Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Philosophy and Christian Theology

First published Mon May 13, 2002; substantive revision Sat Jan 26, 2008

Many of the doctrines and concepts central to Christianity have important philosophical implications or presuppositions. In this article we will take a closer look at some of the central doctrines and concepts, and their philosophical relevance.

Of course, many philosophically laden doctrines and concepts are relevant to Christianity, and we cannot discuss them all here. Rather, our focus will be on those concepts and doctrines that are distinctively Christian, and which have been the focus of a good deal of recent discussion in the philosophical literature. Thus, although theism is a central Christian concept, it is not distinctively Christian and so will not be covered here. Further, although views about the Eucharist, a central Christian concept, have held a significant place in the philosophical dialogue in former times, it will not be discussed here since it has not been a significant focus of recent discussions. As a result, we will concentrate on three distinctive and central Christian concepts which have received significant attention in the recent literature: the doctrines of the Trinity and the Incarnation, and views on the nature of atonement.

1. Philosophy and Christian Theology

Before we begin, it is worthwhile to consider in brief the general relationship between philosophy and Christian religious dogma. In the history of Christian theology, philosophy has sometimes been seen as a natural complement to theological reflection, while at other times the advocates for the two disciplines have regarded each other as mortal enemies. Some early Christian thinkers such as Tertullian were of the view that any intrusion of secular philosophical reason into theological reflection was out of order. Thus, even if certain theological claims seemed to fly in the face of the standards of reasoning defended by philosophers, the religious believer should not flinch. Other early Christian thinkers, such as St. Augustine of Hippo, argued that philosophical reflection complemented theology, but only when these philosophical reflections were firmly grounded in a prior intellectual commitment to the underlying truth of the Christian faith. Thus, the legitimacy of philosophy was derived from the legitimacy of the underlying faith commitments.

Into the High Middle Ages, Augustine's views were widely defended. It was during this time however that St. Thomas Aquinas described another model for the relationship between philosophy and theology. According to the Thomistic model, philosophy and theology are distinct enterprises. The primary difference between the two is their intellectual starting points. Philosophy takes as its data the deliverances of our natural mental faculties: what we see, hear, taste, touch, and smell. These data can be accepted on the basis of the reliability of our natural faculties with respect to the natural world. Theology, on the other hand takes as its starting point the divine revelations contained in the Bible. These data can be accepted on the basis of divine authority, in a way analogous to the way in which we accept, for example, the claims made by a physics professor about the basic facts of physics.

On this way of seeing the two disciplines, if at least one of the premises of an argument is derived from revelation, the argument falls in the domain of theology; otherwise it falls into philosophy's domain. Since this way of thinking about philosophy and theology sharply demarcates the disciplines, it is possible in principle that the conclusions reached by one might be contradicted by the other. According to advocates of this model, however, any such conflict must be merely apparent. Since God both created the world which is accessible to philosophy and revealed the texts accessible to theologians, the claims yielded by one cannot conflict with the claims yielded by another unless the philosopher or theologian has made some prior error.

Since the deliverances of the two disciplines must then coincide, philosophy can be put to the service of theology (and perhaps vice-versa). How might philosophy play this complementary role? First, philosophical reasoning might persuade some who do not accept the authority of purported divine revelation of the claims contained in religious texts. Thus, an atheist who is unwilling to accept the authority of religious texts might come to believe that God exists on the basis of purely philosophical arguments. Second, distinctively philosophical techniques might be brought to bear in helping the theologian clear up imprecise or ambiguous theological claims. Thus, theology might provide us with information sufficient to conclude that Jesus Christ was a single person with two natures, one human and one divine, but leave us in the dark about exactly how this relationship between divine and human natures is to be understood. The philosopher can provide some assistance here, since, among other things, he or she can help the theologian discern which models are, for example, logically inconsistent and thus not even candidates for understanding the relationship of divine and human natures in Christ.

For most of the twentieth century, the vast majority of English language philosophy went on without much interaction with theology at all. While there are a number of complex reasons for this divorce, three are especially important. The first is that atheism was the predominant opinion among English language philosophers throughout much of that century.

A second, quite related reason is that, philosophers in the twentieth century regarded theological language as either meaningless, or, at best, subject to scrutiny only insofar as that language had a bearing on religious practice. The former belief (i.e., that theological language was meaningless) was inspired by a tenet of logical positivism, according to which any statement that lacks empirical content is meaningless. Since much theological language, for example, language describing the doctrine of the Trinity, lacks empirical content, such language must be meaningless. The latter belief, inspired by Wittgenstein, holds that language itself only has meaning in specific practical contexts, and thus that religious language was not aiming to express truths about the world which could be subjected to objective philosophical scrutiny.

The third reason is that a great deal of academic theology moved away from defending the claims of orthodox Christian theism in traditional ways, often seeking devices for re-interpreting these claims in ways congenial to contemporary modes of thought which often ran contrary to the methods employed in analytic philosophy.

In the last thirty years, however, philosophers have returned to many of the traditional claims of orthodox Christianity and have begun to apply the tools of contemporary philosophy in ways that are somewhat more eclectic than those described in the Augustinian or Thomistic models described above. In keeping with the recent academic trend, contemporary philosophers of religion have been unwilling to maintain hard and fast distinctions between the two disciplines. As a result, it is often difficult in reading recent work to distinguish what the philosophers are doing from what the theologians of past centuries regarded as strictly within the theological domain. However, like theologians of the medieval period, much recent work in philosophy of religion seems to fall into one of two categories. The first category includes attempts to demonstrate the truth of religious claims by appeal to evidence available apart from purported divine revelations. The second category includes attempts to demonstrate the consistency and plausibility of theological claims using philosophical techniques. In what follows, we will be considering work that falls into this second category. (For discussions of work falling under the first category see the entries on argument for the existence of God listed in the Related Entries section below.)

2. Trinity

From the beginning, Christians have affirmed the claim that there is one God and that three persons are God: God the Father, God the Son, and God the Holy Spirit. In AD 675, the Council of Toledo framed this pair of claims as follows:

Although we profess three persons we do not profess three substances but one substance and three persons … If we are asked about the individual Person, we must answer that he is God. Therefore, we may say God the Father, God the Son, and God the Holy Spirit; but they are not three Gods, he is one God … Each single Person is wholly God in himself and … all three persons together are one God.

Such formulations set forth the Christian doctrine of the Trinity. Cornelius Plantinga, Jr., reflecting on the Council of Toledo's profession, remarks that it “possesses great puzzling power” (Plantinga 1989, 22). No doubt this is an understatement. The Christian doctrine is puzzling, and this has led some of Christianity's critics to advance the claim that it is, in fact, incoherent.

Perhaps the initial puzzling power of the doctrine of the Trinity is not immediately obvious. After all, someone might think that one thing, Fred, can be “many things” all at the same time, for example, a butcher, a baker, and a candlestick maker. So why can't God be Father, Son, and Holy Spirit all at the same time? Likewise, multiple distinct things can all be “one thing” at the same time. Thus, each member of the Baltimore Orioles baseball team can be Orioles taken individually, as well as “the Orioles” taken collectively. One might then think that defenders of the Trinity might be able to construct models out of such examples that would preserve the logical coherence of the doctrine. But things will not be quite that easy. To see why, we can take a brief detour and then come back to the two examples above.

Traditional Christian theologians have held that however the doctrine of the Trinity is understood, there are two extreme positions that are to be ruled out. These positions are modalism and tritheism. According to modalism, God is one single entity, object, or substance, and each person of the Trinty is simply a mode or a “way in which the one divine substance manifests itself.” This view has been rejected because it seems to sacrifice the distinctness of the divine persons in order to maintain the notion of divine unity. According to tritheism, on the other hand, the divine persons are each distinct individual persons which are so closely related that they together count as a single thing in some fashion. Nonetheless, despite this oneness, the three persons are still three gods. This view has been rejected for the opposite reason, namely, it preserves the distinctness of persons without maintaining any robust sense of the “oneness” of God.

One can now see why the “butcher, baker, candlestick maker” and the “Orioles” examples will not help us in providing a model for the Trinity. The first, like modalism, leans too heavily towards oneness at the expense of the distinctness of the three persons. It holds, that is, that there is really only one Fred, but that Fred can manifest himself in different ways by carrying out three different tasks. The second, like tritheism, leans too far in the opposite direction. On this example, the individual Orioles only form the “single team” because of certain agreements they have made to act cooperatively on the baseball field. There is no genuine, organic unity here.

We would be better equipped to separate the suitable models from the unsuitable ones if we had a clearer notion about just what the Christian means to affirm in confessing the existence of three persons and one God. What is “a person” according to the doctrine, and what is “a God”? Does it make sense, for example, to say that God is a community of wholly distinct (non-overlapping) individuals? Might God be a composite entity? Or should we think of God instead as something like a simple (partless) soul? How we answer these questions will make a big difference in the sorts of Trinitarian models that we regard as viable. Likewise, should we think that something counts as a person only if it is an individual, rational substance? Or might we use the term ‘person’ in a more psychological sense, to refer to something like a “center of consciousness or rational awareness.” Here too our decisions will help to determine our choice of models. And matters are complicated by the fact that neither the Bible nor the traditions of the church offer clear guidance on these questions. As a result, there is a good deal of remaining latitude in constructing a model for the Trinity.

In what follows, we will consider current models of the Trinity: the social model, the psychological model, and the constitution model.

2.1 The Social Model

Throughout the gospels, the first two persons of the Trinity are referred to as ‘Father’ and ‘Son’. This suggests the analogy of a family, or, more generally, a society. Thus, the persons of the Trinity might be thought of as one in precisely the way that, say, Abraham, Sarah, and Isaac are one: just as these three human beings are one family, so too the persons of the Trinity are one God. But, since there is no contradiction in thinking of a family as three and one, this analogy removes the contradiction in saying that God is three and one. Those who attempt to understand the Trinity primarily in terms of this analogy are typically called Social Trinitarians. This approach has been (controversially) associated with Greek or Eastern Trinitarianism, a tradition of reflection that traces its roots to the three great Fathers of the Eastern Church—Basil of Caesarea, his brother Gregory of Nazianzus, and their friend Gregory of Nyssa.

More recently, Richard Swinburne has defended a version of this view according to which each of the three divine persons has all of the essential characteristics of divinity: omniscience, omnipotence, omnipresence, moral perfection, and so forth. However, these three persons are unlike other persons with which we are familiar (and, importantly, unlike the gods of familiar polytheistic systems as well) in that they have necessarily harmonious wills, such that their volitions never come into conflict, and that there is a perfectly loving relation that also necessarily obtains among them. Further, this view is compatible with traditional claims of dependence relations among members of the Trinity. Traditional formulations of the doctrine hold that the Father generates the Son and that Father and Son jointly give rise to (or spirate, literally “breathe forth”) the Holy Spirit. Such relations are possible as long as one person causes the other in such a way that the causing relation has always obtained, and it is impossible for the relation not to obtain.

On this sort of view, there is one God because the community of divine persons is so closely inter-connected that, though they are three distinct persons, they nonetheless function as if they were a single entity. If we were to consider a set of three human persons, for example, who exhibited these characteristics of necessary unity, volitional harmony, and love, it would hard to regard them as entirely distinct in the way we do ordinary persons. And that is, of course, just what the doctrine aims to put forth.

Perhaps this view seems to lean too strongly in the tritheistic direction. How could the social Trinitarian respond to this worry? One way would be to focus attention on exactly what is required in order for many “things” to jointly compose another single “thing.” My (one) body is composed of (many) atoms. My (one) car is composed of (many) parts. Thus, likewise, the one God might be thought of as composed of three Persons. And, indeed, this is exactly what many Social Trinitarians have wanted to say. Thus, for example, C. S. Lewis has famously suggested that God is composed of three persons in just the way that a cube is composed of six sides. More recently, J. P. Moreland and William Lane Craig (2003) argued that the relation between the persons of the Trinity can be thought of as analogous to the relation between the three “dogs” that compose Cerberus, the mythical guardian of the underworld.

Still, part-whole analogies raise additional worries of their own. Is God a fourth thing in addition to the divine persons? If so, what sort of thing is God? Apparently we face a dilemma: Either God is a person, or God is not. If the former, then we have a quaternity rather than a trinity. If the latter, then we seem to commit ourselves to claims that are decidedly anti-theistic: God doesn't know anything (since only persons can be knowers); God doesn't love anybody (since only persons can love); God is amoral (since only persons are part of the moral community); and so on. Bad news either way, then. Thus, many are motivated to seek other models.

2.2 The Psychological Model

Many theologians have looked to features of the human mind or “psyche” to find models to help illuminate the doctrine of the Trinity. Historically, the use of psychological analogies is especially associated with Latin or Western Trinitarianism, a tradition that traces its roots to Augustine, the great Father of the Latin-speaking West. Augustine himself suggested several important analogies. But since each depends for its plausibility on aspects of medieval theology no longer taken for granted (such as the doctrine of divine simplicity), we'll pass over them here and focus instead on two analogies in this tradition that have been developed by contemporary philosophers.

Thomas V. Morris has suggested that we can find an analogy for the Trinity in the psychological condition known as multiple personality disorder: just as a single human being can have multiple personalities, so too a single God can exist in three persons (though, of course, in the case of God this is a cognitive virtue, not a defect)(Morris 1986). Others—Trenton Merricks for example—have suggested that we can conceive of the persons on analogy with the separate spheres of consciousness that result from commissurotomy(Merricks 2006). Commissurotomy is a procedure, sometimes used to treat epilepsy, that involves cutting the bundle of nerves (the corpus callosum) by which the two hemispheres of the brain communicate. Those who have undergone this procedure typically function normally in daily life; but, under certain kinds of experimental conditions, they display psychological characteristics that suggests there are two distinct spheres of consciousness associated with the two hemispheres of their brain. Thus, according to this analogy, just as a single human can, in that way, have two distinct spheres of consciousness, so too a single divine being can exist in three persons, each of which is a distinct sphere of consciousness.

It might appear that the analogy with multiple personality disorder is no better off than the “butcher, baker, candlestick maker” analogy, and therefore similarly leads us into modalism. After all, the personalities of those who suffer from the disorder might seem to be nothing more than distinct manifestations of a single (albeit divided) consciousness which, like the roles of Fred, cannot be manifested at the same time. And the commissurotomy analogy might appear on closer inspection not to be interestingly different from the social analogy. For if there really can be several distinct centers of consciousness associated with a single being, then the natural thing to say is that the “single being” in question is either an additional sphere of consciousness composed of the others, or else a “society” whose members are the distinct spheres of consciousness. But it is far from clear that these criticisms are decisive. And, at least on the surface, these two analogies seem to have a great deal of heuristic value; for both seem to present real-life cases in which a single rational being is nonetheless “divided” into multiple personalities or spheres of consciousness.

2.3 The Constitution Model

The third and final solution to the problem of the Trinity that we want to explore invokes the notion of ‘relative sameness.’ This is the idea that things can be the same relative to one kind of thing, but distinct relative to another. More formally:

RELATIVE SAMENESS: It is possible that there are x, y, F, and G such that x is an F, y is an F, x is a G, y is a G, x is the same F as y, but x is not the same G as y.

If this claim is true, then it is open to us to say that the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are the same God but distinct persons. Notice, however, that this is all we need to make sense of the Trinity. If the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are the same God (and there are no other Gods), then there will be exactly one God; but if they are also distinct persons (and there are only three of them), then there will be three persons.

The main challenge for this solution is to show that the relative-sameness assumption is coherent. This challenge has been undertaken by a number of prominent contemporary philosophers, including Peter Geach and Peter van Inwagen. Despite the efforts of these philosophers, however, the relative-sameness assumption has remained rather unpopular. The reason appears to be that its defenders have not provided any clear account of what it would mean for things to be the same relative to one kind, but distinct relative to another. Recently, however, Michael Rea and Jeffrey Brower have suggested that reflection on statues and the lumps of matter that constitute them can help us to see how two things can be the same material object but otherwise different entities. If this is right, then, by analogy, such reflection can also help us to see how Father, Son, and Holy Spirit can be the same God but three different persons.

Consider Rodin's famous bronze statue, The Thinker. It is a single material object; but it can be truly described both as a statue (which is one kind of thing), and as a lump of bronze (which is another kind of thing). A little reflection, moreover, reveals that the statue is distinct from the lump of bronze. For example, if the statue were melted down, we would no longer have both a lump and a statue: the lump would remain (albeit in a different shape) but Rodin's Thinker would no longer exist. This shows that the lump is something distinct from the statue, since one thing can exist apart from another only if they're distinct. (Notice that the statue can't exist apart from itself.)

It might seem strange to think that a statue is distinct from the lump that constitutes it. Wouldn't that imply that there are two material objects in the same place at the same time? Surely we don't want to say that! But then what exactly are we to say about this case? Notice that this isn't just a matter of one thing appearing in two different ways, or being labeled as both a statue and a lump. Superman and Clark Kent can appear differently (Clark Kent wears glasses, for example); but the names ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ are really just different labels for the same man. But our statue analogy isn't like this. Superman can't exist apart from Clark Kent. Where the one goes, the other goes too (at least in disguise). But the lump of bronze in our example apparently can exist apart from The Thinker. When melted, the lump survives while The Thinker does not. If that's right, then, unlike Superman and Clark Kent, the statue and lump of bronze really are distinct things.

Philosophers have suggested various ways of making sense of this phenomenon. One way of doing so is to say that the statue and the lump are the same material object even though they are distinct relative to some other kind. (In ordinary English, we don't have a suitable name for the kind of thing relative to which the statue and the lump are distinct; but Aristotle and Aquinas would have said that the statue and the lump are distinct form-matter compounds.) Now, it is hard to accept the idea that two distinct things can be the same material object without some detailed explanation of what it would mean for this to occur. But suppose we add that all it means for one thing and another to be “the same material object” is just for them to share all of their matter in common. Such a claim seems plausible; and if it is right, then our problem is solved. The lump of bronze in our example is clearly distinct from The Thinker, since it can exist without The Thinker; but it also clearly shares all the same matter in common with The Thinker, and hence on this view is the same material object.

By analogy, then, suppose we say that all it means for one person and another to be the same God is for them to do something analogous to sharing in common all of whatever is analogous to matter in the case of divine. On this view, the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are the same God but different persons in just the way a statue and its constitutive lump are the same material object but different form-matter compounds. Of course, God is not material; so this can only be an analogy. But still, it helps to provide an illuminating account of inter-Trinitarian relations, which is all that we are currently asking for.

This account is not entirely free of difficulties however. Most importantly, it does not directly answer the question of how many material objects are present for any given region, lump, or chunk. Is there an objective way of deciding how many objects are constituted by the lump of bronze that composes The Thinker? Are there only two things (statue and lump) or are there many more (paperweight, battering ram, etc.)? And if there are more, what determines how many there are? Unless we can answer this question it is hard to know why the “divine matter” constitutes exactly three persons (and not more).

3. Incarnation

The doctrine of the Incarnation holds that, at a time roughly two thousand years in the past, the the second person of the Trinity took on himself a distinct, fully human nature. As a result, he was a single person in full possession of two distinct natures, one human and one divine. The Council of Chalcedon in 451 put forth the canonical statement of the doctrine as follows:

We confess one and the same our Lord Jesus Christ … the same perfect in Godhead, the same in perfect manhood, truly God and truly man … acknowledged in two natures without confusion, without change, without division, without separation–the difference of natures being by no means taken away because of the union, but rather the distinctive character of each nature being preserved, and combining into one person and hypostasis—not divided or separated into two persons, but one and the same Son and only begotten God, Word, Lord Jesus Christ.

Critics have held this doctrine to be “impossible, self-contradictory, incoherent, absurd, and unintelligible.” The central difficulty for the doctrine is that it seems to attribute to one person characteristics that are not logically compatible. For example, it seems on the one hand that human beings are necessarily created beings, and they are necessarily limited in power, presence, knowledge, and so on. On the other hand, divine beings are essentially the opposite of all those things. Thus, it appears that one person could bear both natures, human and divine, only if such a person could be both limited and unlimited in various ways, created and uncreated, and so forth. And this is surely impossible.

Two main strategies have been pursued in an attempt to resolve this apparent paradox. The first is the kenotic strategy. The kenotic view (from the Greek kenosis meaning ’to empty’) finds its motivation in a New Testament passage which claims that Christ Jesus “who, though he was in the form of God, did not count equality with God a thing to be grasped, but emptied himself, taking the form of a servant, being born in the likeness of men. And being found in human form he humbled himself and became obedient unto death…” (Phillipians 2:6-8). According to this view, in becoming incarnate, God the Son voluntarily and temporarily laid aside some of his divine attributes in order to take on a human nature and thus his earthly mission.

If the kenotic view is correct, then (contrary to what theists are normally inclined to think) properties like omnipotence, omniscience, and omnipresence are not essential to divinity: something can remain divine even after putting some or all of those properties aside. The problem, however, is that if these properties aren't essential to divinity, then it is hard to see what would be essential. The so-called ‘omni-properties’ seem to be constitutive of divinity; they are the properties in terms of which divinity is defined. If we say that something can be divine while lacking those properties, then we lose all grip on what it means to be divine.

One might respond to this worry by saying that the only property that is essential to divine beings as such is the property being divine. This reply, however, makes divinity out to be a primitive, unanalyzable property. Critics like John Hick (1993) complain that such a move makes divinity out to be unacceptably mysterious. Alternatively (and perhaps more plausibly), one might simply deny that any properties are necessary for divinity. It is widely held in the philosophy of biology, for example, that there are no properties possession of which are jointly necessary and sufficient for membership in, say, the kind humanity. Moreover, it is very hard to find any interesting properties — apart from properties like ‘having mass’ or ‘being an organism'—that are even merely necessary for being human. That is, it seems that for any (interesting) property you might think of as partly definitive of humanity, there are or could be humans who lack that property. Thus, many philosophers think that membership in the kind is determined simply by family resemblance to paradigm examples of the kind. Something counts as human, in other words, if, and only if, it shares enough of the properties that are typical of humanity. If we were to say the same thing about divinity, there would be no in-principle objection to the idea that Jesus counts as divine despite lacking omniscience or other properties like, perhaps, omnipotence, omnipresence, or even perfect goodness. One might just say that he is knowledgeable, powerful, and good enough that, given his other attributes, he bears the right sort of family resemblance to the other members of the Godhead to count as divine.

Some have offered more refined versions of the kenotic theory, arguing that the basic view mischaracterizes the divine attributes. Rather, God's properties should be characterized as: omniscient-unless-incarnate, omnipotent-unless-incarnate, and so forth. Thus, when the powers of omnipotence are laid aside at the incarnation, Jesus can be fully human while retaining these divine attributes without contradiction. (Feenstra, 1989: 128-152) Unfortunately, this response only raises a further question, namely: if Christ's incarnation required his temporarily surrendering omniscience, then his later exaltation must have involved continued non-omniscience or the loss of his humanity. However, Christians have typically argued that the exalted Christ is omniscient while retaining his humanity. It is hard to see how this view can respond to such an objection. (But for one response see Feenstra 2007: 539).

Moving away from the standard version of the kenotic theory, some philosophers and theologians endorse views according to which it only seems as if Christ lacked divine attributes like omniscience, omnipotence, and so on. Views according to which it simply seems to us (ordinary human beings) as if he lacks those attributes are called krypsis accounts of the incarnation. They are views according to which the apparent loss of divine attributes is only pretense or illusion. Among other things, this raises the concern that the incarnation is somehow a grand deception, thus casting doubt on Christ's moral perfection. More acceptable, then, are views according to which it somehow seems—even to Christ himself—as if certain divine attributes which he actually possesses have been laid aside. On this view, the loss of omniscience, omnipotence, and so on is only simulated. Christ retains all of the traditional divine attributes; but from his point of view it is, nevertheless, as if those attributes are gone. A view like this might be characterized as positing a “functional kenosis.” (Cf. Crisp 2007, Ch. 2.)

One concern that might be raised with respect to the doctrine of functional kenosis is that it is hard to see how a divine being could possibly simulate (to himself, without outright pretense) the loss of attributes like omniscience or omnipotence. But we can find the resources for addressing this worry in what is now widely seen as the main rival to the traditional kenotic theory: Thomas V. Morris's “two minds view.”

Morris develops the two minds view in two steps, one defensive, the other constructive. First, Morris claims that the incoherence charge against the incarnation rests on a mistake. The critic assumes that, for example, humans are essentially non-omniscient. But what are the grounds for this assertion? Unless we think that we have some special direct insight into the essential properties of human nature, our grounds are that all of the human beings we have encountered have that property. But this merely suffices to show that the property is common to humans, not that it is essential. As Morris points out, it may be universally true that all human beings, for example, were born within ten miles of the surface of the earth, but this does not mean that this is an essential property of human beings. An offspring of human parents born on the international space station would still be human. If this is right, the defender of the incarnation can reject the critic's characterization of human nature, and thereby eliminate the conflict between divine attributes and human nature so characterized.

This merely provides a way to fend off the critic, however, without supplying any positive model for how the incarnation should be understood. In the second step, then, Morris proposes that we think about the incarnation as the realization of one person with two minds: a human mind and a divine mind. If possession of a human mind and body is sufficient for something's being a human, then “merging” the divine mind with a human mind and conjoining both to a human body will yield one person with two natures. During his earthly life, Morris proposes, Jesus Christ had two minds, with consciousness centered in the human mind. This human mind had partial access to the contents of the divine mind, while God the Son's divine mind had full access to the corresponding human mind.

The chief difficulty the view faces is the coherence of holding that a single person can possess two distinct minds. Does this view propose an Incarnate Christ with multiple personality disorder? Morris claims that this objection lacks merit. In fact, contemporary psychology seems to provide resources which support the viability of such a model. As Morris points out elsewhere, the human mind is sometimes characterized as a system of somewhat autonomous subsystems. The normal human mind, for example, includes the workings of the conscious mind, the seat of awareness, and the unconscious mind. Morris proposes that similar sorts of relations can be supposed to obtain between the divine and human mind of Christ.

4. Atonement

Traditional Christianity holds that sin separates human creatures from God, but that reconciliation has somehow been made possible through the life, death, and resurrection of Jesus. By virtue of what Jesus has done, human beings are able to have fellowship with God. They can be saved from hell (whatever exactly hell might amount to), and they can enjoy everlasting life. A theory of the atonement is a theory about how the life, death, and resurrection of Jesus contribute to all of this. The most well-known of these theories fall into one of the following three types.

1. Ransom theories, put forward by early Church Fathers such as Origen and Gregory of Nyssa, take as their point of departure the idea that human sin gives the Devil a right to the possession of human souls. The basic view, familiar enough now from literature and film, is that God and the Devil are in a sort of competition for souls, and the rules of the competition state that anyone stained by sin must die and then forever exist as the Devil's prisoner in hell. Thus, much as God loves us and would otherwise desire for us never to die and, furthermore, to enjoy life in heaven with him, the sad fact is that we, by our sins, have secured a much different destiny for ourselves.

But here is where the work of Christ is supposed to come in. According to the ransom view, it would be unfitting for God simply to violate the pre-ordained rules of the competition and snatch our souls out of the Devil's grasp. But it is not at all unfitting for God to pay the Devil a ransom in exchange for our freedom. Christ's death is that ransom. By living a sinless life and then dying like a sinner, Christ pays a price that, in the eyes of all parties to the competition, earns back for God the right to our souls.

2. Moral Exemplar theories, pioneered by Peter Abelard, hold that the atonement is secured by moral reform of the sinner. But such moral reform was not fully possible without someone to set the moral example for fallen creatures. Christ became incarnate, on these theories, in order to set this example and thus provide a necessary condition for the moral reform that is, in turn, necessary for the restoration of the relationship between creature and Creator.

3. Satisfaction theories start from the idea that human sin constitutes a grave offense against God, the magnitude of which renders reconciliation and forgiveness morally impossible unless something is done either to satisfy the demands of justice or to compensate God for the wrong done to him. These theories go on to note that human beings are absolutely incapable on their own of compensating God for the wrong they have done to him. Thus, they need help. Christ, through his life and death and resurrection has provided that help. The different versions of the satisfaction theory are differentiated by their claims about what sort of help the work of Christ has provided. Here we'll discuss three versions: St. Anselm's debt-cancellation theory, the penal substitution theory defended by John Calvin and many others in the reformed tradition, and Richard Swinburne's penitential substitution theory.

According to Anselm, our sin puts us in a kind of debt toward God. As our creator, God is entitled to our submission and obedience. By sinning, we therefore fail to give God something that we owe him. Thus, we deserve to be punished until we do give God what we owe him. Indeed, on Anselm's view, not only is it just for God to punish us; it is, other things being equal, unfitting for him not to punish us. For as long as we are not giving God his due, we are dishonoring him; and the dishonoring of God is maximally intolerable. By allowing us to get away with dishonoring him, then, God would thus be tolerating what is maximally intolerable. Moreover, he would be behaving in a way that leaves sinners and the sinless in substantially the same position before him, which, Anselm thinks, is unseemly. But, of course, once we have sinned, it is impossible for us to give God the perfect life that we owe him. So we are left in the position of a debtor who cannot, under any circumstances, repay his own debt and is therefore stuck in debtor's prison for the remainder of his existence.

By living a sinless life, however, Christ is in a different position before God. He is the one human being who has given God what God is owed. Thus, he deserves no punishment; he does not even deserve death. And yet he submitted to death anyway for the sake of obeying God. In doing this, he gave God more than he owed God; and so, on Anselm's view, put God in the position of owing him something. According to Anselm, just as it would be unfitting for God not to punish us, so too it would be unfitting for God not to reward Jesus. But Jesus, as God incarnate, has already at his disposal everything he could possibly need or desire. So what reward could possibly be given to him? None, of course. But, Anselm argues, the reward can be transferred; and, under the circumstances, it would be unfitting for God not to transfer it. Thus, the reward that Jesus claims is the cancellation of the collective debt of his friends. This allows God to pay what he owes, and it allows him to suffer no dishonor in failing to collect what is due him from us.

As should be clear, the notion of substitution isn't really a part of Anselm's theory of the atonement. But it is a central part of other satisfaction theories. Thus, consider the penal substitution theory. According to this theory, the just punishment for sin is death and separation from God. Moreover, on this view, though God strongly desires for us not to receive this punishment it would be unfitting for God simply to waive our punishment. But, as in the case of monetary fines, the punishment can be paid by a willing substitute. Thus, out of love for us, God the Father sent the willing Son to be our substitute and to satisfy the demands of justice on our behalf.

Richard Swinburne's version of the satisfaction theory also includes a substitutionary element. According to Swinburne, in human relationships, the process of making atonement for one's sin has four parts: apology, repentance, reparation (where possible), and (in case of serious wrongs) penance. Thus, suppose you angrily throw a brick through the window of a friend's house. Later, you come to seek forgiveness. In order to receive forgiveness, you will surely have to apologize and repent—i.e., you will have to show regret and some sort of change of attitude toward your past behavior. You ought also to agree to fix the broken window. Depending on the circumstance, however, even this might not be enough. It might be that, in addition to apologizing, repenting, and making reparations, you ought to do something further to show that you are quite serious about your apology and repentance. Perhaps, for example, you will send flowers every day for a week; perhaps you will stand outside your friend's window with a portable stereo playing a meaningful song; perhaps you will offer some other sort of gift or sacrifice. This something further is penance. Importantly, penance isn't punishment: it's not a bit of suffering that you deserve to have inflicted upon you by someone else for the purpose of retribution, rehabilitation, deterrence, or compensation. Rather, it's a bit of suffering that you voluntarily undergo or a sacrifice that you voluntarily make in order to repair your relationship with someone.

According to Swinburne, the same four components are involved in our reconciliation with God. Apology and repentance we can do on our own, but reparation and penance we cannot. We owe God a life of perfect obedience. By sinning we have made it impossible for God to get that from us. If, upon apologizing to God and repenting of our sins we were thereafter to live a life of perfect obedience, we would only be giving God what we already owe him; we would not thereby be giving back to him anything that we have taken away. Thus, our very best efforts would not suffice even to make reparations for what we have done. There is nothing we can give God to compsensate him for his loss, and there is no extra gift we can give or extra sacrifice we can make in order to do penance.

According to Swinburne, it would be unfitting for God simply to overlook our sins, ignoring the need for reparation and penance. It would also be unfitting for God to leave us in the helpless situation of being unable to reconcile ourselves to him. Thus, on his view, God sent Christ to earth so that Christ might willingly offer his own sinless life and death as restitution and penance for the sin of the world. In this way, then, God helps us to make restitution and penance. We must apologize and repent on our own; we must also recognize our own helplessness to make up for what we have done. But then we can look to the life and death of Christ and offer that up to God on our own behalf as reparation and penance.

Though the ransom theory is of historical importance and has exerted a great deal of literary influence, it has been almost universally rejected since the middle ages, in no small part because it is hard to take seriously the idea that God might be in competition with or have obligations toward another being (much less a being like the Devil) in the ways just described. But while each of the remaining theories has defenders, each faces certain key difficulties as well.

Substitutionary theories, for example, maintain that it is morally impossible for God simply to forgive our sins without exacting reparation or punishment. Some have argued that this entails that God does not forgive sin at all. (Stump, 1988: 61-5) Forgiveness involves a refusal to demand full reparation and a willingness to let an offense go without punishment. Moreover, the penal substitution theory faces the challenge of explaining how it could possibly be just to allow a substitute to bear someone else's punishment. As David Lewis (1997) notes, we do allow for penal substitution in the case of serious fines. But the idea of allowing a substitute to bear someone else's death sentence (or similarly serious punishment) seems, on the face of it, to be morally repugnant. On this score, Swinburne's theory of penitential substitution is on somewhat surer footing; but one problem with Swinburne's view is that it is hard, really, to see what it would even mean to offer up another person's life and death as one's own reparation and penance.

The Anselmian version of the satisfaction theory does not quite encounter these difficulties. But, together with the moral exemplar theory and various other versions of the satisfaction theory, it faces a different sort of problem. Both views seem unable to account for the Biblical emphasis on the necessity of Christ's passion to remedy the problems brought forth by sin. It is hard to see why Christ's death plays any essential role in establishing him as moral exemplar. Further, it is hard to see why it would be needed in order for him to merit the sort of reward that Anselm thinks the Father owes him. Given that Christ is a man, he owes it to the Father to live a sinless life; but why isn't the incarnation itself sufficiently supererogatory to merit the debt-cancelling reward? Moreover, even if we can discover some reason why Christ's death would be necessary under these theories, it is hard to see why it would have to involve such horrible suffering. For purposes of meriting a reward or for serving as an exemplar, why would it not suffice for Christ to dwell among us, live a perfect human life resisting all earthly temptation, and then die a quiet death at home? Indeed, these theories seem unable to account even for the value in Christ's passion, much less its necessity.

Of the various models just considered, the penal substitutionary model is perhaps the most widely accepted among laypersons in the church; but it has been widely rejected by philosophers and theologians. Can it overcome the difficulties posed for it above?

Some have defended substitution models according to which punishment is a fitting response to human sin, and yet also such that it might nonetheless be fairly borne by a surrogate, in this case, the perfect Christ. Stephen Porter, for example, argues that our moral intuitions generally incline us to view punishment of a surrogate as a bad thing, and that some case needs to be made for its permissibility in this instance. In run of the mill cases of punishment, the good reasons for punishment (such as reform of the wrongdoer, deterrence, and so forth) usually weigh in favor of not transferring the punishment to a surrogate. But here, Porter argues, the good reasons for punishing human sinners are not undercut, and that, in fact, there are outweighing reasons for allowing Christ to bear the punishment due human sinners.

Specifically, Porter claims that the goods that come from God's punishment of sin (namely, reparation, manifesting an objective correction to distorted human values, and moral education/reform) justify the punishment. What is more, Porter claims, these ends are more fittingly served through the suffering of Christ on our behalf. The reasons for this are three-fold. First, Christ's vicarious suffering and death is a more severe form of punishment than direct punishment of sinners. That God is willing to incur this striking punishment himself shows how seriously God takes the divine-human relationship, and the process of reconciliation. Second, were we to bear the punishment directly, it might further serve to alienate us from God. Finally, exacting the more severe punishment on God himself serves the expressive function of displaying the perversion and gravity of sin itself. Punishment of an infinite God-man thus better expresses the seriousness of sin.

In Porter's account we have an attempt to respond to the objections raised earlier against substitution views. Concerning the first objection (namely, that paying the full price of sin means that there is no forgiveness on God's part), Porter can reply that the objection is simply misguided. God can forgive without any punishment being exacted. However, certain goods arise as a result of punishment being meted out, and God thus metes out punishment suitable for securing those goods. The second difficulty (i.e., the non-transferrability of punishment) initially seemed to be the most formidable. Porter argues, however, that as long as (a) offender, offended, and surrogate are willing participants, and (b) the goods of punishing can be secured through the punishment of the surrogate, then substitution is permissible, perhaps even preferable. The reason it is permissible, however, is not because the moral debt is “transferred” from sinner to Christ (as the objection assumes) but simply because punishing wrong is a good and punishing a surrogate can equally or better serve the aims of punishing.





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Aquinas, Saint Thomas | atonement | Augustine, Saint | cosmological argument | Descartes, René: ontological argument | faith | God, arguments for the existence of: moral arguments | ontological arguments | teleology: teleological arguments for God's existence