Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Dialectical School

First published Fri Aug 27, 2004

The ‘Dialectical school’ denotes a group of early Hellenistic philosophers that were loosely connected by philosophizing in the — Socratic — tradition of Eubulides of Megara and by their interest in logical paradoxes, propositional logic and dialectical expertise. . Its two best-known members, Diodorus Cronus and Philo the Logician, made groundbreaking contributions to the development of theories of conditionals and modal logic. Philo introduced a version of material implication; Diodorus devised a forerunner of strict implication. Each developed a system of modal notions that satisfies the basic logical requirements laid down by modern standard modal theories. In antiquity, Diodorus Cronus was famous for his so-called Master Argument, which aims to prove that only the actual is possible.

1. Historical and biographical information

The name ‘Dialectical school’ is used for a group of philosophers active from the later 4th to the mid 3rd centuries BC who are referred to as members of the Dialectic sect (hairesis) or as dialecticians (dialektikoi) in some later ancient sources (Diogenes Laertius [DL] 1.19). They were traditionally counted among the philosophers of the Megarian school (founded by Euclides of Megara, author of Socratic dialogues ), but may have formed an independent branch of this sect. Together with the Megarians, Cyrenaics and Cynics they count among the minor Socratic schools. Their main philosophical interest was in dialectical skill and accomplishment, including the development and resolution of logical paradoxes. They also made several important positive contributions to the development of propositional logic. It is uncertain whether the members of the Dialectical school were connected by an institution comparable to other ancient philosophical schools, or whether their union under one name in later reports was based more loosely on their common philosophical interest in dialectic.

Here is a rough chronological list of the members of the Dialectical school. Clinomachus of Thurii, a pupil of Eubulides of Miletus, is named as founder of the sect, but may have been given this title only in hindsight (DL 1.19 and 2.112, Sedley 1977 n.16). Euphantus of Olyntus, another pupil of Eubulides, probably born before 349 BC, may have been the earliest member of the sect. The name ‘Dialectical school’ is reported to have been introduced by its member Dionysius of Chalcedon, active around 320 BC. The most important philosopher of the sect is Diodorus Cronus, who taught in Athens and Alexandria around 315-284 BC. He left no writings. His most famous pupil is Zeno of Citium, founder of the Stoa. The dialectician Aristides belongs to the same generation as Diodorus Cronus. Alexinus (c. 339-265) may have belonged to the sect. The second important philosopher of the dialectical school is the logician Philo (sometimes referred to as Philo of Megara, although we do not know his city of origin); he studied with Diodorus. He wrote a dialogue Menexenos and possibly was the author of a work On Signs and a work On Schemata. All of these are lost. Diodorus Cronus’ five daughters Menexene, Argeia, Theognis, Artemisia and Pantacleia are all said to have been logicians, and thus may have belonged to the school. Finally, the dialectician Panthoides flourished c.280-275 BC, and the dialecticians Aristoteles and Artemidorus can be dated around 250 BC.

Original philosophical contributions are testified only for Diodorus Cronus and Philo, in the areas of logic, language and theory of motion (for Diodorus' contributions in the latter two areas see entry Diodorus Cronus); their views on logic were influential on Stoic logic, which in turn anticipated many of the developments in 20th century logic. Philosophers of the Dialectic sect had an impact also on Epicurean, Peripatetic, and Sceptic philosophy, and seem to have interacted in discussion with members of most Hellenistic philosophical schools. Diodorus Cronus’ modal theory and his Master Argument served as a major philosophical inspiration for Arthur Prior.

2. The beginnings of propositional logic

All we know about the so-called founder of the so-called Dialectical school, Clinomachus of Thurii, is that he was the first who wrote about predicates (katêgorêmata) and propositions (axiômata) and the like (DL 2.112). Our evidence for Diodorus and Philo confirms that they, too, conceived of logic as a logic of propositions. It was the Stoics who systematically developed a logic of propositions and devised subtle classifications of predicates. (By contrast, Aristotle's logic had been a logic of terms, where subject and predicate terms were in principle interchangeable.) The logic of the Dialectical school thus was a precursor of Stoic logic.

At the time of Diodorus and Philo a distinction between simple and non-simple propositions was in circulation among the minor Greek Socratic philosophical sects (DL 2.139). Simple propositions were divided into affirmations and negations (ibid.). Among non-simple propositions, which were thought to be composed of simple ones, conditionals, disjunctions and conjunctions were distinguished. Disjunctions or conditionals featured as premises in many of the logical paradoxes and sophisms which members of the Dialectical school discussed. It is likely that Diodorus and Philo examined the truth-conditions of all three kinds of non-simple propositions; however, we know their views only for the case of the conditional (see below sect. 3).

Their treatment of conditionals and modalities implies that — like most Hellenistic philosophers — Diodorus and Philo worked with a concept of proposition that differs from ours in that it allows truth-values to change over time. For instance, the standard example for a simple proposition, ‘It is day’, does not contain a covert fixed date or definite time determination; rather, it ranges over times, changing its truth-value twice daily, all the while remaining the same proposition. Thus we may think of propositions as they were understood by Hellenistic philosophers as functions of time. Diodorus Cronus can perhaps also be credited with the beginnings of temporal logic, as both his theory of the conditional and his accounts of the modalities are built on logically relevant temporal properties of propositions (see below sects. 3.2 and 4.2). Moreover, he distinguished between propositions in the present tense like ‘Helen has three husbands’ and ‘These men are marrying’ and propositions in a tense of completion (the aorist), ‘Helen had three husbands’ and ‘These men married’, and observed that it is possible for propositions like the latter two to be true, without there ever having been a time at which a corresponding one of the former type was true (Sextus Empiricus [SE], Against the Physicists 2.97-8).

Apart from the various logical puzzles and sophisms, there are only two topics on which we can be sure of a positive contribution to logic by members of the Dialectical school. These are the positions of Diodorus and Philo on the theory of conditionals and on modal logic. Both topics involve notorious difficulties and were extensively and intensely discussed by Hellenistic logicians; so much so that the disputes became part of the general knowledge of the intelligentsia of the time (SE, Against the Grammarians 309-10). Moreover, the theory of modalities was believed to have far-reaching results for other areas of philosophy.

3. Conditionals

In the debate about the conditional (sunêmmenon) the point of disagreement concerned the right truth-conditions of a conditional (Cicero, Academics II 143). This controversy was played out against the background of a common acceptance of what counts as a conditional, and what its function is. Conditionals were understood to be non-simple propositions containing one proposition as antecedent and one as consequent. The antecedent has the particle ‘if’ prefixed to it; the standard form is ‘If p, q’. A conditional serves to manifest the relation of consequence (akolouthia): it announces that its consequent follows from (akolouthein) its antecedent (Sextus Empiricus, Against the Logicians 2.110-112). This relation of consequence was also commonly taken to manifest the relation between premises and conclusion in a valid argument.

3.1 Philonian conditionals

Philo's criterion for the truth of a conditional is truth-functional. Later in antiquity, it was generally accepted as a minimal condition for the truth of a conditional. Philo maintained that a conditional is false when and only when its antecedent is true and its consequent false, and true in the three remaining cases: whenever the antecedent is false, and when both antecedent and consequent are true (SE, Against the Logicians 2.113-114). Thus this notion of a conditional comes very close to that of modern material implication. (It is not the same, since truth for Hellenistic philosophers is relativized to times.) Philo's suggestion is remarkable in that it deviates noticeably from the ordinary language understanding of conditional sentences and requires abstraction on the basis of a concept of truth-functionality.

Remarkable as it is, Philo's view has the following two drawbacks: First, as in the case of material implication, for the truth of the conditional no connection of content between antecedent and consequent is required. Thus, for example, during the day ‘If virtue benefits, it is day’ is Philonian true. This introduces a variant of the so-called ‘paradoxes of material implication’ (Relevance Logic, Conditionals 2.3; Lemmon 59-60, 82). The presentation of Philo's view in our sources shows that the ancients were aware of this problem (SE, ibid. 113-117). Second, due to the time-dependency of Hellenistic propositions, Philo's criterion implies that conditionals can change their truth-value over time: for instance, ‘If it is day, it is night’ is true at night, but false during the day. This is counter-intuitive as regards the ordinary use of if-sentences. Moreover, as the concept of a conditional was also meant to provide for logical consequence between premises and conclusion, this leads to the problematic result that arguments can in principle change from being valid to being invalid and vice versa.

3.2 Diodorean Conditionals

For Diodorus, a conditional proposition is true if it neither was nor is possible that its antecedent is true and its consequent false (SE, Against the Logicians 2.115-117). The reference to time in this account (‘was … is possible’) suggests that the possibility of a truth-value change left open by Philo's truth-condition was one of the factors to be improved on.

We do not know whether Diodorus had his own modal notions in mind when talking about possibility in his criterion, or just some pre-technical, general concept of possibility, or whether he perhaps intended to cover both (Denyer 1981, 39-41; Sedley 1977, 101-2). (The verb used here for being possible, endechesthai differs from the word used for possibility in Diodorus' modal theory, which is dunaton.) If one assumes that he had his own modal notions in view when giving this account (see sect. 4.2 below), his truth-criterion for the conditional stands in the following relation to Philo's: a conditional is Diodorean true now if and only if it is Philonian true at all times. Diodorus has, as it were, quantified the Philonian criterion over time. The conditional ‘If I walk, I move’ is now true because at no time is the antecedent true and the consequent false. Thus for Diodorus, a conditional cannot change its truth-value. If it is true (false) at one time, it is true (false) at all times. If on the other hand one assumes that Diodorus had some unspecified general notion of possibility in mind when producing his account, the criterion will be correspondingly less specific. However, it would presumably still be a minimal requirement that it is never the case that the antecedent is true and the consequent false.

Diodorus' criterion bears some resemblance to the modern concept of strict implication. In particular, it shares some of its disadvantages in that we encounter a parallel to the ‘paradoxes of strict implication’ (Relevance Logic, Lemmon, 153-4). As in Philo's case, no connection of content is required between antecedent and consequent. This time, whenever either the antecedent is impossible or the consequent necessary, the conditional will be true, regardless of whether there is any relevant connection between the two constituent propositions. So for instance ‘If the earth flies, Axiothea philosophizes’ would be true for Diodorus, since the antecedent was considered impossible (DL 7.75). One example given of a Diodorean-true conditional, ‘If it is not the case that there are indivisible elements of things, then there are indivisible elements of things’ (SE, Outlines of Pyrrhonism 2.111), suggests that there was some awareness of these paradoxes in antiquity. In any event, the Stoic Chrysippus developed a system of relevance logic in which neither the ‘paradoxes of material implication’ nor the ‘paradoxes of strict implication’ occur.

4. Modal logic

Modal logic is the second topic where we have evidence about the positions of Philo and Diodorus and their influence on the Stoics (Kneale and Kneale 1962, 117-28; Bobzien 1993). Although the modalities were generally discussed under the heading of ‘On things possible’, the Hellenistic modal systems were each built on a set of four modalities: possibility, impossibility, necessity and non-necessity. The matter of dispute was which system was the right one; that is, which one adequately described the modalities inherent in the world. In connection with this, an extra-logical concern provided additional fuel to the debate: the belief that if propositions stating future events that will not happen all turn out to be impossible, the freedom and choices of individuals would be curtailed. This is a variation on the problem of logical determinism which is known from Aristotle's On Interpretation 9. Several of the sophisms devised and discussed by the Dialectical school touch upon this issue — the Mower Argument, the Lazy Argument (Bobzien 1998, 78-81, 180-233), and the Master Argument.

For Diodorus and Philo, as for the Stoics the modalities were primarily considered as properties of propositions or states of affairs. There is no discussion of modal propositions, i.e. of propositions that contain modal operators, such as ‘It is possible that it is day’ or ‘It is necessary that virtue benefits’, nor of iterated modalities.

4.1 Philonian modalities

Philo's view on possibility has survived in several other sources (Alexander, On Aristotle's Prior Analytics 184; Philoponus, On Aristotle's Prior Analytics 169) but only in one are his accounts of all four modal notions reported:

Possible is that which is capable of being true by the proposition's own nature … necessary is that which is true, and which, as far as it is in itself, is not capable of being wrong. Non-necessary is that which, as far as it is in itself, is capable of being false, and impossible is that which by its own nature is not capable of being true. (Boethius, On Aristotle's On Interpretation 2, II 234)

So according to Boethius the basic feature of Philonian modalities is some intrinsic capability of the propositions to be or not to be true or false. That this feature is intrinsic is plain from the phrases ‘by its own nature’ and ‘in itself’. In one source, both phrases are used to characterize Philonian possibility (Simplicius, On Aristotle's Categories 195); hence both phrases may have originally applied to all four accounts.

In all sources the concept of possibility stands out, and so it seems likely that Philo built his set of modal notions on a concept of internal consistency, as given in his account of possibility. Philo's modal concepts are thus defined by resort to another, perhaps more basic, modal concept. As to the kind of consistency Philo had in mind, we learn nothing more. Notwithstanding this, there can be little doubt that Philo's modal concepts satisfy a number of basic requirements which normal systems of modern modal logic tend to satisfy, too. (I assume here that Philo accepted the principle of bivalence, as we have no contrary information.) These requirements are:

  1. Every necessary proposition is true and every true proposition possible; every impossible proposition is false and every false proposition non-necessary.

According to Philo's accounts, a proposition that is not capable of falsehood must be true; one that is true must be capable of being true; etc.

  1. The accounts of possibility and impossibility and those of necessity and non-necessity are contradictory to each other.

This can be directly read off the definitions.

  1. Necessity and possibility are interdefinable in the sense that a proposition is necessary precisely if its contradictory is not possible.

This holds for Philo's accounts, if one neglects the difference in the two phrases ‘in itself’ and ‘by its own nature’ or assumes that originally both were part of all the definitions. Then a proposition is not capable of being false precisely if its contradictory is not capable of being true, etc.

  1. Every proposition is either necessary or impossible or both possible and non-necessary, i.e. contingent.

In Philo's system this amounts to the fact that every proposition is either incapable of falsehood, or incapable of truth, or capable of both. The fact that Philo's modal accounts — and those of Diodorus and the Stoics — satisfy these four requirements is of course no proof that the ancients consciously reflected upon all of them or regarded them all as principles with which their modal theories had to comply.

4.2 Diodorean modalities

We know a little more about Diodorus' modal theory (in addition to the passages cited for Philo, see Epictetus, Dissertations 2.19, Cicero, On Fate 12, 13, 17; Plutarch, Stoic Refutations 1055e-f). Still, again only one text reports all four definitions of Diodorus' modal notions:

Possible is that which either is or will be <true>; impossible that which is false and will not be true; necessary that which is true and will not be false; non-necessary that which either is false already or will be false. (Boethius, On Aristotle's On Interpretation 2.II.234-235)

Two of these modal accounts are disjunctions, the other two are conjunctions. Provided that Diodorus accepted the principle of bivalence, these definitions, too, satisfy the modal requirements (i) to (iv) above, as can be checked easily.

Apart from that, Diodorus' modalities are of a very different kind from Philo's. There is no modal expression hidden anywhere in his accounts. Instead, which Diodorean modality a proposition has depends wholly on the range of truth-values it has at present and in the future. For example, if a proposition is always true from now on, it is now both necessary and possible; if it is, from now on, sometimes true but not always, it is possible, but not necessary. Hence it is not the case — as is sometimes assumed — that for Diodorus, every proposition is either necessary (and possible) or impossible (and non-necessary). There are propositions that are contingent in the sense of being both possible and non-necessary, namely all those which will change their truth-value at some future time. The proposition ‘It is day’ is such a case.

The dependency of Diodorus' modal notions on the propositions’ truth-values-at-times implies that some propositions can change their modality from possible to impossible and from non-necessary to necessary. For instance, if we assume that the proposition ‘Artemisia is five years old’ is now true, then that proposition is now possible; but it will presumably be impossible at some future time, namely once Artemisia has reached the age of six, since from then on it will never be true again (assuming linearity of time).

We do not know what motivated Diodorus to introduce his modal notions.[1] But we know that Hellenistic philosophers generally regarded Diodorus' modal notions as jeopardizing freedom — a since they rule out the possibility that something that never happens, or is never true, is nonetheless possible. Thus, if ‘Dio goes to Corinth’ is and will be false, then ‘Dio goes to Corinth’ is impossible, and then, or so the thought went, it is impossible for Dio to go to Corinth. In this context it becomes plain why our sources stress the fact that something can be Philonian possible without ever being true or obtaining.This is the relevant difference from Diodorus with respect to logical determinism, the point being that Philo's modalities, unlike Diodorus’, do not unduly limit the scope of contingency.

5. The Master Argument

Diodorus’ definition of that which is possible can be split into two distinct claims: first that everything that either is or will be true is possible, and second, that everything that is possible either is or will be true. The first statement was not questioned by Hellenistic philosophers. It is the second statement that was and is considered counterintuitive and in need of justification; it is this claim which Diodorus attempted to back up with his Master Argument (Alexander, On Aristotle's Prior Analytics 183.34-184.6; Epictetus, Dissertations 2.19).

Despite being widely known in antiquity, the argument has not come down to us; all we have is one brief passage:

The Master argument seems to have been developed from the following starting points: There is a general conflict between the following three <statements>: (I) every past true <proposition> is necessary; and (II) the impossible does not follow from the possible; and (III) something is possible which neither is true nor will be true. Being aware of this conflict, Diodorus used the plausibility of the first two <statements> in order to show that (IV) nothing is possible that neither is nor will be true. (Epictetus, Dissertations 2.19.1)

This is usually understood as implying that the argument was grounded on statements (I) and (II), and had (IV), which is the contradictory of (III), as conclusion; and this is about as far as the passages lead us. But how did the argument run? A viable reconstruction has to satisfy a number of more or less trivial conditions. It must make use of the principles (I) and (II) handed down in Epictetus; in addition to these, it must make use solely of premises plausible to the Stoics; and it must appear valid. For we know that different Stoic philosophers attempted to refute (I) or (II), but we do not hear of anyone questioning the truth of any other premise or the validity of the argument. Moreover, the reconstruction must employ only the logical means and concepts available in antiquity; in particular the notions of proposition, consequence, and modalities used must fit in with the logic of the time, and it must be possible to formulate the argument in ordinary language. Finally, the restored argument should not have a complexity which precludes its presentation at a social gathering, since it appears that people enjoyed discussing the Master argument over dinner (Epictetus, Dissertations. 2.19.8).

The following is an informal reconstruction of the Master Argument which has the advantage of being historically credible and in keeping with the above constraints. (A version of this type of reconstruction was first presented by Arthur Prior (Prior 1955).) The Epictetus passage suggests that the argument was presented in terms of propositions and their modalities, and so will the reconstruction. Other sources present Diodorus' modalities as modalities of states of affairs, and alternative versions of the Master argument can be produced accordingly. (The difference between propositions and states of affairs is often blurred in ancient testimonies of logic.)

In line with Diodorus’ modal definition, the general conclusion of the argument (IV) may be reformulated as

(IV′) If a proposition neither is nor will be true it is impossible.

The first statement is less clear. It runs

(I) Every past true <proposition> is necessary.

The Greek term used for ‘past’ (parelêluthos) is a standard Stoic expression for past propositions, meaning not that the proposition itself subsisted in the past, but that it is in some sense about the past. The principle occurs also in Cicero, together with some explication:

All true <propositions> of the past are necessary … since they are unalterable, i.e. since past <propositions> cannot change from true to false. (Cicero, On Fate 14)

From this passage we may infer that it was a peculiarity of all past true propositions that they cannot change their truth-value to falsehood; and that because of this they are necessary. This suggests that the past true propositions at issue do not include all propositions in the past tense, but that they were those propositions which correspond to some past state or event. For instance, the true past proposition ‘I went to Athens’ corresponds to the event of my having gone to Athens. It can never become false, once it is true. Assume that I went to Athens last month. Then the proposition ‘I went to Athens’ is not only true now, it will also be true tomorrow, the day after, and in fact always from now on. The truth of the proposition is based on the fact that there has been a case of my going to Athens, and — whatever happens from now on — this cannot unhappen. (One can bring out this feature more clearly by reformulating the proposition as ‘It has been the case that I went to Athens’). On the other hand, the proposition ‘You have not been to Athens’ does not correspond to a past state or event. Suppose that up to now you never went to Athens. Then the proposition is true now. Now suppose in addition that you will go to Athens next week. After you have gone there, the proposition ‘You have not been to Athens’ is no longer true. Hence it is not necessary now. (This proposition cannot be correctly paraphrased as ‘It has been the case that you were not in Athens’). We may hence reformulate statement (I) as

(I’) Every true proposition that corresponds to a past state or event is necessary.

The second statement that functions as a premise in the argument is

(II) The impossible does not follow from the possible,

This was accepted by Aristotle and, with the exception of Chrysippus, by all Hellenistic logicians. At least by the Stoics it was understood as

(II′) An impossible proposition does not follow from a possible one.

This amounts to the statement that if a proposition is impossible and follows from some other proposition, then this other proposition is impossible, too.

The following reconstruction assumes that, in addition to (I) and (II), the argument rests on a couple of further principles, which might have been generally taken to be valid and thus not worth mentioning, or else which might have been generally accepted by the Stoics and for this reason omitted by Epictetus. The first additional principle is

(V) If something is the case now, then it has always been the case that it will be the case.

For instance, if I am in Athens now, then it has always in the past been the case that I would be in Athens (at some time). This principle gains historical plausibility from the fact that we find a version of it in Aristotle (On Interpretation 9, 18b9-11), and that another version of it was accepted by the Stoics (Cicero, On Divination 1.125). The second additional principle is

(VI) If something neither is nor will be true, then it has been the case (at some time) that it will never be the case.[2]

This statement is based on the idea that if a proposition presently neither is nor will be true, and you step back in time, as it were, then the formerly present ‘not being true’ turns into a future ‘not going to be true’, so that from the point of view of the past, the proposition will never be true, and the corresponding state of affairs will never be the case. (This is assumed to hold at least for the past moment that immediately precedes the present.) This principle has some plausibility to it. There is some evidence that it may have been discussed in antiquity (Becker 1961, 253-5).

Next the construction of the argument: Fallacies and sophisms were generally presented by means of an example which stands in for the general case, and it is plausible that this was so for the Master Argument as well. Overall, the argumentation then proceeded as follows: you assume of a chosen proposition that it neither is nor will be true; next, by employing (I), (II), (V) and (VI), you deduce that this proposition is impossible. Then you generalize the result to all propositions, since nothing in the argument hinges on the fact that this particular proposition was selected. A suitable example can be found in Alexander's passage on Diodorus' notion of possibility and the Master Argument: the proposition ‘I am in Corinth.’ The argument then starts with the assumption that

(1) the proposition ‘I am in Corinth’ neither is nor will ever be true.

The conclusion to be demonstrated is that

(C) the proposition ‘I am in Corinth’ is impossible.

By (VI) it follows from (1) that

(2) it has been the case (at some time) that I will never be in Corinth.

By (I) (‘all past truths are necessary’), it follows from (2) that

(3) the proposition ‘It has been the case (at some time) that I will never be in Corinth’ is necessary.

But since necessity of a proposition is equivalent to the impossibility of its contradictory (modal requirement (iii) above), from (3) it follows that

(4) the proposition ‘It has always been the case that I will be in Corinth (at some time)’ is impossible.[3]

Now, according to (V), it holds that

(5) if I am in Corinth, then it has always been the case that I will be in Corinth (at some time).

This is equivalent to

(5′) the proposition ‘It has always been the case that I will be in Corinth (at some time)’ follows from the (initial) proposition ‘I am in Corinth’.

Now we can apply (II) (‘the impossible follows from the impossible’) to (4) and (5′), and obtain as a result that

(C) the proposition ‘I am in Corinth’ is impossible.

And this is precisely what the Master argument was meant to show. Moreover, this argument appears to be valid.

Where does the argument go wrong? The ancients went in for criticizing (I) and (II), and one may indeed wonder whether (I) covers cases of the kind to which it has been applied above. But there are also a couple of things questionable with (V) and (VI). With a certain continuum theory of time, it turns out that (VI) does not hold for those — few — cases in which the proposition at issue has started to be false only at the present moment (Denyer 1981, 43 and 45). More importantly, (V) and its variants seem to smuggle in a deterministic assumption. On one or another of these grounds, then, one may attempt to hold the Master Argument unsound, and so to reject Diodorus' own account of the possible as what either is or will be true.


A. Greek or Latin Texts

B. Translations

C. Collections of Testimonies

D. Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

conditionals | Dialectical School | Diodorus Cronus | doxography of ancient philosophy | fatalism | future contingents | logic: ancient | logic: modal | logic: temporal | Megarian School | Prior, Arthur | Stoicism