Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Oct 19, 2005

Ammonius (ca. 435/445-517/526) held the chair of philosophy at Alexandria that had earlier been held by his father Hermeias. Known primarily for his commentaries on Aristotle, which were said to be of greater benefit than anyone else's, he was also distinguished in geometry and astronomy. Himself a pupil of Proclus at Athens, at Alexandria Ammonius taught most of the important Platonists of the late 5th and early 6th centuries: Philoponus, Asclepius, Simplicius, and Olympiodorus. Damascius, who went on to head the school at Athens, heard Ammonius lecture, but attached himself rather to the mentorship of Isidore, who briefly succeeded Proclus' successor Marinus in the Athenian chair. While almost all of Ammonius' Aristotle commentaries were published by students from his lectures, the large commentary on De Interpretatione was written up by Ammonius himself for publication. These commentaries are largely dependent on the lectures of Proclus and thus indebted to Proclus' style of Iamblichean Neoplatonism. Ammonius is known for several contributions, especially for the introduction of an Alexandrian tradition of commentary on Aristotle, but also for the first preserved version of the set of questions to be answered preliminary to the study of Aristotle, the thesis that for Aristotle God is the efficient as well as final cause of the world, and the treatment of the sea battle of De Interpretatione 9 as one of three determinist arguments, along with the ‘Reaper’ and the argument from divine foreknowledge.

1. Life and Works

1.1 Life

Ammonius' father Hermeias, after studying in Athens under Syrianus (from Alexandria, Head of School in Athens from 431/2), went home to Alexandria, where he established the teaching of Platonism as an additional subject in the school of Horapollo (see below), alongside the principal curriculum in rhetoric. His mother Aedesia, a relative of Syrianus, had been meant to marry Proclus (a student of Syrianus who succeeded him as head in 437), but Proclus received a divine warning to avoid the match. From these facts, it is clear that Ammonius, second son of Hermeias and Aedesia, must have been born after about 435 and presumably before 445. He seems to have been dead when Damascius (ca. 460-after 532) was writing his Philosophical History in 526, but alive in 517, when his course on Aristotle's Physics was first published by Philoponus.

Damascius, whose History is the source of most details about Ammonius' life, greatly admired Aedesia for her piety and charity, and while still a young student of rhetoric he gave her eulogy at Horapollo's school. Although the public stipend given her after Hermeias' death, from the time Ammonius and his younger brother Heliodorus were small, was continued by the Alexandrians until her sons' maturity, Damascius says that Aedesia's charitable giving left her sons in debt on her death in old age (ca. 475). This may have something to do with Damascius' opinion that Ammonius was viciously greedy: with this debt, he would certainly have striven to keep teaching and collecting salary and fees (see below, on Ammonius' alleged ‘deal’ with the Christian Bishop of Alexandria). Damascius also gave a rather hagiographic description of Aedesia and Hermeias' eldest child, who died at age seven. Aedesia accompanied her two surviving sons to Athens, where, at her suggestion, both studied with Proclus.

Aedesia and her sons must have returned to Alexandria before 475, where Ammonius assumed his father's former post lecturing on philosophy at the school on Friday mornings. We have reports of lectures on Plato by Ammonius from the beginning and end of his career. Sometime between 475 and 485 Damascius heard him lecture on Platonic philosophy; about 515 Olympiodorus heard him lecture on the Gorgias (Olympiodorus, in Gorg. 199,8-10). Asclepius mentions lectures (or seminars: sunousiai, in Met. 77,4) on Plato and refers to an ‘exegesis’ (in Met. 70,31) of the Theaetetus. Nonetheless, it was his lectures on Aristotle for which Ammonius was famous, and it is these which, for the most part, survive.

In Ammonius' day, Alexandria, unlike Athens, was an important center of Christian cult and culture, the third See of Christendom. The school founded by Horapollo, where after Hermeias joined it the two main courses of study were rhetoric and philosophy, was a hub of the ‘Hellenic’ pagan learning, religion and culture. Nonetheless, some students at the school were—and others would eventually become—Christians. That the school could be a focus of hostile Christian attention had been made abundantly clear by the lynching of Hypatia at the hands of an Alexandrian mob in 415. Questions thus arise about the relation of the school to what Damascius in his History calls ‘the dominant doctrine’. How did the school manage to keep going as a pagan institution in a strongly Christian city? Did the philosophers in the school make any concessions, doctrinal or otherwise, to Christianity?

Ammonius' tenure at the school saw a large-scale attack on the pagan community of Alexandria in the wake of the revolt of Illus (484-488), during which harsh measures were taken against the pagans by the Patriarch Peter III Mongus (482-489), since Illus had allied himself with the corrupt pagan Pamprepius and may have promised him that pagan practice would be tolerated. It was probably during this crisis that Ammonius is represented by Damascius as making an agreement or deal: “Ammonius, who was wickedly greedy and saw everything in terms of what profit he could make, concluded an agreement with the overseer of the dominant doctrine” (Damascius 118B Athanassiadi, with her Introduction, 30-1 and n. 37). Much scholarly attention has focused on the nature of Ammonius' ‘deal’ with the Bishop. The suggestions have been put forward that he agreed to continue the alleged Alexandrian Neoplatonic practice of making the gods into one by collapsing the One into the Intellect (a view congenial to Christianity); or that he agreed to lecture only on Aristotle, not Plato, or not to mention in his teaching the Aristotelian doctrine of the eternity and divinity of the world; or that he betrayed the hiding places of colleagues and pupils. Scholars have adduced counterevidence against the first three suggestions, concerning doctrine. That Ammonius betrayed his fellow Hellenes is a speculation based on his ability—alone among the major figures of the school—to resume his teaching unscathed amid the ruin of Horapollo's school, on Damascius' association of Ammonius' deal with a profit motive, and also on hints that Ammonius may not have been a principled philosophical figure, but rather an evasive person given to intrigue, as evidenced by an earlier power-struggle against one of Damascius' heroes, Horapollo's uncle Heraiscus, who would later be a victim of the persecution (Damascius 78E, 117BC, 119G Athanassiadi, 31-2). Richard Sorabji (1990, p. 12) suggested that Ammonius might have agreed not to make the school a center of pagan and theurgic ritual, which he would also de-emphasize in his teaching, or simply not to make trouble with Christians. He later (2003 and 2005, 21-5) adduced a specific instance of such a change in emphasis, showing that Ammonius glosses over the doctrine of ‘divine names’, their natural origin and theurgic efficacy. According to this doctrine, certain names are given by god, are naturally correct for application to what they name, and their use establishes an efficacious link between one who uses them, e.g. in prayer, and what they name, e.g. a god. Despite his dependence on and agreement with Proclus' exegesis of the Cratylus (cf. Sheppard 1987), Ammonius barely mentions this aspect of theurgic doctrine and practice, which was central to the school of Iamblichus and Proclus and later re-established in Athens by Damascius, and, far from indicating its importance to Neoplatonism, he ascribes it to an obscure priest: “Others attempt to rule out the [application] of ‘by [conventional] imposition’ to names, as Dousareios of Petra does, citing our prayers and curses, in which our names, when they are said, clearly help or harm the people named [by them]” (in Int. 38,23-6). Instead of agreeing with Iamblichus' insistence on theurgy as indispensable to reaching spiritual union with God, a doctrine largely taken over by Proclus, Ammonius harmonized Aristotle with Plato by siding with Porphyry's (232-309) view that names were imposed by humans and, Sorabji suggests, he also agreed with Porphyry's refusal to accept the efficacy of theurgy in purifying the intellect and hence leading us to God. Sorabji's interpretation puts Ammonius in an altogether better light than does Damascius', which is approved by Athanassiadi. For Sorabji his financial gain was the continuation of his municipal salary, so that he could keep his school open, rather than a craven payment for services rendered to the Christian authorities; he did not betray his friends; he did not betray philosophy, since he merely preferred the teaching of Porphyry in the matter of divine names and theurgy to that of Iamblichus and Proclus.

1.2 Works

One work of Ammonius clearly survives in the written form he gave it, his ‘commentary’ (hupomnêma) on Aristotle's De Interpretatione. His commentary on Porphyry's Introduction (in Isag.), is described in the manuscripts variously as ‘Ammonius the Philosopher's Exegesis (or Prolegomena or Commentary) of the Five Sayings’, so that it is perhaps another work given its final form by Ammonius; but its present Prooemium is, in any case, considered inauthentic, and other passages are also interpolations (Busse, CAG IV.3 p. vi).

We hear of other works published by Ammonius, but these are all single book-rolls, monographs on particular points:

The other works of Ammonius which survive are all derived, directly or indirectly, from his lectures, taken down by his students and hence mostly described as being ‘from the voice (apo tês phônês, or: the lectures [skholôn]) of Ammonius'. Two of these are transmitted under the name of Ammonius himself, but are thought to come from the notes of anonymous students from Ammonius' lectures:

Two courses bear the name of Asclepius (ca. 465- ?):

Four courses are transmitted under the name of John Philoponus (ca. 490-ca. 570):

The titles of three of Philoponus' Aristotle courses do not mention Ammonius, and these were probably perceived as representing rather the lectures of Philoponus than those of Ammonius. These are:

However, On Nicomachus' Introduction to Arithmetic (in Nicomachi Intro. Arith.) is thought to be lectures by Philoponus based on Asclepius' publication (see above) of his own notes on Ammonius' lectures (cf. Tarán 1969, 10-13).

2. Ammonius as Aristotelian Commentator

Ammonius established the tradition of Aristotelian commentary in Alexandria. He was followed in this by his students Asclepius, Philoponus (ca. 490-570), Simplicius (writing after 529 after moving to the Athenian school and moving with it from Athens to the East after the school's closure by Justinian), and Olympiodorus (495/505-after 565). The tradition continues through the Christian commentators Elias (probably a pupil of Olympiodorus), David, Ps.-Elias and Stephanus (fl. ca. 610).

In his lectures on Aristotle, Ammonius was heavily indebted to his teacher Proclus, even if he disagreed with him on some important points. The introduction to his in Int. makes Ammonius' great debt to Proclus clear: “Now, we have recorded the interpretations of our divine teacher Proclus, successor to the chair of Plato and a man who attained the limits of human capacity both in the ability to interpret the opinions of the ancients and in the scientific judgment of the nature of reality. If, having done that, we too are able to add anything to the clarification of the book, we owe great thanks to the god of eloquence” (1,6-11; cf. in An. Pr. 43,30, with a citation of Proclus' School Commentary [skholikon hupomnêma]). Proclus, in turn, often used Iamblichus (see, e.g., in An. Pr. 40,16). In addition, Ammonius used other commentators, for example in his in Int. It is thought that most of his material comes from Proclus' lectures, but that Ammonius has polished up what he had in his notes of those lectures, then added material of his own or from other sources. In this case, Ammonius' main source for supplementing Proclus' lectures was apparently the now lost voluminous commentary (see Stephanus in Int. 63,9) of Porphyry, which was also the major source of Boethius' commentary on De Int. and probably also of Ammonius' citations of earlier authors, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias (active late 2nd to early 3rd century), Aspasius (first half of 2nd century), Herminus (2nd C.), and the Stoics. Both Porphyry and Proclus held Int. c. 14 to be spurious (252,10 ff.). Although Ammonius agreed, unlike them he decided to include commentary on the chapter, which he repeats ‘verbatim’ from Syrianus (died ca. 437), having nothing of his own to add (254,22-31; cf. 253,12).

Lectures on the works of Plato and Aristotle presumably lasted about an hour. In Proclus we see signs of such hour-long divisions, as well as a division of the lecture on an individual passage into discussion of its doctrine (theôria), sometimes quite wide-ranging, followed by its wording (lexis); signs of this division are still present in Ammonius' in Int. Students evidently took copious notes, which they might then publish, under their own names or that of Ammonius himself.

The lectures of Ammonius and his students gave a very detailed exegesis of their text and an indication of its philosophical importance, including how it related to other texts of Aristotle and Plato. These two philosophers were each taken to be substantially self-consistent and uniform in opinion throughout his own writings, and in agreement with one another and with the truth (see, e.g., Simplicius, in DA 1,3-21). According to Elias (in Cat. 107,24-7), Proclus put together a list of ten questions to be answered preliminary to the study of Aristotle, and it is Ammonius who gives us the first preserved version of these. One of the preliminary questions concerns the role of the interpreter. Elias (in Cat. 122,25-123,5) says that the exegete is also a knower, in the one capacity explaining what is unclear in his text and in the other judging its truth and falsity. He ought not to insist that his author is always correct, but he ought rather to value the truth more than the man; he ought not to become an exclusive partisan of his philosopher, as Iamblichus was for Plato. Further, he ought to know all of Aristotle, so that he can show on the basis of Aristotle's works that he agrees with himself; he ought to know all of Plato, so that he can show that Plato agrees with himself, while making the works of Aristotle an introduction to those of Plato. These requirements are associated with Ammonius by Olympiodorus in his commentary on the Gorgias (cf. Tarrant in Jackson et al. 1998, p. 11 and notes on 32.1 and 42.2), and one can see the insistence on knowing and judging the truth over loyalty to Aristotle in Ammonius' own introductory precepts (in Cat. 7,34 ff.).

The later Alexandrian commentators tend to emphasize that it is the commentator's duty not to interpret apparent disagreements of Aristotle with Plato literally, but to look to the sense and discover the fundamental agreement or ‘harmony’ (sumphônia) of the two philosophers (e.g., Simplicius, in Cat. 7,31). Ammonius' own statement of the qualities of an exegete (in Cat. 7,34 ff.) does not say this, but in practice he does point out the agreement of Plato and Aristotle (in Int. 39,11). Syrianus and Proclus criticized Aristotle's disagreement with Plato's views on the existence of Forms and on the demiurgic role of God as crafting and creating the physical world. In contrast, Ammonius points out (Asclepius, in Metaph. 69,17-27; cf. Sorabji 2005, vol. 3 sect. 5(d)) that, while Aristotle ‘seems’ to be attacking Plato on the Forms in Metaph. 990b3, he actually agrees with Plato, since he praises (De An. 429a28) those who say that the soul is the place of Forms. Ammonius also makes God the (efficient) cause of all things, in addition to being the final cause (see below, sect. 3.2).

3. Philosophical Positions

For four reasons it is difficult to pinpoint Ammonius' own philosophical positions and contributions to philosophy or to the interpretation of Aristotle: (1) Our evidence is confined to commentaries on Aristotle, whose interpretation did not leave as much scope for expounding Neoplatonic ideas as did that of Plato. (2) He depends in these works on Proclus, whose Aristotle lectures or commentaries do not survive, so that we cannot be sure what in them is really his own. (3) Some of Ammonius' works failed to reach us. (4) We have to depend to a significant degree on his pupils' writings for our information about him and his contributions, and their own stance may be difficult to separate from that of Ammonius himself. The best approach at present attempts to piece together Ammonius' views from his commentary on De Interpretatione, from statements attributed to him by later commentators, and from those lectures of Ammonius which were either published by students under Ammonius' name or which, while published under students' names, seem to show little signs of having altered his teachings—namely, Asclepius on the Metaphysics and the early commentaries of Philoponus (or their early versions, in the case of commentaries, such as that on the Physics, which were revised) (see above, sect. 1.2).

3.1 Ammonius' Neoplatonism

It was claimed by K. Praechter (1910) that the Alexandrian Neoplatonic school of Ammonius and his followers differed substantially from that of Athens both before and after Ammonius' time, particularly by downplaying the Iamblichean theurgic or magical and religious elements and the complex Iamblichean and Proclan hierarchies and triadic groupings at the different levels of reality recognized in Neoplatonist metaphysics (on these, see, e.g., Wallis 1972, 100-110, 123-34, 146-54). In contrast to these wild and woolly Athenian doctrines and practices, Praechter saw the Alexandrian school, in whose commentaries such doctrines do not figure prominently, as more restrained, rational, respectable; they were sober interpreters of Aristotle and had a doctrine much more easily reconcilable with the strong Christian cult of Alexandria. Indeed, scholars like P. Merlan (1968) went further, making Ammonius the purveyor of a strongly Christianized philosophy which featured a creative, personal God.

Recent studies of the Alexandrians (especially Hadot 1978 on Hierocles and Simplicius and Verrycken 1990a on Ammonius) have largely resulted in the abandonment of Praechter's claims. Overlapping personal histories already cast doubt on the hypothesis of a gulf between the two schools. As noted above, Syrianus, head of the school at Athens 431/2-ca. 437, came from Alexandria. Hermeias brought Syrianus' teachings back from Athens to his native Alexandria. Ammonius studied with and was evidently greatly influenced by Proclus in Athens. Furthermore, references and allusions to various important pieces of Proclan doctrine can be adduced from various places in the commentaries of Ammonius and his students. The relative paucity, however, of such references and their lack of centrality to the works in which they are found makes it difficult to assess their significance in this regard. The interpretation of certain statements which might be interpreted as telling against Ammonius' espousal of, say, the transcendent One, is also a complex matter. Ammonius' interpreters now rightly rely to a great extent on context in understanding his works. They ask, for example, whenever Ammonius does not mention a particular Neoplatonic doctrine or mentions it in a simplified form, whether the doctrine was necessary to an understanding of the passage on which Ammonius was commenting. As noted above, Ammonius comments mostly on Aristotle, especially his logical works, and there is reason to believe that these were held to be a preliminary study to that of Plato. In such works there would be no need for Ammonius to go into many of the details of a complex Neoplatonic theology and metaphysics, even if he espoused such views. In some contexts a discussion of certain metaphysical doctrines might even have been inappropriate, especially if the work under discussion was meant to be studied by less advanced students. Thus, the fact that Ammonius does not avail himself of certain opportunities to discuss certain tenets of Neoplatonic metaphysics does not mean that he did not espouse such tenets in other circumstances. On the other hand, Ammonius also commented on Aristotle's natural philosophy and metaphysics, and there is no reason to doubt that the Metaphysics at least would be placed on the same, or only a slightly lower, level as Plato's own works, so that a failure to refer to certain Neoplatonic doctrines there could perhaps indicate that Ammonius did not share them. Further, the very fact that Ammonius was, as emphasized above, especially known for his commentaries on Aristotle, perhaps reflects a tendency on his part not to have espoused a full-blown Neoplatonic metaphysical system.

On the most general level, Ammonius says that the purpose and utility of studying Aristotle's philosophy is “to ascend to the common principle (arkhê) of all things and to be aware that this is the one goodness itself, incorporeal, indivisible, uncircumscribed, unbounded and of infinite potentiality” (in Cat. 6,9-12). Thus, his stance, in this early work, is that of a Neoplatonist, as has been clearly shown by Verrycken (1990, 212-15). Ammonius says that Aristotle's distinction of spoken sound, affection of the soul, and thing in the world (De Int. 16a3-8) corresponds to the Neoplatonic hypostases of Soul, Intellect and God (in Int. 24,24-9). He also places ‘not-being’ above the Intellect at the highest plane of reality and occasionally writes in a manner reminiscent of Proclus' divine henads. So there seems no doubt of his genuine commitment to a Neoplatonic stance in metaphysics, even if he may not have espoused a system as complex as that of Proclus.

3.2 Aristotle's God as Efficient Cause of the World

Aristotle's intellectual God seems not to be a good fit for the role of craftsman and creator which God plays in Plato's Timaeus. Proclus (in Tim. 1.266.28-268.24) says as much: while “the Peripatetics say there is something separate [from the physical world], it is not creative (poiêtikon), but final (telikon); hence they both removed the exemplars (paradeigmata) and set a non-plural intelligence over all things.” Indeed, Proclus says, Aristotle's own principles ought to have made him admit that God was a creator. According to Simplicius, Peripatetic interpreters, including Alexander of Aphrodisias, accepted that God was a final cause of the entire world, that God's moving the heavens made him indirectly the efficient cause of sublunar motion, and that he was also the efficient cause of the heavens' motion, but not of their existence as a substance (in Cael. 271,13-21; in Phys. 1360,24-1363,24). Simplicius goes on to say that Ammonius devoted an entire book to arguing that, contrary to these Peripatetics, God was both final and efficient cause of both the movement and existence of the whole world, sublunar and supralunar. This interpretation, according to Simplicius, allowed Ammonius to harmonize Aristotle with Plato; it should not, therefore, be taken as a concession to Christian doctrine. Instead of criticizing Aristotle, as Proclus had done, Ammonius took five Aristotelian passages and interpreted them as indicating that Aristotle did in fact reason along the lines Proclus had indicated in his criticism. Thus, for example, Ammonius argued, according to Simplicius, that in Physics 2.3, 194b29-32, that from which comes the origin of motion (i.e., God, the unmoved mover) is itself a productive cause. Ammonius also argued that “if, according to Aristotle, the power of any finite body is itself finite, clearly whether it be a power of moving or a power that produces being, then, just as it gets its eternal motion from the unmoved cause, so it must receive its eternal being as a body from the non-bodily cause” (trs. of this and other relevant texts in Sorabji 2005, vol. 2, sect. 8(c)1). Ammonius' harmonization of Aristotle with Plato on this point would prove essential to both Arabic Aristotelians and, eventually, to Aquinas' ability to enlist Aristotle's God for Christianity. Verrycken (1990, p. 218) interprets Ammonius' conception of the relation of God and the world as based on the Neoplatonic ‘procession’ (God's production of the world) and ‘reversion’ (its direction toward God as final cause), with God conceived as the divine Intellect. Verrycken (1990, p. 222) argues further that Ammonius and his school also conceived of Aristotle's God as consisting of two Neoplatonic hypostases, the Good and the Intellect, and that he/it could be viewed as either one, depending on one's point of view: in metaphysics, as we see in Asclepius' commentary, Aristotle's God is mostly understood as the Good, “the first origin and final cause of all reality”; in natural philosophy, as we see in Simplicius, God is primarily the demiurgic Intellect, which is itself the final cause of the world's movement.

3.3 Aristotle and anti-determinism

In his commentary on On Interpretation chapter 9, Ammonius added two other determinist arguments to the famous ‘there will be a sea-battle tomorrow’ argument, making his commentary into a small treatise on determinism. The first of these was the ‘Reaper’ (131,20 ff.), an argument which Ammonius considered more ‘verbal’, which perhaps goes back to Diodorus Cronus and which greatly interested Zeno the Stoic: “if you will [that is, you are going to] reap, it is not the case that perhaps (takha) you will reap and perhaps you will not reap, but you will reap, whatever happens (pantôs); and if you will not reap, in the same way it is not that perhaps you will reap and perhaps you will not reap, but, whatever happens, you will not reap. But in fact, of necessity, either you will reap or you will not reap.” In consequence, Ammonius says, “the ‘perhaps’ is destroyed,” and with it the contingent. Against this, Ammonius argues that if the determinist intends ‘you will reap’ to be contingent, he has already lost his point, but if he intends it as necessary, he is taking for granted what he intends to prove; further, in that case, ‘will reap, whatever happens’ will be true, but the determinist cannot say ‘but in fact either you will reap or you will not reap’, since if one of these is necessary, the other is impossible. Sorabji (1998, 4-5) argues that ‘perhaps’ is ambiguous, marking either a hesitant statement about the future or a statement about present possibilities, and that the determinist argument plays on this ambiguity, something which he thinks Ammonius did not see.

The second determinist argument, said by Ammonius to be ‘more related to the nature of things', is from divine knowledge (132,8 ff.): “the gods either know in a definite manner the outcome of contingent things or they have absolutely no notion of them or they have an indefinite knowledge of them, just as we do.” Ammonius shows that the gods must have definite knowledge of their creations. Is the future definite, then, and not contingent, since the gods know future facts in a definite manner? Ammonius' reply to this question is based on the idea (from Iamblichus, originally) that the type of knowledge depends on the type of knower, not on the type of thing known. Therefore (136,1-17), due to their own nature, the gods, and only they, can have definite (hôrismenê) knowledge of future contingent facts, though those facts are indefinite, in themselves, and not determined. Indeed, with the gods nothing is past or future (133,20), for they are outside of time.

Only after discussing these two additional arguments for the abolition of contingency does Ammonius consider the sea-battle argument from Aristotle's discussion (De Int.18b17-25, 19a30-32): if every affirmation must be true or false and if there is a sea-battle today, it was always true to say that there would be a sea-battle on this day and, hence, it was not possible for this not to happen or not to be going to happen, so that it is necessary for it to happen. Ultimately, all things which are going to happen happen necessarily and none by chance. There has been, since the Stoics, controversy over Aristotle's answers to this argument. What has been called the ‘standard interpretation’ holds that Aristotle thought that, unlike such sentences about the past or present, sentences asserting future singular contingent facts are neither true nor false, exempting them from the principle of bivalence and avoiding the alleged deterministic consequence that contingency and chance are destroyed. There has likewise been a substantial debate over whether Ammonius was an adherent of the ‘standard interpretation’ of Aristotle's answer (cf. Sorabji 1998, Kretzmann 1998, Mignucci 1998, Seel 2000ab).

Ammonius, like Boethius, whose answer is somewhat more complicated, attacks the problem by means of his interpretation of Aristotle's opening remark in the chapter (18a28 ff.) that, while the rule that, of every contradictory pair of sentences, one is true and one false holds among sentences about what is or has happened, as well as sentences about universals taken universally and for singulars in the present or past tense, for universals not said universally it is not necessary, as he has explained in the preceding; “but in the case of future singulars it is not the same.” Ammonius interprets “it is not the same” as indicating a doctrine that sentences about future singular contingent events ‘divide the true and false’ (i.e., obey the principle of bivalence) but do so in an indefinite, ‘not in a definite manner’ (ouk aphôrismenôs): either there will be a sea-battle tomorrow or there will not be one, and certainly there will not both be one and not, but whichever of these two will turn out to be the case, the sentence correctly predicting that outcome is true (and the other false) only in an indefinite, not a definite way. Thus it is not “possible in a definite manner to say which of them will be true and which will be false, since the thing has not already occurred but can both occur and not occur” (130,23 ff.).

The idea of being true ‘in a definite’ or ‘in an indefinite manner’ does not occur in De Int. The interpretation of Aristotle's response to the sea-battle argument by this distinction probably goes back to Alexander of Aphrodisias (cf. Alexander, Quaestiones 1.4 with Sharples 1992, esp. 32-6). The distinction itself is probably taken over from the discussion of one of two contrary properties belonging to a subject ‘in a definite manner’ in Cat. 10, 12b38-40, which may have been suggested to the commentators by Aristotle's remark at De Int. 19a33 that “sentences are true in the way things are.” What precisely is meant by the distinction between being true in a definite or in an indefinite manner is obscure, controversial and much debated in the literature: is it the distinction between necessary or causally deterministic truth and mere truth, or that between being already true and going to be, while not yet being, true (cf. Nicostratus' characterization of ‘the Peripatetics’ in Simplicius, in Cat. 406,13-407,15)?

At the end of his discussion (154,3 ff., interpreting 19a23 ff.), Ammonius brings together necessary and definite truth, but not clearly enough to resolve all questions about the latter. He uses Aristotle's idea that sentences can be necessarily true in two ways, either absolutely, no matter whether they are said of perishable, existing or non-existent things, or for as long as the predicate holds of the subject. The whole of a disjunction of contradictory assertions, such as ‘either there will be a sea-battle tomorrow or there will not be a sea-battle tomorrow’ or ‘either Socrates is walking or Socrates is not walking’, is necessarily true in the absolute sense. Ammonius says that this is still the case when, due to the nature of the thing in question, one of the disjuncts is true in a definite manner, as in ‘either fire is hot or fire is not hot’ (154,11). It appears, then, that Ammonius treats only the contradictory disjunctions as necessarily true in the absolute sense, while their disjoined parts may be necessarily true in the other sense, that is, only as long as the predicate holds of the subject. In the case of certain facts, such as fire being hot, this is always the case, and of two contradictory disjuncts the one which asserts this fact is always true in a definite manner. In the case of contingent facts, then, one disjunct will only be true in a definite manner when the subject exists and the predicate is true of it. For Ammonius, when Aristotle restricts the discussion to future contingent facts, this makes it necessary that neither member of a contradiction said about them be true in a definite manner, ‘whatever happens’, since each, being contingent, must be susceptible of both truth and falsity ‘however it chances’ or ‘for the most part’ or ‘for the lesser part’. Thus, Ammonius' explanation of Aristotle's reply to the determinist has an affinity with his answers to the determinist's claims about the ‘Reaper’ (there, the determinist is said to have illegitimately assumed that ‘you will reap’ is necessary, not contingent; here, to have ignored Aristotle's assumption that the disjuncts are contingent) and about divine foreknowledge (there, the gods are said to know things definitely, because these things are not future for the gods, although they are both future and indefinite for us; here, the future disjuncts are each contingent and, thus, not definitely true, it being open for each to be true or false in the event). Ammonius' approach may not be very satisfying to us, in that it does not answer the question of what kind of truth-value Aristotle or Ammonius assigned to future contingent propositions, but it keeps to the project of De Int., exploring the application of and the exceptions to the rule that every contradictory pair of sentences has one member true and one member false (cf. Whitaker 1996). Boethius (in De Int. II 106,30-107,16, 208,1-18) also uses the distinction between being true in a definite and in an indefinite manner, but there is debate among scholars as to whether he understands this distinction and its role in Aristotle's argument in just the same way as Ammonius (cf. Sorabji 1998, Kretzmann 1998, Mignucci 1998).

4. Influence

Ammonius was chiefly influential as the founder of the school of Aristotle-interpretation in Alexandria. Nearly all the principal commentators who came after him were his pupils or his pupils' pupils. He gave a model for the method of exegesis of Aristotle and Plato and his lecturing style made an impression on students. His commentary on De Interpretatione was particularly important and served as a source for Stephanus and other commentators. In its translation by William of Moerbeke, this work was influential on Aquinas and thus on medieval and later Aristotelian philosophy and semantics.


A. Works of Ammonius in Greek and in Translation

B. Historical Sources

C. Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Alexander of Aphrodisias | Aristotle | Aristotle, commentators on | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | Damascius | Dialectical School | Diodorus Cronus | freedom: ancient theories of | Iamblichus | Neoplatonism | Olympiodorus | Philoponus | Plato | Porphyry | Proclus | Simplicius | Syrianus