Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Medieval Theories of Causation

First published Fri Aug 10, 2001; substantive revision Tue Aug 18, 2009

Causality plays an important role in medieval philosophical writing: the dominant genre of medieval academic writing was the commentary on an authoritative work, very often a work of Aristotle. Of the works of Aristotle thus commented on, the Physics plays a central role. Other of Aristotle's scientific works — On the Heavens and the Earth, On Generation and Corruption — are also significant: so there is a rather daunting body of work to survey.

One might, though, be tempted to argue that this concentration on causality is simply an effect of reading Aristotle, but this would be too hasty. Medieval thinkers were attracted to the problem of causality long before most of Aristotle's texts became available in the thirteenth century: already in the twelfth century the created universe was seen as a rational manifestation of God (Wetherbee 1988, p. 25), and, consequently, the rational investigation of the universe was seen as a way of approaching God: “In the creation of things”, says William of Conches, “divine power, wisdom and goodness are beheld” (William of Conches, Glosa super Platonem, p. 60). This consideration of the relation between the natural world of God continues throughout the Middle Ages: for example, Duns Scotus' proof of the existence of God is an a posteriori modal proof, based on the notion of causality (Craig 1980; Normore 2003; Ross and Bates 2003).

Thus, apart from direct literary influence, the nature of the philosophical and theological themes which were popular in the Middle Ages also led to an emphasis on causality. Writers studied the interrelationship of divine grace and natural processes, the role of the will in ethics, free will and determinism: all of these problems have an important causal component. These questions were often handled by methods which might seem to us to be extraordinarily naturalistic — naturalistic, of course, in the sense of the modes of natural investigation which were current at the time. It comes as no surprise to know that many medieval thinkers discussed the question of whether divine grace can increase: what is surprising is that many of the discussions use the technical tools of Aristotle's physical and biological works, tools which were originally developed to discuss problems of continuity and change in the natural world. What is even more surprising is the technical proficiency of many of these discussions: fourteenth-century work on this topic gave rise to very acute analyses of the variation of continuous quantities (see Murdoch 1975).

What should become evident during this survey is the extremely tight and complex interconnection between medieval causal theories and medieval ontology. After Aristotle's texts had been assimilated, almost all medieval academic theories had an ontology which was basically hylomorphic: substances were composites of matter and form, and change was described as the loss of one form and the acquisition of another. Form was not merely shape, but an active principle: the form of a thing was responsible for its causal role (White 1984; Goddu 1999, p. 148). Furthermore, in any causal interaction, the allocation of active and passive roles to the individuals involved tended to be thought of as unproblematic. Although many aspects of Aristotle's causal theories were extensively and critically debated, this basic hylomorphism persisted throughout; and it is this, rather than anything more arcane, which often poses the greatest problems in assimilating, or evaluating, medieval thought on these topics.

1. Causality and Motion

The term ‘motion’, in Aristotelian philosophy, can stand for a wide range of changes of state, and not simply changes of place (the latter is usually known as local motion). Aristotle's Physics is basically an exhaustive study of motion in this very wide sense. However, local motion is an interesting topic, and we shall start with it.

Motions are, in Aristotle's physics, classified into natural and violent. A paradigmatic example of natural (local) motion is the motion of a freely falling body, whereas an example of violent (local) motion would be the motion of a thrown body. If we throw a body, then it is relatively unproblematic to account for the motion when it is in contact with our hand: what is difficult is to account for its continued motion thereafter. Aristotle's theory accounts for it by saying that, when it is moving, a temporary vacuum is caused behind it, and, in order to fill in this vacuum, air rushes around from the front, thus leaving a void in front of the projectile which is filled by the continued motion of the projectile. This explanation was vulnerable to a large number of objections — for example, it is clearly easier to throw a moderately heavy object, such as a stone, than a light object, such as a bean, whereas light objects ought to be more susceptible than others to motions of the air. And Aristotle's theory, when confronted with the example of two stones thrown in opposite directions so as to pass near to one another, cannot consistently say how the air is supposed to move in the neighbourhood of their close encounter. These objections were made by numerous medieval authors, most significantly by John Buridan (De Caelo et Mundo III, qu. 22, pp. 227ff.) and Nicole Oresme (Du ciel et du monde II, ch. 25ff., pp. 525ff.).

This critique of Aristotle's theory of projectile motion did not come out of nowhere. Aristotle relied on a concept of natural motion, and that, in turn, relied on a concept of natural place: natural motion was motion towards the natural place of a body (i.e. motion downwards in the case of earth, and motion upwards in the case of fire). (Aristotle, Physics IV.5, 212b30–213a5) Ockham is already quite equivocal about the concept of natural place: and this is for several reasons.

  1. One is that — as we shall see later — he is generally quite suspicious about teleology, and the concept of natural place is basically a teleological one. Correspondingly, Ockham attempts — not very successfully — to explain the kinematics associated with natural place in terms of efficient causality. (Ockham, Expositio Physicorum IV, c6: Opera Philosophica V, p. 78; Goddu 1984, pp. 122ff.).
  2. Another reason is because of several examples which tend to undermine the difference between rest and motion. Ockham, and many other medievals, have reductionist accounts of place in terms of contact between bodies; the place of a body is just the surfaces of the bodies surrounding it (Ockham, Expositio Physicorum IV, c6: Opera Philosophica V, pp. 55ff.). So, if we have a ship in a river, which is flowing, is the place of the ship the surface of the surrounding water? Is this, then, a moving place? And what, then, would be the relation between that moving place and fixed places? Ockham eventually decides that there are only fixed places, but his arguments are not very strong, and one is left with the impression that the very ideas of rest and motion have become somewhat problematic. (Ockham, Expositio Physicorum IV, c7: Opera Philosophica V, pp. 79ff.; cf. Goddu 1999)
  3. The final reason is motivated by a theological example: we can suppose that God could create another world than this, but, in that case, what would the earth of that world do? Would it move towards the centre of this world (which seems to us to be the natural place of earth)? Or towards the centre of the other world? (Ockham, I Sent., d. 44: Opera Theologica IV, pp. 655–56; Goddu 1984, p. 124. See also Marsilius of Inghen, Si essent plures mundi.)

Correspondingly, both Buridan and Oresme are sceptical, not only about Aristotle's theory of projectile motion, but also about the related notions of natural place, motion, and rest. They both state — Oresme far more emphatically — that it would be consistent with all we observe if the earth were to rotate while the heavens remained at rest; Oresme and Buridan have, on these grounds, been described as “precursors of Galileo”.

However, what is more interesting for us are the alternative causal accounts that Buridan and Oresme adopted: they both said that projectiles move violently because of a form inherent in them, which led them to move in a non-natural direction, and which naturally decayed. This form was known as ‘impetus’, and was a common theme in the philosophy of the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries; some version of an impetus theory goes back to the early thirteenth century (Wood 1992). There was, especially in the fourteenth century, a considerable amount of quantitative work on impetus which attempted to establish such things as the law according to which impetus decayed (Weisheipl 1982, pp. 535ff.).

What is significant here is that — despite the radical changes in cosmology — this is is still an extremely medieval theory: causation is due to forms inhering in substances, and there is a division of the substances involved into agents and patients. Instead of there being a single form involved in projectile motion — the form of heaviness, responsible for natural motion downwards — there are two, weight and impetus, and the two conflict. The basic ontology is still the same, and the division into agents and patients, though its details may have changed, still persists. Furthermore, despite persistent doubts, there is still something of a distinction between motion and rest, and motion can only be the result of agency. Contrast this with Galileo's or — still more — Newton's account: here uniform motion and rest are treated on an equal footing, and, consequently, there can be no unequivocal distinction between motion and rest. So, although Buridan and Oresme are — in some sense — precursors of Galileo, their causal ontology is still, in important respects, thoroughly medieval (Maier 1964).

2. Causality, Self-Motion, and the Will

An example of motion in the wider sense is an act of the will: it is a change of state of some entity (namely the mind or soul), but would not have been thought of as local motion by most medieval thinkers — thought and will were generally regarded as immaterial processes (see Cross 1999, p. 75).

Aristotle has a picture of willed action in which actions are caused by combinations of beliefs and desires: these belief-desire states are not, of course, themselves actions (Normore 1998). This picture of the will fits with one of Aristotle's major causal doctrines: that nothing causes a change in itself.

However, Aristotle's picture of the will was not undisputed in the Middle Ages: as early as the twelfth century, Anselm had outlined a theory in which the will was a self-mover, and in which moral conflict was explained by the presence of two wills in the same person (Normore 1998, p. 28). This position was later taken up, in conscious opposition to Aristotle, by thinkers in the Franciscan school — Peter Olivi, and then Scotus and Ockham.

Scotus follows a modified Anselmian line, speaking of a single will, with two inclinations: one towards self-fulfillment, the other towards justice). It is the presence of these two inclinations which distinguishes willed causes from natural causes: natural causes are determined to perform their acts (unless impeded), whereas the will is not thus determined (Scotus, Metaphysics IV, 9: in Scotus, On the Will and Morality, pp. 136ff.; Lee 1998; Cross 1999, pp. 84ff.). The will is thus self-determining, rather than determined by its end, and so Scotus affirms self-motion in psychology. In fact, he goes further, and admits self-motion in physical cases as well: for example, a falling object is actively moving towards its goal, and its motion is caused by itself (because it is heavy); so this, too, is an instance of self-motion (Effler 1962).

Ockham expands on Scotus's theory of the will to deny that actions are properly explained by their ends: we are influenced by ends, but our actions are not necessitated by them and thus not caused by them (Ockham, Quodlibet I, qu. 16: Opera Theologica IX, pp. 87ff.). A free agent is one which, under exactly the same circumstances, could have chosen otherwise; and so a free agent can reject the Beatific Vision (and, in fact, actively turn to any other object whatever). (Ockham, Quodlibet IV, q. 1: Opera Theologica IX, pp. 292ff.).

3. Causal Accounts of Perception

Perception was, throughout the Middle Ages, a contentious topic, and it was also a topic in which the answers to strictly causal questions could influence philosophical positions in other areas (for example, on whether certain knowledge of external entities was attainable). The “traditional” view, dating back to Roger Bacon in the mid-thirteenth century, was that physical objects were known because they caused a succession of likenesses, or species, first in the medium between the object and the perceiver, then in the senses, and finally in the intellect, of the perceiver (Tachau 1988, pp. 3ff.). This position was attacked by thinkers such as Henry of Ghent, Peter Olivi, and Duns Scotus. Interestingly, many of these criticisms tend towards a relational account of perception, in which — although species still play a role — the role that they play is to be a means by which we know things, and in which the species themselves are not known directly but only by reflection. (Tachau 1988, p. 66)

Ockham then radicalised these critiques by denying that there are any such species at all: perception and other phenomena which were usually explained by species — the sun heating or illuminating physical objects, for example — were now explained by action at a distance (Tachau 1988, pp. 130ff., Stump 1999). There was a similar debate about the causal mechanisms behind memory, where, again, Ockham denied a species-based account; however, in the case of memory, he replaced species not with action at a distance but with habits (Wolter and Adams 1993).

Ockham denies species not on the basis of empirical evidence, or on the basis of epistemological arguments, but purely and simply on the basis of his razor: if we deny species, then we can give an account of the phenomena which uses fewer entities, because species are entities. Although this position of Ockham's did not have much influence on his contemporaries or followers — it is, after all, extremely implausible — it is a good example of how causal reasoning is affected by tacit ontological assumptions: the fact that species were seen as entities and the fact that Ockham had a programme of reducing the number of entities, led to an account of perception which tried to do away with species. On the other hand, action at a distance was, despite its implausibility, entirely unaffected by Ockham's critique. And, similarly, Ockham's account was not noticeably simpler than the accounts it criticised, which shows how far Ockham's own razor was from the principles of simplicity and the like, which are usually considered to be its modern equivalents.

3.1 Causality and the Emotions

The emotions and the passions occupy a similar place to perception in our mental architecture — they have both perceptual and causal components, the relation between which is not obvious — and it is not surprising that we get very similar treatments of the emotions in later medieval philosophy. Wodeham, for example, has an intricate account of the passions, involving the cognition of actual or possible states of affairs, free acts of the will (accepting or rejecting those states of affairs), and, finally, mental states of pleasure and pain which are caused by the states of affairs themselves (Knuuttila 2004).

4. Causality, Knowledge and Necessity

There is a persistent supposition — see, for example, (Gilson 1937) - that Ockham, and many of his fourteenth-century followers, had a basically Humean position on causality; this supposition has deep historical roots (Nadler 1996), but is inaccurate (Adams 1987, pp. 741ff.).

The supposedly Humean position has three basic assertions: that there is nothing more to causality than the regular sequence of phenomena, that such a regular sequence cannot give a necessary connection, and that, consequently, we can have no certain knowledge of causal relations.

One item in this chain of argument has some textual support in Ockham: he did not believe that the relation of efficient causality was a thing distinct from its relata (Ockham, Quodlibet VI, qu. 12: Opera Theologica IX, pp. 629ff.) However, one can still believe this and hold that causality is a real relation, and Ockham did so believe (Adams 1987, p. 744; White 1990b). So this link in the chain is not found in Ockham.

The “Humean” argument, in addition, makes a detour through psychology: as Adams analyses it, it relies on a premise like “There can be nothing more in concepts than there actually is in intuitions” (Adams 1987, p. 744). But such a detour through psychology, though widely practiced in the eighteenth century, was somewhat foreign to medieval thought (White 1990a). And one should generally be very circumspect in interpreting medieval texts on issues like these: key terms tend to be used in subtly different ways than in the modern literature, and controversies tend to be about issues which are rather different from our controversies (Zupko 2001).

Even though pseudo-Humean arguments of this sort cannot reasonably be ascribed to Ockham or to most other medieval thinkers — with the possible exception of Nicholas of Autrecourt — there still remains the question of what their views on these questions actually were. Since the medievals generally did not conflate ontological and epistemological issues, there are two questions: first about the necessity of causality, and second about whether we can know causal propositions with certainty.

4.1 Causality and Necessity

Medieval thinkers believed that the world was created by God, and so a question like “Is proposition P contingent?” were seen as equivalent to the question “Could God have created a world in which P does not hold?”. So our question can be reduced to one about divine power.

A very common theme in medieval thought is the distinction between God's absolute and ordered, or ordained, power (potentia absoluta and potentia ordinata). This distinction goes back to early medieval thought (Moonan 1994), and was extensively used in later medieval philosophy (Courtenay 1971; Adams 1987, pp. 1186ff.).

God's absolute power is unrestricted power. According to this power, God can create a huge variety of possible worlds. One frequently used principle is this: given two distinct entities, God can create a world in which one of them, but not the other, exists, or, in this world, God can destroy one of them, leaving the other intact. We should note that this is not exactly innocuous; ontologically, it amounts to some sort of logical atomism. See (White 1990b).

But God will, in practice, not exercise absolute power: as Aquinas puts it, “what is attributed to the divine power insofar as the command of a just will executes it, God is said to be able to do with respect to His ordered power”. (Aquinas, Summa theologiae I, qu. 25, a. 5, ad 1) So there are limits to God's ordained power (which come from the concept of a just agent): inside the space of worlds which God could create by absolute power, there is a space of worlds which could be created by ordered power. It is this smaller space of worlds which is relevant for our question of the necessity of causal connections. And, with respect to God's ordered power, there was a wide range of causal assertions which were regarded as necessary by medieval thinkers.

One of the significant aspects of this distinction was that — entirely apart from its theological motivation — it gave medieval authors very powerful and flexible analytical tools. Buridan, for example, deploys this distinction in a very subtle analysis of some extremely obscure arguments in Aristotle (Knuuttila 2001). Scotus uses different, but related, arguments to investigate modal questions such as that of the contingency of the present. To some extent (although there is considerable argument about this area) these methods allowed a far-reaching reformulation of the metaphysics of modality (Normore 2003; cf. Knuuttila 1993).

4.2 Knowing Causal Propositions: Demonstration

As far as our knowledge of causal propositions is concerned, we can again draw a distinction. One question is this: do medieval thinkers, in practice, establish causal propositions on the basis of argument? And the other is this: what sort of metatheory of causal argument do the medievals have?

The answer to the first question is quite straightforward. Ockham, like other fourteenth-century theologians - see, for example, (Biard 2000) on Buridan - frequently gives instances where we can make reliable causal inferences and come to know causal propositions on the basis of experience (Ockham, Ordinatio Prologue, qu. 2: Opera Theologica I, p. 87) These arguments frequently rely on a theory of natural kinds: for example, Ockham writes

Because someone sees that, after eating such an herb, health follows for someone with a fever, and because he can eliminate all other causes of health for that person, he knows evidently that that herb was the cause of health; and thus he has knowledge (experimentum) in the singular case. It is, however, obvious to him that all individuals of the same kind have an effect of the same kind in a patient of the same kind; and thus he assents evidently, as to a principle, that every herb of such a kind cures fever. (Ockham, Ordinatio prologue, qu. 2: Opera Theologica I, p. 87)

The second question is that of a metatheory. Here the story becomes somewhat more complicated. There was a generally accepted metatheory, namely that of Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, according to which scientific demonstrations were syllogistic proofs, based on necessary and self-evident premises. There were two sorts of these: proofs of the simple fact (demonstrationes quia) and proofs of the reasoned fact (demonstrationes propter quid). In the latter, the syllogisms involved must have middle terms that are causes of the state of affairs which is to be demonstrated. This gives a theory of scientific reasoning in which the structure of the arguments is intimately tied up with the structure of the causal chains that they demonstrate.

There is, indeed, an extensive literature of medieval commentaries on the Posterior Analytics, and much of this literature is very important; we find in it a great deal of material on the authors' attitudes to necessity, the structure of science, the relation between various sciences, the autonomy of philosophy vis-à-vis theology, and the like. However, it cannot be taken to be automatically relevant to the practice of reasoning in the Middle Ages: the logical metatheory (that of the syllogism) is far too restrictive, and the conditions placed on scientific demonstrations are far too stringent, for it to be a plausible description of very many actual processes of reasoning, in the Middle Ages or at any other time.

However, one thing that can be found in the literature on the Posterior Analytics is this: demonstrationes propter quid were thought to be proofs which produced knowledge (Serene 1982). That is, they were linguistic items which caused a state of knowledge in those who understood them. This is itself a causal story, and, consequently, medieval discussions of the causal aspects of demonstration are frequently more relevant for contemporary philosophy than are their discussions of its logical aspects, which are, as we have said, uncomfortably closely tied to the theory of the syllogism.

5. Final Causes

We often find in Aristotle and in the literature influenced by him an enumeration of four types of cause: formal, material, efficient and final. The first two are uses of ‘cause’ in a somewhat wider sense than is current nowadays: the term here simply means ‘explanation in general’ (Ockham, Expositio Physicorum II, c11: Opera Philosophica IV, p. 348), and explanations by means of matter and form were common both in Aristotle and in the literature. Efficient causes are what we would now simply call ‘causes’. Final causes, however, are problematic: a final cause is an end or a purpose, and, whereas it is clear that rational agents act for the sake of ends, it is not clear that much else does. Furthermore, it also seems clear to us that the causality of a rationally pursued goal can be reduced to efficient causality.

Aristotle, however, has a much stronger position on final causality: he believes that there are processes in nature (the growing of a tree, for example) which are completed and regulated by a final state, or end, towards which they tend. As Adams puts it,

According to Aristotelian metaphysics, natures are complexes of powers. When appropriately coordinated, the collective exercise of such powers converges on an end. In the sublunary world, elemental powers are simple and deterministic. Even where more complex living things are concerned, the “coordination” of their powers is “built-in” in such a fashion that -- given relevant circumstances -- they function to achieve their end. (Adams 1996, p. 499)

Aristotle's natural science tends to be governed by the biological paradigm, and it is clear that, for him, final causes in this strong sense are extremely pervasive. He also argues in the Physics that natural processes cannot all be explained by final causality alone, which implies that final causality cannot, in general, be reduced to efficient causality.

The medieval literature is far from unanimous on these questions. William of Ockham, for example, who wrote several commentaries on Aristotle's Physics, and who discusses these questions at numerous places in his commentary on Aristotle's Physics, hardly has a uniform position. He is quite happy with explanations of natural phenomena by means of efficient causes in general, but he will also often speak of final causes: what is unclear is whether the final causes he speaks of (with varying degrees of strength in different works) have any explanatory role to play that cannot be reduced to efficient causality (Adams 1998; cf. Goddu 1999).


Primary Literature

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Buridan, John [Jean] | Duns Scotus, John | Marsilius of Inghen | Ockham [Occam], William | Olivi, Peter John | Oresme, Nicole