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Antiochus of Ascalon

First published Tue Mar 1, 2005

Antiochus, who was active in the latter part of the second and the early part of the first centuries B.C.E., was a member of the Academy, Plato's school, during its skeptical phase. After espousing skepticism himself, he became a dogmatist. He defended an epistemological theory essentially the same as the Stoics' and an ethical theory which synthesized elements from the Stoa and Plato and Aristotle. In both areas he claimed to be reviving the doctrines of the Old Academy of Plato and his earliest successors in whose number he included Aristotle.

1. Life and Works

Antiochus was born in the latter part of the second century B.C.E. in Ascalon (whose site is in present-day Israel) and died in 69/8 B.C.E. Early in life he moved to Athens, at this time still the center of the ancient philosophical world, where he became a member of the Academy, the philosophical school that had been founded by Plato in the fourth century B.C.E. He may also have studied with certain of the Stoic philosophers then active in Athens. His membership in the Academy dates from around 110 B.C.E., when Philo of Larissa became the school's head or scholarch. At this time Philo championed a form of the skepticism that had been defended in the Academy since the scholarchate of Arcesilaus in the first half of the third century B.C.E. Antiochus was for many years a student and follower of Philo, whose views he defended in his writings, but at some uncertain point (though certainly before 79 B.C.E.; see Section 3) he broke sharply with Philo and rejected skepticism (Cicero, Acad. 2.69).

From this point on Antiochus was a dogmatist, who maintained that knowledge was possible and that there were truths known to him and other human beings. It is clear that he began a new school of thought and attracted followers. Later in antiquity, when different phases in the history of the Academy corresponding to changes in doctrine and philosophical approach were distinguished, some people spoke of a fourth Academy of Philo and a fifth of Antiochus (Sextus Empiricus [S.E.], Outlines, i.e., Pyrrhoneae hypotyposes [PH] 1.220). These distinctions were not meant to correspond to changes in the Academy as an institution, and evidence about institutional developments at this time is fragmentary and unclear. It is not certain, for instance, whether Antiochus succeeded Philo as scholarch or what institutional status the group formed in Athens by Antiochus and his followers enjoyed.

Political instability in Athens led Philo to transfer his activities to Rome in 88 B.C.E. We know that Antiochus was in Alexandria the following year in the company of Lucullus, a Roman general and statesman with whom he maintained ties for the rest of his life. He also exerted an influence on other prominent Romans. Cicero, though never a follower of his, studied with Antiochus in Athens in 79. Varro, apart from Cicero the greatest Roman intellectual of the first century B.C.E., and Brutus, the assassin of Caesar, counted themselves as adherents of Antiochus' philosophy.

None of Antiochus' books have survived, but we know something about them. He wrote an epistemological work called Canonica in at least two books. The title comes from ‘kanôn,’ meaning ruler or yardstick, a term that was used by philosophers in the Hellenistic period for the standard or criterion of truth by which correct judgments can be made and knowledge secured. It is cited by Sextus Empiricus in his survey of views about the criterion of truth at Against the professors, i.e., Adversus Mathematicos [M] 7.162, 202, and modern scholars have conjectured that it was Sextus' source for much of that survey (cf. Tarrant, 1985, 94-6; Sedley, 1992). The Sosus, possibly a dialogue, was also an epistemological work and belonged to the last phase of Antiochus' controversy with Philo (Cicero, Acad. 2.12). He wrote a book about the gods, concerning which we know nothing more. He sent a book to the Roman Stoic, Balbus, in which he maintained that, despite differences in terminology, the Stoics and Peripatetics (as Aristotle's successors in his school, the Peripatos, were called) were in substantial agreement (Cicero, N.D. 1.16). And Cicero informs us that he wrote in many places about his view of the relation between happiness and virtue (T.D. 5.22).

2. Philosophical Background

Antiochus regarded the criterion of truth and the goal of human life as the two most important concerns of philosophy (Cicero, Acad. 1.29), and we are best informed about his epistemological and ethical views. As we have seen, the occasion for his break from Philo was a disagreement about knowledge. After years of loyally defending the skepticism of Philo and his Academic predecessors, Antiochus came to embrace the opposing dogmatic position that knowledge is possible. What is more, he maintained that the original or Old Academy of Plato and his immediate followers were of the same opinion. This put him in conflict with his more immediate predecessors, some of whom had argued that Plato should also be interpreted as a skeptic (Cicero, Acad. 1.46). Thus, according to Antiochus, it was not he who was departing from Academic tradition, but the institution from the time of Arcesilaus to Philo that had betrayed the true Academic inheritance. He called the skeptical phase of the school's history the New Academy, and claimed to be reviving the Old or true Academy. For this reason, he and his followers also styled themselves the Old Academy.

There is a further complication. The epistemology that Antiochus defended was Stoic in all essential points. This was obvious to his contemporaries, who charged that, far from being an Academic of any kind, he was a Stoic and belonged in the Stoa rather than in the Academy (Acad. 2.69, 132, cf. 137; S.E. PH 1.235). In reply, Antiochus maintained that the Old Academy, the Peripatos and the Stoa were in fundamental agreement. According to him, far from being an innovator, Zeno of Citium, the founder of Stoicism, was responsible only for a new terminology and some corrections to the Old Academic doctrine (Cicero, Acad. 1.35). Though unconvincing to us and to many of his contemporaries, this historical thesis explains how Antiochus could defend Stoic epistemology against the arguments made by his Academic predecessors while claiming to revive the Old Academy. His arguments about both epistemology and ethics were embedded in this reinterpretation of Academic history and thus were part of an argument about who could claim to be the legitimate heir of the school's tradition.

3. Epistemology

‘Skeptic’ is an ancient Greek term meaning inquirer. The Academics did not use it themselves. It was first applied by Pyrrhonian skeptics to their school in order to signal their commitment to open-minded inquiry (see the overview of the entry on ancient skepticism). Understood in this way, the term applies at least as well to the skeptical Academy as to the Pyrrhonian school, which was founded or revived by Aenesidemus, an Academic who reacted against what he saw as an increasingly dogmatic tendency in the Academy of his time in the first century B.C.E. Later in antiquity the term skeptic seems to have been applied to both schools.

Academic skepticism arose out of the debate about the nature and possibility of knowledge between the Academy and the Stoa which had been inaugurated by Arcesilaus (see entry on Arcesilaus). The Academy's method of argument was dialectical. Their model was Socrates as depicted in Plato's Socratic dialogues, where he puts questions to his interlocutors and deduces conclusions unwelcome to them from their replies. Following this example, the Academics took their premises from the doctrines of their Stoic opponents or from assumptions that the Stoics could not reject or could reject only at a high cost in plausibility. By arguing in this way, the Academics hoped to enhance their and their opponents' understanding of the issues and, if possible, to progress towards the discovery of the truth that would resolve the question in contention. The difficulties that the Academics uncovered in this way were, then, meant to be internal to their interlocutors' position, and, in drawing them out, the Academics did not necessarily commit themselves to a position of their own.

Stoic epistemology attempts to show how it is possible for human beings to attain wisdom, which the Stoics take to be a condition entirely free of opinion, i.e., false or insecure judgment (see the section on Logic in the entry on Stoicism). For this to be possible, they maintain, there must be a criterion of truth. In their theory, it is the so-called cognitive impression that plays this part. This they define as an impression from what is, stamped and impressed in exact accordance with what is, and such as could not be from what is not (cf. Annas 1990, Frede 1999). Cognitive impressions, then, are true impressions which are, in addition, distinguished by a special character that can belong to no false impression and that human beings can discriminate. In the paradigm case, which the definition has in view, cognitve impressions are perceptual, but in a broader sense of the term, non-perceptual impressions that afford an equally secure grasp of their contents can also be called cognitive. According to the Stoics, by confining assent to cognitive impressions, it is possible to avoid error entirely.

The existence of the special character supposed to distinguish cognitive impressions from other impressions was the principal target of the Academics' arguments (see Section 3 of the entry on Carneades). If such impressions do not exist, it follows immediately in the context of Stoic epistemology that nothing can be known. On the basis of this result and the Stoic doctrine that the wise, that is human beings as they ought to be, do not hold (mere) opinions (S.E. M 7.155-7), the Academics went on to argue that one ought to suspend judgement about all matters.

These two doctrines—that nothing can be known, or a claim equivalent to it in the Stoic context, and that one ought to suspend judgment—make up the skeptical Academic position, in the sense of the position put forward and defended by Academics if not necessarily endorsed by them. The Stoics, followed by Antiochus in his dogmatic phase, argued that this position is self-refuting since to adopt a position is to assent to its component doctrines and assent is impossible without taking oneself to know. The Stoics also argued, again followed by Antiochus, that the skepticism called for by the Academics' arguments was a practical impossibility since action is impossible without assent and assent is possible only for those who take themselves to know.

Even though, as previously noted, the Academics were not necessarily committed to the skeptical position, they defended the possibility of a life committed to skepticism in order to prevent the Stoics from escaping the difficulties raised for their position indirectly by means of these anti-skeptical arguments. Arcesilaus made a start, but it was Carneades, who did the most, and who was responsible for the version of the defense with which Antiochus was familiar.

Carneades argued that, in the absence of cognitive impressions, a basis for action and inquiry could be found in so-called probable impressions (from probabilis, meaning that which lends itself to or invites approval, Cicero's Latin for the Greek pithanos, meaning persuasive) (see Section 3 of the entry on Carneades).

Building on this account of probable impressions, Carneades defended two views about assent. According to his first proposal, the wise person will always withhold assent, but will be able to act and inquire by following or using probable impressions in a way that does not amount to assent, and so does not involve holding opinions about anything (Acad. 2.59, 99, 108). According to the second, the wise person will assent to what is probable and so form opinions, but provisionally and on the understanding that he may be wrong (Acad. 2.59, 67, 78, 112).

It is a matter of controversy whether Carneades went beyond putting these views forward for the sake of argument and actually subscribed to some of them. It is plain, however, that some of his successors endorsed one or both of the skeptical doctrines. One tendency, led by Clitomachus, Carneades' student and eventual successor as scholarch, favored what we may call a radical skeptical position embracing both doctrines. Though Clitomachus rejected assent, he accepted Carneades' proposal that we could follow or use impressions without assenting to them and adopted this attitude toward, among other impressions, the skeptical doctrines that nothing can be known and that one ought therefore suspend judgment (Acad. 2.109-10). The other tendency favored a moderate or mitigated form of skepticism, which, though it accepted the first skeptical doctrine that nothing can be known, held that it is permissible for the wise to form opinions by assenting to non-cognitive impressions so long as they are sufficiently probable and the assent given to them is bestowed in the provisional spirit of Carneades' second proposal. And this tendency took the opinion that nothing can be known to be among the impressions to which one should assent in this way. The superficial air of paradox dissolves when one realizes that in accepting that one does not know anything one is not taking oneself to know this, but only opining that it is highly probable. The most prominent proponent of this view was Antiochus' teacher, Philo, and it is this, mitigated form of Academic skepticism that Antiochus defended before his conversion to dogmatism.

We are informed about Antiochus' case against Academic skepticism by Cicero's Academica, substantial parts of which have survived intact. Antiochus seems to have followed the Stoics, who produced a substantial literature defending their position and attacking the Academy's probabilistic alternative, but also to have added some elements of his own to the argument (cf. Striker 1997). He defended the veracity of the senses. He seems to have argued that in order even to possess a concept of the truth we must indisputably apprehend some truths in a way that is possible only if there are cognitive impressions (Acad. 2.33). He argued that probable impressions are a wholly inadequate substitute for cognitive impressions (Acad. 2.35-6), so that the charge that by abolishing the cognitive impression (as they think) the Academics deprive human beings of a basis for action stands (Acad. 2.31, 33, 54, 62, 102-3, 110). And he argued that, in maintaining the skeptical position, the Academics must take themselves to know at least one thing, viz., that nothing can be known (Acad. 2.28-9, 109; cf. Burnyeat 1997).

There is one more twist in the story, however. After removing to Rome, Philo published a pair of books which, when they came to Antiochus' attention in Alexandria, seemed to him to represent a radical and intellectually untenable departure from his teacher's previous position. This was the occasion for the Sosus, which contained a stinging riposte to Philo's new ideas. In opposition to Antiochus' view that there were two Academies, an Old and a New, Philo maintained that there had only been one. But he now held that the Academics from Plato to Philo himself were not united by their skepticism, as we have seen some Academics believed. Rather they had never been skeptics because they had never meant to deny the possibility of knowledge. Philo did not deny that Arcesilaus and Carneades had argued against the existence of cognitive impressions. Rather, he now maintained that these arguments showed, and were always intended to show, not that knowledge is impossible, but that knowledge is impossible on the Stoic conception of knowledge, which is therefore mistaken (Acad. 2.18; S.E. PH 1.235).

Philo's Roman innovation, then, was to reject the Stoic account of knowledge while continuing to accept his predecessors' arguments that the last clause of the definition of the cognitive impression, which requires that it be set apart from other impressions by a special character, cannot be satisfied (cf. Barnes 1989, 70-76). For there to be knowledge, he now held, it was enough that there be impressions which are true and accurately formed (Cicero Acad. 2.18). It is not hard to see why Antiochus was disturbed, for, if this is right, Philo was the legitimate heir of a single unbroken Academic tradition stretching back to Plato in which there was no place for alien Stoic doctrines. Cicero, who is our principal source, chose not to recount the details of this controversy (Acad. 2.12). But we know that Antiochus argued that, by abandoning the full Stoic account of cognition and its commitment to cognitive impressions satisfying the complete Stoic definition, Philo succeeded only in bringing about the result he most wanted to avoid, namely that knowledge is impossible (Acad. 2.18). Presumably Antiochus drew on the case he had already brought against Academic probabilism to argue that impressions which fail to satisfy the full Stoic definition of the cognitive impression cannot provide a basis for judgment of any kind let alone judgments of the kind that deserve to be called knowledge.

4. Ethics

Antiochus maintained that his ethical theory was that of the Peripatetics and original Old Academics just as he had maintained that his Stoicizing epistemology was in substance that of the Old Academy (Cicero, Fin. 5.7, 14; Acad. 1.22). He could make this claim about his ethical theory with more justice. On the crucial question of whether to recognize external and bodily items as goods in addition to virtue, he agreed with Aristotle and the Peripatos and disagreed with the Stoics, who made virtue the sole good. Nonetheless, his theory is greatly indebted to the Stoa, and it draws on anti-Stoic arguments of his predecessors in the Academy that also tend to presuppose Stoic ideas. Roughly speaking, Antiochus defended the Peripatatic view about goods on the basis of considerations and in the context of assumptions that belong to a Stoic and not an Aristotelian framework (cf. White 1978).

Cicero expounds and criticizes Antiochus' theory in book 5 of the De finibus and draws on Antiochus in his critique of Stoic ethics in book 4. The Stoics famously maintained that only virtue, which is identical with wisdom or the perfection of reason, is good and only vice, its opposite, evil, whereas all the so-called goods, like health and strength, and their opposites, the so-called evils, were indifferent (see the section Ethics in the entry on Stoicism). Nonetheless the Stoics took some indifferents, often those generally regarded as goods by others, to be preferred and some, often those generally regarded as evils, to be dispreferred. This distinction furnished the material or subject matter for rational selection. Virtue consists in fully rational selection among them. The wise or virtuous person acts with a view to obtaining preferred items and avoiding their opposites, but it is as an expression of his perfected reason that acts of selection are good, not because they secure, or tend to secure, preferred items for him or protect, or tend to protect, him from their dispreferred opposites. According to the Stoics, the sole necessary and sufficient condition for human good and therefore happiness is the possession of virtue. Indifferent items cannot add to or detract from the goodness of such a life by their presence or absence.

To judge by Cicero's evidence, Antiochus appears to have argued against this position by confronting the Stoics with a dilemma. Either the so-called preferred indifferents really were absolutely and utterly indifferent. In that case, the Stoic position collapsed into that of philosophers like the heterodox Stoic, Ariston of Chios, who refused to make distinctions of any kind among the indifferents, thus rendering virtue incapable of supplying practical guidance by destroying the basis for rational selection among actions (Cicero, Fin. 4.47, 60, 69). Or speaking of preferred indifferents was a merely verbal innovation, and the Stoics really regarded the items they called preferred as goods, albeit lesser goods, capable of making a life better by their presence and worse by their absence. Antiochus favored the latter diagnosis (Cicero, Fin. 5.74), and his own position was that virtue is the chief good, but not the sole good; this is the Peripatetic view, which he may well have been right to attribute to the original Old Academy as well (Cicero, Fin. 4.60, 61; 5.14; Acad. 1.22).

The way in which Antiochus appeals to human nature and its development in the exposition and defense of his ethics is modeled closely on Stoic theory, however. To be sure, Aristotle assigns an important role to the development of character through habituation. But Antiochus follows the Stoics and Epicureans in using the so called cradle argument, which played no part in Aristotle's thinking (Fin. 5.55). The idea is that by attending to the behavior of infants, who have not yet been corrupted by contact with society, we will be able to isolate our original natural impulses and discover what the first objects of natural concern or attachment are. If one accepts a general principle according to which the object or objects with which we are naturally concerned or to which we are attached by nature make up human good, the cradle argument can be used to answer the question what is the goal of human life. The Epicureans maintained that infants are naturally impelled to pleasure, and they held that the goal is a life of pleasure.

The Stoics argued that our first natural impulse was not to pleasure but towards the natural advantages, things like health and strength, bodily integrity and well-functioning senses. But it was not because they thought these items are goods; they insisted that they are indifferent though preferred. The infant's natural concern for them is the first stage of a development in which what is truly good only appears later. According to the Stoics, if all goes well, a human being's motives undergo a radical transformation. From this point, the human being recognizes virtue and virtuous activity as the only human goods and acts for the sake of the good. Preferred indifferents are the material or subject matter for the rational selection in which virtue consists, but nothing more. Since the objects of our first natural impulses turn out not to be good but indifferent, to be the object of a natural impulse, or to be in accord with our nature in the way such objects are, is not thereby to be good.

Antiochus agrees with the Stoics about the importance of the first natural impulses and, by and large, about which items are the objects those impulses. But unlike them, he accepts the principle that what agrees or accords with a creature's nature as it is expressed in its natural impulses is good for that creature, and that the good life for human beings is therefore the life characterized by the fullest possible enjoyment of the goods corresponding to our natural impulses (Cicero, Acad. 1.19, 22; Fin. 5.24-5). He believes that he has an Old Academic authority for this in Polemon (Cicero, Fin. 4.14; Acad. 2.131), head of the Academy at the end of the fourth century B.C.E. Nonetheless, despite admitting other goods, he holds that virtue is the highest human good, and he believes that his theory can explain why it is the chief human good without having to make it the only good as the Stoics had done.

On his view, the development which takes a human being to virtue does not involve a transformation of the kind posited by the Stoics. Rather, if all goes well, a human being comes to value reason and hence virtue as the perfection of reason above all other things because reason is the most important part of human nature. It is not so much the character of a human being's motivation that is transformed as he develops, according to Antiochus, as the self which is the object of his natural concern. As a result, though virtue is the chief human good, there is room for other goods as well, because they are in accord with human nature too, albeit less important parts of it. Antiochus' use of the Stoic framework puts him in a position to fault the Stoics for abandoning or forgetting the nature from which they set out (Cicero, Fin. 4.26, 43; 5.72) and for failing to see the difference between taking reason to be the most important part of human nature—which is correct—and thinking that it is the only part (4.41).

Like the Stoics, however, Antiochus wants to claim that virtue is sufficient for happiness. Stoic ethics ensures this result by denying that there are any goods or evils apart from virtue and vice and therefore any items capable of affecting the goodness of a life except virtue and vice. This option was not open to Antiochus because he thinks that there are other goods and evils, which do have this power. His solution, which is the most distinctive feature of his ethical system and the one that seems to have drawn the most criticism, is to distinguish between the happy life (vita beata in Cicero's Latin), for which virtue is sufficient, and the completely or entirely happy life (vita beatissima) (Fin. 5.71, 95; T.D. 5.22), which requires bodily and external goods as well.



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Academy, Plato's | Arcesilaus | Carneades | Cicero | ethics: ancient | Philo of Larissa | skepticism: ancient | Stoicism