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Byzantine Philosophy

First published Mon Sep 8, 2008

For the purposes of this article, Byzantine philosophy is the study and teaching of traditional subjects of philosophy in the Greek language between c. 730 and 1453. The second half of this delineation construes the attribute “Byzantine” rather narrowly, in that it excludes the whole period between c. 330 and c. 730, which is commonly referred to by historians as “Early Byzantine” (and also leaves out of account philosophical activity in the minority languages of the Byzantine Empire). The main reason for focusing on the philosophical works after c. 730 is that Early Byzantine philosophy is usually covered in accounts of late Ancient Philosophy, of which it is a seamless continuation. The first half of the delineation should not be taken to imply any particular view regarding the “true face of Byzantine philosophy”, although we do think that it is by being related in certain ways to the philosophical tradition that a written work is eligible to be classed as philosophical. This tradition was formed in antiquity. Hence, the works discussed here will typically be concerned with questions inherited from ancient philosophy.

We have tried to impose a provisional borderline between Byzantine philosophy and other areas which are so closely related to Byzantine philosophy as to be sometimes inseparable from it. Most importantly, we have tried to demarcate our subject matter from that of Byzantine theology, not because we believe that an account in which the religious dimension is largely ignored will be sufficient to grasp Byzantine intellectual history in its organic entirety, but because we think that a clearer conception of this part of Byzantine intellectual history is both desirable in itself and necessary for the understanding of the whole. This may seem to lead us straight towards an episodic account, concentrating on a few solitary thinkers on the fringe of Byzantine intellectual history. In order to avoid this we have chosen not to place very heavy demands on the originality of the works to be included. Our main concern has been to describe the typical features of the philosophical tradition in Byzantium, rather than to highlight the rare instances when innovative views and arguments were put forward.

The main part of the article is divided into three sections. Section 1 attempts to situate Byzantine philosophy in the general context of Byzantine culture and education, and to give a brief survey of the more important philosophical authors and their works. For Section 2, we have made a selection of two especially significant topics in the fields of natural philosophy and metaphysics. This arrangement allows us to look a bit more closely at the form and content of some Byzantine philosophical views and arguments without giving up the ambition to be reasonably historically comprehensive.

1. Historical Survey

1.1 Byzantine Culture and Education

One conspicuous feature of Byzantine literary culture in general, and the study of philosophy in particular, is its relative continuity with ancient Greek literary culture. In Byzantium, the treasures of this culture never had to be discovered, as they were in the 9th-century Arab East, or even rediscovered, as in the 12th-century Latin West. At all times, Homer's Iliad remained the most important textbook for secondary education. Still, this continuity is not absolute: considerable parts of the literary heritage were pushed into oblivion in periods of cultural decline, some of which were eventually lost, whereas others survived to attract new attention during the subsequent periods of intensified activity. The most important periods of intensified activity, so far as the history of philosophy is concerned, are: (1) the late Phrygian to early Macedonian (842–959), when ancient philosophical texts were saved for posterity by the production of new copies in minuscule script; (2) the late Macedonian to early Komnenan (1042–1143); and (3) the early Palaiologan (1259–1341). Each of these periods was ushered in by the establishment of an Imperial School of Philosophy in Constantinople. Apart from the Imperial Schools, private tutorial played an important part in higher education, some teachers attaining considerable fame, for example Nikephoros Blemmydes (1197–c. 1269), Gregory of Cyprus (1241–1290), Nikephoros Gregoras (1293/94–1360/61) and George Gemistos Plethon (c. 1360–1452). In the Komnenan (1182–1204) and Palaiologan (1259–1453) periods, the Patriarchal School loomed large, at times existing side by side with the Imperial School, but apparently specially designated for the education of the clergy.

There was never in Byzantium anything resembling the autonomous universities of the Latin West. Higher education was designed to train officials of the state and church, not masters of the arts and sciences. The Greek-speaking world was small and decreasing, and there was scarcely any demand in it for very specialized scholarship. Moreover, theology never developed into the kind of systematic discipline it became in the Latin West, and logic was never acknowledged as an ancillary discipline (although it was taught at the Patriarchal School, at least in the Palaiologan period). All this contributed to the prevalence in Byzantine higher education of an encyclopedic ideal, and to the preference of rhetorical over philosophical studies.

There is reason to think that the task facing Leo the Mathematician, as he was appointed to the chair of philosophy at the Magnaura School in the mid-9th century, was to teach Aristotelian logic. In fact, elementary Aristotelian logic and natural philosophy combined with elementary mathematics would always form the standard philosophical curriculum in Byzantium. Perhaps the range of courses was slightly expanded in the late 1040s to the 1070s, when Michael Psellos and John Italos were Consuls of the Philosophers, but the standard curriculum was certainly back in force at the Imperial School under George Akropolites in the 1260s and early 1270s. The logic texts usually studied were Porphyry's Isagoge as well as Aristotle's Categories, De interpretatione, Prior Analytics 1.1–7 and Sophistici elenchi 1–7. Periodically, there seems to have been significant interest also in the second book of the Posterior Analytics, since we have no fewer than four extant Byzantine commentaries on it, in addition to the ancient paraphrase by Themistius and the commentary by pseudo-Philoponus. In natural philosophy, extracts from Aristotle's Physics, De generatione et corruptione and Meteorology would be read, whereas the mathematics course consisted mainly of Nicomachus’ Introductio arithmetica and the first six books of Euclid's Elements. In many cases, students would replace some or all of these texts with compendia such as the widely circulated Epitome logica and Epitome physica by Nikephoros Blemmydes, or the Logic and Quadrivium by the anonymous of 1007 (‘Anonymus Heiberg’)—or indeed John of Damascus’ Dialectica.

It deserves to be noted that before the 12th century, the whole Byzantine output of Aristotelian commentaries dealt exclusively with the works on logic. No doubt this reflects the needs of the educational sector at the time. Natural philosophy in the 7th–11th centuries is only represented by elementary compendia such as the ones by Symeon Seth (mid- to late-11th century). There is a commentary on the Physics attributed in some manuscripts to Michael Psellos, but recent research points to a later date for this work (Golitsis 2007). If the range of subjects covered by the Aristotelian commentaries produced in the two decades after 1118 is much greater, this is due to the initiative of the princess Anna Komnene, who commissioned a number of scholars to write commentaries on previously neglected works of Aristotle. This was an exceptional enterprise: it would and could hardly have been undertaken had it not been preceded by a period of strong interest in philosophy; but it left very few traces in the learned activities of the immediately following decades.

Obviously, there were other forums than the schools for philosophical discourse. Photios seems to have hosted some kind of literary salon in his home in the 850s or 860s, and similar gatherings, where philosophical and other essays were read and discussed, constituted a central element in early Palaiologan cultural life.

1.2 Literary Forms of Byzantine Philosophy

Since Byzantine education was so preoccupied with rhetoric, it is perhaps no wonder that we find a rather large diversity of literary forms employed for philosophical purposes by Byzantine writers. Obviously, this diversity to some extent reflects the various needs of educational and scholarly practice. But there are many literary forms that do not readily lend themselves to use in such contexts; these, then, will have been cultivated for other reasons.

One such form is the dialogue. The philosophical dialogue endured throughout the whole Byzantine era, even if perhaps it did not flourish as abundantly as in the contemporary West. By and large, it seems possible to divide the extant specimens into two subcategories: Plato pastiche and Lucian pastiche. In the latter subcategory belongs the early 12th-century satire Timarion, which offers some amusing mockery of contemporary or near-contemporary philosophy professors like Michael Psellos, John Italos, and Theodore of Smyrna. The elenctic dialogue in Plato's style seems to have been considered particularly useful for polemical purposes. Many dialogues in this subcategory have a more theological than philosophical content, but Theodore Prodromos’ (c. 1100–1170) relatively good-humoured Xenedemus, or, Predicables, and Nikephoros Gregoras’ (1293/94–1360/61) rather more virulent Phlorentius, or, On Wisdom are two conspicuous exceptions. A particularly intriguing example is Hermippus, or, On Astrology: this attempt at a reconciliation between the belief in astral influence over the natural world and the Christian doctrines of divine providence and human free will is one of three anonymous dialogues, probably from the early 14th century, which have been variously attributed to Nikephoros Gregoras, John Aktouarios and John Katrones (or Katrarios) (Hohlweg 1995).

Philosophical treatises, vaguely defined as prose monologues on particular themes arguing personal views, are found predominantly from the three most philosophically productive periods (see section 1.1). They were composed by numerous authors and for various purposes, some of them, no doubt, strictly pedagogical or scholarly; but we will here only mention two examples of a slightly more topical and literary character. The philosophical essays (Logoi) of Nikephoros Choumnos (c. 1250/55–1327) are written in a personal but hardly original style—much in keeping with the views propounded in them—which does not always correspond to the author’s professed ideal of clarity. Those of Theodore Metochites (Sēmeiōseis gnōmikai, c. 1326) represent a further move in the direction of essays in the strict and narrow sense. Inspired by Plutarch and anticipating Montaigne, Metochites seems to have conceived of them as adding up to a ‘self-portrait as a philosopher’, theorizing about, and obviously trying to put into practice, the proper style for philosophy.

Metochites discussed philosophy in some of his orations (Logoi) and some of his hexameter poetry. Dodecasyllabic verse was also put to use, notably by John Tzetzes (c. 1110–1180), who wrote a 1700-line paraphrase of Porphyry's Isagoge. The Byzantines are also known for having enthusiastically cultivated the art of writing letters, in which they occasionally dealt with philosophical questions (e.g., Michael Psellos, Letter to Xiphilinos; Theodore Prodromos, On ‘Great’ and ‘Small’).

Turning to those literary forms that can be assumed to have had an educational or scholarly purpose, the kind of texts that bring us most closely into contact with the daily reality of philosophy classes are undoubtedly the collections of questions and answers that have been handed down from the 1040s to 1070s, the most well-known of which is perhaps the Quaestiones quodlibetales by John Italos (c. 1025–after 1082).

A very well-represented philosophical genre is the compendium. Most of these cover only a part of philosophy, like the logic compendium by John Chortasmenos (c. 1370–1436/37), the Quadrivium by George Pachymeres (1242–c. 1310), or the Logic and Quadrivium by the anonymous of 1007 (‘Anonymus Heiberg’). Some of them attempt universality, like Pachymeres’ paraphrase-compendium of Aristotle’s philosophical writings (the Philosophia), or indeed Joseph Rhakendytes’ (d. 1330) Encyclopedia, which also included rhetoric and medicine. As to the question of why the Byzantines produced compendia, there can be little doubt that they mainly did so for educational purposes. Most of the compendia are wholly or partly concerned with logic, the most basic subject in the philosophical curriculum. They do not contain detailed comments for people already initiated in the subtleties of Aristotelian logic; rather, they are introductory texts that do not presuppose any significant knowledge of the subject. As to the question of why they constantly produced new compendia, not seldom by cutting and pasting from already existing ones, the answer is probably complex. In some cases, a Byzantine teacher may have insisted on composing his own compendium because he was influenced by a different philosophical tradition. More often, he may simply have felt the ones already available were factually or pedagogically inadequate. In other cases, it may have been just an easy means of adding another item to one's list of publications. By the time of Chortasmenos, for instance, it seems to have been perfectly normal to advertise a new compendium as nothing more than a mere compilation.

A large proportion of the Byzantine philosophical texts consist of commentaries on ancient authorities—in fact, almost invariably Aristotle. The only Plato commentary from the period after c. 730 is George Pachymeres’ supplement to Proclus on the last 24 pages of the Parmenides. These commentaries are not, however, all made according to the same pattern. A few main categories can be discerned, and even within some of these categories, there is considerable variation. The most basic type of commentary is (a) simply a collection of scholia or notes, usually transmitted in the margin of the Aristotelian text. The individual scholia of such a collection may be the work of an indeterminate number of scholars. An example is Arethas’ scholia on the Isagoge, which draws on many earlier commentaries, some of which are now lost. It is Arethas’ commentary in the sense that he copied, and possibly collected and edited, the scholia in his Aristotle manuscript; in terms of authorship, however, it is a product of mass collaboration. Next, (b) the collection may be provided with an introduction dealing with preliminary questions. Rules for the composition of such introductions were established by the Alexandrian commentators on Porphyry and Aristotle in the 5th–7th centuries. The best examples in the period after c. 730 of collections of scholia with introductions are probably the commentaries on Porphyry's and Aristotle’s logical works by Leo Magentenos (late 12th or early to mid-13th century). Further, (c) the notes can be integrated in a running commentary, so as to form a quasi-independent whole, each new section introduced by a lemma from the text. This is the standard type of so-called ‘exegetical commentary’ typified by Alexander of Aphrodisias and cultivated in Byzantine times by Michael of Ephesus and Eustratios of Nicaea in the early 12th century. (d) The Alexandrian 6th–7th-century commentaries are sometimes divided into more or less even chunks (praxeis), each starting with a lemma followed by a general explanation of its meaning (theōria), and then proceeding to comments on particular points (lexis). A Middle Byzantine example is provided by Eustratios’ commentary on Posterior Analytics 2. (e) An even more advanced form is represented by George (Gennadios) Scholarios’ commentaries, which, in the manner of contemporary Latin works, are divided into ‘lessons’ (anagnōseis = lectiones), each of which is subdivided into an introduction, a broad analysis of the text into sections, a detailed analysis with interpretations of particular points, and finally ‘investigations’ (zētēmata = quaestiones).

The genre of Aristotelian paraphrase, that is, adaptations in which Aristotle's text is rephrased, reorganized, and amplified or pruned, as need be, in order to make it more easily understood, was allegedly invented by Themistius in the mid-4th century, revived by Michael Psellos in the mid-11th century, and further developed by Sophonias and others in the late 13th to early 14th centuries. It is a curious fact that the only periods from which we have dated paraphrases of Aristotelian works are precisely these three. In addition, there is an Arabic paraphrase that may have been based on a lost Greek paraphrase, which must in that case have been composed in the late 6th or 7th century (D’Ancona 2001). Works of uncertain date include the paraphrase of the Nicomachean Ethics printed in CAG 19 as the work of Heliodorus of Prusa (before 1366; see section 1.3). Sophonias consciously tried to blend elements of ‘exegetical commentary’ with his paraphrase of the De anima, in order to be able to preserve more of Aristotle’s original wording. George Pachymeres effected another kind of hybrid paraphrase by organizing his Philosophia like a compendium, which deals with a given subject, rather than a commentary or a paraphrase, which deals with a given text.

Not only Aristotle's works were paraphrased; there are Christianizing paraphrases of Proclus’ Three Treatises on Providence (the latter have since been lost in the original Greek) by Isaac Sebastokrator (1093–after 1152) and of Epictetus’ Encheiridion (no fewer than three of them, all of uncertain date; one of them, composed and provided with a commentary no later than 960, when the oldest manuscript was copied, seems to have enjoyed considerable popularity in the 13th and 14th centuries: Boter 1999, 197–256). One may also note a paraphrase of Ptolemy's Tetrabiblos sometimes ascribed to Proclus, written before the end of the 10th century (Bydén 2003, 352).

1.3 People, Works, Currents

Our brief survey of the philosophical production in Byzantium starts in the 9th century with the work of the patriarch of Constantinople, Photios (c. 810–after 893), though there is evidence of elementary teaching of logic and ethics in the 7th and 8th centuries during the period of Iconoclasm. The most important philosophical work from this period is the Dialectica, the first part of John of Damascus’ (c. 675–749) widely influential Source of Knowledge, which draws mainly on the late antique commentators on Porphyry’s Isagoge and Aristotle's logical works. Unfortunately, we know little about Leo the Mathematician (c. 790–after 869), who taught Aristotelian logic at the Magnaura School in Constantinople, established soon after the end of Iconoclasm. We only find some notes of his in manuscripts containing Platonic dialogues.

But it is undoubtedly with Photios that we first encounter in Byzantine times a large-scale revival of the study of antiquity and a profound interest in the texts of ancient philosophers. Photios is famous mainly for his Bibliotheke, a vast compilation of ancient Greek literature, and a Lexicon, in which he collected notable words and expressions. He also taught Aristotelian logic and wrote, for this purpose, a commentary on Aristotle’s Categories; this was later serialized in eleven chapters, all of which are included in the Amphilochia, an unsystematic collection of small essays dealing with theological and philosophical topics. In these chapters as well as in some of his other essays, Photios engages in a critical discussion of some of the most central theses in ancient philosophy, such as Plato's conception of forms, whose capacity to function as predicates he rejects, and Aristotle's distinction between primary and secondary substances, which he thinks entails that ‘substance’ is an ambiguous term.

During this “first Byzantine Renaissance”, as the period has been aptly characterized, the archbishop of Caesarea, Arethas (c. 850–932/44) also commented on Aristotle's Categories and Porphyry’s Isagoge (cf. section 1.2). He is better known, however, for having been instrumental in the transmission of ancient texts, in particular the Platonic corpus. He commissioned the transcription of a complete copy of Plato's works to which he added marginal notes; the first part of his Plato text is extant as the famous Clarkianus 39 manuscript in the Bodleian Library of Oxford.

In the mid-11th to early 12th centuries, there is a significant development from the widely humanistic character of Photios’ and Arethas’ interests towards a new understanding of the philosophical enterprise. The philosopher is now regarded as someone with a hard-earned knowledge in all branches of learning, who forms his own views on the philosophical topics discussed by the ancients, and moreover as someone who is interested in applying the philosophical categories to various problems in theology or in everyday affairs.

Michael Psellos (1018–after 1081) was one of the most erudite and intriguing figures of the Byzantine Middle Ages. He was given the title “Consul of the Philosophers” and taught all branches of philosophy. He commented on and paraphrased treatises from the Aristotelian Organon (Categories, De interpretatione, Prior Analytics), and wrote a large number of short treatises discussing particular philosophical issues raised, in part at least, by his pupils: e.g., on the distinction between homonyms and synonyms, on the characteristic of substance as self-existent (authuparktos), on the Platonic forms, on the unity of the soul and the body, on the problem of evil, on dreams. He also compiled a short encyclopedia with the title De omnifaria doctrina. He was a great admirer of Proclus whom he considered an authority among ancient authors. In his attempts to advance philosophical learning he was often attacked concerning his theological orthodoxy, with the result that he often had to be careful to distance himself from heretical doctrines, e.g., in his writings on the Chaldaean Oracles.

John Italos (c. 1025–after 1082) was a pupil of Michael Psellos’, and his successor in the Imperial School as “Consul of the Philosophers”, where he also taught all branches of philosophy. Anna Komnene refers to him in the Alexiad, the history she wrote of the events during the reign of her father Alexios I (1081–1118), as an exceptional thinker and an excellent logician who interpreted Aristotle better than anyone else in his time. Indeed, Italos occupies a special place in the history of Byzantine thought for having been put on trial and condemned by the Church in 1082, on the charge of having advocated the systematic use of philosophical analysis and logical reasoning in clarifying theological issues. Regardless of the positions he defended on such issues, positions some of which, after all, were not at all different from those of other philosophers, notably from Psellos’, what seems to have been really unacceptable for the religious and the political establishment at the time was his rationalist approach towards doctrines which the Orthodox Church considered beyond comprehension, as something Christians should simply accept on faith and as something only the Church had the authority to judge. It is telling that to this day, during the mass of the first Sunday in Lent, the so-called Synodikon of the Greek Orthodox Church is read, in which Italos is anathematized in eleven articles. What mainly survives from his writings are the commentary on the second, third and fourth book of the Topics; two small treatises on dialectic and on the Aristotelian syllogisms together with a very brief synopsis of rhetoric; and finally, the Quaestiones quodlibetales, a collection of ninety-three answers to philosophical questions posed to him by his students, among which were the emperor Michael VII (ruled 1071–1078) and his brother Andronikos Doukas. In these texts Italos seems to question the supremacy of theology over philosophy and even to overturn the established hierarchy. That is to say, Italos obviously follows the ancient conception of philosophy, well known from both the Platonic and the Aristotelian traditions, according to which theology is part of philosophy, since philosophy culminates in the attempt to understand the first principle of everything. It probably was this supposedly arrogant attempt on his part to develop a natural or philosophical theology that led to his trial and condemnation.

After John Italos, Theodore of Smyrna (mid-11th century–after 1112) was appointed “Consul of the Philosophers”. His work Epitome of All Things Pertaining to Nature and to Natural Principles according to the Ancients is still unpublished. It is neither a paraphrase of nor a commentary on Aristotle's Physics, though the topics and the terminology found in the three of its four parts which have survived, in just one manuscript, are clearly Aristotelian.

Eustratios of Nicaea and Michael of Ephesus were two of the contributors to a series of commentaries, initiated by the princess and historian Anna Komnene, on previously neglected Aristotelian works. Their commentaries, in which they followed ancient models, some of which are now lost, but also added their own insightful remarks, were partly translated into Latin and played a role in the development of Aristotelianism in the 13th century.

Eustratios was a pupil of John Italos and became the Metropolitan of Nicaea at the beginning of the 12th century. Anna Komnene in the Alexiad presents him as an extremely erudite scholar both of religious and of secular literature as well as a master of dialectic. He was also asked by the emperor Alexios I to participate in various theological debates with the Latin Church, until he himself, just like his teacher Italos, was finally condemned for heresy in 1117. The reasons for his condemnation are a rather complicated matter involving both theological and political issues. In this connection, however, it is interesting to note that he was famous for his strong conviction of the propriety of using Aristotle's syllogistic in theology; he even stated that Christ himself had argued with the help of Aristotelian syllogisms. What we have of his work as a commentator are his comments on the first and sixth book of the Nicomachean Ethics and his commentary on the second book of the Posterior Analytics. In interpreting Aristotle, Eustratios clearly followed the late antique Neoplatonic philosophers, though at certain places, like the issue concerning the knowledge of first principles, he advocated theses which seem closer in line with his Christian beliefs.

About Michael of Ephesus’ life next to nothing is known. On the other hand, it is perfectly clear that his breadth as an Aristotelian commentator is remarkable. Indeed, Michael has been compared to Alexander of Aphrodisias in respect both of his mode of exposition and method of interpretation. He wrote commentaries not only on the fifth, ninth, and tenth books of the Nicomachean Ethics, but also on Metaphysics 7–14 and on the Sophistical Refutations (both wrongly attributed to Alexander), on the Generation of Animals (wrongly attributed to Philoponus), on the Parva naturalia, on the Parts of Animals, on the Movement of Animals, on the Progression of Animals; furthermore, he wrote comments on the pseudo-Aristotelian treatise De coloribus, which are still unedited, and on the Politics, which have only partly survived.

Theodore Prodromos (c. 1100–c. 1170) continued the tradition of writing extensive commentaries on Aristotle's works by authoring a still unedited commentary on the second book of Aristotle's Posterior Analytics. A couple of his minor works are also worth mentioning. His Xenedemus is a short Plato-style elenctic dialogue on themes from Porphyry’s Isagoge. He also wrote a small essay, On ‘Great’ and ‘Small’, which contains a series of arguments against Aristotle's doctrine in the sixth chapter of the Categories that ‘great’ and ‘small’ are not quantities but relatives, and not contraries.

Nevertheless, not all Byzantine philosophers at the time were in favor of harmonizing ancient wisdom with the Christian doctrines. In fact, since Proclus seems to have represented the ancient philosopher par excellence, being so much admired by Psellos and his pupils, he understandably became the target of Nicholas of Methone (early 12th century–c. 1160/66), who wrote a detailed refutation of the Elements of Theology. Nicholas’ aim clearly was to provide the pious readers with the necessary arguments against the Neoplatonic influences on Christian dogmas, influences that on his view could lead the believers away from the true faith. For instance, Nicholas systematically argues against those of Proclus’ propositions which try to establish that the underlying principle of the universe is pure unity, because he considers them contrary to the Christian belief in the Holy Trinity.

The capture of Constantinople by the Crusaders in 1204 dealt a severe blow to the Byzantine institutions of education and learning. Many teachers and scholars fled the city to find a haven in Nicaea, where the Laskarid dynasty had settled. Education and learning were matters of great concern to the Laskarid emperors; one of them, Theodore II Doukas Laskaris (ruled 1254–58), was himself the author of two works on natural philosophy, Kosmikē dēlōsis (Cosmic Exposition) and Peri phusikēs koinōnias (On Physical Community), in which he brought simple mathematical schemes to bear on elemental theory and cosmology. In 1261 Constantinople was recaptured by Michael VIII Palaiologos, and the period of cultural prosperity that followed is sometimes referred to as the “Palaiologan renaissance”.

The most important philosophy teacher and scholar in the period leading up to this “renaissance” was undoubtedly Nikephoros Blemmydes (1197–c. 1269). Through his students – who included Doukas Laskaris as well as the historian George Akropolites (1217–82), later charged by Michael VIII with the headmastership of the Imperial School in Constantinople – and through his widely read compendia on logic and natural philosophy (see sect. 1.2), Blemmydes exerted an influence that is clearly discernible in many later philosophical works although it has never been systematically measured. In a prefatory note to his compendium on logic, the first version of which was apparently composed in 1237 at the behest of Emperor John III Batatzes, he somewhat unexpectedly emphasizes the utility of logic for theology. Indeed, Blemmydes’ services were employed on more than one occasion to defend the Orthodox dogma of the procession of the Holy Ghost in official debates with papal legates. The relation to the Catholic Church was the dominating political and religious issue for most of the 13th century. A reunion was negotiated at the Second Council of Lyons in 1274, but it lacked popular support, and after the death of Michael VIII in 1282, the new emperor and his patriarch pulled out of the deal. Encounters with Dominican and Franciscan theologians may have helped fuel the interest in logic in Byzantium during this time. The Greek translations of Boethius’ De hypotheticis syllogismis and De topicis differentiis by Manuel Holobolos, who taught logic at the Patriarchal School between 1265 and 1273, must be seen against this background. Other Latin philosophical and theological works were translated by Maximos Planoudes (1260–c. 1310). They do not seem to have had any discernible impact until the mid-14th century, when Augustine's “cogito” appears as one of several arguments against Scepticism in a pamphlet by Nicholas Kabasilas Chamaetos; it reappears in a similar work of unknown date, transmitted as chapter 3 of a miscellany attributed in the (late) manuscripts to one Herennius.

On the other hand, the development of Aristotelian natural philosophy at the hands of Western masters may have encouraged their Greek-speaking colleagues to a more intense study of the relevant texts. As noted in section 1.2, a great number of commentaries, paraphrases and compendia of Aristotle's works, mainly but not exclusively on logic and natural philosophy, were produced in the 13th and early 14th centuries.

Blemmydes’ compendia draw for the most part on Aristotle and his late antique commentators, but occasionally other influences are in evidence, such as that of John of Damascus in the Epitome logica and that of the Stoic cosmologist Cleomedes in the Epitome physica. Besides these two compendia, Blemmydes composed two anthropological works, De anima and De corpore, and two short treatises on a much-discussed question of both theological and philosophical import, Against the Predetermination of the Terminus of Life, in which he defends the causal connection between moral choice and life span, although he proceeds mostly by appeal to authority.

The historian George Pachymeres (1242–c. 1310), who also taught at the Patriarchal School, wrote a voluminous Aristotelian paraphrase-compendium covering not only logic and natural philosophy but also metaphysics and ethics, the Philosophia. In addition, he wrote a textbook on the four mathematical disciplines (the Quadrivium) and, more importantly, the only Late Byzantine commentary on Plato, a continuation of Proclus’ incompletely transmitted commentary on the Parmenides, which contrasts starkly with its ancient predecessor by applying a “logical” (i.e., non-metaphysical) method of interpretation and a paraphrastic mode of exposition. A growing body of evidence shows that Pachymeres was deeply engaged in collecting, transcribing, and editing manuscripts of philosophical authors.

Pachymeres’ concern with Plato was not coincidental. If the boom in Aristotelian studies in this period was partly a response to the challenge of Western philosophy and theology, it seems reasonable to think that a similar cause may be found for the rising popularity of Plato, who was much less known than Aristotle in the West. Ever since Late Antiquity Aristotelian logic and natural philosophy had been commonly regarded as propaedeutic to Platonic metaphysics, and the hierarchical relation between the two philosophers was now increasingly stressed, sometimes (as in Nikephoros Gregoras’ Phlorentius) in the context of open criticism of the Aristotelian inclinations of Latin philosophy. Platonic metaphysics was, however, a theologically precarious field, and it is hardly surprising if those who plowed it were not at all times equally outspoken about the fruits of their labor. Still, in the 1260s, George Akropolites willingly admitted that his interpretations of Church Fathers were informed by the divinely inspired Plato, Proclus, Iamblichus and Plotinus; and towards the end of our period George Gemistos Plethon went so far as completely to discard Christianity in favor of Neoplatonic polytheism.

Another early Palaiologan compendium extends its ambit to cover rhetoric and medicine as well as the whole of philosophy. This is the Encyclopedia of Joseph Rhakendytes (aka Joseph the Philosopher, died 1330). Joseph drew heavily on the works of his Byzantine predecessors. His part on logic reproduces Blemmydes’ Epitome logica with some additions; his part on natural philosophy combines works by Blemmydes with works by Pachymeres and Michael of Ephesus; his part on the quadrivial disciplines is identical with the Logic and Quadrivium by the anonymous of 1007.

A contemporary of Pachymeres was Sophonias, a Constantinopolitan monk and later Catholic convert, whose hybrid paraphrase of Aristotle's De anima was mentioned in section 1.2. On stylistic grounds the anonymously transmitted paraphrases of the Categories, the Prior Analytics, the Sophistici elenchi, and the Parva naturalia edited in CAG 23 and 5 may also be attributed to Sophonias. Even though these works are in themselves of limited philosophical interest, it has been shown that Sophonias draws on John Philoponus’ lost commentary on book 3 of the De anima.

Of more interest is the mostly anonymously transmitted paraphrase of the Nicomachean Ethics edited in CAG 19 as the work of Heliodorus of Prusa. This attribution is clearly a hoax; in fact the only thing we know about the circumstances under which the work was composed is that it must have been before 1366, when the earliest manuscript is dated. There is no terminus post quem, although it has been (inconclusively) argued that Ps.-Heliodorus is dependent on Eustratios. The paraphrase is clearly and competently written, but remains curiously understudied.

Not all Late Byzantine philosophical authors were content to write compendia, paraphrases, and commentaries on the classical authors. One who decided to write essays on natural philosophy in order to investigate the relevant questions independently of Aristotle and Plato was Nikephoros Choumnos (c. 1250/55–1327), a leading figure at the court of Andronikos II in the 1290s and 1300s. Choumnos’ main concern was with elemental theory, cosmology, and psychology. Many of his essays seem to have been composed on the occasion of literary gatherings, some of which were presided over by the emperor.

It is typical of Choumnos’ approach that he seeks to argue philosophically, that is by valid inference from principles and definitions that are universally accepted, for views that are already theologically established. Thus he attempts to refute Aristotle’s theory that the heavens are composed of a fifth, naturally ungenerable and imperishable body, not by simply appealing to the Christian doctrine that the world was created at the beginning of time and persists only through the grace of its creator, but by pointing out that Aristotle's attempt to deduce his theory from the fact that the heavens have a circular movement fails, inasmuch as he has only secured the premise that all simple bodies have simple movements, not that all simple movements belong to simple bodies, which is what his argument requires. Likewise, Choumnos argues by elimination against the theory of pre-existing matter (which is how he, following Aristotle, interprets the chōra of Plato's Timaeus), and insists against the theory of separate forms that if forms do not allow self-predication, they are not participated in by individuals; but if they do, they are not universal and eternal, but individual and perishable. The bottom line is that matter and form are inseparable and simultaneously created. Another time he attacks the theory of recollection, which he takes to entail the pre-existence of the soul, by flatly denying that knowledge can suffer destruction or, obviously, be revived, and stressing the fact that this follows from Plotinus’ (whom he considers to be his main opponent) view that the activities of the soul are immortal. He even prides himself on having proved the doctrine of the resurrection of the body on the basis of Plato's views on the migration of souls.

Originality of thought and expression was also striven for by Choumnos’ rival and adversary at court, Theodore Metochites (1270–1332). It is perhaps most clearly attained in his Sēmeiōseis gnōmikai (Sententious Notes), a collection of 120 essays on subjects as diverse as the reasons for Aristotle's obscurity and for Plato's use of the dialogue form, the interrelations between different faculties of soul, and the pros and cons of different political constitutions. A significant part of the essays are taken up by meditations on the transience of human life, not infrequently bearing on the vicissitudes of Metochites’ own life and career. He also lingered over many of these themes in his orations, notably On Education.

In a more traditional vein, Metochites wrote paraphrases of all of Aristotle's writings on natural philosophy; his proudest accomplishment, however, was his monumental Introduction to the study of Ptolemaic astronomy. The superiority of mathematics (including astronomy) to natural philosophy is in Metochites’ view warranted by the higher degree of reality of mathematical objects, which he seems (especially in his hexameter poem On Mathematics) to have conceived as being ultimately derived by procession from intelligible objects, even if he sometimes speaks of them as the products of abstraction from sensibles. The two conceptions are probably intended to be complementary, as indeed they are in many Neoplatonic writers.

Metochites’ student and intellectual heir, Nikephoros Gregoras (1293/94–1360/61), began his career as an astronomer and ended it as a theological controversialist. Some of his letters and a few passages of his Roman History touch upon philosophical subjects: especially noteworthy is the vehement criticism of Aristotle in the dialogue Phlorentius, ostensibly an account of the author's debate with Barlaam of Calabria (c. 1290–1348) in 1331–32. As Gregoras notes with disdain, Barlaam was well-versed in contemporary Latin scholasticism; but it was his knowledge in ancient Greek philosophy and mathematics (including astronomy) that aroused both admiration and hostility when he arrived at Constantinople in the 1320s. In his Solutions for George Lapithes he is largely concerned with defending Aristotle against accusations of inconsistency with Plato as well as with himself. In so doing he addresses issues of more profound importance than Gregoras does in his Solutions for Helena Palaiologina, which deal principally with problems of natural philosophy; but the Neoplatonic epistemology in Barlaam’s Solution 4 and especially his First Greek Letter, according to which scientific knowledge rests on innate “substantial principles” in our souls, which reflect the creative principles in the Divine Intellect, and thus indicate the true causes of the nature of things, is curiously inconsistent with the theory expounded in his Anti-Latin Treatises, which states that the universal principles in our souls, on which demonstrative arguments are based, are completely derived from the experience of particulars.

Barlaam and Gregoras were both on the losing side in the Hesychast strife, which raged between c. 1337 and 1351 and revolved around the question of theological method. The winner was Gregory Palamas (1296–1359), famous for his claim that even though God's substance (ousia) is necessarily concealed to us, we can have direct experience of his activities (energeiai). The first 29 of Palamas’ 150 Chapters attempt to put natural philosophy on a more secure footing by placing facts about the world as a whole—in contrast to particular facts, such as astronomical phenomena—in the same epistemological category as facts about God and Man, which are only knowable through the teaching of the spirit. Thus Palamas expends considerable energy on denouncing the erroneous views of the Greek natural philosophers, Platonists as well as Aristotelians.

In the last years of the Byzantine Empire, philosophical writers tended indeed to identify themselves as either Platonists or Aristotelians, and to emphasize the disagreements existing between the two ancient authorities. This approach was very different from the harmonizing endeavors of the late antique commentators, and it was left as a legacy to Renaissance and early modern Aristotelianism and Platonism. Its roots are to be found in the anti-Aristotelian sentiments of 14th-century authors such as Metochites and Gregoras, but it came into full blossom in the great controversy which started in 1439, when George Gemistos Plethon (c. 1360–1452) published his pamphlet De differentiis, and ground to a halt after the Latin version of Cardinal Bessarion’s (1403–1472) In calumniatorem Platonis was printed thirty years later.

Plethon's pamphlet purported to show how inferior Aristotle was to Plato, in spite of being more admired especially in the Latin West. Like Metochites before him, Plethon seems to have drawn on the Middle Platonist Atticus for his criticisms, which cover every part of Aristotle's philosophy and end with a refutation of Aristotle's objections to the Theory of Forms. Aristotle was duly assisted by George (Gennadios) Scholarios (c. 1405–after 1472), whose Contra Plethonem bears testimony to a philosophical education that was clearly more Latin than Greek. Of paramount concern to Gennadios was the repudiation of Plethon’s claim that Aristotle's God is not creator of the world. This is achieved inter alia by recourse to the time-honored hypothesis of creation ab aeterno. As his sobriquet suggests, Gennadios was an extremely erudite man, who prided himself on being a better Aristotelian commentator than his Byzantine forerunners precisely on account of his vast knowledge of the Latin literature, including translations of Avicenna and Averroes. His commentaries on Porphyry's Isagoge and Aristotle’s Categories and De interpretatione are the most extensive Byzantine ones on these works, and owe a great deal, with respect to their content and form, to earlier and contemporary works in Latin. Especially strong is the influence of Thomas Aquinas, many of whose works Gennadios also translated, thus continuing the efforts of Demetrios (c. 1323/26–c. 1397/98) and Prochoros (c. 1333/34–c. 1370/71) Kydones in the preceding century.

The controversy dragged on with new contributions on Plato’s behalf by Plethon and Michael Apostoles; and on Aristotle's by Theodore of Gaza, Andronikos Kallistos, and George of Trebizond. All these men were native Greek speakers; and except for Trebizond, they all wrote in their mother tongue. The importance of the controversy for Renaissance philosophy is largely due to Bessarion, who tried, in the work already mentioned, to give a fair hearing to both philosophers (thus reverting to the traditional approach of harmonization), and whose systematic account of Platonism was unprecedented in the Latin literature.

A few years after his appointment as patriarch in 1454 (thus after the fall of Constantinople), Scholarios gave orders for all existing copies of Plethon's Book of Laws to be destroyed. It is clear from the remaining fragments that this work constituted Plethon's prescription for a happy life for humankind, advocating an ethics and a politics inspired by Plato himself as well as by Middle Platonic, Neoplatonic, and Stoic writers, and propagating a philosophically refined form of the old Olympian religion. One surviving chapter (De fato) argues, both from the nature of causation and from the assumption that the gods have foreknowledge, that all events are determined by fate. According to Plethon, this is compatible with freedom, not in the sense that human beings are not ruled by anything, but in the sense that they are ruled by their own intellect: being free is simply submitting to the decree of Zeus. Divine punishment is justified as a method for teaching human beings to become free. A combination of Platonic and Stoic influences is also manifest in another short treatise by Plethon, On Virtues.

2. Topics

2.1 The Immortality of the Soul

The question of the immortality of the soul is a potential point of conflict between Orthodox Christian doctrine and Byzantine natural philosophy. Byzantine natural philosophy, like its late antique predecessor, was largely based on the works of Aristotle. In Book 2 of the De anima, Aristotle defines the soul as “the first actuality of a natural body which potentially has life.” He himself draws the conclusion that the soul must be inseparable from the body. It seems clear, too, that on this view the soul cannot survive the moment of the body's death. Still, Aristotle leaves open the possibility that there may be some part of the soul that is not the actuality of a body, and therefore may be separable. As he explains in Book 3 of the De anima, the mental faculty by which we think and form beliefs, nous, variously translated as “mind” or “intellect”, in fact lacks a bodily organ. In one of the most intriguing and hotly debated passages of ancient philosophy, De anima Book 3, chapter 5, Aristotle introduces the notion of a kind of intellect that he describes as productive and active, and this kind of intellect, according to him, is not only separable from the body but is “alone immortal and eternal.” The question, then, is whether the eternal life of this productive and active intellect is enough to ensure survival after death for the individual human soul.

Aristotle's definition of the soul presented a formidable challenge to Byzantine Christians and late antique pagan philosophers alike. As Theodore Metochites explained in his Sēmeiōseis gnōmikai (3.6–7),

those who have commented upon Aristotle's writings are even unable to conclude from them whether the man thinks that the soul is immortal or not. Some of them are of the opinion that he does not allow any possibility for the soul to exist without the body, and they easily convince the multitude that this is so. They refer to those texts in which Aristotle defines the soul as dependent on the body, ruling that it is “the actuality of an organic body by nature endowed with life,” without distinguishing any unique and incorporeal part of it, and consequently also thinking that it is destined to pass away with the body. Others have the opposite view.

Among the ancient authors who held the view that Aristotle denied any kind of immortality for the individual human soul we find Alexander of Aphrodisias, who famously identified the productive intellect of De anima 3.5 with the first mover. Christian authors such as Hippolytus of Rome, Tatian, Ps.-Justin Martyr, Gregory of Nyssa, and Theodoret also claimed that Aristotle believed the soul to be wholly mortal, and they all condemned him for it. Perhaps it is not so surprising that the fiercely anti-Aristotelian 2nd-century Platonist Atticus did the same; but Aristotle's definition was also criticized by Plotinus and Porphyry, since it seemed to suggest that the soul was not a separable substance.

One may presume that Metochites’ attribution of this view to “the multitude” expresses contempt. In fact he seems to have sided with “the opposite view”, namely,

that [Aristotle] does in fact define soul as immortal and assign to it a unique and incorporeal mode of being. [Those who hold this view] refer to those texts in which he considers intellect as functioning separately and possessing an activity which does not require the body; and [they say that] both in the De anima and especially in Physics 7–8 he compares the intellect in the body to the pilot of a ship: on the one hand it governs the body, but on the other it is carried along with it, although it still has a separate being and is destined to abandon the body but not itself.

This was the standard view. Among those who maintained that Aristotle did assign immortality to at least some part of the individual soul are all the late antique commentators whose commentaries on the De anima are extant.

Of the Neoplatonists, John Philoponus, whose commentary was highly influential throughout the Greek Middle Ages though virtually unknown in the Latin West, held that Aristotle agreed with Plato that of the three kinds of soul (1) the vegetative soul alone is wholly inseparable from the body; (2) the irrational soul (comprising the faculties of imagination and sense-perception as well as appetite and desire) is separable from the gross body, though inseparable from the pneuma, and thus mortal; and (3) the rational soul, the substance of which transcends all body, but some of whose activities are bound up with the human body (as those of the pilot are bound up with the ship), is wholly separable and thus immortal. It seems clear that “rational soul” in this context is synonymous with “intellect” in the Aristotelian texts. Ps.-Simplicius takes a similar view, but in Ps.-Philoponus’ (= ?Stephanus’) commentary, the scheme is altered so as to allow immortality even to the two perishable kinds of soul (“for they perish not in their capacity of soul but in their capacity of being in a body”). Thus Plato's dictum that “all soul is immortal” (Phdr. 245c6) according to Ps.-Philoponus holds true, even though intellect is the only part of soul which is immortal and eternal, as Aristotle says. The interpretation of Phaedrus 245c6 as referring to “both rational, irrational and vegetative” soul is ascribed to Numenius (f. 47) and repudiated by Philoponus (In DA 9.35–10.1). What all the Neoplatonic commentators took for granted is that the productive intellect introduced in De anima 3.5 is part of the individual human soul. This must be so, since in their view the De anima is a treatise on the human soul.

The interpretative tradition of the Neoplatonic commentators stretches well beyond the 11th century, when John Italos defended what he took to be Aristotle's position, namely that rational soul alone is immortal, against Ps.-Philoponus’ interpretation of the above-mentioned Platonic dictum (quaestiones nos. 36; 50). This is also what Sophonias argued at the turn of the 14th century in his paraphrase of De anima 3.2. Thus both he and Italos conformed to the same scheme as Philoponus and Ps.-Simplicius. In the same vein, Nikephoros Blemmydes, in his De anima (c. 1263), made extensive use of the analogy of the pilot of a ship as interpreted by the Neoplatonists. First he used it to show that Aristotle thought the rational soul was separable and immortal; then he developed it into an image of the turmoil experienced by the rational soul as long as it is connected with the body. And in the early 12th century, Michael of Ephesus pointed out, when commenting on Aristotle's dictum that the activity of the better part of us is more serious, that the intellect which is part of us comes into its own only after being separated from the body, which shows, he says, “that those who claim that Aristotle was of the opinion that the soul is mortal were fundamentally wrong” (In NE 10, 576.25–33).

Having thus briefly summarized the arguments both of those who claim that Aristotle did not believe in the immortality of the soul and of those who maintain that he did, Metochites adds an observation of his own in support of the latter's view:

And the fact is that he himself says the same thing as them in these very books, where he shows (following Plato, although he tries to conceal this) that there is one part of the self-moved thing that can only be moved but not cause movement, and another part which can only cause movement but not per se be moved, although it can be moved per accidens (namely, when it is moved along with the thing that it itself moves). From this it will follow, then, that what is moved by something else will also cease to be so; whereas what moves itself will consequently not cease to do so, and will not abandon itself (its essence being exactly to move itself); since it can under no circumstances abandon itself, it is also clear that it is part of its essence to exist forever and not cease from its movement, i.e. from its very essence and life.

In this passage Metochites seems to contend that Aristotle’s argument against self-movement in Physics 7.1 and 8.5 entails the proposition that “what moves itself will not cease to do so,” which is used as one of the premises of an argument for the immortality of the soul. This latter argument is apparently strongly inspired by the first part of the proof of immortality in Socrates’ palinode in Plato's Phaedrus (245c5–8). It seems to be an “ontological” kind of argument. That is to say, it attempts to show that the (eternal) existence of the soul follows from its nature. The soul's nature is defined precisely as its movement, whereby it moves itself. The idea is obviously that since the mover and the moved thing, if they are identical, cannot be disconnected, there will always be sufficient reason that the moved thing is moved (because there will always be a mover connected with it) and that the mover causes movement (because there will always be something there for it to move). Now, what seems to be the other premise of this argument, namely the proposition that the soul moves itself, is refuted by Aristotle in De anima 1.3–4 on the strength of the very proposition established in Physics 7.1 and 8.5 and cited by Metochites in the preceding paragraph, namely that movement is necessarily an irreflexive relation. The question is, then: what reason, if any, can Metochites have for thinking that the proposition that self-movement is eternal follows from (an argument containing) the proposition that self-movement does not exist?

It may be noted that Metochites deduces this proposition in two steps. First he says that it follows from Aristotle’s view—namely, (A) that movement is an asymmetrical relation between two contiguous entities, one of which causes movement and one of which is moved—(1) that for any movement, if the moving and the moved parts are disconnected, the movement will cease. Then he adds the further inference (2) that if the moving and the moved parts are identical, the moving part will not cease to cause movement. Since (2) clearly does not follow either from (A) or from (1), but does seem to follow from the converse of (1)—that for any movement, only if the moving and the moved parts are disconnected, the movement will cease—one may wonder whether Metochites may have fallen prey to the fallacia consequentis: if (if p then q) then (if not-p then not-q).

Even if we cannot definitively clear him of this charge, we may be able to point to extenuating circumstances. The Neoplatonic commentators, too, espouse the ontological argument for the immortality of the soul. They also accept Aristotle's analysis of movement as necessarily an irreflexive relation; they believe, however, that “movement” in this context refers exclusively to physical movement, and thus that the analysis does not concern the self-movement of the soul. That is to say, they affirm the compatibility of the premises of the ontological argument with Aristotle's analysis of movement. They do not try to deduce the former from the latter. That is why it is interesting to find in Proclus’ Elements of Theology (14, 16.15–23) an attempt to deduce the existence of a self-moved soul à la Plato from that of an unmoved intellect à la Aristotle. It is not clear that it is a successful attempt; but it may still have predisposed some of Proclus’ readers to understand Aristotle's cosmological argument in Physics 8.5 as a proof of the existence of both an unmoved mover and (by implication) a self-moved soul. At any rate, if this is how Metochites understood it, his suggestion that the premises of the ontological argument for the immortality of the soul are implied by Aristotle's analysis of movement may seem less far-fetched.

2.2 Metaphysics: Universals

There is plenty of textual evidence that the attempt of Neoplatonist commentators of Late Antiquity to reconcile the doctrines of Plato and Aristotle on the issue of universals was closely followed in Byzantium by prominent thinkers like John Italos, Eustratios of Nicaea, Nikephoros Blemmydes, Nikephoros Choumnos and George (Gennadios) Scholarios. More specifically, Byzantine philosophers as a rule adopted the Neoplatonist commentators’ three ways of understanding genera (and species) terms as referring to:

  1. the genera before the particulars (pro tōn pollōn), which are generally identified with the Platonic Ideas in God’s mind;
  2. the genera in the particulars (en tois pollois), which are supposed to correspond to Aristotle's immanent forms; and
  3. the genera after the particulars (epi tois pollois / meta tous pollous), which are concepts in human minds.

These three types of genera are the ones first introduced by the 5th-century Neoplatonist Ammonius in his commentary on Porphyry’s Isagoge; they are also discussed in Elias’ and David's commentaries on the same work, in Olympiodorus’ Prolegomena, and in Philoponus’ commentary on Aristotle's Categories. And it is the same three ways of understanding genera (and species) terms that are discussed by Arethas in his commentary on Porphyry's Isagoge, but are also hinted at in Photios’ treatise Various Questions for Discussion on Genera and Species (= Amphil. 77) as well as in Psellos’ paraphrase of Aristotle's De interpretatione.

This attempt to bring together the three ways of understanding genera (and species) terms has been labeled as “conceptual” or “moderate realism” (Benakis 1982), but it has also been presented as a nominalist or conceptualist position (Joannou 1954; Lloyd 1990). In view of this disagreement, it may be interesting to take a closer look at the position the Byzantines advocated and to compare it with that propounded by the Neoplatonist commentators. In particular, it is important to focus on John Italos’ views on genera, since he repeatedly discusses them at great length in his Quaestiones quodlibetales and there seems to be no earlier indications of any more vivid or systematic interest in this issue.

In quaestio 5, for instance, Italos talks about the same three types of genera in the same order, but a certain detail of his account proves to be quite intriguing. Italos, too, regards the genera before the particulars as the causes and paradigms of perceptible individuals, which are not predicates, are separate from them, and exist in God's mind, perfectly accommodating in this way the requirements of Christian dogma. But then he presents the genera in the particulars and the genera after the particulars in a manner which seems to differ from Ammonius’ account, for he seems to treat them as two subdivisions of one class of genera, which is distinguished from the genera before the particulars by being later-born (hysterogenē) than the perceptible individuals, capable of being predicated of them, inseparable from them, and acquired by our mind by abstraction. What makes the genera in the particulars differ from the genera after the particulars, according to Italos, is the fact that they are inseparable from the particulars in which they are: they are not predicated of many particulars, but only of the one particular which participates in them. The animal in Socrates is not the same as the animal in Plato. On the other hand, the genera after the particulars are predicated of many particulars, and it is one and the same genus that is predicated both of all the particulars together and of every single one of them separately.

Does this mean that Italos understands the genera in the particulars as referring to forms which are particular? In other words, does this mean that he interprets Aristotle's immanent forms as particular rather than universal? The pedigree of such an interpretation is not negligible; both Proclus in his Elements of Theology as well as his teacher Syrianus in his commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics viewed the immanent forms as particulars, without implying in any way that on this point they disagreed with Aristotle. And although Ammonius is not clear on this subject, there is no reason to believe that he was not here in agreement with these other Neoplatonists. This, of course, does not mean that such an interpretation of Aristotle's theory has to be the right one. But it is reasonable to think that, by Italos’ time, treating Aristotle's immanent forms as particulars was an acceptable, if not the standard, interpretation.

Most importantly, though, the point on which Italos seems to differ from Ammonius’ account of the three types of genera is that he considers not only the genera after the particulars as acquired by our mind by abstraction but also the genera in the particulars as such. For it seems that the genera after the particulars are acquired by our mind by abstraction of the common characteristics of perceptible individuals, just like in Ammonius’ commentary, while the genera in the particulars are acquired by our mind by abstraction of the particular form from the matter involved in each particular. Therefore, the genera in the particulars do seem to represent, on Italos’ view, what they represent for Proclus and Syrianus, namely immanent forms that are particular.

But if both the genera after the particulars and the genera in the particulars are acquired by our mind by abstraction, does this mean that, for Italos, they are not beings? On the contrary, Italos offers a whole series of arguments to support the thesis that the genera are beings (quaestiones 3, 19, 31). For this purpose he draws what he takes to be Aristotle's distinction between two senses of something's being incorporeal (quaestio 8):

  1. Something is incorporeal per se, truly, and strictly speaking, when it does not need a body for subsisting.
  2. Something is incorporeal per accidens and by abstraction, when it depends on a body for subsisting.

Thus, according to Italos’ interpretation of Aristotle, the genera are incorporeal in a weak sense, since they are not strictly speaking incorporeal but depend on a body for subsisting. Indeed, this is the sense that Italos himself adopts in his understanding of the genera as incorporeal; genera are incorporeal per accidens and not per se, because they are incorporeal insofar as they are in the human soul, while at the same time they are corporeal by participation (kata methexin) insofar as they subsist in the particulars. And the genera that he has in mind in such contexts are obviously the genera in the particulars and the genera after the particulars.

But if the genera are incorporeal beings, is there a special sense in which they are said to be beings? Italos often makes use of another distinction, which is a commonplace in Platonic texts from Plotinus to Simplicius, but seems to have its origins even earlier; namely, the distinction between something subsisting and something depending on mere thought. According to Italos (quaestio 19), things that do not subsist (anupostata) but depend on mere thought are not beings. As for things that subsist, he distinguishes between two different kinds of beings; namely, between beings that subsist per se, which he calls subsistences (hupostaseis), and beings that subsist in something else (enupostata). Subsistences are prior by perception, they are particulars and are for the most part bodies, whereas beings that subsist in something else are prior by knowledge, they are incorporeal, they are predicates shared by many things, and they are thoughts (noēmata / dianoēmata). Italos’ terminology here clearly shows the influence of the Christian Fathers, and in particular of John of Damascus, who in his Dialectica draws just this distinction between subsistences, things that subsist in something else, and things that do not subsist. According to Italos, therefore, both subsistences and beings that subsist in something else are beings, and thus do not depend on mere thought. Italos distinguishes these two kinds of beings from the standard examples of things that do not subsist, i.e., goat-stags and centaurs, as well as from his own examples of many-eyed men and four-headed horses; for all these are, on his view, nothing but fabrications of the human mind and products of our imagination (phantasmata). On the other hand, it also is important not to overlook the difference between subsistences and beings that subsist in something else. Although the first subsist per se, the latter are thoughts that subsist in something else.

Hence, Italos’ position on the three types of genera could be summarized as follows: All types of genera are incorporeal beings, the genera before the particulars are subsistences whereas the genera in the particulars as well as the genera after the particulars are beings that subsist in something else. That is to say, although only God, God's thoughts, and the perceptible individuals exist in the strong sense as subsistences, all types of genera are beings; they may be beings in a different sense, but they all are beings and not constructions of our mind devoid of reality. For this reason, it would perhaps be misleading to label Italos as a “nominalist”, since he does not defend the view that the in rebus and post res genera are mere expressions, but it would also be misleading to label him as a “realist”, since he does not think that the in rebus and post res genera are subsistences. Presumably, it is this difficulty of pinning down Italos’ position that has led to the introduction of intermediate labels such as “conceptualist” and “conceptual” or “moderate realist”.


Primary Literature

Anonymus Christianus

Anonymus (1007)

Anonymus (11th century)

Anonymus (12th century)


Barlaam of Calabria

Bessarion, Basileios

Blemmydes, Nikephoros

Choumnos, Nikephoros

Eustratios of Nicaea

Gregoras, Nikephoros

[Heliodorus of Prusa]

John of Damascus

John Italos

Kabasilas Chamaetos, Nicholas

Manuel Holobolos

Metochites, Theodore

Michael of Ephesus

Michael Psellos

Nicholas of Methone

Pachymeres, George

Palamas, Gregory

Planoudes, Maximos


Plethon, George Gemistos

Scholarios, George (Gennadios)


Symeon Seth

Theodore Doukas Laskaris (Theodore II)

Theodore Prodromos

Secondary Literature

General surveys


Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the authors with suggestions.]

Related Entries

afterlife | Alexander of Aphrodisias | Aristotle | Aristotle, commentators on | Aristotle, General Topics: logic | Aristotle, Special Topics: natural philosophy | conceptualism | metaphysics | Neoplatonism | nominalism: medieval versions of | Plato | Plato: middle period metaphysics and epistemology | Plotinus | Porphyry | Proclus | realism | theology: natural | universals: the medieval problem of