be accepted as it stands. Intuitionists need not, however, rest their view about the property of goodness on a general thesis about the relation of concepts and properties. All they need do is identify what it is about certain concepts, like the concepts of water and heat, that provides us with reasons to think that the corresponding properties are different, and then argue that these reasons do not apply to the concept of goodness.

With concepts of natural properties and substances like heat and water we have two reasons for thinking that the corresponding properties may be different. First, the concept of heat seems metaphysically superficial and incomplete. It is the concept of a property that has certain characteristic effects on us and on other things, but does not aim to tell us about the nature of the property that has those effects. The concept of water seems superficial in the same way. This concept only picks out certain surface features of water, such as its being clear, odourless, tasteless, etc. It does not, however, tell us anything about the nature of the substance that has these features. In both cases empirical science seems well-suited to complete this picture by investigating the property or substance that has these distinctive effects, or surface features. In doing this, empirical science provides us with an account of heat and water which is metaphysically deeper than the one provided by the corresponding concepts.

Secondly, even if the concept of heat were not incomplete or superficial, in so far as it is a concept of a natural property we have good reason to think that the empirical sciences are much better equipped to discover the nature of heat than a priori reflection. The same is true of the concept of water. In so far as this is a concept of a natural substance, the empirical sciences are far better suited to tell us the nature of this substance than a priori reflection.

These reasons do not apply to the concept of goodness. First, this concept does not seem to be metaphysically superficial or incomplete in the way that the concept of heat or water is. When we think of something as good we do not think of it merely as having certain effects on us, or as picking out certain surface properties the property of goodness has, but think of it as having a distinctive characteristic. Not all intuitionists agreed with Moore that nothing could be said about the nature of this characteristic (though they all agreed that this is a non-natural property). A. C. Ewing, for example, maintained that the characteristic we have in mind when we think of something as being good is the property it has of being the fitting object of a pro-attitude. If this, or something like it, is correct, then the concept of goodness does not merely describe certain properties goodness has, but aspires to tell us what goodness is.[19] It does not, therefore, call for a metaphysically deeper account from some other source in the way that the concept of heat or water does.

It is not, however, clear that this argument will persuade critics of intuitionism and nonnaturalism. They may want more from an analysis of ‘good’. They might, for example, want an analysis that helps explain why some things rather than others are good, and which explains the connection between the properties that make something good, and its goodness. Without these explanatory features they may well regard the analysis of good offered by Ewing superficial and in need of a metaphysically deeper account.

Indeed, as Robert Shaver points out (2007, 289) according to one intuitionist account of good the analysis does call for a metaphysically deeper account of the nature of the property. C. D. Broad, for instance, analyses good as meaning “there is one and only one characteristic or set of characteristics whose presence in any object that I contemplate is necessary to make me contemplate it with approval” (1985, 283). Critics may claim that this analysis is just as plausible as Ewing's, and leaves room for an alternative, naturalist account of the property that explains my approval.

Shaver also points out that it is a mistake to assume that synthetic identities can only be established by empirical means. This is a mistake, because one could arrive at the conclusion that two different notions refer to the same property by a priori reflection. So even if no empirical investigation can show that a moral and a non-moral term pick out the same property, this might still be shown by a priori reflection.

2.3 Queerness

Some philosophers think that there could be no moral facts as intuitionists understand these. This is because such facts would be unlike any other facts of which we know. Such philosophers think of non-natural facts and properties as ‘queer’ (see, Mackie, 1977). This queerness is probably at the heart of many philosophers' uneasiness about the idea of a non-natural property. But we need to be clear about what it is that is supposed to be so queer about the non-natural nature of goodness as intuitionists understand it.

The intuitionist conception of goodness may be regarded as mysterious because it is alleged to be unanalysable or indefinable. But that wouldn't pick up on the non-natural nature that intuitionists claim moral properties have. This objection would apply to any notion that philosophers claim is primitive in the sense that no informative definition in other terms can be offered, be it the notion of explanation, knowledge, or pain. It expresses rather a certain philosophical disappointment that a definition can't be offered. It is often said that “One person's primitive is another person's mystery”, but this supposed sense of mystery attaches to the unanalysability claim rather than the non-naturalness claim.

Furthermore, some intuitionists did not think that goodness is unanalysable. For instance, Sidgwick thought that good could be analysed as what ought to be desired, and Ewing maintained that it could be analysed as the fitting object of a pro-attitude. If the sense of mystery of the intuitionist notion of goodness stems from its unanalysability, then this sense of mystery will not apply to these intuitionists' concept of goodness, even though it is still a non-naturalist conception. But critics might respond that these definitions really only move the mysterious notion elsewhere, e.g., to the unanalysable terms ‘ought’ and ‘fittingness’.

John Mackie maintained that moral properties, understood broadly along intuitionist lines, are queer because they are inherently motivational, in the sense that when we come to see that some act is good, we are motivated to do it. No other property we know of has such inherent motivational force. If such properties could be understood naturalistically, e.g., as being such as to elicit desire in those who perceive them, then the inherent motivational force of moral properties would not be queer. For if something's goodness were identical with its being such as to elicit desire when perceived, it would be no surprise that we come to desire it when we perceive it. But intuitionists' non-naturalism rules out this explanation of the intrinsic ‘to be pursuedness’ of moral properties.

Intuitionists may respond to this objection by drawing on a recent version of Ewing's fitting attitude analysis of goodness. Ewing thought that to be good is to be the object of a fitting pro-attitude. T. M. Scanlon has argued that goodness is to be understood as something's having properties that give us reason to have a pro-attitude towards it (1998, 95), and like the intuitionist view about goodness and rightness, he thinks that the notion of a reason cannot be understood in other, non-normative terms (1998, 17). So his view is something intuitionists can accept. If they do, then there would seem to be no mystery about the magnetism of the good. If coming to see that something is good is coming to see that we have reason to have a pro-attitude towards it, then it would be no surprise if rational individuals come to have a pro-attitude towards perceived goods, any more than it would be surprising if rational beings come to do what they judge they ought to do. If one has Humean leanings one might want an explanation of how a judgement that one has reason to have an attitude, or that one ought to do something, can by itself motivate. But then the problem is not with the non-natural nature of moral properties, but is one within moral psychology, and involves the debate between those who endorse a Humean theory of motivation, and those who deny this.

But the mystery may be normative rather motivational if we assume, following Kant, that moral reasons are categorical reasons. Categorical reasons are ones that apply to us independently of what we care about. One might doubt that there are any such reasons. One argument for such a view is that normative practical reasons must be the sort of thing from which we can act. So they must be able to motivate us to act, and they can only do that by latching onto something we care about. But if all practical reasons must be able to latch onto something we care about, then no reasons are categorical in the Kantian sense. So the very idea of a moral reason may be quite mysterious and queer.

A final mystery is epistemic. It may be maintained that it is quite unclear how we can know of moral facts. This mystery may stem from the idea that non-natural properties lack causal powers. So the mystery is how we could know of something that is causally impotent. Intuitionists might respond by asking why a property must be causally efficacious if we are to be able to know which things have that property. They may point out that, on some views, dispositional properties such as warmth, fragility, or colour properties, lack causal powers. These powers are located in the non-dispositional base properties on which the dispositional properties supervene, rather than in the dispositional properties themselves. If this view were true, that would not imply that we could not know whether something was warm, fragile, or coloured. And if that could be true of non-causal, dispositional properties, then it could be true of causally impotent moral properties.

It may, however, be pressed that the causal impotency of moral properties causes problems for the analogy of intellectual seemings with perceptual seemings. Perceptually things seem to be a certain way, say red or square, because those things and their properties causally interact with our perceptual system. But if moral properties are causally impotent, then causal interaction could not explain why certain things seem to the intellect to be true.


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